Philosophy of Liberation

First published Thu Jan 28, 2016; substantive revision Wed Oct 7, 2020

Philosophy of Liberation is the collective name for a philosophical movement and method of doing philosophy that emerged at first in Argentina during the late sixties, but that went on to spread throughout Latin American during the early seventies. It is for this reason that sometimes some critics and historiographers of the philosophy of liberation make reference to a “strict” and a “broad” conception of the philosophy of liberation, in order to refer to the immediate context of its earliest articulations, and to its later general dissemination and development. The philosophy of liberation belongs to the “maturity” stage within the “contemporary” period of Latin American philosophy, if we use Jorge J.E. Gracia and Manuel Vargas’s periodization of Latin American philosophy (Gracia and Vargas 2013). Without question, however, the philosophy of liberation is the distinct manifestation of Latin American philosophy that has received the most international attention, and that has had the most influence both within Latin America and the United States[1].

While the philosophy of liberation is deeply rooted in the history and debates of Latin American philosophy, to the extent that it may be claimed that it is the most elaborate and substantive response to the task articulating a distinct Latin American philosophy, it is nonetheless also a chapter within the broader history of European philosophy. Even as it defines itself as a critique of Eurocentrism and the hegemony of European philosophy, it has evolved out of and made use of its philosophical currents, movements, concepts and debates. Some may be argue that the philosophy of liberation belongs to phenomenology, hermeneutics, and Marxism, or more generally, historical materialism. In fact, because many philosophers of liberation came out of these different traditions, the philosophy of liberation was and remains from the outset an internally heterogeneous movement. This heterogeneity has increased as some philosophers have engaged in what Enrique Dussel has called a “South-South Dialogue,” in which philosophies from the so-called “global south” address each other directly without deferring to the authority of dominant Euro-American philosophy (Dussel 2015).

The philosophy of liberation aims to think the distinct place and role of Latin American in world history using what are argued to be autochthonous cultural and intellectual resources, from out of a situation of economic, cultural, political, and philosophical dependency. It has a practical aim: liberation. In very general terms, the philosophy of liberation defines itself as a counter-philosophical discourse, whether it be as a critique of colonialism, imperialism, globalization, racism, and sexism, which is articulated from out of the experience of exploitation, destitution, alienation and reification, in the name of the projects of liberation, autonomy and authenticity. That is, the philosophy of liberation has presented itself as an “epistemic rupture” that aims to critique and challenge not only basic assumptions and themes of Euro-American philosophy, but also to make philosophy more responsive to and responsible for the socio-political situation in which it always finds itself. Thus, by “counter-philosophical discourse”, philosophers of liberation did not mean that it was “anti-philosophical”. Instead, they meant to emphasize a heightened degree of reflexiveness or self-awareness in their theorizing. Positively, the philosophy of liberation affirms cultural diversity, gender and racial equality, and political sovereignty. In more recent years, some philosophers of liberation have been using the language of “pluriversality,” instead of “universality,” to refer to this fundamental affirmation and celebration of global cultural diversity (Dussel 2015; Mignolo 2011). The philosophy of liberation’s philosophical orbit is defined by the axes of critique, commitment, engagement, and liberation. As a critique of all forms of philosophical dependency and inauthenticity, it is consciously and avowedly a metaphilosophy. The philosophy of liberation is thus, among other things, a view about what counts as philosophy and how it should be pursued.

This article is divided into four main parts: history, background, currents, and themes and debates.

1. History

As was noted, the philosophy of liberation belongs to the “maturity” stage of the “contemporary” period of the history of Latin American philosophy (Gracia and Vargas 2013; Gracia 1988–89). As a philosophical movement that engages in the critical task of recovering what is distinctly “Latin American” thought, it has sought explicitly to unearth and rescue Amerindian thought, in its pre-Colombian and post-Conquest forms, as well as all the different philosophical tendencies and movements that emerged during the long history of colonialism, independence and projects of national formation. It is for this reason that the philosophy of liberation has as one of its goals a critical historiography of Latin American thought, specifically, and philosophy tout court, in general. Figures such as Enrique Dussel, Rodolfo Kusch, Arturo Roig, and Leopoldo Zea have articulated their versions of the philosophy of liberation in terms of a recovery of earlier stages in the formulation of a project of Latin American liberation. Yet, the philosophy of liberation as a self-conscious movement and current, emerged out of a very distinct convergence of geo-historical, cultural, intellectual and philosophical tendencies, conflicts and processes.

