First published Wed Jun 9, 2021

Though not all scholars agree on the meaning of the term, “neoliberalism” is now generally thought to label the philosophical view that a society’s political and economic institutions should be robustly liberal and capitalist, but supplemented by a constitutionally limited democracy and a modest welfare state. Recent work on neoliberalism, thus understood, shows this to be a coherent and distinctive political philosophy. This entry explicates neoliberalism by examining the political concepts, principles, and policies shared by F. A. Hayek, Milton Friedman, and James Buchanan, all of whom play leading roles in the new historical research on neoliberalism, and all of whom wrote in political philosophy as well as political economy. Identifying common themes in their work provides an illuminating picture of neoliberalism as a coherent political doctrine.

After outlining some inadequate characterizations of neoliberalism, this entry critically discusses neoliberal attitudes towards liberalism, capitalism, democracy, and the welfare state, and ends with a discussion of common criticisms.

1. Explicating A Challenging Term

For many years, the term “neoliberalism” has been in search of a referent. Is neoliberalism an ideology that fetishizes the market? Or is it a political program aimed at establishing the rule of the capitalist class? Is neoliberalism the enemy of the state? Or does it favor the state to sustain the conditions for competitive markets? Rajesh Venugopal (2015: 166) has argued that neoliberalism

is now widely acknowledged in the literature as a controversial, incoherent, and crisis-ridden term, even by many of its most influential deployers,

such as Michel Foucault (2004 [2010]). Venugopal’s assessment was arguably apt just ten years ago.

But several recent book-length treatments of neoliberalism (Burgin 2012; Biebricher 2018; Slobodian 2018; Whyte 2019) have helped give form to an arguably inchoate political concept. As Quinn Slobodian argues,

in the last decade, extraordinary efforts have been made to historicize neoliberalism and its prescriptions for global governance, and to transform the “political swearword” or “anti-liberal slogan” into a subject of rigorous archival research. (2018: 3)

Along similar lines, Thomas Biebricher (2018: 8–9) argues that neoliberalism no longer faces greater analytic hurdles than other political positions like conservatism or socialism.

In light of this recent historical work, we are now in a position to understand neoliberalism as a distinctive political theory. Neoliberalism holds that a society’s political and economic institutions should be robustly liberal and capitalist, but supplemented by a constitutionally limited democracy and a modest welfare state. Neoliberals endorse liberal rights and the free-market economy to protect freedom and promote economic prosperity. Neoliberals are broadly democratic, but stress the limitations of democracy as much as its necessity. And while neoliberals typically think government should provide social insurance and public goods, they are skeptical of the regulatory state, extensive government spending, and government-led countercyclical policy. Thus, neoliberalism is no mere economic doctrine. According to Biebricher, neoliberalism

explicitly addresses the noneconomic preconditions of functioning markets and the interactive effects between markets and their surroundings. (2018: 27)

And neoliberals share

the problem of how to identify the factors indispensable to the maintenance of functioning markets. (2018: 26)

Slobodian argues that all neoliberals

saw the intellectual project as finding the right state and the right law to serve the market order. (2018: 87)

Neoliberals thereby offer unique institutional prescriptions on distinctive grounds. Importantly, then, neoliberalism as a philosophical doctrine is not an attempt to suffuse institutions with the idea of human agents as homo economicus, (Brown 2019). Instead, following Jessica Whyte (2019: 8), neoliberalism has a normative dimension that goes beyond the economic, since neoliberals believed

that a functioning competitive market required an adequate moral and legal foundation,

such that the arguments for neoliberal institutions involved an appeal to normative principles (2019: 14, 233).

We can helpfully explicate neoliberalism by examining the political concepts, principles, and policies shared by three twentieth century political economists: F. A. Hayek, Milton Friedman, and James Buchanan. While they were trained as economists, all three wrote in political theory, and Hayek and Buchanan did so extensively. Identifying the common themes in their work provides an accurate and illuminating picture of neoliberalism as a philosophical doctrine.

These figures were selected in response to the aforementioned historical research on neoliberalism. Biebricher (2018: 2) identifies all three figures as neoliberals, though he also counts Europe-focused “ordoliberals”, specifically Walter Eucken, Wilhelm Röpke, and Alexander Rustow, as neoliberals. Slobodian (2018: 268) identifies Friedman, Hayek, and Buchanan as neoliberals, though he also includes the arguably libertarian Ludwig von Mises,[1] and a long litany of ordoliberals; he also focuses his analysis on what he calls “Geneva school neoliberalism”, where a great deal of neoliberal thought about global institutions was focused.[2] Whyte (2019: 31) focuses more on Hayek and Friedman than Buchanan, but she includes them in a larger cast of characters. So, while Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan are not the only neoliberals, they are central to the new historical analysis. And by focusing on their thought, we not only ease the burden of analysis, but provide space to focus on neoliberal ideas as crafted by their most reflective and insightful proponents. Further, other neoliberals said much less about their philosophical commitments, so we have less material to work with. Perhaps the relative silence of other neoliberals makes it harder to justify using Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan to represent them, but their shared political alliances and policies demonstrate substantial overlap.[3]

This entry’s approach to defining neoliberalism differs from that of Biebricher, Slobodian, Whyte, and Brown (Brown 2019) in much the same way as political theorists and philosophers differ from historians, and indeed how philosophers differ from political theorists. Neoliberalism can be understood as a somewhat static doctrine to provide a basis for evaluation, and that can later serve to explicate variations on the view. It is perhaps more natural to treat neoliberalism as a dynamic system of ideas, as historians do, and even some political theorists. Nonetheless, a review of Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan reveals a sufficiently static doctrine to count as a kind of political philosophy.

The use of the term “neoliberalism” in this entry does not fit all uses of the term. Thus, the goal is less to explain what “neoliberalism” really means in all its uses, but rather to proffer a meaning based on three criteria. First, the term “neoliberalism” should be used to denote a fairly coherent set of positions. Second, it should be used to capture the views of those figures most often associated with the position. Finally, we should focus on capturing the most serious and even-handed uses of the term, such as by academic historians, rather than more popular and pejorative uses of “neoliberalism”. This essay’s account of the meaning of the term satisfies all three criteria. It identifies a coherent doctrine understood in light of the views of its proponents, and its use of the term overlaps with the more careful uses of the term by recent academic historians. We pursue all three aims by locating common commitments in the thought of Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan.

2. Inadequate Descriptions

If we want to understand neoliberalism in terms of the ideas of those commonly associated with it, and usages proposed by historians, we should understand neoliberalism as a doctrine about how politics and the economy should be organized. It is not a theory of justice or legitimacy. Rather, neoliberals appeal to a plurality of moral considerations to justify their preferred institutions. We should also avoid defining neoliberalism as fitting within any of the following four categories. Neoliberalism should therefore not be identified as (§2.1) an ethos or conception of the good life, (§2.2) a school of thought within utilitarianism, (§2.3) a version of libertarianism, or (§2.4) an ideal theory.

