Plato’s Ethics and Politics in The Republic

First published Tue Apr 1, 2003; substantive revision Tue Sep 12, 2017

Plato’s Republic centers on a simple question: is it always better to be just than unjust? The puzzles in Book One prepare for this question, and Glaucon and Adeimantus make it explicit at the beginning of Book Two. To answer the question, Socrates takes a long way around, sketching an account of a good city on the grounds that a good city would be just and that defining justice as a virtue of a city would help to define justice as a virtue of a human being. Socrates is finally close to answering the question after he characterizes justice as a personal virtue at the end of Book Four, but he is interrupted and challenged to defend some of the more controversial features of the good city he has sketched. In Books Five through Seven, he addresses this challenge, arguing (in effect) that the just city and the just human being as he has sketched them are in fact good and are in principle possible. After this long digression, Socrates in Books Eight and Nine finally delivers three “proofs” that it is always better to be just than unjust. Then, because Socrates wants not only to show that it is always better to be just but also to convince Glaucon and Adeimantus of this point, and because Socrates’ proofs are opposed by the teachings of poets, he bolsters his case in Book Ten by indicting the poets’ claims to represent the truth and by offering a new myth that is consonant with his proofs.

As this overview makes clear, the center of Plato’s Republic is a contribution to ethics: a discussion of what the virtue justice is and why a person should be just. Yet because Socrates links his discussion of personal justice to an account of justice in the city and makes claims about how good and bad cities are arranged, the Republic sustains reflections on political questions, as well. Not that ethics and politics exhaust the concerns of the Republic. The account in Books Five through Seven of how a just city and a just person are in principle possible is an account of how knowledge can rule, which includes discussion of what knowledge and its objects are. Moreover, the indictment of the poets involves a wide-ranging discussion of art. This article, however, focuses on the ethics and politics of Plato’s Republic. For more on what the Republic says about knowledge and its objects, see Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology, and for more about the discussion of the poets, see Plato: rhetoric and poetry.

This article attempts to provide a constructive guide to the main issues of ethics and politics in the Republic. Two assumptions shape its organization. First, it assumes that an account of ethics and politics in the Republic requires a preliminary understanding of the question Socrates is facing and the strategy Socrates uses to answer the question. Second, it assumes that politics in the Republic is based upon the moral psychology in the Republic, and thus that the former is more profitably discussed after the latter. With these assumptions in place, the following outline unfolds:

1. Introduction: The Question and the Strategy

1.1 The Nature of the Question

In Book One, the Republic’s question first emerges in the figure of Cephalus. After Socrates asks his host what it is like being old (328d–e) and rich (330d)—rather rude, we might think—Cephalus says that the best thing about wealth is that it can save us from being unjust and thus smooth the way for an agreeable afterlife (330d–331b). This is enough to prompt more questions, for Socrates wants to know what justice is. Predictably, Cephalus and then Polemarchus fail to define justice in a way that survives Socratic examination, but they continue to assume that justice is a valuable part of a good human life. Thrasymachus erupts when he has had his fill of this conversation (336a–b), and he challenges the assumption that it is good to be just. On Thrasymachus’ view (see especially 343c–344c), justice is conventionally established by the strong, in order that the weak will serve the interests of the strong. The strong themselves, on this view, are better off disregarding justice and serving their own interests directly.

Socrates sees in this “immoralist” challenge the explicit question of whether one should live a just or unjust life (344d–e), and he tries repeatedly to repel Thrasymachus’ onslaught. (See the entry on Callicles and Thrasymachus.) Eventually, Thrasymachus withdraws sullenly, like Callicles in the Gorgias, but Socrates’ “victory” fails to satisfy Glaucon and Adeimantus. The brothers pick up where Thrasymachus left off, providing reasons why most people think that justice is not intrinsically valuable but worth respecting only if one is not strong enough (or invisible enough) to get away with injustice. They want to be shown that most people are wrong, that justice is worth choosing for its own sake. More than that, Glaucon and Adeimantus want to be shown that justice is worth choosing regardless of the rewards or penalties bestowed on the just by other people and the gods, and they will accept this conclusion only if Socrates can convince them that it is always better to be just. So Socrates must persuade them that the just person who is terrifically unfortunate and scorned lives a better life than the unjust person who is so successful that he is unfairly rewarded as if he were perfectly just (see 360d–361d).

The challenge that Glaucon and Adeimantus present has baffled modern readers who are accustomed to carving up ethics into deontologies that articulate a theory of what is right independent of what is good and consequentialisms that define what is right in terms of what promotes the good (Foster 1937, Mabbott 1937, cf. Prichard 1912 and 1928). The insistence that justice be praised “itself by itself” has suggested to some that Socrates will be offering a deontological account of justice. But the insistence that justice be shown to be beneficial to the just has suggested to others that Socrates will be justifying justice by reference to its consequences.

In fact, both readings are distortions, predicated more on what modern moral philosophers think than on what Plato thinks. Socrates takes the basic challenge to concern how justice relates to the just person’s objective success or happiness (Greek eudaimonia). In Book One, he argued that justice, as a virtue, makes the soul perform its function well and that a person who lives well is “blessed and happy” (352d–354a, quoting 354a1). At the beginning of Book Two, he retains his focus on the person who aims to be happy. He says, “I think that justice belongs in the best class [of goods], that which should be loved both for its own sake and for the sake of its consequences by anyone who is going to be blessed” (358a1–3). Given this perspective, Socrates has to show that smartly pursuing one’s happiness favors being just (which requires always acting justly) over being unjust (which tolerates temptation to injustice and worse), apart from the consequences that attend to the appearance of being just or unjust. But he does not have to show that being just or acting justly brings about happiness. The function argument in Book One suggests that acting justly is the same as being happy. If Socrates stands by this identity, he can simultaneously show that justice is valuable “itself by itself” and that the just are happier.

But the function argument concludes that justice is both necessary and sufficient for happiness (354a), and this is a considerably stronger thesis than the claim that the just are always happier than the unjust. After the challenge Glaucon and Adeimantus present, Socrates might not be so bold. Even if he successfully maintains that acting justly is identical to being happy, he might think that there are circumstances in which no just person could act justly and thus be happy. This will nonetheless satisfy Glaucon and Adeimantus if the just are better off (that is, closer to happy) than the unjust in these circumstances. (See also Kirwan 1965 and Irwin 1999.)

1.2 Rejected Strategies

After the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus, Socrates takes off in a strange direction (from 367e). He suggests looking for justice as a virtue of cities before defining justice as a virtue of persons, on the unconvincing grounds that justice in a city is bigger and more apparent than justice in a person (368c–369b), and this leads Socrates to a rambling description of some features of a good city (369b–427c). This may seem puzzling. But Socrates’ indirect approach is not unmotivated. The arguments of Book One and the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus rule out several more direct routes.

First, Socrates might have tried to settle quickly on a widely accepted account of what justice is and moved immediately to considering whether that is always in one’s interests. But Book One rules this strategy out by casting doubt on widely accepted accounts of justice. Socrates must say what justice is in order to answer the question put to him, and what he can say is constrained in important ways. Most obviously, he cannot define justice as happiness without begging the question. But he also must give an account of justice that his interlocutors recognize as justice: if his account of justice were to require torturing red-headed children for amusement, he would fail to address the question that Glaucon and Adeimantus are asking.

Moreover, Socrates cannot try to define justice by enumerating the types of action that justice requires or forbids. We might have objected to this strategy for this reason: because action-types can be specified in remarkably various ways and at remarkably different levels of specificity, no list of just or unjust action-types could be comprehensive. But a specific argument in Book One suggests a different reason why Socrates does not employ this strategy. When Cephalus characterizes justice as keeping promises and returning what is owed, Socrates objects by citing a case in which returning what is owed would not be just (331c). This objection potentially has very wide force, as it seems that exceptions could always be found for any action-type that does not include in its description a word like ‘wrong’ or ‘just’. Wrongful killing may always be wrong, but is killing? Just recompense may always be right, but is recompense?

So Book One makes it difficult for Socrates to take justice for granted. What is worse, the terms in which Socrates accepts the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus make it difficult for him to take happiness for granted. If Socrates were to proceed like a consequentialist, he might offer a full account of happiness and then deliver an account of justice that both meets with general approval and shows how justice brings about happiness. But Socrates does not proceed like that. He does not even do as much as Aristotle does in the Nicomachean Ethics; he does not suggest some general criteria for what happiness is. He proceeds as if happiness is unsettled. But if justice at least partly constitutes happiness and justice is unsettled, then Socrates is right to proceed as if happiness is unsettled.

In sum, Socrates needs to construct an account of justice and an account of happiness at the same time, and he needs these accounts to entail without assuming the conclusion that the just person is always happier than the unjust.

1.3 The Adopted Strategy

The difficulty of this task helps to explain why Socrates takes the curious route through the discussion of civic justice and civic happiness. Socrates can assume that a just city is always more successful or happy than an unjust city. The assumption begs no questions, and Glaucon and Adeimantus readily grant it. If Socrates can then explain how a just city is always more successful and happy than an unjust city, by giving an account of civic justice and civic happiness, he will have a model to propose for the relation between personal justice and flourishing.

Socrates’ strategy depends on an analogy between a city and a person. There must be some intelligible relation between what makes a city successful and what makes a person successful. But to answer the Republic’s question, Socrates does not need any particular account of why the analogy holds, nor does he need the analogy to hold broadly (that is, for a wide range of characteristics). It works even if it only introduces an account of personal justice and happiness that we might not have otherwise entertained.

