Intertheory Relations in Physics

First published Thu Jan 18, 2024

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Patricia Palacios replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

A physical theory may relate to another physical theory in many different ways. For instance, it may reduce to another, it may fail to reduce to the other, it may be theoretically equivalent to the other, or there may be a duality between them. Although theoretical equivalence (e.g., Glymour 1980; Barrett & Halvorson 2016; Weatherall 2019a, 2019b) and dualities (e.g., Matsubara 2013; Read 2016; Rickles 2011, 2017; De Haro et al. 2016) are important topics of research on their own, the focus of this entry will be on intertheory reduction.

Intertheoretic reductions, whereby a theory is said to reduce to another, play an important role in modern physics. But under what conditions can we say that a theory reduces to another, and what is achieved by reduction? This entry will describe different approaches one might take to these questions. I will also discuss the relationship between reduction and supervenience and between reduction and emergence. Finally, I will discuss the status of the reductionist program in light of contemporary debates in physics and the philosophy of physics.

1. The Aims of Intertheoretic Reduction

Intertheoretic reductions play an outstanding role in physics, but the aims of reduction are not always clear. Traditionally, perhaps due to the influence of Ernest Nagel (1949, 1961, 1970), the reduction of a theory \(T_2\) to another \(T_1\) was taken to amount to the explanation of the reduced theory \(T_2\) by the reducing theory \(T_1\). This idea is also present in some reductive programs in physics. For instance, Rudolf Clausius, one of the first physicists to formulate the Second Law of thermodynamics, believed that the atomic theory might be helpful in explaining why entropy never decreases for isolated systems (Klein 1973). Similarly, Ludwig Boltzmann justified his own attempts to connect the Second Law of Thermodynamics with the atomic theory as a way of giving a statistical mechanical explanation of the Second Law of Thermodynamics (Boltzmann 1885; Klein 1973).

However, it would be a mistake to take explanation to be the only epistemic function of intertheoretic reduction. Nickles (1973), for instance, pointed out that intertheoretic reductions can often serve to justify the success of the reduced theory. According to Fletcher (2019), this is particularly important in cases in which the reduction of a theory to another does not seek to eliminate the reduced theory, but rather to retain it as a useful device for making predictions. For instance, the reduction of Newtonian gravitation to general relativity may be understood as giving a justification for why Newtonian gravitation was so successful in the past; at the same time, this reductive relation may be used to justify the further use of Newtonian theory as a convenient tool for making predictions under certain conditions. Torretti (1990) points out that in order to legitimize the use of the reduced theory, there needs to be a structural relationship between the reduced and reducing theories, which assures that the reduced theory will be successful in all relevant cases. It will be seen below (Section 2.3) that this requirement imposes an important restriction upon the models of reduction that will be suitable to describe successful reductions in physics.

Nickles (1973) also stresses that the previous success of the reduced theory generally imposes constraints on the physical variables and their mathematical relations in potential successor or reducing theories. This means that the reduced theory can also work as a heuristic guide in the development of the reducing theory. Crowther (2018) has emphasized this epistemic role in the context of the reduction of general relativity and quantum field theory to quantum gravity. Feintzeig (2022) has also emphasized this role in the alleged reduction of classical mechanics to quantum mechanics.

Apart from helping in the construction of the reducing theory, the reduction of a theory to another is also said to play a role in the acceptance or consolidation of the new theory (Lakatos 1974 [1978]; Crowther 2018; Palacios 2022). Allegedly, the ability of the reducing theory to recover the successful predictions of the old (reduced) theory should be taken as an important argument for the consolidation of the new (reducing) theory. An example of this is the recovery of the predictions of optical theory by Maxwell’s electromagnetic theory of light, which contributed to the acceptance of Maxwell’s theory itself (see Worrall 1989 for details of this reduction). Dizadji-Bahmani, Frigg, and Hartmann (2011) develop a Bayesian analysis to show how reduction impacts not only on the consolidation, but also on the confirmation of the new theory.

The reduction of a theory to another can also contribute to unification in the traditional sense in philosophy of science, for when one reduces a theory to another, one also unifies the domains of the two theories (Fletcher 2019; van Riel 2011).

Apart from the epistemic roles mentioned above, reduction also aims to support the relative fundamentality of the reducing theory with respect to the reduced theory. Establishing fundamentality is a crucial function of reduction, since it can account for its asymmetric character. Loosely speaking, fundamentality can be understood in the sense that the reducing theory has some “advantage” over the reduced theory or it is in some sense “better” than the reduced theory. In the philosophical literature, one can distinguish at least three different ways in which a theory \(T_1\) is said to be more fundamental than the other \(T_2\).

  1. Empirical power: \(T_1\) accounts for every observation within the scope of \(T_2\), as well as for new observations outside \(T_2\)’s domain (Lakatos 1974 [1978]; Callender 1999; Nagel 1961),
  2. Aesthetic or epistemic virtues: \(T_1\) is “simpler”, “more elegant” or more “systematized” than \(T_2\) (Torretti 1990),
  3. Ontological supremacy: \(T_1\) has the right ontology or at least an ontology that is closer to the truth than the ontology of \(T_2\) (Butterfield 2011a).

There is a large discussion on fundamentality in the metaphysics of science: for a review of this literature, see McKenzie (2019) and Morganti (2020a, 2020b).

Although the above are very important roles of reduction, the list is not exhaustive. Crowther (2020), for instance, refers to other important roles that reduction may play in scientific theories.

2. Models of Intertheoretic Reduction

In the philosophy of science, different models have been suggested, which aim to fulfill the above mentioned roles. In this section, I will focus on the models that are more relevant for the reduction between physical theories. For a more general discussion around scientific reduction see the entry on scientific reduction.

2.1 Nagelian model of reduction

In the 1940s, Nagel (1949) famously argued that all reductions in science could be described in terms of logical deductions. These ideas were then developed in his 1961 seminal book “The Structure of Science”. For Nagel, there is a general way of characterizing the main components and the logical structure of the different types of reduction in science. According to him, every reduction can be constructed as a series of statements, in which one of them, i.e., the reduced theory, is the conclusion while the others, i.e., the reducing theory and auxiliary assumptions, are the premises. In the case of homogeneous reductions, in which all the technical terms in the reduced theory \(T_2\) are present in the reducing theory \(T_1\), the formal structure is straightforwardly that of a deductive argument. In the case of inhomogeneous reductions, in which at least one term in the reduced theory does not occur in the reducing theory, the reducing theory needs to be supplemented by “rules of correspondence” or “bridge laws” (BL), which establish connections between the terms of the reducing theory and the terms of the reduced theory. Once the reducing theory has been adequately supplemented by bridge laws, inhomogeneous reductions, like homogeneous reductions, embody the pattern of deductive arguments. This idea can also be put in terms of definitional extension of a theory (Butterfield 2011a). The core idea of Nagelian reduction is that a theory \(T_1\) reduces another theory \(T_2\), if and only if \(T_2\) can be presented as a definitional extension of \(T_1\), which means that \(T_2\) can be shown to be a sub-theory of the augmented theory \(T_1 \cup \BL\).

Thus, according to the Nagelian model, there are two main properties that serve to give a general characterization of reductions in science:

  • Derivability: The laws of the reduced theory can be logically derived from the laws of the (augmented) reducing theory plus auxiliary assumptions.