2.1 Neoliberalism as Ethos

Many think that neoliberal societies put profit ahead of other central values. David Harvey, for instance, argues that

neoliberalism values market exchange as “an ethic in itself, capable of acting as a guide to all human action, and substituting for all previously held ethical beliefs”. (2005: 3)

George Monbiot insists that neoliberalism

sees competition as the defining characteristic of human relations. It redefines citizens as consumers. (2016)

Brown (2019) agrees. Some say that neoliberalism is an ideology where everyone is supposed to focus on economic prosperity or economic growth. Others say that neoliberalism is an ethos of the firm that rejects corporate social responsibility, instead recommending that firms focus solely on their bottom lines (Steger & Roy 2010: 13).

But neoliberals instead advance a view about the design of social institutions, and not a particular ethos of social life. In fact, they have rather little to say about how to live the good life. Instead, neoliberals argue that their defense of capitalism does not necessitate profit seeking as a way of life and that markets do not produce people with such an ethos. It is true that they think certain attitudes and values, such as an excessive focus on social justice, equality of outcomes, hostility to all pursuit of profit, can undermine the foundations of a free society. But that does not imply that they embrace a consumerist ethos.

To illustrate, consider Friedman. Friedman holds that part of the case for freedom is that we don’t know what persons ought to value because no one really knows what the good life consists in; a free society is good because it allows people to experiment with different forms of life to answer those questions for themselves (Friedman 1987 [2017: 185]). And while Friedman (1962a [2002: 133]) proclaimed that corporations’ first duty is to maximize profits for their shareholders and that public policy should ensure that the maximization of profit works to the benefit of all, even he does not advocate a particular account of what persons ought to value.

Hayek and Buchanan are even clearer in denying that the good life consists in economic ends like wealth maximization. Buchanan (1991: 343) emphasizes personal ethical responsibility, adhering to social norms forbidding debt (1987: 456, 461), and following “moral-ethical rules or norms for behavior” (1999: 451). Hayek thinks social life in a free society requires that people follow an array of rules and norms that have nothing to do with profit seeking, since many of these rules are below our conscious thought (Hayek 1973). Surprisingly, both Hayek (1988: 135–142) and G. Brennan and Buchanan (1985: 150) even think that free societies needed people prepared to act based on fundamentally religious impulses.

Admittedly, Friedman and Buchanan use homo economicus to understand much of human behavior. But Buchanan (Brennan and Buchanan 1981: 81) understands homo economicus broadly; it could be “seen to maximize almost anything at all”, and so has no inherent commitment to, say, wealth maximization.

2.2 Neoliberalism as a School of Thought within Utilitarianism

Some theorists claim that “classical liberalism”, a term often used to refer to our three neoliberals, is fundamentally utilitarian in its understanding of the basis for social order (Freeman 2011: 25).[4] However, Buchanan (1975) is an avowed contractarian and rejects utilitarianism because it requires aggregating personal values in ways Buchanan thinks impossible or inappropriate. While many characterize Friedman (1974a [2017: 72]) as a utilitarian, he says that “I myself have never accepted utilitarianism”. Friedman’s defense of the free market as maximizing utility was never meant to imply that people lacked basic rights that might forbid utility maximization in some cases. Friedman focuses on utility-based considerations because he thinks they have universal appeal. Hayek (1988: 69) not only rejects utilitarianism, he rejects the broader class of consequentialist theories of social order: he rejects any demand for justification where morality is grounded in its production of some particular goal, like happiness. Hayek (1978: 132) is better described as a contractarian.

2.3 Neoliberalism as Libertarianism

Neoliberals are much friendlier to the nation-state than libertarians. Second, libertarians often argue for institutional structures directly from a moral theory and a theory of justice, an approach taken by Robert Nozick (1974). In contrast, neoliberals seldom appeal to fleshed out theories of justice, such as a theory of natural rights, even if they appeal to the language of justice at various point. To focus on the case of natural rights theories of justice, Buchanan does not believe in them. He begins his treatise on political philosophy, The Limits of Liberty, with the insistence that there is no morality beyond what we agree to (Buchanan 1975: 1). Hayek barely comments on natural rights, and Friedman discusses them primarily rhetorically. This is not to say that neoliberals reject deontic constraints on the use of state power. Hayek and Buchanan’s contractarianisms forbid pursuing liberty and prosperity in ways that all cannot agree to. Neoliberals instead focus on the consequence-based arguments for liberalism without adopting consequentialism. They simply rationalize liberalism in part based on the claim that liberalism has good consequences.

One is on better ground arguing that neoliberalism is a twentieth century revival of classical liberal ideas in response to certain unique twentieth century challenges. Neoliberalism arose in the late 1940s as a response to three twentieth century ideologies that advocated large states: communism (as the most prominent form of socialism), fascism, and social democracy. Neoliberals sought to confine state power to a range of functions much more limited than that undertaken by extensive states of these three varieties. Hayek’s work on informational systems was a response to communist central planning. Friedman’s monetarism was a response to Keynesian macroeconomic policy. And Buchanan’s public-choice research program was a response to the economics of general equilibrium and market failure economics.

2.4 Neoliberalism as Ideal Theory

Philosophers have come to understand ideal theory in a number of ways, but we can follow John Rawls’s (1971 [1999: 7–8, 215–6, 308–9]) understanding of ideal theory as describing the best social and political order in light of certain high-minded accounts of human capacities, behavior, and natural circumstances, in particular a preparedness to comply with institutions that embody the correct conception of justice. Ideal theories of justice provide accounts of the “realistic utopia” that citizens should strive for, a society where everyone acts as justice demands by fully complying with just institutional rules (Rawls 2001: 4, 13).

Neoliberals reject both elements of political theorizing. First, they tend to reject theorizing about an ideal. This is because neoliberals are often skeptical about our ability acquire moral knowledge; there is an epistemic barrier to knowing what is truly right and good. Again, Friedman repeatedly says that the case for a free society is that we don’t know “what sin is” and Hayek argues that, given the limitations of our knowledge,

It is at least doubtful whether at this stage a detailed blueprint of a desirable internal order of society would be of much use—or whether anyone is competent to furnish it. (1944 [2007: 237])

Hayek does not think that political philosophers invent societies; rather, neoliberals do not think they’re in a position to describe how an ideal society would function.

Now, importantly, Buchanan (1975: 91–106) is a philosophical anarchist: “The ideal society is anarchy, in which no one man or group of men coerces another”. And Friedman (1974a [2017: 87]) thinks that it is “desirable to have a vision of the ideal” and seems to embrace libertarianism as that ideal. Further, he may think that many of his favored welfare-state policies would not be part of an ideal social order. Yet both Friedman and Buchanan think attempts to reach the ideal could backfire and so political economy should focus making marginal improvements to institutions. In this way, neoliberals sometimes have political ideals, but it is not central to their politico-economic doctrine, that is, to what they actually advocate.