Although this is all that the city-person analogy needs to do, Socrates seems at times to claim more for it, and one of the abiding puzzles about the Republic concerns the exact nature and grounds for the full analogy that Socrates claims. At times Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply to both persons and cities because the same account of any predicate ‘F’ must apply to all things that are F (e.g., 434d–435a). At other times Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply in both cases because the F-ness of a whole is due to the F-ness of its parts (e.g., 435d–436a). Again, at times Socrates seems to say that these grounds are strong enough to permit a deductive inference: if a city’s F-ness is such-and-such, then a person’s F-ness must be such-and-such (e.g., 441c). At other times, Socrates would prefer to use the F-ness of the city as a heuristic for locating F-ness in persons (e.g., 368e–369a). Plato is surely right to think that there is some interesting and non-accidental relation between the structural features and values of society and the psychological features and values of persons, but there is much controversy about whether this relation really is strong enough to sustain all of the claims that Socrates makes for it in the Republic (Williams 1973, Lear 1992, Smith 1999, Ferrari 2003).

Still, the Republic primarily requires an answer to Glaucon and Adeimantus’ question, and that answer does not depend logically on any strong claims for the analogy between cities and persons. Rather, it depends upon a persuasive account of justice as a personal virtue, and persuasive reasons why one is always happier being just than unjust. So we can turn to these issues before returning to Socrates’ remarks about the successful city.

2. Ethics, Part One: What Justice Is

2.1 Human Motivations

Socrates seeks to define justice as one of the cardinal human virtues, and he understands the virtues as states of the soul. So his account of what justice is depends upon his account of the human soul.

According to the Republic, every human soul has three parts: reason, spirit, and appetite. (This is a claim about the embodied soul. In Book Ten, Socrates argues that the soul is immortal (608c–611a) and says that the disembodied soul might be simple (611a–612a), though he declines to insist on this (612a) and the Timaeus and Phaedrus apparently disagree on the question.) At first blush, the tripartition can suggest a division into beliefs, emotions, and desires. But Socrates explicitly ascribes beliefs, emotions, and desires to each part of the soul (Moline 1978). In fact, it is not even clear that Plato would recognize psychological attitudes that are supposed to be representational without also being affective and conative, or conative and affective without also being representational. Consequently, ‘belief’ and ‘desire’ in translations or discussions of Plato (including this one) must be handled with care; they should not be understood along Humean lines as motivationally inert representations, on the one hand, and non-cognitive motivators, on the other.

The Republic offers two general reasons for the tripartition. First, Socrates argues that we cannot coherently explain certain cases of psychological conflict unless we suppose that there are at least two parts to the soul. The core of this argument is what we might call the principle of non-opposition: “the same thing will not be willing to do or undergo opposites in the same respect, in relation to the same thing, at the same time” (436b8–9). This is a perfectly general metaphysical principle, comparable to Aristotle’s principle of non-contradiction (Metaphysics G3 1005b19–20). Because of this principle, Socrates insists that one soul cannot be the subject of opposing attitudes unless one of three conditions is met. One soul can be the subject of opposing attitudes if the attitudes oppose each other at different times, even in rapidly alternating succession (as Hobbes explains mental conflict). One soul can also be the subject of opposing attitudes if the attitudes relate to different things, as a desire to drink champagne and a desire to drink a martini might conflict. Last, one soul can be the subject of opposing attitudes if the attitudes oppose in different respects.

Initially, this third condition is obscure. The way Socrates handles putative counter-examples to the principle of non-opposition (at 436c–e) might suggest that when one thing experiences one opposite in one of its parts and another in another, it is not experiencing opposites in different respects (Stalley 1975; Bobonich 2002, 228–31; Lorenz 2006, 23–24). That would entail, apparently, that it is not one thing experiencing opposites at all, but merely a plurality. But Socrates later rewords the principle of non-opposition’s “same respect” condition as a “same part” condition (439b), which explicitly allows one thing to experience one opposite in one of its parts and another in another. The most natural way of relating these two articulations of the principle is to suppose that experiencing one opposite in one part and another in another is just one way to experience opposites in different respects. But however we relate the two articulations to each other, Socrates clearly concludes that one soul can experience simultaneously opposing attitudes in relation to the same thing, but only if different parts of it are the direct subjects of the opposing attitudes.

Socrates employs this general strategy four times. In Book Four, he twice considers conflicting attitudes about what to do. First, he imagines a desire to drink being opposed by a calculated consideration that it would be good not to drink (439a–d). (We might think, anachronistically, of someone about to undergo surgery.) This is supposed to establish a distinction between appetite and reason. Then he considers cases like that of Leontius, who became angry with himself for desiring to ogle corpses (439e–440b). These cases are supposed to establish a distinction between appetite and spirit. In Book Ten, Socrates appeals to the principle of non-opposition when considering the decent man who has recently lost a son and is conflicted about grieving (603e–604b) (cf. Austin 2016) and when considering conflicting attitudes about how things appear to be (602c–603b) (cf. Moss 2008 and Singpurwalla 2011). These show a broad division between reason and an inferior part of the soul (Ganson 2009); it is compatible with a further distinction between two inferior parts, spirit and appetite.

Socrates’ arguments from psychological conflict are well-tailored to explain akrasia (weakness of will) (Penner 1990, Bobonich 1994, Carone 2001). In the Protagoras, Socrates denies that anyone willingly does other than what she believes to be best, but in the Republic, the door is opened for a person to act on an appetitive attitude that conflicts with a rational attitude for what is best. How far the door is open to akrasia awaits further discussion below. For now, there are other more pressing questions about the Republic’s explanation of psychological conflict.

First, what kinds of parts are reason, spirit, and appetite? Some scholars believe that they are merely conceptual parts, akin to subsets of a set (Shields 2001, Price 2009). They would object to characterizing the parts as subjects of psychological attitudes. But the arguments from conflict treat reason, spirit, and appetite as distinct subjects of psychological states and events, and it seems best to take Socrates’ descriptions at face value unless there is compelling reason not to (Kamtekar 2006). At face value, Socrates offers a more robust conception of parts, wherein each part is like an independent agent.

Indeed, this notion of parts is robust enough to make one wonder why reason, spirit, and appetite are parts at all, as opposed to three independent subjects. But the Republic proceeds as though every embodied human being has just one soul that comprises three parts. No embodied soul is perfectly unified: even the virtuous person, who makes her soul into a unity as much as she can (443c–e), has three parts in her soul. (She must, as we shall see, in order to be just.) But every embodied soul enjoys an unearned unity: every human’s reason, spirit, and appetite constitute a single soul that is the unified source of that human’s life and is a unified locus of responsibility for that human’s thoughts and actions. (It is not as though a person is held responsible for what his reason does but not for what his appetite does.) There are questions about what exactly explains this unearned unity of the soul (see E. Brown 2012).

There are also questions about whether the arguments from conflict establish exactly three parts of the soul (and see Whiting 2012). Some worry that the discussion of Leontius does not warrant the recognition of a third part of the soul (but see Brennan 2012), and some worry that the appetitive part contains such a multitude of attitudes that it must be subject to further conflicts and further partitioning (and see 443e with Kamtekar 2008). Answering these questions requires us to characterize more precisely the kind of opposition that forces partitioning , in accordance with the principle of non-opposition (compare Reeve 1988, 124–31; Irwin 1995, 203–17; Price 1995, 46–48; and Lorenz 2006, 13–52), and to examine more carefully the broader features being attributed to the three parts of the soul (on appetite, e.g., compare Bobonich 2002, Lorenz 2006, and Moss 2008).

Fortunately, the arguments from conflict do not work alone. Indeed, they cannot, as the principle of non-opposition merely establishes a constraint on successful psychological explanations. Appeals to this principle can show where some division must exist, but they do not by themselves characterize the parts so divided. So, already in Book Four’s arguments from conflict, Socrates invokes broader patterns of psychology and appeals to the parts to explain these patterns (cf. 435d–436b).

This appeal to reason, spirit, and appetite to explain broader patterns of human thought and action constitutes the Republic’s second general strategy to support tripartition. It receives its fullest development in Books Eight and Nine, where Socrates uses his theory of the tripartite soul to explain a variety of psychological constitutions. In the most basic implementation of this strategy, Socrates distinguishes people ruled by reason, those ruled by spirit, and those ruled by appetite (580d–581e, esp. 581c): the first love wisdom and truth, the second love victory and honor, and the third profit and money. This simplistic division, it might be noted in passing, fixes the sides for an ongoing debate about whether it is best to be a philosopher, a politician, or an epicure (see, e.g., Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics I 5 and X 6–8). But more important for our purposes here, this basic classification greatly illuminates the division of the soul.

First, we learn about the organizing aims of each of the psychological parts (Cooper 1984, Kahn 1987, Reeve 1988, Moss 2005). In Book Four, reason is characterized by its ability to track what is good for each part and the soul as a whole (441e, 442c). In Book Nine, reason is characterized by its desire for wisdom. These are not bifurcated aims. Socrates argues that people are not satisfied merely with what they take to be good for themselves but want what is in fact good for them (505d). So reason naturally pursues not just what it takes to be good for the whole soul but also the wisdom that ensures that it would get this right. Nor is wisdom’s value merely instrumental to discovering what is good for one. If wisdom is a fundamental constituent of virtue and virtue is a fundamental constituent of what is good for a human being, then wisdom turns out to be a fundamental constituent of what is good for a human being. So it should not be surprising that the part of the soul that tracks and pursues what is good for the whole soul also loves wisdom. Spirit, by contrast, tracks social preeminence and honor. If ‘good’ is the organizing predicate for rational attitudes, ‘honorable’ or ‘fine’ (Greek kalon) is the organizing predicate for spirited attitudes (Singpurwalla 2013). Finally, appetite seeks material satisfaction for bodily urges, and because money better than anything else provides this, people ruled by appetite often come to love money above all.