1.1 The Long History

The philosophy of liberation, arguably, began in the late sixties when Leopoldo Zea and Augusto Salazar Bondy launched a debate with the question: “Is there a Latin American philosophy?” Whether the answer was affirmative or negative did not affect the fact that the movement would have to embark on the long path of the recovery of Latin American philosophy, at the very least in order to identify those moments of originality and authentically autochthonous Latin American thinking. It is for this reason that some philosophers liberation have argued that there are at least three antecedent historical stages that serve as the geological subsoil of liberation philosophy. Following Dussel, they could be sketched as follows (Dussel 2005: 374–5):

First Period. This is the period of the beginning of the critique of the conquest and the development of a discourse that engages Amerindian thought. An important inaugural date is 1511 when Antón de Montesinos critiques the way evangelization is taking place in the Americas. This is the period when a distinct continental awareness of the injustice that is being committed against the indigenous populations of the so-called New World emerges. The debate between Ginés de Sepúlveda and Fray Bartolomé de las Casas at Valladolid in 1550 marks the clear emergence of a liberation discourse and consciousness. In this debate Sepúlveda articulated a moment in the emergent imperial and colonizing modern consciousness of Europe when he argued that Amerindians were naturally born slaves and that therefore they were to be subjugated. Sepúlveda questioned the humanity of Amerindians (Dussel 2007, 2007a; Ruiz Sotelo 2010). In contrast, de las Casas affirmed the rational humanity of Amerindians, while acknowledging their distinctiveness. In fact, de las Casas affirms their rationality and treats appeals to their reason as a theological and evangelical norm. The only true way for evangelization is the path of rational deliberation and not violent religious usurpation and imposition.

Second Period. This epoch is defined by the process of what might be called the first emancipation, from 1750 until the end of the nineteenth century. Defining figures are Benito Diaz de Gamarra, who published in 1774 his Elementa Recientioris Philosophiae, Carlos de Singüenza y Góngora, and Francisco Xavier Clavigero, who articulated an anti-colonial and anti-absolutist political philosophy that launched a critique of the Spanish monarchy. Some of the notable figures of this epoch include Fray Servando Teresa de Mier (1763–1827), Manuel M. Moreno (in La Plata, what would become Argentina, 1778–1811), Simón Rodríguez (in Venezuela, 1751–1854), Simón Bolivar (1783–1830), Francisco de Miranda (1750–1816), Juan Germán Roscio (1763–1821). In the eighteenth century, these thinkers and many other “patriotras” articulated a political discourse of emancipation from the Spanish crown. They called for continental independence, as well as the development of a distinct “American” identity. Because of her blend of poetry, theological speculation, praise of Amerindian traditions, and nascent feminist awareness, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651–1695) should also be considered a contributor to this first discourse of emancipation and should be included among the figures that define this epoch.

Third Period.This epoch could characterized as a second moment of emancipation, beginning at the end of the nineteen century and being bookended with the Cuban Revolution in 1959. Defining figures are José Carlos Mariátegui (1894–1930), whose book Siete ensayos sobre la realidad peruana (Seven Interpretative Essays on Peruvian Reality) (1968) gave expression to a new emancipation agenda that is explicitly elaborated in terms of a dual approach that is attentive to the historical reality of the Americas, with its indigenous and criollo backgrounds. It launched a critical appropriation of European ideas in the “Latin American” context. This epoch is defined by the crises of both development efforts and populisms that were inattentive to the severe racial, ethnic, and class divisions within the Latin American nations. It is against this context that Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925–1974) and Leopoldo Zea (1912–2004) began to debate the question whether there is a Latin American philosophy. This third period is defined by the explicit consciousness of economic, political, social, and cultural dependence, under-development, and domination (Vallega 2014). It is in this period that the need of a discourse of liberation begins to be explicitly articulated.

1.2 The Immediate History

This section discusses the broader social and intellectual context of the third period indicated above, from which an explicit and nuanced philosophy of liberation would emerge.

An important part of the origin of the philosophy of liberation as an autochthonous philosophical movement was rooted in the question of a distinct or authentic Latin American philosophy. The problem of a distinct Latin American philosophy has been in gestation at least since the late nineteen century, when the so-called “generation of patriarchs” began to ask about a philosophy or thinking from and for the “Americas” (Beorlegui 2004). This problem took a distinct shape when Salazar Bondy (1968) re-framed it in terms of the question as to the actual existence of a Latin American philosophy. Using existentialist and Marxist categories, Salazar Bondy gave a negative answer. There is no authentic Latin American philosophy because the sub-continent has lived and developed under conditions of mental colonialism, intellectual subordination, and philosophical dependence. In order to achieve an authentic Latin American philosophy, Salazar Bondy maintained, the sub-continent had to achieve its independence and establish its autonomy and self-determination. These thoughts, and Zea’s subsequent response (1969), set the agenda for a generation. The philosophy of liberation , so explicitly christened, it could be argued, has gone through at least the following three stages: constitution and maturation, persecution and exile, challenges and debates (Dussel 2005; Beorlegui 2004; Cerutti Guldberg 1983 [2006]).