Second, Hayek (1944 [2007: 157–170]), Friedman (1962b [2017: 23]), and Buchanan (Buchanan and Tullock 1962) all deny that we should assume that people will tend to comply with what justice and the law requires. People go wrong, especially when they have too much power. As Friedman (1962b [2017: 23]) says, “the liberal conceives of men as imperfect beings” and assumes that organizing society is as much about “preventing ‘bad’ people from doing harm” as it is about helping others do good. Buchanan’s project is to theorize politics “without romance” and deny the feasibility of a contractarian agreement on principles of justice. If anything, compliance is an endogenous variable in their models of social order, where different sets of social rules will produce different levels of compliance and are to be chosen in part on that basis. In brief, compliance is never taken for granted. Their non-ideal theory is also associated with their opposition to socialisms of all kinds: socialism is irresponsible ideal theory whose purported feasibility rests entirely on the illicit assumption that human nature can be modified to make persons more rational and altruistic. Society will not work as socialists predict.

3. Liberalism

Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan see themselves first and foremost as defenders of individual freedom and the freedom of small groups such as the family. Liberty is usually construed negatively, as when Hayek says that liberty is when “coercion of some by others is reduced as much as possible in society” (1960 [2011: 11]). Coercion occurs

when one man’s actions are made to serve another man’s will, not for his own but for the other’s purpose. (1960 [2011: 133])

We keep coercive power in check by defining a private sphere of individual activity and limiting state power (Caldwell 2004: 289). Friedman thinks similarly. His liberalism is understood as the embrace of

a government that is limited primarily to preserving a legal structure that allows people to cooperate voluntarily in the marketplace, and whose power is dispersed. (Butler 1985: 22)

For Friedman, Liberals

take the freedom of the individual, or perhaps the family, as our ultimate goal in judging social arrangements. (Friedman 1962b [2017: 22])

And more directly: “I define freedom as the absence of coercion of one person by another” (1987 [2017: 185]).

Neoliberals do not always embrace negative conceptions of liberty alone. Hayek’s (1960 [2011: 11]) conception of freedom can be interpreted as republican, as the view that one is free when she is free from arbitrary interference, since Hayek repeatedly worries about government engaging in arbitrary controls that prevent people from developing long-term plans. This partly explains his insistence that a society can be free only when it is governed by the rule of law, since while law typically coercively interferes, it interferes in a non-arbitrary, predictable fashion (1960 [2011: 21, 153]). While Buchanan does not share Hayek’s republican sympathies, he too agrees that general rules make liberty possible. Critically, none of these three thinkers embrace a moralized conception of freedom where freedom is the condition of a person whose rights are respected, in contrast to libertarians like Nozick (1974).

One remarkably strong emphasis among neoliberals, especially Hayek, is the importance of the rule of law. All persons have a right to be treated as equals by the legal, administrative, and political institutions in their society. No one is to be favored according to their degree of social influence or social power or inherited status. When people are not protected by the rule of law, their freedoms are intolerably restricted because they can be arbitrarily interfered with and cannot predict how they will fare in the future. This means they cannot make unimpeded use of the liberties that they currently possess. Neoliberals wield the rule of law against those who favor more extensive states, including both social-democratic liberals and socialists, on the grounds that extensive administrative states must violate the rule of law to engage in their characteristic activities. Hayek argues that absolutism arises from “powerful, centralized administrative machinery” whose professional administrative class becomes “the main rulers of the people” (1960 [2011: 193]). Large bureaucracies invariably interfere, and in an arbitrary fashion. This dangerous logic of bureaucracy was a fundamental feature of Buchanan’s research program, and the rule of law is his solution, too. For these reasons, neoliberals believe equal treatment before the law is a central procedural liberty that persons possess not only in court but whenever they are subject to state coercion. Neoliberals embrace limited government in part because they believe that equal treatment before the law can be achieved only by limiting government and embracing capitalist economic liberties like freedom of contract, since both institutional practices allow others to follow general rules and avoid seeking approval from an arbitrary authority (1960 [2011: 205, 230]).

The most common rationale for freedom in Hayek and Friedman is “ignorance—we cannot be sure we are right” (Friedman 1987 [2017: 185]). As we have seen, while Friedman says he favors “a free society because my basic value is freedom itself”, he nonetheless asks, “How do I justify that preference? … If I really knew what sin is, I could not justify it” (1987 [2017: 185]). Similarly, Hayek says that the case for individual freedom

rests chiefly on the recognition of the inevitable ignorance of all of us concerning a great many of the factors on which the achievement of our ends and welfare depends. (1960 [2011: 29]; Caldwell 2004: 347)

And even: “If we knew how freedom would be used the case for it would disappear” (Hayek 1960 [2011: 31]). The purpose of individual freedom is to enable each person to

make the fullest use of his knowledge, especially of his concrete and often unique knowledge of the particular circumstances of time and place. (1960 [2011: 156–7])

Friedman focuses on ignorance of moral facts, while Hayek focuses on moral ignorance, as well as ignorance about how to organize people’s lives, but either way, ignorance is the chief justification for freedom.

A certain kind of epistemic humility, particularly humility about how to organize society and what the consequences of our preferred policies will be, is essential to neoliberal thought. However, as we have seen, sometimes neoliberals adopt a broader skepticism that casts our grasp of moral facts into doubt. We ought to see epistemic humility about a wide range of non-normative social facts as an essential feature of neoliberal doctrine, whereas humility about moral facts is less central to understanding what neoliberalism is. Thus, neoliberalism can be formulated apart from this broader form of moral skepticism.

Neoliberals also stress that freedom allows people with different ends to cooperate and create peace (Hayek 1978: 111–136). This is an important theme for Buchanan (1975). As a contractarian, he thinks that the goal of agreement on constitutional rules is to end the Hobbesian state of war and secure enough peace to establish mutual gains from exchange. Thus, a second rationale for extensive negative liberties is that they are instrumental for cooperation and peace.

Neoliberals obviously embrace strong rights to private property, rights that apply not only to goods and services for one’s own consumption but to capital as well (Hayek 1988: 35; 1973: 107). The rationale for private property rights is similar to the general case for liberal liberties that we have already discussed. Hayek (1988: 35; 1973: 107; 1960 [2011: 35]) and Friedman (1962a [2002: 8–9]) in particular argue that we can’t fully distinguish economic from other liberties even conceptually. They both famously argue that political and economic freedom cannot be separated in practice either. That is part of the point of Capitalism and Freedom and arguably the central point of The Road to Serfdom. Buchanan (1993: 230) and Hayek (1960 [2011: 141]) also stress that private property rights allow persons to make plans, in part because private property enables people to save money and thereby become less dependent on employers and bureaucrats. Private property is further thought to be “an essential condition for the prevention of coercion” and the wide dispersal of power (Hayek 1960 [2011: 140]). Freedom of contract is embraced for similar reasons. And to respect these rights, a society will have to embrace capitalism, since the exercise of these rights inexorably yield capitalist economic arrangements, where capital is held by both capital owners and workers.

4. Capitalism

We can understand capitalism as an economic system where the range of goods and services on offer is governed in accord with a strong right to private property and a system in which prices are set by private organizations. People are free to exchange goods and services under whatever terms they contract for, with few restrictions. Neoliberals share this understanding, even if they do not always defend capitalism by name.