The basic division of the world into philosophers, honor-lovers, and money-lovers also illuminates what Socrates means by talking of being ruled by one part of the soul. If one part dominates in you, then aims of that part are your aims. If, for example, you are ruled by spirit, then your reason conceives of your good in terms of what is honorable. Reason has its own aim, to get what is in fact good for the whole soul, but in a soul perfectly ruled by spirit, where there are no genuine psychological conflicts between different parts, reason’s love for truth and wisdom must be limited to that which is also held to be honorable.

Still, Plato’s full psychological theory is much more complicated than the basic division of persons would suggest. First, there are different kinds of appetitive attitudes (558d–559c, 571a–572b): some are necessary for human beings; some are unnecessary but regulable (“lawful”), and some are unnecessary and entirely uncontrollable (“lawless”). So there are in fact five kinds of pure psychological constitutions: aristocratically constituted persons (those ruled by their rational attitudes), timocratically constituted persons (those ruled by their spirited attitudes), oligarchically constituted persons (ruled by necessary appetitive attitudes), democratically constituted persons (ruled by unnecessary appetitive attitudes), and tyrannically constituted persons (ruled by lawless appetitive attitudes). The first three of these constitutions are characteristically ordered toward simple aims (wisdom, honor, and money, respectively), but the last two are not so ordered, because there is no simple aim of the unnecessary appetites, be they lawful or lawless. In effect, the democratic and tyrannical souls treat desire-satisfaction itself and the pleasure associated with it as their end. The democrat treats all desires and pleasures as equally valuable and restricts herself to lawful desires, but the tyrant embraces disordered, lawless desires and has a special passion for the apparently most intense, bodily pleasures (cf. Scott 2000, Johnstone 2013, and Johnstone 2015).

The second complication is that some people are not perfectly ruled by one part of the soul, but are subject to continuing conflicts between, say, attitudes in favor of doing what is honorable and appetitive attitudes in favor of pursuing a shameful tryst. Socrates does not concentrate on these people, nor does he say how common they are. But he does acknowledge their existence (544c–d, cf. 445c). Moreover, the occurrence of akrasia would seem to require their existence. For if I am perfectly ruled by my spirit, then I take my good to be what is honorable, and how could I be akratic? My spirit and my reason are in line, so there will be no overpowering of rational preferences about what is best by spirit. You might suppose that my appetite could overcome my sense of what is honorable, but in that case, it would seem that I am not, after all, perfectly ruled by my spirit. Things might seem different with people ruled by their appetite. Certainly, if I were perfectly ruled by appetite, then I would be susceptible to akrasia of the impetuous sort, acting on appetitive desires without reflectively endorsing them as good. But impetuous akrasia is quite distinct from the standard akrasia in which I endorse φing as best for me and at just that moment intentionally ψ instead, and standard akrasia would seem to be impossible in any soul that is perfectly ruled by any one part of the soul. If you think that competing appetitive attitudes could give rise to a strict case of standard akrasia, you should recall how Socrates would have to explain these cases of psychological conflict in order to avoid multiplying his divisions in the soul.

The general strategy of the Republic’s psychology—to explain human thought and action by reference to subpersonal homunculi—remains both appealing and problematic (Burnyeat 2006). Moreover, the dialogue is filled with pointed observations and fascinating speculations about human psychology. Some of them pull us up short, as, for example, the Freudian recognition of Oedipal desires that come out only in dreams (571c–d). The full theory is complex, and there remain numerous questions about many of its details.

Fortunately, these questions do not have to be settled here for us to entertain Socrates’ response to Glaucon and Adeimantus’ challenge. Indeed, although his response builds closely on the psychological theory, some broad features of the response could be accepted even by those who reject the tripartite psychology.

2.2 Introducing Virtuous Motivations

In Book Four, Socrates defines each of the cardinal virtues in terms of the complicated psychology he has just sketched. A person is wise just in case her rational attitudes are functioning well, so that her rational part “has in it the knowledge of what is advantageous for each part [of the soul] and for the whole in common of the three parts” (442c5–8). So the unwise person has a faulty conception of what is good for him. A person is courageous just in case her spirited attitudes do not change in the face of pains and pleasures but stay in agreement with what is rationally recognized as fearsome and not (442bc). So the coward will, in the face of prospective pains, fail to bear up to what he rationally believes is not genuinely fearsome, and the rash person will, in the face of prospective pleasures, rush headlong into what he rationally believes to be fearsome. A person is temperate or moderate just in case the different parts of her soul are in agreement. So the intemperate person has appetitive or spirited attitudes in competition with the rational attitudes, appetitive or spirited attitudes other than those the rational attitudes deem to be good. Finally, a person is just just in case all three parts of her soul are functioning as they should (441d12–e2; cf. 443c9–e2). Justice, then, requires the other virtues. So the unjust person fails to be moderate, or fails to be wise, or fails to be courageous.

Actually, the relation among the virtues seems tighter than that, for it seems that the unjust person necessarily fails to be wise, courageous, and temperate (cf. Cooper 1998). You might try to deny this. You might say that a person could be courageous—with spirited attitudes that track perfectly what the rational attitudes say is fearsome and not, in the face of any pleasures and pains—but still be unjust insofar has her rational attitudes are inadequately developed, failing to know what really is fearsome. But Socrates seems to balk at this possibility by contrasting the civically courageous whose spirit preserves law-inculcated beliefs about what is fearsome and not and the genuinely courageous in whom, presumably, spirit preserves knowledge about what is fearsome and not (430a–c). So you might say instead that a person could be moderate—utterly without appetitive attitudes at odds with what his rational attitudes say is good for him—but still be unjust insofar as his rational attitudes are inadequately developed and fail to know what really is good. But this picture of a meek, but moderate soul seems to sell short the requirements of moderation, which are not merely that there be no insurrections in the soul but also that there be agreement that the rational attitudes should rule. This would seem to require that there actually be appetitive attitudes that are in agreement with the rational attitudes’ conception of what is good, which would in turn require that the rational attitudes be sufficiently strong to have a developed conception of what is good. Moreover, it would seem to require that the rational attitudes which endorse ruling be ruling, which would in turn require that the rational attitudes are at least on the path toward determining what really is good for the person. If these considerations are correct, then the unjust are lacking in virtue tout court, whereas the just possess all of the virtues.

After sketching these four virtues in Book Four, Socrates is ready to move from considering what justice is in a person to why a person should be just (444e). But this is premature. Socrates is moving to show that it is always better to have a just soul, but he was asked to show that it is always better to be the person who does just actions. We might doubt that an answer concerning psychological justice is relevant to the question concerning practical justice (Sachs 1963).

It is easy to misstate this objection (Demos 1964, Dahl 1991). The problem is not that the question is about justice as it is ordinarily understood and Socrates is failing to address conventional justice. Neither the question nor the answer is bound to how justice is ordinarily understood, given what happened in Book One. Moreover, the problem is not that Socrates’ answer is relevant only if the class of the psychologically just and the class of the practically just are coextensive. That would require Socrates to show that everyone who acts justly has a just soul, and Socrates quite reasonably shows no inclination for that thesis. (Some people do what is right for the wrong reasons.) He may have to establish some connection between doing just actions and becoming psychologically just if he is to give reasons to those who are not yet psychologically just to do just actions, but an account of habituation would be enough to do this (cf. 443e, 444c–d).

The real problem raised by the objection is this: how can Socrates justify the claim that people with just souls are practically just? First, he must be able to show that the psychologically just refrain from injustice, and second, he must be able to show that the psychologically just do what is required by justice. The first point receives a gesture when Socrates is trying to secure the claim that harmonious functioning of the whole soul really deserves to be called justice (442e–443a), but he offers no real argument. Perhaps the best we can do on his behalf is to insist that the first point is not a thesis for argument but a bold empirical hypothesis. On this view, it is simply an empirical question whether all those who have the motivations to do unjust things happen to have souls that are out of balance, and an army of psychologists would be needed to answer the question.

That might seem bad enough, but the second point does not even receive a gesture. There is no denying the presence of this second requirement on the grounds that justice is a matter of refraining from harm (“negative duties”) and not of helping others (“positive duties”). Socrates does not criticize the Book One suggestion that justice requires helping friends (332a ff.); he and his interlocutors agree that justice requires respect for parents and care for the gods (443a); and they treat the principle that each should do his job (and thereby contribute to the city) as the image of justice (443c). So according to Plato’s Republic justice includes both negative and positive duties.

Before we can consider Socrates’ answer to the question of the Republic, we must have reason to accept that those who have harmonious souls do what is required by justice. Otherwise, we cannot be sure that psychological harmony is justice. Unfortunately, Socrates does not give any explicit attention to this worry at the end of Book Four or in the argument of Books Eight and Nine. But there are other places to look for a solution to this worry. First, we might look to Books Five through Seven. Second, we might look to Books Two and Three.

2.3 Perfectly Virtuous Motivations

In Book Four Socrates says that the just person is wise and thus knows what is good for him, but he does not say anything about what knowledge or the good is. In Books Five through Seven he clearly addresses these issues and fills out his account of virtue. He shows, in sum, that one is virtuous if and only if one is a philosopher, for he adds to Book Four’s insistence that virtue requires knowledge the new claim that only philosophers have knowledge (esp. 474b–480a). His account also opens the possibility that knowledge of the good provides the crucial link between psychological justice and just actions.