  • Connectability: In the case of inhomogeneous reductions, there are bridge laws, which connect the vocabulary of the reducing theory with the vocabulary of the reduced theory.

Nagel (1961) also pointed out that if the reduction is not trivial, the bridge laws should constitute scientific hypotheses, which should be susceptible of empirical confirmation or disconfirmation (see Nagel 1970; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010; Schaffner 2012; Bangu 2011 for a detailed discussion on the status of bridge laws).

It is important to note that Nagel’s model of reduction has the same structure as Hempel’s deductive nomological (DN) model of scientific explanation, according to which a law is explained by another, if and only if it is a logical consequence of the other law plus auxiliary assumptions (Hempel 1965) (for a discussion on the DN model, see the entry scientific explanation). This general characterization of intertheoretic reductions in terms of logical deduction has important virtues if we think of the goals of intertheoretic reduction mentioned in the previous section. In fact, the greatest advantage of understanding reduction in terms of logical deduction is that logical deduction is truth-preserving. This means that if \(T_1\) and \(\BL\) as well as the auxiliary assumptions are all true, then the reduced theory must also be true. In other words, if we accept the validity of the new theory \(T_1\), then on the basis of the logical relation between \(T_1 \cup \BL\) and \(T_2\), we are forced to accept the validity of \(T_2\) under certain auxiliary assumptions. Straightforwardly, this leads to the justification of the use of \(T_2\) as a useful device for making predictions and can also lead to explain the success of \(T_2\) from the perspective of \(T_1\). Furthermore, given that in most cases the reduced theory \(T_2\) has proven to be empirically successful, showing that \(T_2\) is a logical consequence of the augmented theory \(T_1 \cup \BL\), implies that in the augmented theory, one can recover all the successful predictions of \(T_2\). One can then use this structural relation between \(T_2\) and the augmented theory \(T_1 \cup \BL\) as an argument for the consolidation or acceptance of the new theory \(T_1\), which in general replaces the old theory \(T_2\).

In spite of its advantages, the Nagelian model of reduction has been challenged by a number of philosophers. In the next section, I will address some of these criticisms.

2.2 Problems with the Nagelian model

One of the most important criticisms to the Nagelian model is that even in the most paradigmatic cases of reduction in science, the reduced theory cannot be strictly deduced from the reducing theory plus bridge laws (Feyerabend 1962; Sklar 1967; Schaffner 1967, 2012). Consider the example of the reduction of the Galilean law of a freely falling body to the Newtonian theory, which is interpreted by Nagel (1961) as a paradigmatic case of homogeneous reduction. It has been often pointed out (e.g., Schaffner 1967; Sklar 1967; Torretti 1990) that even in this case, the reduced theory cannot be derived from the reducing theory, since the two theories are strictly speaking inconsistent. In fact, while Galileo’s law asserts that the acceleration of a freely falling body near the earth’s surface is constant, Newtonian theory implies that acceleration varies with the distance between the falling body and the earth’s center of mass. This means that, at most, what can be derived from the reducing theory is an approximation to the reduced theory, and not the reduced theory itself. In the 1970s, Nagel (1970) explicitly recognized the use of approximations in intertheoretic reductions and argued that approximations are not incompatible with his model, since they can take part in the auxiliary assumptions needed to derive the reduced theory (see van Riel 2011 and Sarkar 2015 for a more detailed discussion of the problem of approximations in the Nagelian model).

Feyerabend (1962) also criticized the model by pointing out contentious issues associated not only with the derivability condition, but also with the connectability condition. His criticism of the connectability condition came from his “incommensurability thesis”, according to which all scientific vocabulary, including observational terms, is globally “infected” by the theory in which it functions. However, Nagel (1970) replied to these objections with an incisive criticism to the incommensurability thesis.

Another criticism to the model is that it relies on a syntactic view of theories. Moulines (2006) argues, for instance, that a problem of the Nagelian model is that it conceives reduction as a relationship between sets of statements. Instead, he—together with collaborators—developed an approach to reduction known as the “Structuralist Approach” (Balzer, Moulines and Sneed 1987), which was compatible with the semantic view of theories (see Section 2.7). A further issue that has been pointed out is that the fact that there are no restrictions for the auxiliary assumptions makes this model too liberal (Sarkar 1992). Another critique to the Nagelian model is that the status of bridge laws is not clear (Sklar 1993). This is the question about what kinds of statements bridge laws are. Although Nagel (1961) deliberately allows for different interpretations of bridge law statements, the problem of specifying the type of statements that can qualified as a bridge law became important to cope with the multiple realizability argument, to which we now turn.

One of the most important critiques to the Nagelian model has to do with the multiple realizability thesis, which is the possibility that the same property can be instantiated or realized by different types of systems (Putnam 1967). The most common example of multiple realizability is that of pain. Allegedly, pain is multiply realizable, since it can be instantiated, for instance, in human’s and octopus’ brains. For some philosophers, multiple realizability poses a problem for Nagelian reduction, since it challenges the idea of constructing bridge laws that identify a specific property in the reduced theory with a corresponding property in the reducing theory (Fodor 1974, 1997; Kitcher 1984). Although this objection was raised firstly in the context of philosophy of mind, philosophers of physics have also addressed a similar concern by looking at specific case studies in physics. Sklar (1993: 352), for instance, argues that temperature is multiply realizable and that this poses a problem for the Nagelian reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics. More recently, Batterman (2000, 2002, 2018, 2021) has offered a similar argument in the context of universality, which is the common behavior observed among different systems when they undergo a critical phase transition (see Section 2.6 for more details about this example). According to him, a reductive explanation of universality (which should be understood as multiple realizability) fails, because it does not allow us to answer the question about why different systems behave in the same way close to a phase transition. Franklin (2019) replies to this objection by defending a reductive explanation of universality. More generally, Dizadji-Bahmani et al. (2010) and Butterfield (2011a) reply to the objection of multiple realizability arguing that it does not pose a problem for Nagelian reduction.

Although some philosophers of science have offered a recent defense of the Nagelian model trying to deal with many of the aforementioned problems (e.g., Butterfield 2011a; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010; van Riel 2011; Sarkar 2015), the issues that were raised soon after Nagel suggested his model motivated the introduction of alternative models of reduction and also modifications of the original Nagelian model. We will discuss some of these models in the next sections.

2.3 Kemeny and Oppenheim’s model

In order to offer a solution to the issues related with the derivability condition in Nagel’s model, Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) suggested an alternative general model of reduction, by relinquishing the idea of linking the structures of the reduced and the reducing theories. In their model, intertheoretic reduction is defined indirectly relative to a set of observational data. More precisely, the model proposes that a theory \(T_2\) is reduced by means of \(T_1\) relative to observational data \(O\), iff (i) the vocabulary of \(T_2\) contains terms that are not part of the vocabulary of \(T_1\), (ii) any part of \(O\) explainable by means of \(T_2\) is explainable by \(T_1\), and (iii) \(T_1\) has a greater systematic power than \(T_2\), which means that \(T_1\) has the ability to predict as wide a range of phenomena as possible from as little data as possible.