In defending capitalism, neoliberals focus on defeating two foes: socialism and Keynesianism, which they typically consider as offering the most influential alternatives to their preferred institutions. Socialism, at least the form of socialism targeted by neoliberals, is an economic system where capital is socially owned, typically by government, and the capital stock is produced, organized, and its outputs distributed by the central government that is, where the economy is centrally planned. Neoliberals attack Marxist socialism in the strongest terms, but Marxists are not their sole targets. Hayek is keen to refute the twentieth century socialist Oskar Lange (1936), who adopted some aspects of neoclassical economics. Neoliberals also targeted democratic socialism; for example, Hayek (1944 [2007: 163–4]) targeted Fabian socialists in The Road to Serfdom.

The neoliberal case against socialism is based on three concerns: inefficiency, conflict, and power. Socialism is inefficient, generates social conflict, and concentrates power in dangerous ways. Let’s begin with inefficiency, the familiar argument that socialist economies impoverish society vis-à-vis capitalism.[5] Hayek’s early claim to fame was his role in what is called the socialist calculation debate, which concerned how socialist planners can plan the production and distribution of capital goods without the use of a price system. Socialists argued that planners should be able to plan by collecting preference and production information from citizens. Ludwig von Mises (1922 [1936/1951]) began the debate by arguing that, without a price system, the information required to plan the economy did not exist. Without a price system, there is no information for planners to collect and compute. Oskar Lange (1936) replied that socialist managers of firms could mimic market prices. Hayek (1945) disagreed with Lange; even if the information required to plan the economy existed, it would be too hard to collect and impossible to compute before the relevant information changed. The problem is that the information required to plan the economy is not given to anyone. For Hayek, we can plan the economy

if we possess all the relevant information, if we can start out from a given system of preferences, and if we command complete knowledge of available means.

But that is “emphatically not the economic problem which society faces” (1945: 519). Instead,

the “data” from which the economic calculus starts are never for the whole society “given” to a single mind which could work out the implications and can never be so given.

In contrast, the market economy can make use of this information through the price system. The price system can draw on each person’s local and often tacit knowledge to effectively produce goods and services without collecting that information in one place. The “marvel” of the market is that, when some raw material is scarce,

tens of thousands of people whose identity could not be ascertained by months of investigations, are made to use the material or its products more sparingly,

and this occurs

without an order being issued, without more than perhaps a handful of people knowing the cause. (1945: 527)

Hayek’s analysis of how minds process information (Caldwell 2004: 261–285) and how commercial society, and systems of cultural and moral rules, evolve is perhaps the principal focus of his work (2004: 286–321). Friedman (2000 [2012: 234]) and Buchanan (1969: 87–8) agree with Hayek’s analysis.[6]

Neoliberals appeal to a range of considerations to justify the market besides informational arguments, such as the creativity of the market mechanism and its capacity to raise living standards. Eamonn Butler (1985: 22) points out that Friedman’s case for capitalism, as developed in Capitalism and Freedom, is based on

the diversity, rapid adjustment, innovation and experimentation found in the market.

In Free to Choose, Friedman argues that, when the state attempts to centrally plan, ordinary citizens “have a low standard of living” (Friedman & Friedman: 54–5). The market, on the other hand, has “the remarkable power of raising material standards quicker than any other” system, while preserving freedom (Butler 1985: 197). Hayek (1978: 67) emphasizes that capitalism preserves competition, which he sees not as a means of reaching a market-clearing price but as a “discovery procedure” for generating new ideas and innovations. Buchanan tends to focus on the argument that markets provide people with better incentives than those faced by government officials. Because

politicians and bureaucrats are seen as ordinary persons much like the rest of us, (Buchanan 1979: B4 [1984: 20])

they lack the motivation to even try to implement a socialist plan. Instead, they will use their power over the economy at least partly for selfish ends, which would undermine the effectiveness of socialist government, even if all the informational problems could be solved.

The next set of arguments against socialism is that socialism creates needless conflict. Hayek writes that socialism

presupposes a much more complete agreement in the relative importance of different social ends than actually exists

and that, as a result,

the planning authority must impose upon the people the detailed code of values that is lacking. (1997: 193; also see 1944 [2007: 109, 166])

Friedman argues similarly in saying that

the wider the range of activities covered by the market, the fewer are the issues on which explicitly political decisions are required and hence on which it is necessary to achieve agreement. (1962a [2002: 24])

Markets allow people who disagree to benefit one another despite having different values. Socialism, in contrast, requires a central plan, and so must impose controversial and sectarian values and ends on everyone. To solve these conflicts and impose a central plan, socialist governments must concentrate political power.

Socialism excessively concentrates power in other ways, too. Socialists have often argued that capitalist economic power can be reined in by transferring the means of production to society, but Hayek (1944 [2007: 165]) replies that socialism does not “extinguish power”, it just concentrates power in one place. Friedman (1955 [2017: 4]) agrees, arguing that “political power by its nature tends to be concentrated” whereas economic power “can be highly deconcentrated if it is organized by means of an impersonal market”. The danger of concentrating power in political institutions is that “government is more subject to concentrated interest groups”, whereas markets are altered by the “diffuse pressure of millions of individual consumers”. Similarly, while governments promote monopolies, “the market breaks them down” (Butler 1985: 223). An advantage of markets is that people can refuse to engage in exchange, whereas under socialism everyone is caught up in a power struggle. Additionally, Hayek (1978: 99) argues that under socialism, political power determines the social position of individuals and groups, an ironic result of a doctrine whose aim is to diffuse power. Buchanan (1993: 246) agrees, though for somewhat different reasons.

Neoliberals do not defend capitalism on the ground that it gives people what they deserve. Friedman and Buchanan do not make such arguments, and Hayek argues against such claims. Hayek (1978: 70) repeatedly says that there’s no particular merit in market outcomes, and so one cannot say that market income is just or unjust. Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan understand that market outcomes are often arbitrary from a moral point of view. Markets make some undeserving persons rich and some deserving persons poor.

As noted, Keynesianism is neoliberalism’s other great foe. Let us understand Keynesianism as a series of policy proposals aimed at correcting purported market failures at the macroeconomic level, and especially as the use of deficit-financed spending to manage the business cycle and stimulate the economy. These policies were inspired by John Maynard Keynes (1935 [1965: 2011]), even if he did not always consistently adopt them.[7]

All three thinkers take great pains to answer Keynesian arguments for government intervention. Hayek’s (1941 [2007]) arguments concern how government spending and the monetary authority’s actions affect the structure of capital goods across the economy. Contra Keynes’s (1935 [1965: 37–45]) comfort with statistical aggregates in the General Theory, Hayek (1941 [2007]) contends that relying on simple economic aggregates obscures how capital and investment are structured across the economy. Hayek also thinks the premier cause of recessions is policy that makes bank credit too easy, which leads to malinvestment that has to be liquidated in a bust. Importantly Hayek’s critique of Keynes was not influential in the latter half of the twentieth century. Friedman’s and Buchanan’s ideas, especially Friedman’s, carried more weight.