Constitution and Maturation (1969–1975). The philosophy of liberation was explicitly labeled as such at the Second Argentine National Congress of Philosophy, which was held in Cordoba in 1971 (Dussel 2017). The inaugurating group was conformed by Osvaldo Ardiles, Alberto Parisini, Juan Carlos Scannone, Julio de Zan, and Anibal Fornari. But this group took a more formal shape at the jornadas (week long working seminars) of philosophy that were organized at the Jesuit University, Universidad of San Salvador (where Pope Francis was educated), in San Miguel, in the outskirts of Buenos Aires, Argentina. The first jornada took place in 1971, and a second was held later the same year with the title “Latin American Liberation”. A third jornada was held in 1973, at which Salazar Bondy gave a paper titled “Filosofía de la dominacion y filosofía de la liberación (Philosophy of Domination and Philosophy of Liberation” (1973), and Leopoldo Zea gave a paper titled “La filosofía latinoamericana como filosofía de la liberación (Latin American Philosophy as a Philosophy of Liberation)” (1973). This stage comes to a close in 1975 with the First Mexican National Congress of Philosophy in Morelia, Mexico, with papers by Dussel, Miró Quesada, Arturo Roig, and Abelardo Villegas. This was an important meeting because it signaled the launching of the philosophy liberation as a Latin American philosophical agenda that supersedes its initial Argentine formulations. A new group of philosophers from across Latin America entered into the debate: Hugo Assmann, Carlos Bazán, Arturo Roig,

In 1974 the journal Revista de Filosofía Latinoamericana begins to be edited and published in Buenos Aires, and goes on to become a major publishing venue for philosophers of liberation, along with Stromata, published at the University of El Salvador, in Buenos Aires, Argentina, in which many of the inaugural essays and quasi-manifestos of the movement were published.

Persecution and Exile (1975–1983). Following the military lead coup d’état against María Estela Martínez Perón in March of 1976, there began a period called the “dirty war,” which was in fact a form of “state terrorism,” that included the persecution and assassination of philosophers affiliated with the nascent movement of the philosophy of liberation. Due to their persecution, many went into exile, moving to Canada, Ecuador, Mexico, Peru, and Venezuela. One of the consequences of this persecution was that hitherto Argentine project of a Latin American philosophy of liberation was brought to other parts of Latin America, making it into a continental project. However, the Latin American dictatorships of the sixties and the Cold War in general, had directly influenced internal debates about the “who” of Latin American philosophy, and consequently had polarizing and decisive effects for how liberation was understood. The role of populism and nationalism in defining the task of philosophy became a litmus test. In 1980, the AFYL (Asociación Filosofia y Liberación [Philosophy and Liberation Association]), was established in Bogotá, Colombia, and it become a major vehicle for organizing congresses, round tables, and sessions at international philosophy congresses.

Challenges and Debates (1983 to today). With the transition to democracy and the collapse or defeat of the military dictatorships in Latin America there began a new stage in the normalization and maturation of liberation philosophy. Horacio Cerutti Guldberg’s Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana (Philosophy of Latin American Liberation) (2006) offered the most comprehensive historical and critical reconstruction of the movement. In 1988–89, Jorge J.E. Gracia edited a special issue on “Latin American Philosophy”, with a long essay by Cerutti Guldberg in which a synoptic overview of the movement is presented. In 1993, Ofelia Schutte published her Cultural Identity and Social Liberation in Latin American Thought in which a critical confrontation with some key theses of liberation philosophy is developed. These substantive texts signaled the maturity and general coherence of the philosophy of liberation, at the very least as it was perceived by its critics. These works called for re-articulations and reformulations that made explicit the inner tensions and divisions within the group of thinkers that had first given voice to this new current and method of doing philosophy in Latin America.

These differences and divergences have become increasingly pronounced. It may now no longer be possible to speak of a “philosophy of liberation”, in the singular. Instead, it may be more appropriate to speak of “philosophies of liberation”, in the plural, where what is shared is a set of overlapping themes among the distinct accounts of what are the situations and conditions from which liberation is to be sought, and different philosophical methods and traditions used to articulate those accounts . To be sure, there remains a substantive core that holds together the constellation of the philosophy of liberation now in the middle of its fourth decade of existence. Widely shared characteristics of the various philosophies of liberation include the following:

  1. An indisputable point of departure for all philosophers liberation is the consciousness of the economic, social, political and cultural dependence of Latin America on Europe and the United States.
  2. The general affirmation that “philosophy” has to be practiced from a specific context of both engagement and commitment within the distinct Latin American historical and geopolitical situation. The claim is that implicitly or explicitly all philosophizing is always a form of commitment with an existential situation. All philosophers of liberation share the conviction that a philosophy that is worthy of that name is a tool or means of enlightenment, a theoretical elaboration at the service of a praxis of liberation. The philosophy of liberation is the twin of a practice of emancipation.
  3. All philosophizing is done out of a concrete historical situation. Yet, this “concrete historical” situation has received different formulations, which define the different currents within the philosophy of liberation (see section 3, below). For now, we can note that the “point of departure” can be a people, nation, or autochthonous culture; it can refer to a class or economic group understood along Marxist lines; it can include a cultural, historical, existential project that manifests itself in terms of a historical formation or agent.
  4. As a critique of putatively colonized thinking and dependent philosophy, the philosophy of liberation is a metaphilosophy. For this reason, issues of method are integral to its philosophical agenda. In tandem with the different “points of departure” for philosophy that is authentically grounded, different liberation philosophers argue on behalf of the virtues of one or another philosophical method or current. Thus, we find some philosophers of liberation who are “indigenistas”, some who at one time or another were Ricoeuerian, Heideggerian, Levinasian; others who were Diltheyan, Gadamerian, and Gaosian and/or Ortegian, and some who were Marxists. The philosophy of liberation, which is critical of European philosophy, is so from within, immanently, even when some of its representatives argue from some “analectical” standpoint, or standpoint of metaphysical “exteriority” to imperial and totalizing thought. It is thus not surprising that philosophy “companions” or handbooks to Existentialism, Phenomenology, Marxism, or to figures such as Martin Heidegger, Karl Marx, Emmanuel Levinas, include entries on “philosophy of liberation”, or some of its most representative figures.
  5. Inasmuch at it is defined by the word “liberation”, all philosophy of liberation is entangled with the project of sketching an utopia and identifying the “subject” of the construction of such an utopia. The utopia of liberation entails either recognizing the suppressed historical subject, or forging a new one. This liberation or emancipating subject could be “el pueblo”, or the proletarian class, or the popular sectors, made up by the “pueblo” now understood as the destitute and exploited of the nation. For others, as we will see, this subject is constituted by the nation as it is embodied in its popular sector. That sector is not understood simply in terms of class or even cultural identity, but in terms of an anti-colonial attitude aimed at national sovereignty.