The main problem of this model is that it seems too weak to account for many cases of reduction in science (Sklar 1967; Torretti 1990). The weakness of this model is due to the fact that it does not impose any structural relationship between \(T_1\) and \(T_2\). Indeed, it only requires that the two theories make the same observational predictions within the range of phenomena covered by \(T_2\). The problem is that without positing a structural link between \(T_1\) and \(T_2\), the reduction does not allow one to justify the success of \(T_2\) on the basis of \(T_1\). This means that one cannot use the reduction of \(T_2\) to \(T_1\) to justify the use of \(T_2\) under certain conditions. Furthermore, without a structural relationship between \(T_1\) and \(T_2\), one cannot explain \(T_2\) on the basis of \(T_1\) and one cannot argue for the ontological fundamentality of \(T_1\) over \(T_2\). It seems therefore that the only epistemic goals of the Kemeny and Oppenheim’s model can be (i) to help consolidate \(T_1\), by showing that this new theory makes the same (or similar) predictions as the older theory \(T_2\), and (ii) to support the relative fundamentality of \(T_1\) over \(T_2\) in the epistemic sense that \(T_1\) has greater systematic power than \(T_2\). Note that cases of “reduction” that only lead to the consolidation of the reducing theory are cases in which the reduced theory is in fact replaced by the reducing theory and the reduced theory is overthrown. An example is the reduction of the phlogiston theory by the oxygen theory of combustion or the caloric theory by the energetic theory of heat.

2.4 Generalized Nagel-Schaffner model

Schaffner (1967) suggested a revision of the Nagelian model of reduction, which was supposed to give a more general characterization of intertheoretic reductions than the original model, and also was supposed to cope with some of the problems associated to the original formulation of the Nagelian model. This revised model says that reduction occurs if and only if:

  1. All the primitive terms \(q_1,\ldots,q_n\) appearing in the corrected reduced theory \(T_2^*\) appear in the reducing theory \(T_1\) (in the case of homogeneous reductions), or are associated with one or more of \(T_1\)’s terms with the help of reduction functions, i.e., bridge laws.

  2. \(T_2^*\) is derivable from \(T_1\), when \(T_1\) is conjoined with bridge laws.

  3. \(T_2^*\) corrects \(T_2\) in the sense that it provides more accurate experimentally verifiable predictions than \(T_2\) in almost all cases, indicates why \(T_2\) was incorrect (e.g., crucial variables are ignored), and also elucidates why \(T_2\) worked as well as it did.

  4. \(T_2\) should be explicable by \(T_1\) in the sense that \(T_1\) yields \(T_2^*\) as a deductive consequence.

  5. The relations between \(T_2\) and \(T_2^*\) should be one of strong analogy, which means that \(T_2^*\) bears a close similarity to \(T_2\), or produces numerical predictions which are “very close” to \(T_2\)’s.

Schaffner’s contention was that this model should be thought of as a “general reduction paradigm” of intertheoretic reductions in science. He also tries to show that other approaches to reduction, such as the Nagelian model and the Kemeny and Oppenheim’s model were just special cases of this generalized model. In Schaffner (1977, 2012), he reiterates this idea by proposing an even more general model, which he baptized as “The general reduction replacement model”. More recently, Dizadji-Bahmani et al. (2010) argue that a slightly revised version of this model, which they dubbed as “the Generalized Nagel-Schaffner Model” (GNS), gives us the right analysis of intertheoretic reductions. An important difference between the GNS model and Schaffner’s original proposal is that the GNS model (like Nagel’s model) emphasizes the role of auxiliary hypotheses, which do not play an important role in the original formulation of Schaffner’s model. According to the GNS model, reduction is the deductive subsumption of a corrected version of \(T_2\), i.e., \(T_2^*\), under \(T_1\), where the deduction involves (i) first deriving a restricted version, \(T_1^*\), of the reducing theory \(T_1\) by introducing boundary conditions and auxiliary assumptions, and then (ii) using bridge laws to obtain \(T_2^*\) (Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010: 398).

An important example of the GNS reduction, interpreted as a paradigmatic example of reduction by Schaffner himself, is the reduction of physical optics to Maxwell’s electromagnetic theory. In fact, in order to achieve the reduction of physical optics \(T_2\) to the electromagnetic theory \(T_1\), Sommerfeld (1950 [1954]) modified the laws of physical optics. In particular, on the basis of Maxwell’s equations, he modified Fresnel’s famous sine and tangent laws of the ratio of the relevant amplitudes of incident, reflected, and refracted polarized light. In other words, he constructed a modified version \(T_2^*\) of the original secondary theory \(T_2\), which was approximately derived from a low-level theory \(T_1\), which in this case corresponds to Maxwell’s electromagnetic theory. This modified version of Fresnel’s laws can be regarded as a close analogue of the original laws of physical optics, in the sense that it produces predictions that are very close to the predictions of physical optics. Dizadji-Bahmani et al. (2010) also take the reduction of the Second Law of Thermodynamics to statistical mechanics to be an instance of the GNS model. However, Valente (2021) has questioned this alleged GNS reduction by distinguishing between the reduction of the Second Law and the Minus First Law (see Callender 1999; Frigg 2008; Robertson 2022; Sklar 1993; and Uffink 2001, for a philosophical discussion around the reduction of the Second Law, see also the entry on philosophy of statistical mechanics).

Like the original Nagelian model, the GNS model has been the target of criticisms. Although the model aims to offer a solution for the problem of approximations, it does not necessarily cope with other problems associated to the Nagelian model, such as the problem of multiple realizability (see section 2.2). A specific problem of this model is that the meaning of strong analogy appears to be too vague to allow us give a precise characterization of reduction (Sarkar 1998: 173). Dizadji-Bahmani et al. (2010) address this and other problems of the GNS model and try to offer a compelling reply to each of them.

Independently of whether the above-mentioned problems can be successfully solved or not for some particular case studies, the question remains about the generality of the GNS model or possible revised versions of it. Although some authors have interpreted this model as a general model of reduction in physics (Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010), others have defended a more pluralistic approach to reduction (Nickles 1973; Torretti 1990; Palacios 2023)

2.5 Limiting reduction

In contrast to Nagel (1961) and Schaffner (1974), Nickles (1973) rejects the idea that there is a single model of reduction that is capable to capture the logical structure of reductions in science.

In his analysis, Nickles distinguishes between two different models of reduction attached to different scientific functions or purposes: reduction1, which corresponds to the Nagelian model, and reduction2, which consists in the recovery of one theory from another by applying a set of limiting operations or other appropriate transformations. According to his view, whereas reduction1 amounts to the explanation of a theory by another and leads to ontological economy, reduction2 has a heuristic and justificatory role (heuristic in the sense that it helps in the construction of the new theory and justificatory in the sense that it helps explaining why the previous theory was successful in the past). For him, the different models are also associated to different types of reduction. In fact, reduction1 serves to account for “domain-combining reductions”, in which there are two different theories describing the same range of phenomena at different levels of description. On the other hand, reduction2 serves to account for “domain-preserving” reductions, in which one theory is a successor of the other. Domain-combining and domain-preserving have been sometimes understood in terms of “synchronic” and “diachronic reductions” respectively (Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010)

Since the Nagelian model has been discussed in the previous sections, I will focus now on Nickles’ notion of reduction2. Nickles’ (1973: 197) reduction2 can be characterized as follows:

  • reduction2 Let \(O_i\) be a set of intertheoretic operations, then a theory \(T_2\) reduces2 another \(T_1\) iff \(O_i(T_1) \to T_2\), where the arrow represents “mathematical derivation” understood in a broad sense including not only logical deduction but also limiting operations and approximations of many kinds.