Friedman and Buchanan are concerned about Keynesian claims that recessions are due to declines in aggregate demand and can only be addressed with heavy helpings of debt-financed fiscal stimulus (even though Keynes himself was not always a fan of debt-financed countercyclical policy). Friedman (1959) developed the doctrine of monetarism, which holds that inflation is always and everywhere a monetary phenomenon. Inflation and the business cycle can be controlled by monetary policy and so do not require a fiscal response. With his co-author, Anna Schwartz, Friedman (Friedman & Schwartz 1963) argues that the Great Depression was due not to a fall in aggregate demand but was instead caused by the Federal Reserve System, ironically created to manage recessions, because the Fed allowed the monetary base to collapse. Had the Fed ensured the growth of the monetary supply, the Great Depression could have been avoided. This is central to the case for the market because the Great Depression was widely blamed on capitalism. If the Depression was a government failure, the result of monetary mismanagement, then the Depression provides no basis for rejecting capitalism—and may even provide reason to embrace it.

The central policy response, for Friedman (1959), is to shift the management of the business cycle from Congress to the Federal Reserve and lock the Federal Reserve into a monetary expansion rule to prevent it from making major mistakes. Monetary-policy makers are simply not knowledgeable enough to use monetary policy to manage the business cycle. Instead, they should be bound to a rule that would lead to gentle inflation, which would both avoid hyperinflation and prevent cyclical unemployment by mitigating the dislocations caused by sticky nominal wages, contra Keynes (1935 [1965: 231–7]). Focusing exclusively on growing the monetary base would also prevent a collapse in the money supply and thereby avoid some kinds of recession.

Buchanan’s critique of Keynes differs from Friedman’s, though their critiques are mutually reinforcing. Buchanan (1987, 1999) thinks that even if Keynes’s diagnosis of recessions is correct, his cure cannot work well so long as governments are staffed with real-world people. Many politicians and government officials are more concerned about benefiting themselves and special interest groups than about promoting the common good. So, when a government engages in debt-financed economic stimulus, the money is more likely to be directed to politicians’ favored groups than to the places the stimulus money is most needed. A central difficulty for Keynesian fiscal policy is the pervasive risk of government failure caused by the actions of often self-interested economic actors, a consistent theme of The Calculus of Consent (Buchanan & Tullock 1962). Likewise, once people develop a taste for direct transfers, they will make it hard to shrink the deficit when the recession is over, leading to long-term debt and lower economic prosperity and growth.

5. Democracy

Neoliberals embrace democracy. More specifically, they endorse equal rights to vote and participate in elections, and they support parliamentary democracy as the means of enacting legislation. Hayek says,

I profoundly believe in the basic principles of democracy as the only effective method which we have yet discovered of making peaceful change possible, (1979: xiii)

and he claims to be concerned about disillusionment with democracy “as a desirable method of government”. For Hayek, the market system must be “embedded in a set of social institutions” if it is to work, and that includes a “democratic polity subject to the rule of law” (Caldwell 2004: 348). The point of The Road to Serfdom is to argue that liberal democratic socialism is unstable and that socialism must cease to be democratic or cease being socialism. So any attempt to plan the economy would not only destroy liberal rights; it would inevitably destroy democracy.

Hayek’s case for democracy tends to be instrumentalist, as he argues that

the true value of democracy is to serve as a sanitary precaution protecting us against an abuse of power. It enables us to get rid of a government and try to replace it by a better one. (1979: 137)

It is also “one of the most important safeguards of freedom” (1979: 5). And yet Hayek thinks recognizing that persons are equals requires not only equality before the law but “the demand that all men should also have the same share in making the law” even if democracy is a “means rather than an end” that needs limits (1960 [2011: 103, 107–8]).

This commitment was shared by members of the Mont Pelerin Society, which Hayek organized. Angus Burgin argues that

An assumed relationship between free markets and democratic politics pervaded the society’s discussions throughout its first decade of existence and provided a foundational premise for many of the members’ contributions to its debates. (2012: 117)

Friedman routinely defends free markets on the ground that they contribute to political freedom and democracy; both freedoms are “inseparable” (Butler 1985: 207). Friedman (1962a [2002: 9]) often says that he knows of

no example in time or place of a society that has been marked by a large measure of political freedom, and that has not also used something comparable to a free market to organize the bulk of economic activity.

So, he appears to think that democracy is a great good, but we are led to guess the reasons why. One could argue that Friedman’s case for democracy is largely that it protects liberty and allows a bad government to be peacefully replaced. But there is little in his corpus that speaks to this question one way or another.

Buchanan is the most democratic of the three. He agrees that democracy is essential for social peace and prosperity, but he emphasizes that political equality requires government to be based on the consent of the people. Democracy is an extension of his individualism:

The approach must be democratic, which in this sense is merely a variant of the definitional norm for individualism. Each man counts for one, and that is that. (Buchanan 1975: 2).

While Buchanan insists on unanimous consent for constitutional rules (strikingly, among non-ideal persons), he thinks that constitutions may allow for decision-making rules weaker than unanimity, such as majority rule. It is true that Buchanan (Buchanan and Tullock 1962: 85–96) argues that legislative rules should be supermajoritarian rather than majoritarian, but that is still an embrace of democracy, especially when undergirded by the consent of the people as a whole.

However, unlike many classical and contemporary democratic theorists, neoliberals do not see democracy as involving a social ethos or national culture, nor do they see democracy as an expression of freedom in itself. As Hayek (1979: 5) notes, “democracy itself is not freedom”. Friedman insists that freedom is to be understood negatively, such that the political process is understood as restricting freedom and perhaps protecting it, but not as embodying it. Buchanan also criticizes what he regarded as an essentially “romantic” view of democracy according to which the will of the people is expressed in the actions of a democratic government.

Notably, neoliberals spend far more time arguing for limits on democracy than arguing for democracy itself. This is partly because, since fascism was defeated, the goodness of democracy has been taken for granted by both neoliberals and their interlocutors. Hayek, Friedman, and Buchanan instead focus on criticizing “unlimited” democracy. Hayek (1944 [2007: 111–2]) is worried that an unlimited democracy could undermine the rule of law and create tyranny. The powers of any “temporary majority” have to be limited, he says (1960 [2011: 106]). Unlimited power is “the fatal defect of the prevailing form of democracy” and is based on the erroneous premise that all law “emanate[s] from legislatures” (1979: 3–4). Another problem for unlimited democracy is that democratic assemblies will take on more power that they can wield effectively and so will be forced to

hand [authority] over to the administrators charged with the achievement of particular goals. (1960 [2011: 116])

In an unlimited democracy

the holders of discretionary powers are forced to use them, whether they wish it or not, to favour particular groups on whose swing-vote their powers depend. (1979: 139)

The point of the third volume of Law, Legislation, and Liberty was arguably to restore faith in democracy by defending limitations upon it.