The philosophers are initially distinguished from non-philosophers because they answer questions like ‘What is beautiful?’ by identifying the imperceptible property (form) of beauty instead of some perceptible property or particulars (474b–480a). Socrates does not name any philosophers who can knowledgeably answer questions like that. In fact, his account of how philosophers would be educated in the ideal city suggests that the ability to give knowledgeable answers requires an enormous amount of (largely mathematical) learning in advance of the questions themselves (521b–540a). How would this mathematical learning and knowledge of forms affect one’s motivations?

One effect can be found by interpreting the form of the good that the philosopher comes to grasp, since this should shape the philosopher’s rational conception of what is good for her. The form of the good is a shadowy presence in the Republic, lurking behind the images of the Sun, Line, and Cave. But it is clear enough that Socrates takes goodness to be unity (Hitchcock 1985). He explicitly emphasizes that a virtuous person makes himself a unity (443c–e) and insists that a city is made good by being made a unity (462a–b). The assumption that goodness is unity also explains why mathematics is so important to the ascent to the good (through mathematics an account of the one over the many is learned) (cf. Burnyeat 2000), why the good is superior to other forms (the good is the unity or coherence of them, and not another alongside them), why the other forms are good (by being part of the unified or coherent order), and why goodness secures the intelligibility of the other forms (they are fully known teleologically). (It also comports with the evidence concerning Plato’s lecture on the good (e.g., Aristoxenus, Elementa Harmonica II 1; cf. Aristotle Eudemian Ethics 1218a20 and Metaphysics 988a8–16 and b10–15.) So the philosophers, by grasping the form of the good, will recognize goodness in themselves as the unity in their souls. They will see that the harmony or coherence of their psychological attitudes makes them good, that each of their attitudes is good insofar as it is part of a coherent set, and that their actions are good insofar as they sustain the unity in their souls (cf. 443e).

But there are other ways in which mathematical learning and knowledge of forms might affect one’s motivations. Socrates suggests one way when he says that a philosopher will aspire to imitate the harmony among the forms (500b–d). Some scholars have understood Socrates to be saying that philosophers will desire to reproduce this order by cultivating more order and virtue in the world, as Diotima suggests in the Symposium (Irwin 1995, 298–317; cf. Waterlow 1972–1973, Cooper 1977, Kraut 1991). On this reading, knowledge of the forms motivates just actions that help other people, which helps to solve the standing worry about the relation between psychological justice and practical justice.

Unfortunately, it is far from obvious that this is what Socrates means. He does not actually say in the Republic that knowledge of the forms freely motivates beneficence. In fact, he says eight times that the philosophers in the ideal city will have to be compelled to rule and do their part in sustaining the perfectly just city (473d4, 500d4, 519e4, 520a8, 520e2, 521b7, 539e3, 540b5). It is possible to understand this compulsion as the constraint of justice: the philosophers rule because justice demands that they rule. But Socrates himself suggests a different way of characterizing the compulsion. He suggests that the compulsion comes from a law that requires those who are educated to be philosophers to rule. Moreover, this characterization better fits Socrates’ insistence that the philosophers are the best rulers because they prefer not to rule even while they are ruling (520e–521b, with 519c and 540b). For on this account, the philosophers’ justice alone does not motivate them to rule; rather, their justice motivates them to obey the law, which justly compels them to rule (E. Brown 2000).

There is another reason to worry about explaining just actions by the motivating power of knowledge. If the philosophers are motivated to do what is just by their knowledge of the forms, then there would seem to be an enormous gap between philosophers and non-philosophers. In addition to the epistemic gap—the philosophers have knowledge and the non-philosophers do not—we have a motivational gap: the philosophers’ knowledge gives them motivations to do what is required by justice, and the non-philosophers are not similarly motivated. This gap suggests some rather unpalatable conclusions about the character of non-philosophers’ lives even in the ideal city, and it also sits poorly with Socrates’ evident desire to take the philosophers’ justice as a paradigm that can be usefully approximated by non-philosophers (472c–d).

2.4 Imperfectly Virtuous Motivations

Socrates’ long discussion in Books Two and Three of how to educate the guardians for the ideal city offers a different approach (E. Brown 2004, Singpurwalla 2006; cf. Gill 1985, Kamtekar 1998, and Scott 1999). This education is most often noted for its carefully censored “reading list;” the young guardians-to-be will not be exposed to inappropriate images of gods and human beings. Less often noted is how optimistic Socrates is about the results of a sufficiently careful education. A well-trained guardian will “praise fine things, be pleased by them, receive them into his soul, and, being nurtured by them, become fine and good,” and each will “rightly object to what is shameful, hating it while he’s still young and unable to grasp the reason” (401e4–402a2; cf. 441e). Note that Socrates has the young guardians not only responding to good things as honorable (with spirited attitudes), but also becoming fine and good. Moreover, Socrates is confident that the spirited guardians are stably good: when he is describing the possibility of civic courage in Book Four, he suggests that proper education can stain the spirited part of the soul with the right dispositions so deeply that they will be preserved “through everything” (429b8, 429c8, 430b2–3).

This optimism suggests that the motivations to do what is right are acquired early in moral education, built into a soul that might become, eventually, perfectly just. And this in turn suggests one reason why Socrates might have skipped the question of why the psychologically just can be relied upon to do what is right. Socrates might assume that anyone who is psychologically just must have been raised well, and that anyone who has been raised well will do what is right. So understood, early childhood education, and not knowledge of the forms, links psychological justice and just action.

Of course, there are questions about how far Socrates could extend this optimism about imperfect virtue among non-philosophers. Perhaps honor-loving members of the auxiliary class have psychological harmony secured by their consistent attachment to what they have learned is honorable, but what about the members of the producing class? Can their attachment to the satisfaction of bodily desires be educated in such a way that they enjoy, in optimal social circumstances, a well-ordered soul? Do they even receive a primary education in the ideal city? These questions will be considered more fully below (and see Wilberding 2012 and Wilburn 2014).

Open questions aside, it should be clear that there are two general ways of linking psychological justice to just action: one that depends upon the motivational power of knowledge in particular and the other that depends upon the early training of a wide range of attitudes in the young. If one of these ways works, then Socrates is entitled to argue that it is always better to be just than unjust by showing why it is always better to have a harmonious soul.

3. Ethics, Part Two: Why a Person should be Just

3.1 Psychological Health

It is possible to find in the Republic as many as five separate arguments for the claim that it is better to be just than unjust, without regard to how other people and gods perceive us. The first appeals to an analogy between psychological health and physical health in Book Four (445a–b). The second, third, and fourth are what Socrates calls his three “proofs” in Books Eight and Nine (543c–580c, esp. 576b–580c; 580c–583a; 583b–588a). And the fifth is the image of the human soul consisting of a little human being (reason), a lion (spirit), and a many-headed beast (appetite) (588b ff.). Yet the first of these is interrupted and said in Book Eight to be continuous with the first “proof” of Books Eight and Nine (543c), and the last of them seems to be offered as a closing exhortation. This whittling leaves us with the three arguments that Socrates labels his “proofs” (580c9, cf. 583b), the first discussing psychological health and disease at length and the second and third concerning pleasure.

Already in Book Four, Glaucon is ready to declare that unjust souls are ruined and in turmoil. But Socrates presses for a fuller reckoning. When he finally resumes in Book Eight where he had left off in Book Four, Socrates offers a long account of four defective psychological types. The list is not exhaustive (544cd, cf. 445c), but it captures the four imperfect kinds of pure psychological constitutions: pure rule by spirited attitudes, pure rule by necessary appetitive attitudes, pure rule by unnecessary but regulable appetitive attitudes, and pure rule by lawless appetitive attitudes. At the end of this long discussion, Socrates will again ask which sort of person lives the best life: the aristocratic soul of Books Six and Seven, or one of the other souls of Books Eight and Nine?

We might expect Socrates and Glaucon to argue carefully by elimination, showing the just life to be better than every sort of unjust life. But they do not. Instead, they quickly contrast the tyrannical soul with the aristocratic soul, the most unjust with the most just. This might seem to pick up on Glaucon’s original demand (in Book Two) to see how the perfectly just—who is most unfortunate but still just—is better than the perfectly unjust—who is unjust but still esteemed. But it does not even do that, since Socrates is very far from portraying the best soul in the least favorable circumstances and the worst soul in the most favorable circumstances. Nevertheless, Socrates’ limited comparison in Book Nine might provide the resources to explain why it is better to be the unluckiest philosopher than the luckiest tyrant and why it is better to be just than to be unjust in any way whatsoever, for it might provide general lessons that apply to these other comparisons.

Socrates and Glaucon characterize the person ruled by his lawless attitudes as enslaved, as least able to do what it wants, as full of disorder and regret, as poor and unsatisfiable, and as fearful (577c–578a). These characterizations fit in a logical order. The tyrant is enslaved because he is ruled by an utterly unlimited appetite, which prompts in him appetitive desire whenever any chance object of appetite presents itself to his consideration. Given this condition, he experiences appetitive desires that he cannot satisfy, either because they are too difficult for him to satisfy or because satisfying them would prevent satisfying other of his desires. His experience of unsatisfied desires must make him wish that he could satisfy them and feel poor and unsatisfiable because he cannot. Worse, because his unsatisfied appetitive desires continue to press for satisfaction over time, they make him aware of his past inability to to do what he wants, which prompts regret, and of his likely future inability to do what he wants, which makes him fearful. The result is a miserable existence, and the misery is rooted in unlimited attitudes that demand more satisfaction than a person can achieve. In a nutshell, the tyrant lacks the capacity to do what he wants to do.