It it important to note that, for Nickles, in reduction2 one says that the successor theory \(T_1\) reduces to the previous theory \(T_2\) under certain mathematical operations. This inversion in the direction of the reduction with respect to the philosophical terminology, in which generally it is the previous theory the one that reduces to the successor theory, is motivated by the way in which physicists talk about reduction. This is the reason why this model is sometimes named as the “physicist’s concept of reduction” (e.g., Batterman 2002). However, since this difference in the direction of reduction is not important to understand this approach to reduction, from now on I will stick to the philosophers’ jargon.

Nickles himself recognizes that in order for reduction2 to hold, it is necessary that the mathematical operations performed on \(T_1\) make physical sense. Although he is not explicit about what he means by “physical sense”, one can interpret this constraint as signifying that after applying a set of mathematical operations on \(T_1\), the resulting (limit) theory can still describe realistic behavior (Butterfield 2011a, 2011b; Palacios 2018, 2019, 2020). For example, taking the limit of a constant of nature to zero may result in a (limit) theory that does not account for realistic behavior unless this limit is adequately explained. Similarly taking the limit of a parameter such as temperature or the number of particles in a system to infinity may also be illegitimate if these limits are not adequately justified.

A special case of reduction2 is limiting reduction, which refers to cases in which the transformations correspond to mathematical limits. Based on Nickles’ account, Palacios (2019: 625) defines limiting reduction as follows:

  • Limiting reduction2 Let \(Q^1\) denote a relevant quantity of \(T_1\), \(Q^2\) a relevant quantity of \(T_2\), then a quantity \(Q^2\) of \(T_2\) limiting reduces to a corresponding quantity \(Q^1\) of \(T_1\) iff (i) \(\lim_{x \to \infty} Q_x^1 = Q^2\) (where \(x\) represents a parameter appearing in \(T_1\)) and (ii) the limiting operation makes physical sense.

A prototypical example of limiting reduction is the reduction of the classical equations of motion to relativistic equations in the Newtonian limit. As it is well known, in the theory of special relativity physical quantities such as the energy and momentum of a moving body with a rest mass \(m_0\) can be expressed in terms of the so-called Lorentz factor \(\gamma\):

\[ \begin{align} E & =\gamma m_0c^2\\ p &=\gamma m_0v\\ \end{align} \]

Arguably, when the Lorentz factor goes to 1, one can recover the values of the classical counterparts of these quantities defined, respectively, as \(E=m_0c^2\) and \(p=m_0v\). Since the Lorentz factor takes the form

\[ \gamma (v) = \frac{1}{\sqrt{1-(v/c)^2}}, \]

one can make this expression go to 1 in the limit \((v/c)^2 \longrightarrow 0\), where \(c\) is the speed of light and \(v\) the velocity of a moving body in a given inertial frame. Although there are different ways of interpreting this limit (Fletcher 2019), the most common interpretation is as an approximation of the velocity of bodies that are moving slowly compared to the speed of light (Palacios & Valente 2021). This can be seen more clearly by noticing that the Lorentz factor \(\gamma\) can be expanded into a Taylor series:

\[ \begin{aligned} \gamma (v) &= \frac{1}{\sqrt{1-(v/c)^2}} \\ &= \sum_{n=0}^\infty \left( \frac{v}{c} \right)^{2n} \prod_{k=1}^n \left( \frac{2k-1}{2k} \right) \\ & = 1 + \frac{1}{2} \left( \frac{v}{c} \right)^2 + \frac{3}{8} \left( \frac{v}{c} \right)^4 + \frac{5}{16} \left( \frac{v}{c} \right)^6 + \cdots\\ \end{aligned}\]

If one considers only the first term of this Taylor expansion, one will recover the exact values of the classical quantities of interest, and this will constitute just an approximation of the velocity \(v\) of the objects for which \(v \ll c\). Taking more terms into account will give results that are more accurate from the relativistic point of view, but that depart from the classical values. According to Batterman (1995, 2002) this is a prototypical case of a “regular” limit, which is different from a “singular” limit, which will be discussed in Section 2.7. Norton (2012) also proposes a way of making precise a distinction between idealizations and approximations, which allegedly reflects common usage. According to him, idealizations involve the appeal to fictional systems, whereas approximations do not necessarily involve the existence of such systems. He then argues that cases like the Newtonian limit are idealizations that can be trivially demoted to approximations. According to him, idealizations that can be demoted to approximations, or approximations that do not constitute idealizations, do not pose a problem for intertheory reduction (see also Palacios & Valente 2021 and Frigg 2022: Ch. 11 for a discussion of this topic). Fletcher (2019) analyses in detail the limiting reduction of general relativity to Newtonian mechanics, and also explains how matter, energy and spacetime geometries differ from relativistic and classical spacetimes.

If we understand limiting reduction as a reduction between functions or equations representing physical quantities, then it is clear that this type of reduction can be combined with other models of reduction, such as the Nagelian or the GNS model, in order to achieve the reduction of a theory to another. Nickles (1973) recognizes this and explicitly says that in some cases limiting reduction may help clarify the analogous relationship between \(T_2\) and \(T_2^*\) in the Schaffner model:

There is no reason to think that reductions2 can in all cases take over the work of Schaffner’s analogy relation, but when it can we shall have \(T_1\) reducing1 \(T_2\) approximatively by reducing1 \(T_2^*\), which in turn reduces2 to \(T_2\). (Nickles 1973: 195)

Palacios (2019, 2022) further elaborates this idea and argues that in many cases, reduction1 and limiting reduction (or reduction2) may be combined to achieve important epistemic goals of reduction. She takes the case of the reduction of the thermodynamics of phase transitions to statistical mechanics to be a paradigmatic case in which the Nagelian model and limiting reduction are successfully combined (see Section 2.6).

2.6 The Problem of Singular Limits

In physics, Michael Berry (2002) has stressed the importance of “singular limits”, which he interprets as limits that connect physical theories involving concepts that are qualitatively very different. Although Berry suggests that singular limits are compatible with reduction, Batterman (e.g., 1995, 2002, 2005, 2011) and Rueger (2000a, 2000b, 2004), among others, have argued that limiting reduction, and more generally, intertheoretic reduction, fails in cases involving such limits. More precisely, Batterman (2002: 18–19) defines singular limits as cases in which the behavior in the limit is of a fundamentally different character than the nearby solutions one obtains “on the way to the limit”, that is, as \(\epsilon \to \infty\) (or 0, depending on the limit that we are considering), where \(\epsilon\) is a fundamental parameter. In other words, these are cases in which the following schema—called the “R-schema”—fails:

\[ \lim_{\epsilon \to \infty} T_1 = T_2. \]

Cases in which the solution of the relevant equations in \(T_1\) smoothly approach the solutions of the corresponding equations in \(T_2\) are cases in which the R-Schema holds. For Batterman, these cases should be interpreted as regular limits and they do not pose a problem for reduction. On the other hand, he argues that cases of singular limits are incompatible with limiting reduction (Section 2.5).