Friedman (1962b [2017: 26]) echoes many of these points, stressing that political freedom is just “the absence of coercion of a man by his fellow men” and that the fundamental threat to freedom “is the power to coerce” whether that power be in the hands of a dictator or of “a momentary majority”. Friedman also worries that democracy will tend to lead to regulation, inefficiency, and control if we have “bureaucratic democracy” rather than “participatory democracy”.[8]

Buchanan’s (1962: 131–146) rationale for constitutional constraints on democracy is richer and more perceptive than Hayek’s or Friedman’s. His contract theory is devoted to arguing that simple majority rule can lead to a variety of problems, most centrally the risks of shifting coalitions of voters or legislators redistributing wealth away from one another, leading to Pareto-inferior outcomes for all. Another problem with unlimited democracy is that

even under the most favorable conditions the operation of the democratic process may generate budgetary excesses. Democracy may become its own Leviathan unless constitutional limits are imposed and enforced. (Buchanan 1975: 204–5)

Limitations on democracy are also required by political equality itself, since the “tyranny of the majority” is a threat to the minority’s equal rights, and can be especially dangerous “because it feeds on the idealistic illusion that participation is all that matters (Buchanan 1993: 259). Consequently, Buchanan (1999: 75–88) advocates exit mechanisms, such as federalist arrangements, that allow people to escape excessive democracy.

Four caveats before the section ends: First, despite their concerns about unlimited democracy, neoliberals want to protect democratic rights. One problem they have with expansive states is that large states reduce the effectiveness of each person’s vote. This is because large governments cannot balance their many tasks and cannot secure agreement on top priorities. The result, Hayek argues, will be democratic instability, leading to dictatorship. In contrast to more egalitarian liberals, neoliberals do not attempt to engineer the democratic process through democratic deliberation. They instead hope to protect democratic rights by adopting constitutional constraints later in the democratic process, for example by restricting the power to legislate. Second, while neoliberals support restrictions on democracy, they strongly favor decentralizing of political power and ensuring that power is held by all and they are committed to protections from governmental and corporate predation and domination. As Friedman notes,

Business corporations are not a defense of free enterprise. On the contrary, they are one of the chief sources of danger. (Burgin 2012: 202)

They simply disagree with egalitarian liberals about how to ensure this institutionally. As noted above, neoliberals stress designing institutions so that corrupt and domineering institutions cannot form, within or outside government, such as using markets. But they also appeal to constitutional mechanisms like supermajority rules (Buchanan & Tullock 1962) and federalism (Feld 2014) to limit oppression and corruption. Thus, neoliberals are deeply concerned that people be protected from excessive political control, but they do not emphasize public deliberation is central to securing those ends. We might say they prefer “exit” mechanisms over “voice” mechanisms for restraining the use of political power (Hirschman 1970). Third, neoliberals are not alone in advocating constitutional limits on democracy, even though most democratic theorists on the left place fewer limitations on democracy than neoliberals do.

Finally, historians of political thought have drawn attention to the fact that the neoliberals discussed here were sometimes associated with the dictatorship of Augusto Pinochet in Chile. But Buchanan (Farrant & Tarko 2018) and Friedman (Burgin 2012: 205) have at best a scant connection with that regime and were critical of it. Unfortunately, Hayek is another story. Hayek had a partial theory of “transitional dictatorship” that allowed a liberal dictator to avoid socialist outcomes and transition a society into a liberal democracy, and this helps explain some favorable remarks he made on behalf of the Pinochet regime (Farrant, McPhail, & Berger 2012; Biebricher 2018: 142–7; Slobodian 2018: 277). Hayek’s support for the regime does not undermine the democratic commitments of neoliberals, but Hayek was arguably too suspicious of democracy. We can see the dangers in sharply separating liberalism from democracy, which tempts one to choose liberal dictatorship over democratic socialism.

6. The Welfare State

Neoliberals support modest taxation, the redistribution of wealth, the provision of public goods, and the implementation of social insurance, embracing a state somewhat more expansive than one where government protects people from foreign powers and domestic criminals, produces public goods, and provides limited services for the poor. For instance, Hayek (Caldwell 2004: 291), Friedman (Butler 1985: 206), and Buchanan (1975: 35–52) favor government provision of public goods because markets will under-produce public goods, and so government should act even if it will sometimes fail (Butler 1985: 206).

Of course, neoliberals are skeptical of government regulation, largely because they think regulatory bodies tend to be turned from good purposes to bad ones (2007: 93). This is a consistent theme of Friedman’s (1962a [2002: 137–160]) work, especially in his criticisms of occupational licensure. And the analysis of rent-seeking is one of Buchanan’s main ideas, shared by his long-time co-author Gordon Tullock. Large bureaucracies turn too much power over to administrators, power that practically begs to be misused by special interests (Butler 1983: 209). And, of course, neoliberals all oppose Keynesian fiscal policy, especially debt-financed stimulus (Buchanan 1987: 456; Butler 1985: 186). But these concerns are consistent with embracing the welfare state.

Hayek is quite friendly to various government interventions. In The Road to Serfdom, Hayek (1944 [2007]) defends countercyclical monetary policy, government construction of transportation infrastructure, social insurance for natural disasters, government health insurance, a basic minimum income, and strict regulations with respect to working hours, health and safety on the job, poisons, deforestation, harmful agricultural methods, noise, smoke, and the prices of goods and services that are natural monopolies (1944 [2007: 22, 43–4, 133–5, 217]; Burgin 2012: 90–1). Similarly, The Constitution of Liberty says government should prevent of depressions and provide pensions, medical care, and money for education in the form of vouchers (1960 [2011: 264, 276, 286, 294, 379]). Hayek repeatedly stresses that the

old formulae of laissez faire or non-intervention do not provide us with an adequate criterion for distinguishing between what is and what is not admissible in a free system. (1960 [2011: 231]; also see Hayek 1944 [2007: 71]; 1973: 62; 1979: 41)

Hayek even supports a basic income:

… the assurance of a certain minimum income for everyone … appears not only to be a wholly legitimate protection against a risk common to all, but a necessary part of the Great Society in which the individual no longer has specific claims on the members of the particular small groups into which he was born. (1979: 55)

While Hayek’s use of the term “legitimate” is imprecise and may only somewhat overlap with the use of the term in contemporary political philosophy, he apparently thinks that governments are morally required to engage in welfare-state measures. Governments should pursue poverty relief not only because it is beneficial but because it is the right thing to do. Hayek worries that social safety nets can get out of control, but he supports them anyway (Caldwell 2004: 291).

While Friedman is the most libertarian of the three (Burgin 2012: 213), he never advocates abolishing the redistribution of wealth for some purposes, claiming that government ought to “relieve acute misery and distress” (Friedman 1951 [2012: 7]). Government should

protect members of the community who cannot be regarded as “responsible” individuals, principally children and the insane. (Butler 1985: 206)

And again,

Government relief of poverty, the liberal will support and welcome, primarily on the explicitly paternalistic ground of taking care of the irresponsible. (Friedman 1974b [2012: 23])

One of his most famous policy proposals is a negative income tax, where the poor would receive cash transfers if their incomes were low enough, financed by positive income taxes on the rich and middle class (Friedman 1962a [2002: 191–4]). Friedman (1960 [2002: 191–2]) thought this policy was legitimate to reduce poverty because pure private charity may invite free-riding. He (1962a [2002: 85–107]) is also the inventor of the school-voucher policy, and he (1974b [2012: 20]) supported compulsory education so long as government does not control the schools.[9] Friedman worried that the welfare state would be too bureaucratic and authoritarian, however, which is why he favored replacing most welfare-state programs with cash transfers.