These general and shared characteristics, problems and themes could be summarized in three observations about the coherence and unity of the philosophy of liberation.. First, there is a general agreement that Latin American philosophy must be a philosophy of liberation that aims at overcoming dependence, domination and subordination. Second, there is ample disagreement as to the who, what, or how, is this project of liberation to be undertaken. Third, there is also ample disagreement as to the “content” or final goal of liberation. In short, the philosophy of liberation is defined by what many would argue is integral to all philosophy as such, namely questioning the general individual existential situation of alienation, the corresponding project of liberation, and what the utopia of achieved liberation could and would look like. Philosophers of liberation argue, nevertheless, that this questioning takes on a universal character only and precisely because it is taken up from within a specific and unique existential, historical, and geo-political situation.

2. Background

Like all philosophical movements and traditions, the philosophy of liberation emerged out of both world historical and regional socio-historical contexts. In terms of the world historical background, World War II, and in particular the disclosures about the genocide of the Jews, the Cold War, and the South East Asian wars, created a world historical stage in which Europe and its intellectual and moral traditions stood discredited. Whereas before, all things European were regarded as the standard against which everything would have to be measured, Europe had become suspect. Latin Americans had to look elsewhere for inspiration and intellectual guidance.

The regional socio-historical situation was framed, on the one side, by the Cuban revolution, and the numerous military dictatorships throughout the Latin American subcontinent, on the other, that took place as a consequence of the Cold War and the failures of economic development in Latin America. The Cuban revolution, however, had a profound impact in the socio-political-cultural imagination throughout Latin America. In the iconic image of Che Guevara (1928–1967), the revolution promise a transformation of the Latin American human being—el nuevo hombre—as it also raised the possibility of political sovereignty for Latin American nations. The decade of the sixties in Latin American was a time of political turmoil, but above all of cultural renewal and utopian yearning.

The philosophy of liberation, however, was above all an intellectual and philosophical response and unquestionably synthesis of a series of intellectual and cultural movements that had been gestating for a decade throughout Latin America. The cultural context was so ripe with proclamations and thinking about “liberation” that if the philosophy of liberation had not been so named in the late sixties and early seventies, today we would have wondered whether philosophers had been abducted from this world and sequestered in some time capsule. The philosophy of liberation was both necessary and inevitable.

Drawing on the work of Carlos Beorlegui, a historian of Latin American philosophy, we can say that there are some identifiable “matrixes”, or intellectual sources, from which liberation philosophy emerged (Beorlegui 2004: 677–690).[2] Here, they will be characterized as follows.

The Economic Matrix: The Theory of Dependence. After the end of World War II, the United States undertook to finance the “development” of Latin America on the model of industrialized and capitalist nations. This is what the Alliance for Progress (1961–1973) aimed to do this by granting loans that would help economically underdeveloped nations to ascend the ladder of economic development. This program was guided by the economic theory called “desarrollismo” or developmentalism. Yet, Latin American nations continue to lag behind both socially and economically.

It is in the face of this failure that a series of economists began to develop “dependency theory”, or the “theory of the development of underdevelopment”, among who were: Theothonio dos Santos, Fernando Henrique Cardoso, Enzo Falleto, Celso Furtado, and Anibal Quijano. The core of this theory was that the underdevelopment of the Latin American nation was not due to endogenous factors, but rather was a direct consequence of economic dependence on Europe and the United States. The model of development that reigned during the fifties and sixties, according to these theorists, had a double perverse effect: greater capital accumulation in the metropolises and lending nations, and greater indebtedness and impoverishment in the so-called underdeveloped nations. The economic underdevelopment of Latin America was now to be understood in terms of an economic theory that showed that underdevelopment is not a prior stage in the natural economic development of nations, but rather an integral dimension of the international economic order created by colonialism, imperialism, and neo-imperialism.

The Religious Matrix: The Theology of Liberation. The emergence of Liberation Theology has been amply documented and studied in the specialized literature. Yet, liberation theology is as much a phenomenon of global Catholicism as it is a unique Latin American development. The reforms began with Vatican II (1962–1965) and the Second Latin American Bishops congregation in Medellín, Colombia (1968), created the church context for the consolidation of what was in effect a social movement, namely the “communidades de base” (base communities). The theology of liberation developed in response to a new understanding of the church’s relationship to the “people” and the role of the faith in a world of incredible poverty and social inequality.