In this discussion, the use of the thermodynamic limit in the case of phase transitions has been taken as one of the most paradigmatic cases of singular limits. Phase transitions are sudden changes of a thermal system from one state into another, occurring for instance when liquid water changes to vapour due to an increase of temperature. According to Batterman (2002, 2009, 2011), the thermodynamic limit used in the theory of phase transitions is a case of a singular limit. The reason can be briefly described as follows. According to thermodynamics, which deals with the behaviour of thermal systems from a macroscopic point of view, phase transitions occur when the function representing the derivatives of the free energy is discontinuous. Such a discontinuity matches with the observed data, since sudden transitions from one phase to another appear to take place abruptly. Now, when attempting to recover the same phenomena within statistical mechanics, which describes thermal systems at the microscopic level as being composed by a very large number \(N\) of molecules, one faces a mathematical impossibility; namely, if \(N\) is finite, the function representing the derivative of the free energy remains continuous no matter how large \(N\) is. Instead, one can recover the sought-after discontinuity by taking the thermodynamic limit, which prescribes that both the number of molecules \(N\) and the volume \(V\) of the system go to infinity while its density remains fixed (Goldenfeld 1992; Kadanoff 2009).

Bangu (2019) offers a recent defense of Batterman’s position based on a distinction between data and phenomena. On the other hand, many philosophers have replied to Batterman’s argument by giving a deflationary interpretation of the thermodynamic limit in the case of phase transitions, according to which phase transitions are a successful case of intertheory reduction. This deflationary interpretation mostly consists of showing, by appealing to toy examples or computer simulations, that approximately the same behavior that can be observed at the limit can also be observed on the way to the limit (e.g., Ardourel 2018; Callender 2001; Butterfield 2011b; Butterfield & Bouatta, 2012; Lavis et al. 2021; Feintzeig 2019; Kadanoff 2013; Norton 2012, 2014; Palacios 2019, 2022; Palacios & Valente 2021; Wu 2021). Shech (2013) also discusses this problem and offers a different perspective on the issue around the use of infinite limits in phase transitions.

Related to the case of continuous phase transitions, some philosophers, most notably Batterman (2002, 2011) and Morrison (2012, 2015), have argued that the use of renormalization group methods in the explanation of universal behavior is another instance of singular limits. In a nutshell, it was observed that close to a critical phase transition, disparate systems, as different as fluids and magnets, display universal behavior, which means that they have the same quantitative and qualitative behavior. According to Batterman and Morrison, the explanation of universality on the basis of renormalization group methods requires invoking the thermodynamic limit. The reason is that this framework relies on finding non-trivial fixed points, which can only be well-defined in the limit. Although these arguments are persuasive, some philosophers have argued against this conclusion by showing that universal behavior can also be explained on the basis of finite systems (Franklin 2018; Palacios 2019, 2022; Saatsi & Reutlinger 2018; Wu 2021). Very recently, Ardourel and Bangu (2023) have offered what they take to be a more nuanced perspective on this matter. Another argument for the irreducibility of universal behavior is associated with the problem of multiple realizability, which was discussed in Section 2.5.

Apart from the case of classical phase transitions, other example that has been extensively analyzed in the debate on singular limits is the use of the thermodynamic limit in quantum phase transitions. In this discussion, authors such as Liu and Emch (2005) and Ruetsche (2011) argue that taking the thermodynamical limit is indispensable for a quantum mechanical description of the phenomena; on the other hand, other authors, such as Landsman (2013) and Fraser (2016), have defended a deflationary view towards the limit.

Another putative example of a singular limit is the van der Pol oscillator. Whereas Rueger (2000a, 2000b, 2004) argues that this a case in which a singular limit is involved, Wayne (2012) gives a deflationary interpretation of the limit. Finally, there is a similar discussion on the use of infinite limits in the explanation of symmetry-breaking phenomena. Some authors, most notably Morrison (2012), have given arguments in the same direction as Batterman to argue that the limits involved in spontaneous symmetry breaking are necessary. On the other hand, Fraser (2016), Landsman (2013), and Wallace (unpublished [OIR]) have suggested that, although a deflationary explanation of the use of the thermodynamic limit in the derivation of spontaneous symmetry breaking is less straightforward than the one given in the case of first-order phase transitions, such an explanation can be given.

2.7 The Structuralist Approach

A model of reduction that has been largely ignored in the Anglo-American discussion is the model of Balzer, Moulines, and Sneed (Balzer et al. 1987). This model is part of the so-called “structuralist” program and is characterized by the use of set-theoretical predicates. As such, it is associated with a semantic view of theories, in which a theory is not viewed as a class of statements or propositions, but rather as a class of models. In addition, this approach has the advantage of giving a precise reconstruction of intertheoretic relations and of offering a precise notion of intertheoretic approximation.

According to the structuralist approach, to say that a domain \(A\) is reducible to domain \(B\) is to say that theory \(T_A\) has an ontological reductive link to theory \(T_B'\), where “ontological reductive link” is a kind of intertheoretical relation. Each theory is determined by a class of models \(M\), each of which has a particular structure and satisfies the same set of axioms. Even if there are different specific formulations of reductive relations within the structuralist framework, the common core of the structuralist program, can be summarized as follows (Moulines 2006).

For kinds \(A\) and \(B_1,\ldots,B_n\), \(A\) is reducible to \(B_1,\ldots,B_n\), only if there are theories \(T\) and \(T'\) such that:

  1. \(A\) appears as a basic domain within the models of \(T\);

  2. analogously for the \(B_i\)’s with respect to \(T'\);

  3. the field of experience \(F\) subsumed by \(T\) (i.e., the field of application of \(T\) we are interested in) is a subfield of the field corresponding to \(T'\);

  4. there is an ontological reductive link \(\phi\) from \(T\) to \(T'\) relating A to \(B_i\);

  5. \(T\) is nomologically reducible to \(T'\).

According to this approach, there is an ontological reductive link from \(A\) to \(B_i\), if \(A\) “comes out of” \(B_i\) by successively applying set theoretical operations, such as Cartesian products. Nomological reducibility means in this framework that those models of \(T\) that subsume the interesting field of experience \(F\) are correlated (through the ontological reductive link) to actual models of specializations of \(T'\) (structures satisfying the fundamental laws of \(T'\)). In particular, models that subsume the same field of experience as in \(T\).

In contrast to the original Nagelian model, this approach does not require that all concepts of \(T\) are definable in terms of \(T'\). Only the relationship between \(A\) and \(B_i\) matters and only in those models that subsume the field \(F\) we are interested in.

In addition, this model does not require semantic predicate-by-predicate connections (in the sense of Nagel’s bridge laws), nor the deducibility of statements, although it is compatible with them. In this sense, this model is weaker than the Nagelian model of reduction. Another advantage of the model is that if one introduces an appropriate topology, it can give a precise characterization of approximative reductions, which cannot only serve to account for cases of limiting reduction but also for other cases of approximate reductions (Balzer et al. 1987; Moulines 1980, 1984).

One can see then that the structuralistic account of reduction opens the possibility of discussing matters of strong analogy and approximative reduction on a less informal level than other models of reduction; because of that it has the potential of improving the approximative Nagelian model and Nickles’ model of reduction2. The problem is then shifted to the task of showing that some of the interesting cases of reduction fit into this account. Although the model has led to detailed reconstructions of particular examples of reductions in physics, such as the reduction of rigid body mechanics to Newtonian particle mechanics (Sneed 1971) and Kepler’s planetary theory to Newtonian particle mechanics (Moulines 1980), it is not at all clear whether all relevant reductions in physics can be reconstructed in this way (Torretti 1990).