Two more points about Friedman on poverty relief. First, Friedman thinks that

[t]here are no natural rules and definitions of property. There is ultimately an essentially arbitrary element to where we draw the line. (1974a [2017: 86])

This is a point usually stressed by critics of libertarianism on the ground that property rights are conventional, not natural, and so cannot morally prohibit redistribution (Murphy & Nagel 2002). This passage suggests that Friedman’s political philosophy does not include a natural right of private property as an impediment to redistribution. Second, Friedman sees his defense of the welfare state as a part of his non-ideal theory, not his ideal. He supports vouchers and the negative income tax

not because these are necessarily part of my ideal utopia[n] society but because they seem to me the most effective steps, given where we are, in moving toward where we want to go. (Burgin 2012: 175)

In fact, Friedman (1974a [2017: 79]) has sympathies with anarchism, though he thinks it is not “a feasible social structure”. This is consistent describing neoliberalism as a non-ideal theory. While in ideal theory, Friedman is a libertarian, or at least more libertarian than most other neoliberals, his non-ideal theory is neoliberalism.

Buchanan is both the hardest to pin down on the welfare state and the most egalitarian. He has virtually nothing to say about government poverty relief. Buchanan’s contractarianism nonetheless embraces some redistribution, as he thinks his social contract would yield unanimous agreement on having a “productive” state, which provides many tax-financed goods, and could also provide social insurance (Buchanan 1975: 124). Buchanan also defends a principle of equal opportunity, which he thinks requires a 100 percent inheritance tax that would prevent the formation of an aristocracy. Presumably this principle could justify other forms of redistribution.

Neoliberals stridently reject one of the most common rationales for the welfare state, namely pursuing an egalitarian conception of social justice. Hayek is clearest on this point, given his total rejection of the very idea of social justice, which he understands, somewhat peculiarly, as a set of moral principles that govern the justifiability of specific distributions of economic resources, though not moral principles that govern the functioning of an economic system as a whole. Hayek (1978: 78) thinks that the idea of social justice is confused in that justice cannot be applied to specific market outcomes because they are not the result of direct, conscious choices. Social justice is an incoherent idea, much like the idea of a “moral stone”. Hayek thinks it imperative that the state not be used to achieve a precise income distribution (Caldwell 2004: 350):

any policy aiming directly at a substantive ideal of distributive justice must lead to the destruction of the Rule of Law. (1944 [2007: 79])

Yet Hayek has an idiosyncratic understanding of social justice. He thinks it requires the that certain specific economic outcomes be imposed, rather than that a society’s moral, legal, and political rules work to the advantage of all. Hayek supports the latter requirement. Hayek says that the “most desirable order of society” is

one which we would choose if we knew that our initial position in it would be decided purely by chance (such as the fact of our being born into a particular family). (1978: 132)

If Hayek sounds like Rawls, it is no coincidence. Hayek’s reading of Rawls’s earlier papers (not A Theory of Justice) led him to believe he had no quarrel with Rawls, for Rawls

acknowledges that the task of selecting specific systems of distributions of desired things as just must be abandoned. (1978: 100)[10]

Thus, Hayek seems to share Rawls’s concept of social justice, though not his conception of it. And this concept of social justice is compatible with liberty. The pursuit of social justice only implies the destruction of the rule of law if our conception of social justice requires us to tinker with particular economic outcomes (Hayek 1960 [2011: 85]). These points are by now well-understood by Hayek’s defenders (Tomasi 2012: 142–150).

Buchanan and Friedman are less focused on rejecting social justice, but their positions resemble Hayek’s. Buchanan’s contractarianism leads him to hold that a society’s distributions are fair if they are the product of rules that all agree to, and otherwise not, so if pursuing distributive justice means breaking the constitutional rules that we have agreed to, it is problematic. But social contracts may have redistributive rules. If people agree to redistributive rules, then redistribution is justified. In this way, Buchanan is closer to Rawls than Hayek is.

Friedman has much less to say about social justice. He mostly stresses that only some kinds of equality are desirable. Friedman (1980 [2017: 144]) often says, for instance, that we should only seek equality of opportunity, not equality of outcome (Butler 1985: 218). But he also feels the need to argue that markets do not have an inherent tendency to produce very unequal outcomes. Friedman (1955 [2017: 14]) says that

the way to reduce inequality … is not by the misleading palliative of sharing the wealth but by improving the workings of the market, strengthening competition, and widening opportunities for individuals to make the most of their own qualities.

Differences in economic power do not argue for a redistributive state but for more capitalism:

The virtue of free enterprise capitalism is that it sets one businessman against another and is thus the most effective device for control. (1974a [2017: 84])

Free markets undermine monopoly economic power, whereas government generates it (Butler 1985: 210).

7. Criticisms of Neoliberalism

This section covers criticisms of neoliberalism, but it leaves out a great many of them. The reason for this is that many of the most well-known criticisms of neoliberalism are simply criticisms of capitalism as such. Accordingly, this section focuses on criticisms aimed directly at neoliberalism.

7.1 Ethos Criticisms

Many criticize neoliberalism for structuring society around the market, commodifying market relations, and in general manipulating people into serving the ends of what is best for commerce or economic production. In this way, neoliberalism builds society around a cash nexus. But unlike full capitalism, neoliberalism does so in a covert way that takes serious scholarly work to demonstrate. Neoliberalism itself is not an ethos, as noted above, but neoliberalism might be seen to give rise to an excessively capitalist/transactional relationship between persons. While she rejects this characterization of neoliberalism, Jessica Whyte argues that it is often characterized as

an amoral economic ideology that subordinates all values to an economic rationality, (2019: 19)

following a number of others, like Wendy Brown (2015). Here the analysis draws heavily on Foucault (2010) where neoliberalism is said to reduce practical rationality to economic considerations, where

there is no difference between the infraction of the highway code and a premeditated murder. (2015: 253–4)

Indeed, one might make the more worrisome argument that neoliberalism leads not so much to selfish attitudes but towards bigoted, hierarchical, and traditional ones (Brown 2019: 7, 37).

7.2 Inequality

One central concern about neoliberalism is that, even if it boosts economic growth, it also increases economic inequality, which is problematic in several ways. Two kinds of inequality criticisms are generally offered. The more well-known are the empirical criticisms that neoliberal regimes lead to dangerous inequalities just from the data, such as Thomas Piketty’s book, Capital (2014), which holds that economic inequality is growing and is a threat to democracy, much as Martin Gilens’s (2014) work on inequality and the responsiveness of democratic policy-making to the richest 10%.