The philosopher, by contrast, is most able to do what she wants to do, for she wants to do what is best, and as long as one has agency, there would seem to be a doable best. (Should circumstances make a certain apparent best undoable, then it would no longer appear to be best.) But this is not to say that the philosopher is guaranteed to be able to do what she wants. First, Socrates is quite clear that some appetitive attitudes are necessary, and one can well imagine circumstances of extreme deprivation in which the necessary appetitive attitudes (for food or drink, say) are unsatisfiable. Second, the capacity to do what is best might require engaging in certain kinds of activities in order to maintain itself. So even if the philosopher can satisfy her necessary appetitive attitudes, she might be prevented by unfortunate circumstances from the sorts of regular thought and action that are required to hold onto the capacity to do what is best. Thus, even if a philosophical soul is most able to do what it wants, and the closest thing to a sure bet for this capacity, it does not retain this ability in every circumstance.

This comparison between the tyrannical soul and the philosophical soul does all the work that Socrates needs if the capacity to do what one wants correlates closely with human success or happiness and if the lessons about the tyrant’s incapacity generalize to the other defective psychological constitutions.

Socrates does not need happiness to be the capacity to do what one wants, or the absence of regret, frustration, and fear. He could continue to think, as he thought in Book One, that happiness is virtuous activity (354a). But if his argument here works, happiness, whatever it is, must require the capacity to do what one wants and be inconsistent with regret, frustration, and fear.

How does the argument apply to unjust people who are not psychologically tyrannical? Anyone who is not a philosopher either has a divided soul or is ruled by spirit or appetite. Division in the soul plainly undercuts the ability to do what one wants. Can one seek honor or money above all and do what one wants? Although the ability to do what is honorable or make money is not as flexible as the ability to do what is best, it is surely possible, in favorable circumstances, for someone to be consistently able to do what is honorable or money-making. This will not work if the agent is conflicted about what is honorable or makes money. So he needs to be carefully educated, and he needs limited options. But if he does enjoy adequate education and an orderly social environment, there is no reason to suppose that he could not escape being racked by regret, frustration, or fear. This explains how the members of the lower classes in Socrates’ ideal city—who are probably not best identified as the timocrats and oligarchs of Book Eight (Wilberding 2009 and Jeon 2014)—can have a kind of capacity to do what they want, even though they are slavishly dependent upon the rulers’ work (cf. 590c–d).

The characterization of appropriately ruled non-philosophers as slavish might suggest a special concern for the “heteronomous” character of their capacity to do what they want and a special valorization of the philosophers’ “autonomous” capacity. But we should be hesitant about applying these frequently confused and possibly anachronistic concepts to the Republic. Plato would probably prefer to think in terms of self-sufficiency (369b), and for the purposes of Socrates’ argument here, it is enough to contrast the way a producer’s capacity is deeply dependent upon social surroundings and the way a philosopher’s capacity is relatively free from this dependence, once it has been cultivated.

This contrast must not be undersold, for it is plausible to think that the self-sufficiency of the philosopher makes him better off. Appropriately ruled non-philosophers can enjoy the capacity to do what they want only so long as their circumstances are appropriately ruled, and this makes their success far less stable than what the philosophers enjoy. Things in the world tend to change, and the philosopher is in a much better position to flourish through these changes. Those of us living in imperfect cities, looking to the Republic for a model of how to live (cf. 592b), need to emulate the philosopher in order to pursue stable, reliable success or happiness.

Nevertheless, so far as this argument shows, the success or happiness of appropriately ruled non-philosophers is just as real as that of philosophers. Judged exclusively by the capacity to do what one wants and the presence or absence of regret, frustration, and fear, philosophers are not better off than very fortunate non-philosophers. (The non-philosophers have to be so fortunate that they do not even recognize any risk to their good fortune. Otherwise, they would fear a change in their luck.) The philosopher’s success is more secure than the non-philosopher’s, but if it is also better as success than the non-philosopher’s, Socrates’ first argument does not show that it is. (See also Kenny 1969 and Kraut 1992.)

Socrates needs further argument in any case if he wants to convince those of us in imperfect circumstances (like Glaucon and Adeimantus) to pursue the philosophical life of perfect justice. The first argument tries to show that anyone who wants to satisfy her desires perfectly should cultivate certain kinds of desires rather than others. We can reject this argument in either of two ways, by taking issue with his analysis of which desires are regularly satisfiable and which are not, or by explaining why a person should not want to satisfy her desires perfectly. The first response calls for a quasi-empirical investigation of a difficult sort, but the second seems easy. We can just argue that a good human life must be subject to regret and loss. Of course, it is not enough to say that the human condition is in fact marked by regret and loss. There is no inconsistency in maintaining that one should aim at a secure life in order to live the best possible human life while also realizing that the best possible human life will be marked by insecurity. In fact, one might even think that the proper experience of fragility requires attachment to security as one’s end. Instead, to reject Socrates’ argument, we must show that it is wrong to aim at a life that is free of regret and loss: we must show that the pursuit of security leads one to reject certain desires that one should not reject. In this way, we move beyond a discussion of which desires are satisfiable, and we tackle the question about the value of what is desired and the value of the desiring itself. To address this possible objection, Socrates needs to give us a different argument.

3.2 Pleasure

This explains why Socrates does not stop after offering his first “proof.” Many readers are puzzled about why he offers two more. After all, the geometer does not need to offer multiple proofs of his theorem. What might seem worse, the additional proofs concern pleasure, and thereby introduce—seemingly at the eleventh hour—a heap of new considerations for the ethics of the Republic. But as the considerations at the end of the previous section show, these pleasure proofs are crucial.

Plato merely dramatizes these considerations. Socrates has offered not merely to demonstrate that it is always better to be just than unjust but to persuade Glaucon and Adeimantus (but especially Glaucon: see, e.g., 327a, 357a–b, 368c) of this claim. Insofar as Glaucon shows sympathy for spirited attitudes (372d with the discussion in section 4.1 below, and cf. 548d), his attachment to these attitudes could survive the realization that they are far from perfectly satisfiable. He may say, “I can see the point of perfectly satisfiable attitudes, but those attitudes (and their objects) are not as good as my less-than-perfectly satisfiable attitudes (and their objects).” Glaucon needs to be shown that the rewards of carrying insecure attitudes do not make up for the insecurity.

The additional proofs serve a second purpose, as well. At the end of Book Five, Socrates says that faculties (at least psychological faculties) are distinguished by their results (their rate of success) and by their objects (what they concern) (477c–d). So far, he has discussed only the success-rates of various kinds of psychological attitudes. He needs to discuss the objects of various kinds of psychological attitudes in order to complete his account. If we did not have the discussion of the second proof, in particular, we would have an incomplete picture of the Republic’s moral psychology.

The two arguments that Socrates proceeds to make are frustratingly difficult (see Gosling and Taylor 1982, Nussbaum 1986, Russell 2005, Moss 2006, Warren 2014, Shaw 2016). They are very quick, and though they concern “pleasures,” Socrates never says exactly what pleasure is. (At one point (585d11), the now-standard translation of the Republic by Grube and Reeve suggests that “being filled with what is appropriate to our nature is pleasure,” but it is better to read less into the Greek by rendering the clause “being filled with what is appropriate to our nature is pleasant.”) The first argument suggests that pleasures might be activities of a certain kind, but the remarkably abstract second argument does not provide any special support to that suggestion. Even if a convincing account of how Plato wants us to conceive of pleasure in the Republic is wanting, however, we can get a grasp on the form of the two “pleasure proofs.”

The first is an appeal to authority, in four easy steps. First, Socrates suggests that just as each part of the soul has its own characteristic desires and pleasures, so persons have characteristic desires and pleasures depending upon which part of their soul rules them. The characteristic pleasure of philosophers is learning. The characteristic pleasure of honor-lovers is being honored. The characteristic pleasure of money-lovers is making money. Next, Socrates suggests that each of these three different kinds of person would say that her own pleasure is best. So, third, to decide which pleasure really is best, we need to determine which sort of person’s judgment is best, and Socrates suggests that whoever has the most reason, experience, and argument is the best judge. Finally, Socrates argues that the philosopher is better than the honor-lover and the money-lover in reason, experience, and argument.

It is sometimes thought that the philosopher cannot be better off in experience, for the philosopher has never lived as an adult who is fully committed to the pleasures of the money-lover. But this point does not disable Socrates’ argument. The philosopher does not have exactly the experience that the money-lover has, but the philosopher has far more experience of the money-lover’s pleasures than the money-lover has of the philosopher’s pleasures. The comparative judgment is enough to secure Socrates’ conclusion: because the philosopher is a better judge than the others, the philosopher’s judgment has a better claim on the truth.

But this first proof does not explain why the distinction in pleasures is made; the appeal to the philosopher’s authority as a judge gives no account of the philosopher’s reasons for her judgment. Moreover, the first pleasure proof does not say that the philosopher’s pleasures are vastly superior to those of the money-lover and the honor-lover. So Glaucon—or anyone else tempted to avoid the mathematical studies of Book Seven—might think that the superiority of the philosopher’s psychological justice is slight, and given the disrepute heaped on the philosophers (487a ff.), Glaucon or anyone else might decide that the less-than-perfectly just life is better overall. Socrates needs to show that the philosopher’s activities are vastly better than the non-philosopher’s activities in order to answer the challenge originally put forth in Book Two by Glaucon and Adeimantus. So it is for very good reason that Socrates proceeds to offer a second pleasure proof that he promises to be the “greatest and most decisive overthrow” for the unjust (583b6–7).