Another limitation of this model is that it may appear too weak, since, at least in the original formulation, it did not specify the sort of transformation \(\phi\) that relates the domains in the two theories. Therefore, it allows for cases that are not generally considered to be successful (ontological) reductions. For example, it could account for cases in which there is an ad hoc mathematical relationship between the domains of two theories that are completely unrelated (Moulines 1984; Schaffner 1967). A possible solution to this problem comes from specifying the sort of relationship admissible in successful reductions. For instance, Moulines (1984) has argued that in order to have a real reduction at the ontological level, the sets of physical individuals (constituting the domain of a theory) need to be in a biunivoque correspondence. In other words, the ontological reductive link needs to be a one-to-one function.

Another approach to reduction, closely related to the structuralist approach, is the “New Wave” approach, championed mostly by philosophers of mind, such as Churchland (1979, 1985, 1990) and Bickle (1996, 1998). This approach to reduction is more liberal than the Nagelian and structuralist models and allows for a larger variety of relations between the reduced and reducing theories. The two main criticisms to this approach are that (i) it fails to distinguish between cases of replacement and genuine reduction (Endicott 1998, 2001) and (ii) that is not entirely new (Endicott 1998; Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010). For more details of these models, see the entry scientific reduction.

2.8 Contemporary Approaches

Nickles’ concept of limiting reduction and the structuralist model inspired contemporary topological approaches to reduction (e.g., Scheibe 1997; Fletcher 2016, 2020). The goal of these approaches is mainly to make precise the notion of approximation involved in limiting relations. In other words, to make explicit the sense in which the reduced theory approximates the reducing theory. A similar approach has been developed by Landsman (2007, 2017), who has focused mainly on the reduction of the classical theory to quantum theories in the classical limit \(\hbar \to 0\), by employing the tools of the \(C^*\)-algebra framework (see Feintzeig 2020, 2022 for a discussion of the interpretation of the formalism in this approach).

The contemporary literature in philosophy of physics has also improved our understanding of some basic aspects of intertheory reduction. Contrary to many approaches to intertheory reduction in physics, which take intertheory reduction to be the “global” derivation of one theory from another, Rosaler (2015) argues that reductions in physics normally have a “local” character. In this weaker form of intertheory reduction, the reductive relation is not between complete theories, but rather between models of a single system. Furthermore, he has also argued that reductive relations should be better interpreted as a posteriori relations (Rosaler 2019). More precisely, he argues that reduction not only depends on the structural relation between the theories to be compared, but also on empirical facts about where the theories succeed at describing real systems. Reduction should be understood, therefore, as an a posteriori relation.

Also, in the last few years, more and more attention has been paid to the functional approach to reduction in the philosophy of physics (e.g., Baker 2021; Esfeld & Sachse 2011; Knox 2014 [Other Internet Resources], 2019; Lam & Wüthrich 2018, 2020; Butterfield & Gomes 2022, 2023; Robertson 2022; Lorenzetti 2023. Roughly speaking, functional reduction describes inter-theoretic reduction as a relationship between upper-level realizers and lower-level realizers. For instance, finding a statistical mechanical realizer that plays the functional role of thermodynamic temperature or thermodynamic free energy allows for establishing a reductive relation between thermodynamics and statistical mechanics. The functional approach to reduction originally elaborated by Lewis (1972) and Kim (1984), is usually not interpreted as an alternative to existing models of reduction, but instead it is thought to be embedded in traditional models of reduction, since it can play a role, for example, in interpreting the bridge laws in the Nagelian model. Butterfield and Gomes (2023) take functionalism to be an improvement of Nagelian reduction. Lorenzetti (2024), on the other hand, distinguishes between two types of functional reduction, one that elaborates on Lewis’s account (1972) and is embedded within Nagelian reductionism, and the other that adopts a semantic view and is associated with the structuralist approach to reduction. Yet other authors discussing functionalism in physics (Baker 2021; Knox 2019) have made the relationship between functionalism and reduction less explicit.

3. Reduction, Supervenience and Emergence

Discussions around inter-theory reductions usually overlap with discussions on supervenience and emergence. In fact, in the philosophical literature, especially in the philosophy of mind, supervenience has often been associated with nonreductive physicalism (Hellman & Thompson 1975; Davidson 1970; List & Menzies 2009), which denies the reduction of mental properties to physical properties. Similarly, in philosophy of science, emergence has been frequently associated to a failure of inter-theory reduction (Batterman 2002; Rueger 2000a, 2004). This section will analyse the extent to which these terms are intrinsically related, or should be considered as logically independent.

3.1 Supervenience with or without reduction

Informally, supervenience means that there cannot be two events (or theories) alike in all low-level properties without being identical in all their high-level properties. Consequently, two events cannot differ with respect to the high-level properties without differing in some lower-level properties. Kim (1984) distinguishes between weak supervenience, strong supervenience and global supervenience. He defines weak supervenience as:

\(A\) weakly supervenes on \(B\) if and only if necessarily for any \(x\) and \(y\) if \(x\) and \(y\) share all properties in \(B\) then \(x\) and \(y\) share all properties in \(A\); that is, indiscernibility with respect to \(B\) entails indiscernibility with respect to \(A\). (1984: 158)

In contrast to weak supervenience, which holds in a particular world, strong supervenience holds across worlds and is defined as follows:

\(A\) strongly supervenes on \(B\) just in case, necessarily, for each \(x\) and each property \(F\) in \(A\), if \(x\) has \(F\), then there is a property \(G\) in \(B\) such that \(x\) has \(G\), and necessarily if any \(y\) has \(G\), it has \(F\). (1984: 165)

Finally, there is global supervenience, which he proves to be equivalent to strong supervenience:

\(A\) globally supervenes on \(B\) just in case worlds that are indiscernible with respect to \(B\) (“B-indiscernible”, for short) are also \(A\)-indiscernible. (1984: 168)

According to Kim (1990), not all these types of supervenience imply reduction understood in the Nagelian sense. But if strong and global supervenience hold, it may be possible to reduce the supervenient to the subvenient due to strong connectability. On the other hand, if strong supervenience fails it should not be possible to obtain a Nagelian reduction between the two. Butterfield (2011a) develops this idea further, showing that under certain assumptions, global supervenience collapses into Nagelian reduction, understood as definitional extension. This equivalence between global supervenience and reduction rests on the validity of Beth’s theorem (1959), which requires, among other assumptions, that the language of the theories is first-order, finitary (i.e., has finitely many predicates) and extensional. Hellman and Thompson (1977), who also discuss Beth’s theorem, question the plausibility of these assumptions and give three examples of supervenience without reduction. One of these examples concerns the relationship between thermodynamics and statistical mechanics, which they consider to be a case of supervenience without reduction. They claim that one of the reasons for the failure of reduction (as definitional extension) in this case is that the microscopic mechanics lacks some properties of the thermodynamic theory, which means that reduction is blocked.

More recently, List (2019) and Dewar (2019) have reanalyzed the relationship between supervenience and reduction. List argues, in a similar vein as Hellman and Thompson, that there can be supervenience without reduction. Dewar, on the other hand, focuses on the topological constrains that we need to impose to first-order theories in order to obtain reducibility. For a more detailed discussion on the concept of supervenience and its relationship with emergence and reduction, see the entry on supervenience.