The theology of liberation forged a whole new language: the “preferential option for the poor”, the “underside of history”, “the church of the people”, “orthopraxis is prior to orthodoxy” that influenced some philosophers of liberation. Still, two of the most important contributions of the theology of liberation to the philosophy of liberation were the imperative that critical reflection had to emerge out of committed praxis, and the problematization of the concept of “el pueblo”. The theology of liberation may be understood as theological reflection on what constituted a people, a community of faith. In short, theology of liberation asks: who is the subject of God’s soteriology. Most noteworthy is that Gustavo Gutierrez published his Teología de la liberación. Perspectivas (A Theology of Liberation) in 1971 in Peru, while Hugo Assmann published his Opresión-Liberación: desafío a los cristianos (Oppression-Liberation: Challenge to Christians) the same year in Chile. The Catholic Church also provided an institutional framework within which some of the work of philosophers of liberation could be pursued by hosting “jornadas”, sponsoring congresses, and providing teaching opportunities in its affiliated universities for philosophers of liberation, many who had been expelled from public universities.

The Educational Matrix: The Pedagogy of the Oppressed. In 1970, after nearly two decades of literacy work in the Brazilian favelas and poor sectors of Brazil, Paulo Freire published his paradigm shifting text Pedagogia del oprimido (Pedagogy of the Oppressed) (1970), which was followed in 1972 by his Education for the Praxis of Liberation. At the core of Freire’s work were three key ideas: if the people are to overcome their dependence, they can only do so through their own agency, by becoming the subject of their own liberation; to become a subject of one’s own liberation means to engage in a process of conscientização, or consciousness raising, that takes place through a pedagogy that rejects the notion of the learner as a passive receptacle and instead departs from the fundamental realization that learning is a dynamic process. Two key notions of Freire’s pedagogy of liberation were that (1) teaching requires listening to the people, and (2) schooling means life, that is, learning is both indispensable to life and it takes place in the midst of living. Freire’s key phrase “conscientização” goes on to be appropriated by liberation philosophers as their own goal: philosophy is at the service of the raising of both individual and collective consciousness.

The Literary-Artistic Matrix: The Boom and the Muralists. It is often forgotten that the sixties were the time of the Latin American literary Boom. This is the decade when José M. Arguedas, Julio Cortázar, Carlos Fuentes, Gabriel García-Márquez, Mario Vargas Llosa, Octavio Paz, Juan Rulfo, Ernesto Sábato published their major works. During this decade there also emerged a genre that gave expression to the heavy consciousness of dependence and the spirit of rebellion and quest for emancipation, namely the Novelas de Guerrilla; among which are Julio de la Vega’s Matías, el apóstol suplente (1971, Jesús Lara’s Ñaucahuazú, Sueños (1969, Renato Prada Oropeza’s, Los fundadores del alba (1969), Gaby Vallejo de Bolívar’s Los Vulnerables (1973, Oscar Uzin Fernández’s, La oscuridad radiante (1976). Just as these writers demonstrated how a distinct Latin American literary tradition could be forged, the muralists demonstrated how standards of artistic beauty that celebrated proudly the aesthetic sensibility and creativity of the continent. The estética indigenista (indigeneous aesthetics) celebrates by muralists like Diego Orozco, Rivera, Siqueiros, and painters like Frida Kahlo, created a new iconic representation of the Latin American people that more ecumenically reflected the continent’s mestizaje, or racial mixing and hybridity.

The Sociological Matrix: The Sociology of Liberation. The fifties and sixties, as was already noted, were decades of tremendous social-economic-political turmoil throughout Latin America. Latin American industrialization went in tandem with massive urbanization and de-ruralization. Extensive migrations from the countryside to the cities gave rise to the shantytowns that are so distinctly visible in most Latin American metropolises. Sociologist began to address the unique challenges of de-ruralization and urbanization. In Colombia, sociologist Orlando Fals Borda, who worked with Colombian peasants, began to develop what he called a “sociology of liberation” that meant to address the very unique situation of the urban and rural poor in contexts in which the state was nearly absent. Fals Borda studied in particular the ways in which the poor created their own institutions and norms of social interaction. Combined with the theory of dependence, the sociology of liberation, created an interdisciplinary matrix that sought to address the conditions of systemic inequity, while raising the norm that people could be the agents of their own liberation.

It is clear that both dependence and liberation were in the lips of economists, sociologists, theologians, and writers. The philosophy of liberation gave expression in concepts what was a lived local and globally interlinked experience.

3. Currents

Like existentialism, hermeneutics, phenomenology, and poststructuralism, the philosophy of liberation was never a homogeneous or monolithic movement. From its inception the philosophy of liberation was marked by internal tensions, which over time have become more intense, but that have also led to philosophical developments that have taken the original theses to new levels of refinement and theoretical elaboration. Cerutti Guldberg, who has written the most substantive and comprehensive study of liberation philosophy, has offered a typology of the internal currents that names four different currents (Cerutti Guldberg 1983, 1988–9, 2006). Beorlegui, writing more recently, argues that there are in fact six currents, though he accepts Cerutti Guldberg’s four as being the core and originating current (Beorlegui 2004: 695–727). These four currents will now be discussed sequentially.