Socrates’ final argument moves in three broad steps. The first establishes that pleasure and pain are not exhaustive contradictories but opposites, separated by a calm middle that is neither pain nor pleasure. This may sometimes seem false. The removal of pain can seem to be pleasant, and the removal of a pleasure can seem to be painful. But Socrates argues that these appearances are deceptive. He distinguishes between pleasures that fill a lack and thereby replace a pain (these are not genuine pleasures) and those that do not fill a lack and thereby replace a pain (these are genuine pleasures). The second step in the argument is to establish that most bodily pleasures—and the most intense of these—fill a painful lack and are not genuine pleasures. Finally, Socrates argues that the philosopher’s pleasures do not fill a painful lack and are genuine pleasures. Contra the epicure’s assumption, the philosopher’s pleasures are more substantial than pleasures of the flesh.

The pleasure proofs tempt some readers to suppose that Socrates must have a hedonistic conception of happiness. After all, he claims to have shown that the just person is happier than the unjust (580a–c), and he says that his pleasure arguments are proofs of the same claim (580c–d, 583b). But these arguments can work just as the first proof works: Socrates can suppose that happiness, whatever it is, is marked by pleasure (just as it is marked by the absence of regret, frustration, and fear). This is not to say that one should take pleasure to be one’s goal any more than it is to say that one should pursue fearlessness as one’s goal. Pleasure is a misleading guide (see 581c–d and 603c), and there are many false, self-undermining routes to pleasure (and fearlessness).

Socrates’ indirect approach concerning happiness (cf. section 1.2 above) makes sense if he thinks that justice (being just, acting justly) is happiness (being happy, living well) (354a). Anyone inclined to doubt that one should always be just would be inclined to doubt that justice is happiness. So Socrates has to appeal to characteristics of happiness that do not, in his view, capture what happiness is, in the hope that the skeptics might agree that happiness correlates with the absence of regret, frustration, and fear and the presence of pleasure. That would be enough for the proofs.

Even at the end of his three “proofs,” Socrates knows that he cannot yet have fully persuaded Glaucon and Adeimantus that it is always better to be just than unjust. Their beliefs and desires have been stained too deeply by a world filled with mistakes, especially by the misleading tales of the poets. To turn Glaucon and Adeimantus more fully toward virtue, Socrates needs to undercut their respect for the poets, and he needs to begin to stain their souls anew. But Socrates’ theoretical arguments on behalf of justice are finished. The work that remains to be done—especially the sketch of a soul at the end of Book Nine and the myth of an afterlife in Book Ten—should deepen without transforming our appreciation for the psychological ethics of the Republic.

4. Politics, Part One: The Ideal Constitution

4.1 Utopianism

Just as Socrates develops an account of a virtuous, successful human being and contrasts it with several defective characters, he also develops an account of a virtuous, successful city and contrasts it with several defective constitutions. So the Republic contributes to political philosophy in two main ways. I will take them up in turn, starting with four disputed features of Socrates’ good city: its utopianism, communism, feminism, and totalitarianism.

To sketch a good city, Socrates does not take a currently or previously extant city as his model and offer adjustments (see 422e, and cf. Statesman 293e). He insists on starting from scratch, reasoning from the causes that would bring a city into being (369a–b). This makes his picture of a good city an ideal, a utopia.

The Republic’s utopianism has attracted many imitators, but also many critics. The critics typically claim that Plato’s political ideal rests on an unrealistic picture of human beings. The ideal city is conceivable, but humans are psychologically unable to create and sustain such a city. According to this charge, then, Plato’s ideal constitution is a nowhere-utopia (ou-topia = “no place”). But if ‘ought’ implies ‘can’, then a constitution that cannot exist is not one that ought to exist. So, the objection goes, Plato’s ideal constitution fails to be an ideal-utopia (eu-topia = “good place”).

To consider the objection, we first need to distinguish two apparently ideal cities that Socrates describes. The first, simple city is sketched very briefly, and is rejected by Glaucon as a “city of pigs” though Socrates calls it “the healthy city” (369b–372e). It contains no provision for war, and no distinction among classes. The second, initially called by Socrates a “fevered city” and a “city of luxuries” (372e) but later purified of its luxuries (see especially 399e) and characterized as a beautiful city (“Kallipolis,” 527c2), includes three classes, two that guard the city and its constitution (ruling and auxiliary guardians) and one that produces what the city needs. (At 543c–d, Glaucon suggests that one might find a third city, as well, by distinguishing between the three-class city whose rulers are not explicitly philosophers and the three-class city whose rulers are, but a three-class city whose rulers are not philosophers cannot be an ideal city, according to Socrates (473b–e). It is better to see Books Five through Seven as clarifications of the same three-class city first developed without full explicitness in Books Two through Four (cf. 497c–d, 499c–d).)

The charge of “utopianism” would apply well to the first city Socrates describes. This city resembles a basic economic model since Socrates uses it in theorizing how a set of people could efficiently satisfy their necessary appetitive desires (Schofield 1993). At the center of his model is a principle of specialization: each person should perform just the task to which he is best suited. But Socrates’ model makes no provision for reason’s rule, and he later insists that no one can have orderly appetitive attitudes unless they are ruled by reason (esp. 590c–d; cf. 586a–b). So the first city cannot exist, by the lights of the Republic’s account of human nature (Barney 2001). It is a nowhere-utopia, and thus not an ideal-utopia.

This is not to say that the first city is a mistake. Socrates introduces the first city not as a free-standing ideal but as the beginning of his account of the ideal, and his way of starting highlights two features that make the eventual ideal an ideal. One is the principle of specialization. With it Socrates sketches how people might harmoniously satisfy their appetitive attitudes. If reason could secure a society of such people, then they would be happy, and reason does secure a society of such people in the third class of the ideal city. (So the model turns out to be a picture of the producers in Kallipolis.) But the principle can also explain how a single person could flourish, for a version of it explains the optimal satisfaction of all psychological attitudes (442d–444a with 432b–434c). Indeed, this principle is central to the first “proof” for the superiority of the just life. The second feature crucial to Socrates’ ideal enters when Glaucon insists that the first city is fit for pigs and not human beings. He objects that it lacks couches, tables, relishes, and the other things required for a symposium, which is the cornerstone of civilized human life as he understands it (Burnyeat 1999). Glaucon is not calling for satisfaction of unnecessary appetitive attitudes, for the relishes he insists on are later recognized to be among the objects of necessary appetitive attitudes (559b). Rather, he is expressing spirited indignation, motivated by a sense of what is honorable and fitting for a human being. He insists that there is more to a good human life than the satisfaction of appetitive attitudes. This begins to turn Glaucon away from appetitive considerations against being just. It also completes the first city’s introduction of the two kinds of arguments for the superiority of the just life, by appealing, as the pleasure proofs do, to the intrinsic value of different kinds of psychological satisfaction.

Does the “utopianism” objection apply to the second city, with its philosopher-rulers, auxiliary guardians, and producers? Some readers would have Plato welcome the charge. As they understand the Republic, Socrates sketches the second city not as an ideal for us to strive for but as a warning against political utopianism or as an unimportant analogue to the good person. There are a couple of passages to support this approach. At 472b–473b, Socrates says that the point of his ideal is to allow us to judge actual cities and persons based on how well they approximate it. And at 592a–b, he says that the ideal city can serve as a model (paradeigma) were it ever to come into existence or not. But these passages have to be squared with the many in which Socrates insists that the ideal city could in fact come into existence (just a few: 450c–d, 456bc, 473c, 499b–d, 502a–c, 540d–e). His considered view is that although the ideal city is meaningful to us even if it does not exist, it could exist. Of course, realizing the ideal city is highly unlikely. The widespread disrepute of philosophy and the corruptibility of the philosophical nature conspire to make it extremely difficult for philosophers to gain power and for rulers to become philosophers (487a–502c). Nevertheless, according to what Socrates explicitly says, the ideal city is supposed to be realizable. The Laws imagines an impossible ideal, in which all the citizens are fully virtuous and share everything (739a–740 with Plato: on utopia), but the Republic is more practical than that (Burnyeat 1992; cf. Griswold 1999 and Marshall 2008). So if Plato does not intend for us to think of the Republic’s ideal city as a serious goal worth striving for, something other than Socrates’ explicit professions must reveal this to us. I consider this possibility in section 6 below.

But if Socrates would not welcome the “utopianism” charge, does he successfully avoid it? This is not clear. It is difficult to show that the ideal city is inconsistent with human nature as the Republic understands it. Socrates supposes that almost all of its citizens—not quite all (415d–e)—have to reach their fullest psychological potential, but it is not clear that anyone has to do more than this.

Nevertheless, we might make the “utopianism” charge stick by showing that the Republic is wrong about human nature. This version of the criticism is sometimes advanced in very sweeping terms: Plato’s psychology is “too optimistic” about human beings because it underplays self-interest, say. In these general terms, the criticism is false. Socrates builds his theory on acute awareness of how dangerous and selfish appetitive attitudes are, and indeed of how self-centered the pursuit of wisdom is, as well. In fact, it might be easier to argue in sweeping terms that the Republic’s ideal city is too pessimistic about what most people are capable of, since it consigns most human beings to lives as slaves (433c–d, cf. 469b–471c) or as citizens who are slavishly dependent upon others’ ruling (590c–d). Still, more specific criticisms of Plato’s psychology may well be tenable, and these might even show that the Republic is too optimistic about the possibility of its ideal city.

Such criticism should be distinguished from a weaker complaint about the Republic’s “utopianism.” One might concede to the Republic its psychology, concede the possibility of the ideal city, and nevertheless insist that the ideal city is so unlikely to come about as to be merely fanciful. A hard-nosed political scientist might have this sort of response. But this sounds like nothing more than opposition to political theory proposing ideals that are difficult to achieve, and it is not clear what supports this opposition. It is not as though political theorizing must propose ideas ready for implementation in order to propose ideas relevant to implementation. The Republic’s ideal can affect us very generally: we can consider the unity and harmony fundamental to it, and consider whether our own cities and souls should be allowed to fall short in unity and harmony where they do. But it can also work in more specific terms: we should be able to recognize and promote the strategies and policies crucial to the Republic’s ideal, including careful moral education societally and habitual regulation of appetitive desire personally, or the equal opportunity for work societally and the development of multiple kinds of psychological attitudes personally.