3.2 On the compatibility between emergence and reduction

Sometimes, emergence is associated to the failure of intertheoretic reduction. In his Devil in the Details (Batterman 2002), for instance, Batterman defines emergent behavior as

a result of the singular nature of the limiting relationship between the finer and coarser theories that are relevant to the phenomenon of interest. (2002: 121)

He interprets this notion of emergence in an ontological sense, suggesting that the singular behavior captured by a singular limit denotes real behavior, which is ontologically distinct from the behavior that appears in finite systems. Later (e.g., Batterman 2011), he seems to move towards an epistemological conception, in which emergence is understood as an epistemic failure, meaning that certain concepts of the phenomenological theory cannot be predicted or explained in terms of the microscopic theory. Rueger (2000a, 2004) defends a similar view, defining emergence as a failure of intertheoretic reduction and in particular of limiting reduction.

These conceptions are in line with the traditional conception in philosophy of mind that emergence is an alternative position with respect to the reduction of mental states to physical states (Broad 1925; Davidson 1970; Beckermann, Flohr & Kim 1992; Kim 1998).

However, it should be noted that there is a recent tendency among philosophers of physics to think of emergence and reduction as being compatible (e.g., Butterfield 2011a, 2011b; Butterfield & Bouatta 2012; de Haro 2019, Crowther 2015; Norton 2014, Palacios 2022). Although this alleged compatibility between emergence and reduction is not new and can be traced back to Nagel (1961) and Wimsatt (1976), the systematic analysis done by Butterfield (2011a, 2011b) led many contemporary philosophers of physics to endorse this position. The compatibility defended by Butterfield and endorsed soon after by Norton (2012), among others, relies on specific definitions of emergence and reduction. Butterfield and Norton, for instance, understand emergence as a relationship between scales and argue that this conception of emergence is compatible with intertheory reduction in the Nagelian sense, which describes a relationship between different theories. They focus on several examples, where the case of phase transitions is the most notable one. Crowther (2015) analyses this compatibility for the case of quantum gravity. Palacios (2022) focuses on the case of critical phase transitions and defends a compatibility between two notions of emergence, which she dubbed as “few-many” and “coarse-grained” emergence. Here intertheory reduction is understood as a combination between the Nagelian model and limiting reduction.

It is important to point out, however, that this alleged compatibility between emergence and reduction only holds for what philosophers know as weak emergence. In contrast to strong emergence, which denies microphysicalism, weak emergence does not deny microphysicalism, namely the thesis that all natural phenomena are ultimately constituted and metaphysically determined by fundamental physical entities. For a more detailed discussion on weak and strong emergence, see the entry on emergent properties.

4. Reduction and Reductionism

So far, we have focused on intertheory reductions that may hold between two theories or parts of theories. Reductionism, in contrast, is the much stronger claim that ultimately all sciences are reducible to one basic science, usually fundamental physics. I will now discuss the status of this project in light of three contemporary discussions in physics and the philosophy of physics.

4.1 The Theory of Everything

The theory of everything is the idea sometimes attributed to Einstein (1940) and Hawking (1984) that there will be an ultimate theory of the universe constituting a set of equations capable of describing all phenomena that have been observed, or that will ever be observed (Gribbin 2009; Laughlin & Pines 2000; ’t Hooft et al. 2005). Even if this idea may sound appealing and pragmatically valuable, many physicists have questioned the feasibility of this project. Laughlin and Pines (2000), for instance, have argued that the equations of conventional nonrelativistic quantum mechanics, which may be the best candidate for the theory of everything, have not been solved exactly when the number of particles exceeds around ten. According to them, this problem is not associated to the present state of the art, since not even a future super computer could carry out this calculation due to a catastrophe dimension. They also point out that even for other candidates for theories of everything, one would need to use approximate calculations for deriving the behavior of larger systems. They say that it is through such calculations that we have learned why atoms, for instance, have the size they do and why chemical bonds have the length and strength they do. In early 1970s, Philip Anderson (1972), in his seminal paper “More is Different”, made a similar point that such calculations were computationally intractable:

Starting with the fundamental laws and a computer, we would have to do two impossible things—solve a problem with infinitely many bodies, and then apply the result to a finite system—before we synthesized this [macroscopic] behavior. (1972: 395)

Barrow (2007), Hartle (2003), ’t Hooft (2017) have recently discussed the status of the theory of everything. Although Barrow and Hartle have a rather negative view towards this project, ’t Hooft offers a more optimistic perspective, although by adopting a weaker interpretation of what is meant by “theory of everything.”

Importantly, the skepticism about the so called “Theory of Everything” should neither be taken as undermining intertheory reduction, which allows for approximations, nor reductionism, which is the idea that all theories converge to the most fundamental one. Anderson (1972) himself realizes this when he distinguishes between “reductionism” and “constructionism”. For him, reductionism is “the ability to reduce everything to simple fundamental [higher-energy/lower-level] laws” (1972: 393). Constructionism, on the other hand, corresponds to “the ability to start from those [fundamental] laws and reconstruct the universe” (ibid). One can see then that it is the latter rather than the former that is closer to the original idea of the theory of everything. One of the most important theses in Anderson’s paper is that the “reductionist hypothesis does not by any means imply a ‘constructionist’ one”(ibid). In fact, he believes in the truth of reductionism, but denies constructionism. However, there is an ambiguity in Anderson’s paper on whether he argues against constructionism in principle or in practice. In some passages, he can be interpreted as defending a failure of constructionism in principle, yet in others a failure in practice. Luu and Meißner (2020), for instance, take him to argue for the latter, whereas Ellis (2020) takes him to defend the former (For a detailed analysis on Anderson’s paper, see Mainwood 2006 and Humphreys 2015).

Interestingly, Steven Weinberg, who has sometimes been taken to defend the theory of everything, seems to argue for reductionism and not constructionism. In fact, in his book Facing Up: Science and Its Cultural Adversaries, he explains his idea of reductionism as follows:

Relying on this intuitive idea that different scientific generalizations explain others, we have a sense of direction in science. These are arrows of scientific explanation, which thread through the space of all scientific generalizations. Having discovered many of these arrows, we can now look at the pattern that has emerged, and we noticed a remarkable thing: perhaps the greatest scientific discovery of all. These arrows seem to converge to a common source! Start anywhere in science and, like an unpleasant child, keep asking “why”? You will eventually arrive at the level of the very small. (Weinberg 2001: 17–18)

Weinberg reminds us that in the 1920s the lowest level that was known was quantum mechanics. By the 1970s was the quantum field theory of particles and he had the hope that the next level would be a theory of superstrings, which was not completed at that time, and is still not complete. Importantly, for Weinberg the truth of the thesis of reductionism does not depend on the extent of human knowledge or on the current state of physics. This is because he endorses an ontological conception of reductionism, which he calls “objective reductionism”, according to which reductionism is a feature of the world itself. In the philosophy of physics literature, this concept corresponds to “microphysicalism”, which, as mentioned above, is the thesis that everything is ultimately constituted by the same fundamental physical entities (whatever they are) (e.g., Bain 2013a; Hüttemann 2004; Palacios 2022).

4.2 Effective Field Theories

A contemporary research program, which has sometimes been taken as the realization of the reductionist approach (Giudice 2008), is the Effective Field Theories (EFTs) approach.