The other kind of critique of inequality under neoliberalism is derived from Rawls’s work. As is well-known, Rawls rejected welfare-state capitalism and a more robust form of capitalism which he called the system of natural liberty on the grounds that they do not satisfy Rawls’s two principles of justice (Rawls 2001; O’Neill and Williamson 2014). Rawls argued that even welfare-state capitalism cannot protect the value of political liberty or realize its priority (Rawls 1993 [2005]) because it allows for the accumulation of capital in too few hands, which leads to economic domination of politics, and shuts many people out of the goods of owning and operating at least some of the capital they need to enjoy the worth of their constitutional liberties.

Another kind of inequality that has been raised as a concern for neoliberal societies is the imbalance of political power within the firm between bosses and workers. Elizabeth Anderson (2019) has argued, for instance, that this is a form of tyrannical “private government” and that the institutions defended by neoliberals (though she does not use this term) are insufficient to equalize the freedoms of capitalists and workers.

7.3 Undermining Democracy

A very common criticism of neoliberalism is that it undermines democracy. This might be because high economic inequality undermines democracy, as Martin Gilens (2014) argues in Affluence and Influence and defended by Larry Bartels (2008 [2016]). Another way in which neoliberalism could undermine democracy is by prioritizing the protection of classical liberal economic liberties, like the right to private property. These can lead to restrictions on the ability of democratic citizens to choose to redistribute wealth. This problem is especially acute given Hayek’s favorable view of the Pinochet regime in Chile. Hayek hoped that Chile would become a democracy, but he believed that the Pinochet coup had allowed Chile to dodge the bullet of democratic socialism as advocated by Salvador Allende, Pinochet’s predecessor. There is a tension between the liberalism and the democratic commitments within neoliberalism that in practice tends to mean that democracy suffers.

7.4. Economic Irrationality

Neoliberal regimes rely heavily on market mechanisms, and neoliberals claim that markets are efficient or at least highly economically productive (neoliberals disagree about how to characterize and explain market productivity and efficiency). But behavioral economists (Kahneman 2013; Ariely 2010) have identified various biases in human reasoning that undermine the homo economicus model that neoliberals are said to use to model and predict economic development (though as shown above, neoliberals have a subtler relationship with homo economicus). See entry on bounded rationality.

7.5 Keynesian Rebuttals

Neoliberalism, as noted, arose in part in response to the dominance of Keynesian macro-economic policy. But Keynesians, most notably Paul Krugman (2012), have struck back by arguing that neoliberal criticisms of Keynesian policy fail. This is especially true because neoliberals often claimed that fiscal policy is ineffective stimulus vis-à-vis monetary stimulus. During the Great Recession, Krugman argued that the Federal Reserve had lowered interest rates so much that further monetary stimulus would fail, and so fiscal policy had to intervene.

Many of the criticisms of neoliberal regimes engaging in “austerity” during the Great Recession are based in an underlying Keynesian model, as the critics of government spending cuts during the Great Recession were often based on the idea that they hurt the economic prospects of the poor, whereas according to neoliberals, shrinking government spending during a recession is not harmful to the poor for a variety of reasons. See entry on philosophy of economics.

7.6 Trickle-Down Economics

One common charge against neoliberalism is its false promise of “trickle-down” benefits of economic growth to the poor from the rich (Quiggin 2012). Strictly speaking, trickle-down economics is not a genuine school of economic thought, nor would Hayek, Friedman, or Buchanan have accepted that description of their views. They did argue that all would benefit from the prosperity brought about through the free market, but this was not necessarily because the rich would benefit first. Hayek (1960 [2011]) argued that there is a kind of trickle-down effect for the prices of goods and services, where luxuries for the rich become commonalities for the poor because manufacturers figure out how to lower prices to broaden market penetration over time. And indeed, it is standard in mainstream economics to hold that as businesses accumulate capital, they can afford to pay their workers more and so can bid workers away from other companies. That process often involves increasing wages, so more capital in the hands of the rich can lead to higher wages for the poor through fairly ordinary causal channels. All the same, many neoliberal officials promised gains for the poor that did not often materialize.

7.7 Libertarian Criticisms

Neoliberalism and libertarianism are distinct, if related views. And in some respects, the neoliberals were libertarian under some conditions. Indeed, Buchanan thought anarchy was the morally best regime, even if it was infeasible in practice. But it is still common for libertarians to criticize more moderate libertarians for allowing any redistribution of wealth, such as Murray Rothbard (1973, 1982 [2002]), Robert Nozick (1974), or for prioritizing democracy over more epistocratic or elite-leaning forms of political decision-making, such as Jason Brennan (2016).

7.8 Colonialist Criticisms

It is common in some circles to argue that neoliberal regimes are colonialist in character, though in an unusually direct way. The thought is that neoliberalism was adopted by regimes in the Anglophone world and in much of Western Europe, and that this formed an international elite consensus about how economies around the world should be run. This led to a “Washington Consensus” that caused policy interventions that interfered with the democratic governance of developing nations, increased inequality, and made the poor worse off. For comprehensive discussion, see Whyte (2019: chapters 3–5).

7.9 Populist/Nationalist Criticisms

It is increasingly common for right-wing populists to criticize neoliberal policy on the grounds that it emphasizes free trade and free immigration lead to a range of deleterious consequences, from the shrinking of the industrial base of rich democratic countries like the United States, such as that advanced by Patrick Deneen (2019). A stronger form of this concern is that allowing immigrants from different cultures to acquire citizenship within a country will harm or degrade the culture and politics of that country.

7.10 Feminist Criticisms

Some, like Nancy Fraser (2017), worry that neoliberalism has co-opted feminism by making the feminist ideal into one that serves as a kind of false market-based meritocracy, where the aim of feminism is, for instance, that woman who has well-paying career, and at its highest ideal, female entrepreneurship and becoming CEOs of a company. This left feminism unable to attend to the needs and interests of women who neoliberalism has harmed. See entry on feminist perspectives on globalization.

7.11 Remaining Criticisms

Neoliberalism is subject to other objections, but many resemble problems for other liberal democratic theories, such as the conflict between liberal rights (however understood) and democracy—the “procedure-substance” dispute in the deliberative democracy literature, as well as how any sufficiently liberal approach to associational freedom takes the freedom of marginalized groups seriously given the prospect for local oppression. Neoliberals have diverse conceptions of freedom, though typically negative, with all the standard criticisms those views invite. And, then, to the extent that neoliberalism like Hayek and Buchanan adopt a contractarian framework for justifying institutions, their defenses will inherit all the difficulties with contractarianism.

8. Summary

This entry is not meant to determine the one true meaning of “neoliberalism”, but rather to illuminate neoliberalism as a coherent philosophical doctrine embraced by figures commonly called neoliberals. The entry also prioritizes more even-handed and less pejorative uses of the term in recent historical research. This is not to discount more historical and dynamic understandings of neoliberalism. They contain insight. But the goal of this entry has been to characterize neoliberalism as a philosophical position. If we do so, we can understand neoliberalism as a politico-economic doctrine that embraces robust liberal capitalism, constitutional democracy, and a modest welfare state.[11]


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