So the Republic’s ideal city might be objectionably nowhere-utopian, but the point is far from obvious. Of course, even if it is not nowhere-utopian, it might fail to be attractively ideal-utopian. We need to turn to other features of the second city that have led readers to praise and blame it.

4.2 Communism

One of the most striking features of the ideal city is its abolition of private families and sharp limitation on private property in the two guardian classes. Starting with Aristotle (Politics II 1–5), this communism in the Republic’s ideal city has been the target of confusion and criticism (see Nussbaum 1980, Stalley 1991, Mayhew 1997). On the one hand, Aristotle (at Politics 1264a11–22) and others have expressed uncertainty about the extent of communism in the ideal city. On the other, they have argued that communism of any extent has no place in an ideal political community.

There should be no confusion about private property. When Socrates describes the living situation of the guardian classes in the ideal city (415d–417b), he is clear that private property will be sharply limited, and when he discusses the kinds of regulations the rulers need to have in place for the whole city (421c ff.), he is clear that the producers will have enough private property to make the regulation of wealth and poverty a concern. But confusion about the scope of communal living arrangements is possible, due to the casual way in which Socrates introduces this controversial proposal. The abolition of private families enters as an afterthought. Socrates says that there is no need to list everything that the rulers will do, for if they are well educated, they will see what is necessary, including the fact that “marriage, the having of wives, and the procreation of children must be governed as far as possible by the old proverb: friends possess everything in common” (423e6–424a2). It is not immediately clear whether this governance should extend over the whole city or just the guardian classes. Still, when he is pressed to defend the communal arrangements (449c ff.), Socrates focuses on the guardian classes (see, e.g., 461e and 464b), and it seems most reasonable to suppose that the communism about families extends just as far as the communism about property does, on the grounds that only the best people can live as friends with such things in common (cf. Laws 739c–740b).

To what extent the communism of the ideal city is problematic is a more complicated question. The critics claim that communism is either undesirable or impossible. The charge of impossibility essentially extends one of Plato’s insights: while Plato believes that most people are incapable of living without private property and private families, the critics argue that all people are incapable of living without private property. This criticism fails if there is clear evidence of people who live communally. But the critic can fall back on the charge of undesirability. Here the critic needs to identify what is lost by giving up on private property and private families, and the critic needs to show that this is more valuable than any unity and extended sense of family the communal arrangements offer. It is not clear how this debate should go. Plato’s position on this question is a stubbornly persistent ideal, despite the equally stubborn persistence of criticism.

4.3 Feminism

Socrates ties the abolition of private families among the guardian classes to another radical proposal, that in the ideal city the education for and job of ruling should be open to girls and women. The exact relation between the proposals is contestable (Okin 1977). Is Socrates proposing the abolition of families in order to free up women to do the work of ruling? Or is Socrates putting the women to work since they will not have the job of family-caregiver anymore? But perhaps neither is prior to the other. Each of the proposals can be supported independently, and their dovetailing effects can be claimed as a happy convergence.

Many readers have seen in Plato’s Republic a rare exception in western philosophy’s long history of sexist denigration of women, and some have even decided that Plato’s willingness to open up the best education and the highest jobs to women shows a kind of feminism (Wender 1973). Other readers disagree (Annas 1976, Buchan 1999). They point to Plato’s indifference to the needs of actual women in his own city, to Socrates’ frequent, disparaging remarks about women and “womanish” attitudes, and to the illiberal reasons Socrates offers for educating and empowering women.

The broad claim that Plato or the Republic is feminist cannot be sustained, and the label ‘feminist’ is an especially contested one, but still, there are two features of the Republic’s ideal city that can be reasonably called feminist. First, Socrates suggests that the distinction between male and female is as relevant as the distinction between having long hair and having short hair for the purposes of deciding who should be active guardians: men and women, just like the long-haired and the short-haired, are by nature the same for the assignment of education and jobs (454b–456b). This suggestion seems to express the plausibly feminist point that one’s sex is generally irrelevant to one’s qualifications for education or employment.

The second plausibly feminist commitment in the Republic involves the abolition of private families. The feminist import of this may be obscured by the way in which Socrates and his interlocutors talk of “women and children shared in common.” In fact, Socrates’ companions might well have been forgiven if this way of talking had called to mind pictures of orgiastic free love in the guardians’ camp, for that, after all, is how Aristophanes’ Ecclesiazusae plays the proposal of “sharing women and children” for laughs. But as Socrates clarifies what he means, both free love and male possessiveness turn out to be beside the point. (The talk of “sharing women and children” reflects the male perspective of the men having the conversation but not the content of the proposal.) Then Socrates’ proposal can seem especially striking. Plato is clearly aware that an account of how the polis should be arranged must give special attention to how families are arranged. Relatedly, he is clearly aware that an account of the ideal citizens must explain how sexual desire, a paradigmatic appetitive attitude, should fit into the good human life. Only very recently, with feminist interventions, have sexual desire and its consequences come to seem crucial to political theory, and we might think that Plato’s awareness of these as topics of political philosophy shows at least proto-feminist concern. All the more might this awareness seem feminist when we relate it back to the first plausibly feminist commitment, for Plato wants the economy of desire and reproduction to be organized in such a way that women are free for education and employment alongside men, in the guardian classes, at any rate.

Three of the objections to calling the Republic feminist say more about the contest over the label ‘feminist’ than they do about Plato. First, some have said that feminism requires a concern for women’s rights and have then argued that Plato is not a feminist on the grounds that he shows no interests in women’s rights. This particular argument is not quite to the point, for it says nothing about Plato’s view of women per se. He is not interested in women’s rights just to the extent that he is not interested in anyone’s rights. Second, some have said that feminism requires attention to what actual women want. Since Plato shows no interest in what actual women want, he would seem on this view of feminism to be anti-feminist. But the limitations of this criticism are apparent as soon as we realize that Plato shows no interest in what actual men want. Plato focuses instead on what women (and men) should want, what they would want if they were in the best possible psychological condition. Actual women (and actual men), as we might put Plato’s point, are subject to false consciousness. Third, some have insisted that feminism requires attention to and concern for the particular interests and needs of women as distinct from the particular interests and needs of men. Since Plato does not admit of particular women’s interests and needs, he would not, in this view, be a feminist (except insofar as he accidentally promoted any supposed particular interests by, say, proposing the abolition of the private family). Again, however, this objection turns on what we understand by ‘feminism’ more than on what Socrates is saying in the Republic. There should be no doubt that there are conceptions of feminism according to which the Republic is anti-feminist. But this does not undercut the point that the Republic advances a couple of plausibly feminist concerns.

Better ground for doubting Plato’s apparent feminist commitments lies in the reasons that Socrates gives for them: Socrates consistently emphasizes concern for the welfare of the whole city, but not for women themselves (esp. 456c ff.). But Socrates’ emphasis in Book Five on the happiness of the city as a whole rather than the happiness of the rulers (and cf. 465e–466c) might have more to do with his worries about convincing his interlocutors that ideal rulers do not flourish by exploiting the ruled. Thus, his emphasis need not be taken to represent a lack of concern for the women’s interests. After all, what greater concern could Socrates show for the women than to insist that they be fully educated and allowed to hold the highest offices? Socrates goes on to argue that the philosopher-rulers of the city, including the female philosopher-rulers, are as happy as human beings can be.

The best reason for doubting Plato’s feminism is provided by those disparaging remarks about women. We might try to distinguish between Plato’s rather harsh view of the women around him and his more optimistic view of women as they would be in more favorable circumstances (Vlastos 1989). It is also possible to distinguish between the traditional sexist tropes as they feature in Plato’s drama and the rejection of sexism in Plato’s ideas. But it is not clear that these distinctions will remove all of the tension, especially when Socrates and Glaucon are saying that men are stronger or better than women in just about every endeavor (455c).

Final judgment on this question is difficult (see also Saxonhouse 1976, Levin 1996, E. Brown 2002). The disparaging remarks have to be taken one-by-one, as it is doubtful that all can be understood in exactly the same way. Moreover, it is of the utmost importance to determine whether each remark says something about the way all women are by nature or essentially. If Plato thinks that women are essentially worse than men, then Socrates’ claim that men and women have the same nature for education and employment is puzzling. But if the disparagements do not express any considered views about the nature of women, then we might be able to conclude that Plato is deeply prejudiced against women and yet committed to some plausibly feminist principles.

4.4 Totalitarianism

Some of the most heated discussions of the politics of Plato’s Republic have surrounded the charge of totalitarianism famously advanced by Karl Popper ([1945] 1971). Like the other “isms” we have been considering, totalitarianism applies to the Republic only conditionally, depending on the definition of ‘totalitarianism’ offered. But it is worth thinking through the various ways in which this charge might be made, to clarify the way the philosopher-rulers wield political authority over the rest of the city (see Bambrough 1967, Taylor 1986, L. Brown 1998, and Ackrill 1997).

Critics of Plato’s Republic have characterized the aims of Kallipolis’ rulers as totalitarian. Socrates is quite explicit that the good at which the rulers aim is the unity of the city (462a–b). Is this an inherently totalitarian and objectionable aim?