3.1 The Ontologicist

This current is generally associated with Mario Casalla, Carlos Cullen, Gunther Rodolfo Kush, and Amelia Podetti. According to these thinkers, a Latin American philosophy of liberation has to begin from the ontological situation of the American people, which has a distinct relationship to being. This distinct relationship to being is expressed in the two forms of the verb “to be” in Spanish: ser (to be) and estar (to be in). Authentic Latin American philosophy begins from the estar of the American people in its own being. At the same time, everything that is either European or North American has to be rejected as manifestations of a philosophy of oppression and philosophical hegemony. This new philosophy that breaks with the past and everything that is allegedly foreign must break with the “ontological dependence” that has been suffered by Latin American in different ways. This current rejects as much European liberalism, as a form of abstract individualism, and Marxism, as a form of economic and inorganic collectivism. It calls for a form of populism that is neither nationalistic nor class oriented. Instead, “el pueblo” is considered as an ontological entity, a community of fate, and organic unity that is a pure manifestation of a being-in that assumes distinct cultural characteristics. This “pueblo” is not the nation, but the American mestizo and Amerindian. It is for this reason that Cerutti Guldberg also refers to this current as a manifestation of “anti-historicist populism” (Cerutti Guldberg 1988–9: 46).

3.2 The Analectical

This current is associated with Enrique Dussel and Juan Carlos Scannone. Like the ontologicist, the analectical also presents itself as a critique of both Eurocentrism and North American neo-colonialism. It presents itself as a critique of modernity, conceived as a colonial and imperial ideology that has “encubierto” or concealed what is distinctly Latin American. More generally, however, the analectical current articulates itself as a metaphysical critique of the thinking of the totality, of all that is thought in terms of being, the whole that is postulated as the true. At the same time, it also argues that philosophy must “depart” or “locate” itself with reference to both a subject and object of philosophizing. This subject and object is also “el pueblo”, or the people.

In contrast to the ontologicist position, however, the people is not understood ontologically, but metaphysically, or more precisely analectically, (derived from “ana” or beyond, in contrast to “dia” or through and between). This strand of the philosophy of liberation aims to overhaul all of philosophy by subsuming all Western philosophy under the logic of the thinking of ontology and the dialectical totality that is always self-referential, from Aristotle and Plato, to Hegel, Marx and Habermas.

For philosophers in the analectical current, the authentic people is what is always outside the totality. Its form of being cannot be determined once and for all. It is at a given time, as it gives expression to its quest for justice that has left its own legacy and memory of struggle. However, its continuing quest for justice and the redress of past sufferings remain undetermined and unaccounted for. If for the ontologicist current the role of the philosopher is to guide the people to recognize its own deep and unsuspected wisdom, for the analectical philosopher the role of philosopher is one that is focused on being attentive to the clamoring, or “interpellations”, of the people, so that he or she can give voice to their cry for justice. That said, it must also be noted that both Dussel and Scannone have moved beyond many of these ideas, as they were first formulated in the early seventies (Dussel 1998, 2007; Scannone 1990). To this extent the analectical denomination may be already anachronistic. While Scannone, remaining faithful to his Levinasian philosophical commitments, has turned towards the development of “inter-cultural philosophy”, Dussel’s critical engagement with Karl-Otto Apel and Jürgen Habermas has led him to develop a more dialectical philosophy of liberation, one which has made the linguistic and pragmatic turn (Vallega 2014). Furthermore, in dialogue with Walter Mignolo and Santiago Castro-Gómez, Dussel has been arguing that the philosophy of liberation contributed and is part of the “decolonial turn” in Latin American philosophy (see Castro-Gómez, 2011; Dussel 2015; Mignolo, 2011; Mignol and Walsh 2018; Moraña, Dussel, Jáuregi, eds. 2008; Allen and Mendieta, forthcoming).

3.3 The Historicist

This current is associated with the work of Horacio Cerutti Guldberg, Arturo Roig, Arturo Ardao, and Leopoldo Zea. Like the “problematizing” current (see below), it presents itself as a critique of the two prior tendencies. These thinkers argue that it is neither possible nor desirable to set out from some absolute unsoiled and authentic point of departure. Instead, they argue that we are always already immersed in a history of ideas, and the task is thus to think the experience of Latin America from out its distinct history as it has been already thought. Indeed, a lot of the work the thinkers in this current have done is to engage in a rigorous reconstruction of the history of ideas in Latin America, to see their emergence out of unique process of social transformation, and their continued dialogue and confrontation across the decades and centuries. This history of ideas in Latin America has also been presented as part of the project of political emancipation. It is for this reason that the historical antecedents of Latin American philosophy cannot be dismissed, for they are also part of a history of the forging of political freedom in the subcontinent (Zea 1991).