Huggett and Weingard (1995) define an “Effective Field Theory” as a theory that “effectively captures everything relevant [at a given scale]” (1995: 172). EFTs play an essential role in many different areas of physics, ranging from particle physics and condensed matter physics to inflationary cosmology. Moreover, it is common among physicists to think of all our current physical theories, including the Standard Model, as low-energy EFTs of some unknown fundamental theory (Luu & Meißner 2020, 2021; Rivat & Grinbaum 2020; Wells 2012)

Usually, EFTs are constructed through a process in which the degrees of freedom are eliminated (or integrated out) from a high-energy or short-length scale theory by using a technique called “Renormalization group methods” (Bain 2013b; Georgi 1993; Huggett & Weingard 1995). An example of this approach is the construction of the low-energy theory describing the behavior of the quantum-Hall liquid from a corresponding high-energy theory, which is achieved by interacting out the electron degrees of freedom (Bain 2013a; Shech & McGivern 2021). Another approach consists of going from low-energy EFTs to high-energy EFTs, by adding new terms (coupling-constants) in order to account for high-energy effects (details in Crowther 2015; Hartmann 2001; Manohar 2020). In this case, one constructs an effective higher-energy theory on the basis of a well-known lower-energy theory. A candidate example for this is the construction of a high-energy theory on the basis of the standard model (see Bain 2013a, Georgi 1993, Manohar 1997 for a more detailed discussion of this example).

In practice, arriving at a lower-energy EFT from the high-energy EFT is not a simple task, and external guidance such as experimental results are needed in order to find an adequate transformation that keeps the free energy and the relevant physics approximately invariant (Bain 2013a, 2013b; Crowther 2015; Luu and Meißner 2020). So, in practice, the construction of the low-energy theory from the high-energy theory is not just a matter of deducing the former from the latter. Instead, a phenomenological investigation of the system is often required in order to assure that the transformation will maintain the relevant physics.

This apparent lack of deducibility in EFTs has played an important role in the discussion on reductionism. For instance, Cao and Schweber (1993) take it as a motivation for defending a pluralistic and antireductionist picture of the world, in which the world is supposed to be arranged into an infinite hierarchy of autonomous domains, each level having its own ontology and its own fundamental laws. This anti-reductionist picture relies, on the one hand, on the idea that the low-energy theory cannot be simply derived from the high-energy theory without appealing to low-energy empirical information. On the other hand, it rests on “the decoupling theorem,” which is a theorem that demonstrates that high-energy contributions have negligible effect on low-energy regimes. A similar anti-reductionist view has recently been defended by Ellis (2020).

Hartmann (2001) criticizes Cao and Schweber’s line of reasoning, by pointing out that the decoupling theorem is valid only under restrictive conditions (for instance it requires the high-energy theory to be perturbatively renormalizable). He also argues that, in many cases, distinct EFTs can be actually related by means of deductive relations and bridge laws, hence they can be understood as instances of Nagelian reduction. Castellani (2002) makes a similar point, arguing that even if not in practice, the deduction of lower-energy EFTs from higher energy EFTs is possible in principle. In fact, she says that we normally have to appeal to empirical input, because we do not have a complete renormalizable theory at infinitely short distances. If we had such a theory, we would be able to construct lower-level EFTs at any distance in a totally systematic way (see also Georgi 1993):

The EFT schema, by allowing definite connections between the theory levels, provides an argument against the basic antireductionist claim of the scientists’ debate. A reconstruction (the way up) is not excluded, even though it may have to be only in principle. In this sense, EFT does not represent a vindication of Anderson’s 1972 views, as has been claimed. (Castellani 2002: 15)

Bain (2013a, 2013b) is more skeptical about the possibility of deriving low-energy EFTs from higher energy EFTs without empirical input. He points out that in realistic cases, the low-energy dynamical equations and degrees of freedom are formally distinct from those of the high-energy theory. For him the difference between the two theories and their degrees of freedom is substantial enough that the two theories generally admit different ontologies and cannot strictly speaking be considered to be “a part” of one another.

Rivat and Grinbaum (2020) agree that usually there are important formal differences between the lower-level and higher-level EFTs, however they contend that these differences are not incompatible with Nagelian reduction. In fact, they stress that Nagelian reduction does not require the two theories to be formally identical and admits approximations and even the appeal to empirical input in the form of auxiliary assumptions:

[T]he relation between two EFTs involve approximations and heuristic reasoning: e.g., performing a saddle point approximation when integrating out heavy fields or taking the zero mass limit of some light field. Bain claims that these features make the task of formulating the relation between two theories in terms of a mathematical derivation difficult, if not impossible. Here, again, successful Nagelian reductions are relatively permissive to the use of intermediary approximations, assumptions, and heuristic reasoning. The ultimate goal of a Nagelian reduction is to explain away the success of the low-energy theory by means of the high-energy theory, not to provide a strict derivation relying only on the resources of the high-energy theory. (Rivat & Grinbaum 2020: 13)

Butterfield (2014) also considers the EFT approach to be compatible with Nagelian reduction and interprets it as a family of Nagelian reductions. Despite these arguments, there is currently no consensus as to whether the EFT framework is compatible with intertheory reduction or not. For instance, recently, there has been a heated discussion between Luu and Meißner (2020, 2021), who take EFTs to be compatible with reductionism, and Ellis (2020), who argues that EFTs imply an anti-reductionist picture of the world.

A related discussion concerns the notion of naturalness in quantum field theory. For a discussion around this topic, see, e.g., Franklin (2020), Wallace (2019) and Williams (2015).

4.3 Multiscale Modeling

Another philosophical discussion, which has proved relevant for the general topic on reduction in physics is the debate on multiscale models. According to some philosophers (e.g., Batterman 2013b, 2021; Batterman & Green 2021; Wilson 2017; Bursten 2018), the fact that scientific modeling usually requires appealing to features and properties of different mesoscale levels, undermines the view that the world is sharply divided into distinct levels, in particular, the microscopic and the macroscopic. Moreover, according to them this undermines the reductonist idea that the higher (phenomenological) level can be ultimately derived from the next lower (microscopic) level. McGivern (2008) has also pointed out that multiscale models do not fulfill Kim’s (1998) minimal condition for intertheory reduction, according to which all high-level properties must be identifiable with distinct micro-level properties.

Multiscale models have proved to be very useful in modeling systems in several disciplines, such as fluid mechanics, aerodynamics and geophysics. Although philosophers involved in this debate succeed in emphasizing the importance of mesoscale levels in a variety of case-studies, such as nanoscale crack propagation in silicon and hydrodynamic models, the extent to which the existence of multiscale models undermines reductionism is still contentious. Franklin (unpublished [OIR]), for instance, argues that the antireductionist interpretation of multiscale models relies on a very narrow conception of reductionism associated to a bottom-up methodology. According to him, if we focus instead on reductive explanations, which account for the stability of various features at larger scales and explain why bottom-up methodological reductionism fails, we will conclude that the existence of multiscale models does not undermine reductionism. A similar argument is given by Franklin (2019) in the context of renormalization group explanations. Although Franklin’s arguments are persuasive, it would be interesting to investigate whether specific models of intertheoretic reduction, such as the Nagelian model, can be made compatible with the concrete multiscale models examined in the literature. Butterfield and Bouatta (2016) argue, for instance, that renormalization group explanations can be indeed interpreted as Nagelian reductions, but it remains to be seen whether such an interpretation can be given to the other examples examined in the discussion around multiscale models.


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