3.4 The Problematicizing

This current is associated with the work of Horacio Cerutti Guldberg, José Severino Croatto, Manuel Ignacio Santos, and Gustavo Ortiz. Cerutti Guldberg has also argued that Salazar Body and Hugo Assmann ought to be considered as contributing to this current. For this group of thinkers, the criteria of philosophy’s efficacy or relevance cannot be authenticity, or how it relates or departs from some “null” point of enunciation that either responds to or is an interpellation of some “macro” subject. For this current, the question is what could constitute a critical reflection, without fetishes or mystifications, on the demanding crises and challenges of Latin American social reality. Unlike the ontologizing and the analectical currents, both the historicizing and the problematicizing reject all ontological or metaphysical attempts to fix “el pueblo” or what is properly “Lo Americano”, (that is, what properly belong to the “Americas”). Philosophy is caught in the river of history, it cannot jump out of, or pretend that a “rupture” with the past can be executed or proclaimed. For this group of thinkers, the critical issues were twofold. First, how does philosophy respond to a specific set of historical challenges, without falling pray to the ideological prejudices that condition that presentation of that very historical? Second, what is the language that will allow that philosophical reflection to remain ever vigilant?

Notwithstanding these substantive and often time irreconcilable differences, the philosophy of liberation has been recognized as an extremely important and representative philosophical movement that synthesized and responded to distinctly Latin American intellectual traditions and historical challenges. In nearly half a century, other figures have aligned themselves with the movement, even if they were not part of the founding cohort.

This is the case with Franz Hinkelammert, who was born in Germany in 1931, and was educated in the Free University in Berlin. In 1963, he emigrated to Latin America, first to Chile and then to Costa Rica, where along with Hugo Assmann, he funded the Departamento Ecuménico de Investigaciones (DEI). His original training was in economics, but over the last four decades he has produced a series of influential books dealing with the relationship between theology, economics, and philosophy. His work takes up liberation theology, but from the perspective of political economy and aims to show that the theology of liberation’s critique of religious idolatry are matched by Marxism’s critique of the fetish of the commodity form and exploitation. Hinkelammert has also produced a series of monographs aimed at the critique of neoliberalism. Still, what he has contributed is what he calls the Crítica de la razón utópica (Critique of Utopian Reason) (1984), which is operative as much in Marxism as it is in liberalism. To counter unrealizable utopian projects, Hinkelammert introduced the principle of “factibilidad” or feasibility, as criteria for the evaluation of the ethicalness or morality of any transformative moral-political project.

Another figure that has contributed to the further refinement of the philosophy of philosophy, mostly through his students, is the Jesuit theologian Ignacio Ellacuría, born in 1930 in Viscaya, Spain. He was a student of Karl Rahner and Xavier Zubiri. He moved to El Salvador, to teach at the Universidad Centroamericana (UCA), where he became rector in 1969, a position he led until 1989 when he was assassinated by paramilitary forces trained by the United States military.

Ellacuría worked closely with the Spanish philosopher Zubiri, whose work aimed to overcome the separation between epistemology and ontology, knower and known, through the notion of what he called “sentient intelligence”, or “feeling logos”. Ellacuría took up Zubiri’s ontological work and transformed it into a philosophy of history. Reality is historical and thus it is dynamic. Dynamic historical reality is where subjects are formed, but they are also the ones that make historical reality transformative because of their praxis, their practical engagement with the world. The praxis of human, however, is also always the expansion of the horizon of action. Praxis gives rise to more possibilities for engagement historical reality. The telos of praxis is thus greater liberty. His incomplete magnum opus Filosofía de la realidad histórica (1991) aimed to develop a philosophy of history that celebrated the “historical intelligence” that is the sediment of praxical beings taking charge of their historical reality that aims at greater liberty. It is to be noted that Ellacuría’s philosophy of history and “feeling logos” have been most effectively taken up in Dussel’s most recent work on the ethics and politics of liberation, which is one reason that, as was noted above, the “analectical” designator may no longer be a useful denomination for a current that has been influenced so profoundly by recent developments in Latin American philosophy (Dussel 1998, 2007, 2009, 2017, 2018; Bautista 2014; Grant 2020; Mills 2018).

4. Themes and Debates

Philosophical currents have distinct profiles not only because of the theses that define their methods and approaches, but also because of the themes and problems that remain their preoccupations despite changes and the incorporation of new methods and theses. The philosophy of liberation has since its inception taken up the following themes.

The question of populism. At the heart of the philosophy of liberation is the problem of the historical subject of liberation. This problem has been addressed in terms of the idea of the “pueblo” or people. Yet, this has been defined in a variety of ways: as an ethnocultural historical formation; as a socio-economic entity; as a cultural entity that transcends both nations and classes; as what is to be forged through a democratic political project. The problem of what or who is the “people” has taken on a new urgency as new forms of democratic participation have emerged, and as Latin American nations find themselves more integrated economically and politically due to hemispheric transformations. The political transformations of the last decade throughout Latin America, away from revolutionary violence and towards political participation, have been addressed in terms of the need to rethink the issues of political representation and participation.

The question of the subject. This problem is the other side of the question about the historical subject of liberation. What is the relationship between the individual subject, whether it be conceive as an epistemic or ethical agent, and their belonging to a macro-historical subject, where this may be conceived as “el pueblo” that is either a national-cultural unit, or a transnational, cultural entity, such as the “Americas”. As a chapter in phenomenological-hermeneutical philosophy, the philosophy liberation has addressed the nature of the particular and distinct embodied, free, historically located, and dependent subject. The embodied and historical situatedness of the agent is continuously addressed from the standpoint of the most deprived and most vulnerable in the collective historical subject that is always under question.

The Question of Gender/Race. As in the liberation of theology, the philosophy of liberation was initially slow to address the questions of both gender and race, although the later was always a central theme of Latin American philosophy in general. The issue of race was addressed in terms of mestizaje, blanqueamiento (whitening, i.e. the idea that through racial mixing Blacks would become White and thus assimilate into the broader society), indigenity, negritude, and racial mixing in general. Mestizaje, however, has tended to cover up the distinct role that race has played in the formation of Latin American identity. The question of gender, nonetheless, was explicitly addressed by Enrique Dussel as early as 1977 in the third volume of his Filosofía Etica Latinoamericana (Dussel 1977), in which he developed an erotics of Latin American liberation. In 1980 Dussel published Liberación de la Mujer y Erótica Latinoamericana, which is made up of re-edition of the seventh chapter of this third volume, along with a new text titled “Toward a Metaphysics of Feminity,” which as the title suggests aims to offer a metaphysical understanding of gender, in which woman is the “Other” of man. Dussel’s metaphysics was critiqued for being an anachronistic and “machista” ontologization of Catholic, in particular, and Christian, more generally, understandings of sex and gender that negated the historical contingency of gender roles that resulted in a recalcitrant rejection of sexual difference other than man/woman (Schutte 1993). In the epilogue to the 1994 edition of Liberación de la Mujer y Erótica Latinoamericana, Dussel, however, rejected and critiqued his earlier views, noting that the Latin American feminism of the sixties was primarily oriented towards a critique of North American feminism, and that the category of “gender” had not yet being thoroughly absorbed and appropriated within Latin American thinking. He also rejected the unintended “homophobic” dimension of his earlier call for an “Erotics” of Latin American liberation. Over the last three decades, in dialogue with Linda Alcoff, Lynda Lange, Maria Lugones, Ofelia Schutte, and Elina Vuola (Alcoff and Mendieta, eds. 2000), as well as theologians such as Maria Clara Bingemer,  Ivone Gebara, and Elsa Tamez, philosophers of liberation have began to address what Lugones has called “the coloniality of gender” (Lugones 2010).

The question of utopia. As a philosophical movement defined by the quest for liberation, the philosophy of liberation has had to always address the question of the role of utopia in energizing individual and social movements. The question of utopia, however, is the problem of the collective imaginary that projects goals that will guide transformative movements. Yet, at the same time, such transformative imaginaries are criticized because of their lack of feasibility or operability.

The question of history. The significance of history is a problematic that threads the entire current and tradition of the philosophy of liberation, not only because “dependency” and “liberation” are understood as historical issues, but because the very project of liberation is to be undertaken from within history. Indeed, even in its most “ontological” and “analectical” versions, the philosophy of liberation is always addressing the historical character of human existence. Collectively, philosophers of liberation affirm that historical indexicality of freedom, that is, that human freedom cannot be understood in the abstract, but only against a very specific historical conditions that are material because they take the form of socio-political institutions. For philosophers liberation, human liberty must be embodied and material precisely because it is part of a dynamic historical reality.

The question of democracy and social order. The philosophy of liberation was defined as much by its resistance to all forms of authoritarianism as by the persecution that many of its philosophers suffered at the hands of dictators and authoritarian political figures. In its early years question of democracy, legitimacy and legality were subordinate to the metaphysical and ontological questions of the subject of historical emancipation. However, over the last two decades, the political future of Latin American has become a more pressing issue. The quest for national sovereignty and liberation from Euroamerican imperialism is now framed in terms of ethnoracial democracies and the greater participation of sectors of the Latin American people that were either excluded or entirely ignored during the processes of national independence and national-state formation. In the first decades of the twenty-first century, philosophers of liberation think of themselves as contributing to the elaboration of what has been called “multicultural” democracy, and in this way, more historically inflected and less “ontological” notions of “el pueblo” are being embraced and developed.

To close, like most vibrant and still alive currents in world philosophy, the philosophy of liberation has been contributing to three key issues that are vital to all philosophy in general, namely: the question of meaning, i.e., how we produce, reproduce and transmit historically produced meanings across a variety of semiological and hermeneutical practices. This is the general question of how humans continue to communicate across time, even when their basic conditions of the production of world-views has radically altered. In tandem, the philosophy of liberation, which began partly as a challenge to a certain historiography of ideas in Latin America, continues to raise the question of how we write the history of philosophy, for whom and for what purposes, in such a way that we surrender to neither ideological distortions nor naïve purisms, neither Eurocentrism nor thirdworldism. Finally, like all transformative and enduring philosophical movements, the philosophy of liberation has since its inception articulated itself as a metaphilosophical reflection, i.e., as a philosophy that reflects on its own practice and what merits the dignity of being called philosophy tout court (Vallega 2014).


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