The problem, Popper and others have charged, is that the rulers aim at the organic unity of the city as a whole, regardless of the individual interests of the citizens. But this would be surprising, if true. After all, the Republic provides a picture not just of a happy city but also of a happy individual person, and in Book One, Socrates argues that the ruler’s task is to benefit the ruled. So how could the rulers of Kallipolis utterly disregard the good of the citizens?

Some readers answer Popper by staking out a diametrically opposed position (Vlastos 1977). They maintain that Plato conceives of the city’s good as nothing more than the aggregate good of all the citizens. On this view, citizens need to contribute to the city’s happiness only because they need to contribute to the happiness of other citizens if they are to achieve their own maximal happiness. Any totalitarian control of the citizens is paternalistic. Yet this view, too, seems at odds with much of the Republic. When Socrates says that the happiest city is a maximally unified city (462a–b), or when he insists that all the citizens need to be bound together (519e–520a), he seems to be invoking a conception of the city’s good that is not reducible to the aggregate good of the citizens.

So a mixed interpretation seems to be called for (Morrison 2001; cf. Kamtekar 2001, Meyer 2004, and Brennan 2004). In the Republic, the good of the city and the good of the individual are independently specifiable, and the citizens’ own maximal good coincides with the maximal good of the city. Since Plato believes that this coincidence is realized only through propagandistic means in the ideal city, the propaganda is paternalistically targeted at the citizens’ own good but not exclusively at the citizens’ own good. On this view, if the citizens do not see themselves as parts of the city serving the city, neither the city nor they will be maximally happy.

This does not leave Kallipolis’ aims beyond reproach, for one might well be skeptical of the good of unity, of Plato’s assumption that individuals reap their own maximal good when the city is most unified, or of the Republic’s claims about how this unity (and these individual goods) might be achieved. But it is not obvious that the rulers of Kallipolis have inherently totalitarian and objectionable aims (cf. Kamtekar 2004).

Kallipolis has more clearly totalitarian features. First, totalitarian regimes concentrate political power in one bloc and offer the ruled no alternative. The ideal city of Plato’s Republic is plainly totalitarian in this respect.

But the concentration of political power in Kallipolis differs in at least two ways from the concentration in actual totalitarian states. First, Socrates insists that in the ideal city, all the citizens will agree about who should rule. This agreement is the city’s moderation (430d–432a), caused by the city’s justice (433b, cf. 351d). Socrates also suggests some ways of explaining how the non-philosophers will agree that the philosophers should rule. First, he offers a way of persuading those who lack knowledge that only the philosophers have knowledge (476d–480a), which in effect offers a way of explaining to the non-philosophers that only the philosophers have the knowledge required to rule. Second, he suggests that the non-philosophers will be struck by the philosophers’ obvious virtue (500d–502a). (Their virtue would be especially striking to the producers, since the philosophers do without private property, which the producers love so much.) Finally, he suggests that in Kallipolis, the producers will be grateful to the guardian classes for keeping the city safe and orderly, wherein they can achieve their good, as they see it, by optimally satisfying their necessary appetitive attitudes (463a–b).

The second way in which Kallipolis’ concentration of political power is special that it does not concentrate anything good for the rulers. Socrates is clear that the philosophers despise political power (519c, 540a), and they rule not to reap rewards but for the sake of the ruled (cf. 341c–343a), because their justice obligates them to obey the law that commands them to rule (see section 2.3 above). In fact, the rulers of Kallipolis benefit the ruled as best they can, helping them realize the best life they are capable of. These benefits must include some primary education for the producer class (see 414d), to make good on the commitment to promote especially talented children born among the producers (415c, 423d) and to enable the producers to recognize the virtue in the philosophers. But the benefits extend to peace and order: the producers do not have to face warfare.

A second totalitarian feature of Kallipolis is the control that the rulers exert over daily life. There is nothing especially totalitarian about the rule of law pervasive in Kallipolis (see esp. 415d–e, and cf. the laws that apply to the rulers, such as the marriage law and the law commanding philosophers to rule) (Meyer 2006 and Hitz 2009). But the rulers control mass culture in the ideal city, and they advance a “noble lie” to convince citizens of their unequal standing and deep tie to the city (414b–415d). This propagandistic control plainly represents a totalitarian concern, and it should make us skeptical about the value of the consent given to the rulers of Kallipolis.

It is one thing to identify totalitarian features of Kallipolis and another thing to say why they are wrong. Three very different objections suggest themselves. First, we might reject the idea of an objectively knowable human good, and thus reject the idea that political power should be in the hands of those who know the human good. Here we should distinguish between Plato’s picture of the human good and the very idea of an objective human good, for even if we want to dissent from Plato’s view, we might still accept the very idea. At least, it does not seem implausible to suppose that some general psychological capacities are objectively good for their possessors (while others are objectively bad), and at that point, we can ask whether political power should be used to foster the good capacities and to restrain or prevent the bad ones. Given that state-sponsored education cannot but address the psychological capacities of the pupils, only very austere political systems could be supported by a thorough-going skepticism about the human good.

Second, we might accept the idea of an objectively knowable human good, but be wary of concentrating extensive political power in the hands of a few knowers. We might reject Plato’s apparent optimism about the trustworthiness of philosopher-rulers and insist on greater checks upon political power, to minimize the risks of abuse. If this is our objection, then we might wonder what checks are optimal.

Finally, we might reject Plato’s scheme on the grounds that political self-determination and free expression are themselves more valuable than Plato recognizes. This sort of response is perhaps the most interesting, but it is by no means easy. For it is difficult to assess the intrinsic value of self-determination and free expression, apart from skepticism about the knowledge or power of those who would limit self-determination or free expression. Moreover, it is difficult to balance these values against the concerns that motivate Plato. Where does the power over massive cultural forces lie when it is not under political control? And to what extent can we live well when our culture is not shaped by people thoughtfully dedicated to living a good human life? These are not questions that can be easily shrugged off, even if we cannot embrace Kallipolis as their answer.

5. Politics, Part Two: Defective Constitutions

The best human life is ruled by knowledge and especially knowledge of what goodness is and of what is good for human beings. So, too, is the best city. For Plato, philosophers make the ideal rulers for two main reasons. First, they know what is good. Second, they do not want to rule (esp. 520e–521b). The problem with existing cities is correspondingly twofold. They are ruled by people who are ignorant of what is good, and they suffer from strife among citizens all of whom want to rule. These flaws are connected: the ignorant are marked by their desire for the wrong objects, such as honor and money, and this desire is what leads them to seek political power. All existing regimes, whether ruled by one, a few, or many, show these defects. So in the Republic Socrates does not distinguish between good and bad forms of these three kinds of regime, as the Stranger does in the Plato’s Statesman (301a–303b, cf. Aristotle, Politics III 7).

Nonetheless, Socrates has much to say in Books Eight and Nine about the individual character of various defective regimes. He organizes his account to emphasize appetite’s corrupting power, showing how each defective regime can, through the corruption of the rulers’ appetites, devolve into a still worse one (Hitz 2010, Johnstone 2011). In the timocracy, for example, nothing checks the rulers from taking money to be a badge of honor and feeding their appetites, which grow in private until they cannot be hidden anymore. The account is thus deeply informed by psychology. It does not purport to be an account of what has happened (despite Aristotle’s treatment of it in Politics V 12), any more than Books Two through Seven purport to give an historical account of an ideal city’s genesis. It is not, for all that, ahistorical, for Plato’s concerns about corruption are clearly informed by his experiences and his understanding of history. The account, psychologically and historically informed, does not offer any hint of psychological or historical determinism. Socrates does not identify the transitions from one defective regime to the next as inevitable, and he explicitly allows for transitions other than the ones he highlights. This is just one story one could tell about defective regimes. But this particular story is valuable as a morality tale: it highlights the defective regimes’ vulnerability to the corruption of the rulers’ appetites.

The political psychology of Books Eight and Nine raises a host of questions, especially about the city-soul analogy (see section 1.3 above). Is the account of political change dependent upon the account of psychological change, or vice versa? Or if this is a case of mutual interdependence, exactly what accounts for the various dependencies? It seems difficult to give just one answer to these questions that will explain all of the claims in these books, and the full, complex theory that must underlie all of the claims is by no means clear.

But those questions should not obscure the political critiques that Socrates offers. First, he criticizes the oligarchs of Athens and Sparta. His list of five regimes departs from the usual list of rule by one, rule by a few, and rule by many (cf. 338d) because he distinguishes among three different regimes in which only a few rule. He contrasts the ideal city, in which the wise rule, and two would-be aristocracies, the timocracy in which the militaristically “virtuous” rule and the oligarchy in which the rich rule. Socrates argues that these are not genuine aristocracies, because neither timocracy nor oligarchy manages to check the greed that introduces injustice and strife into cities. This highlights the deficiencies of the Spartan oligarchy, with its narrow attention to valor (cf. Laws, esp. Books One and Two), and of the Athenian oligarchs, many of whom pursued their own material interests narrowly, however much they eyed Sparta as a model. So the Republic distances Plato from oligarchic parties of his time and place.

Second, Socrates criticizes the Athenian democracy, as Adeimantus remarks (563d). Many readers think that Socrates goes over the top in his description, but the central message is not so easy to dismiss. Socrates argues that without some publicly entrenched standards for evaluation guiding the city, chaos and strife are unavoidable. Even the timocracy and oligarchy, for all their flaws, have public standards for value. But democracy honors all pursuits equally, which opens the city to conflict and disorder.

Some readers find a silver lining in this critique. They note that the democracy’s tolerance extends to philosophers (cf. 561c–d), allowing such things as the conversation that Socrates, Glaucon, and the others are having (557d). But the Republic also records considerable skepticism about democratic tolerance of philosophers (487a–499a, cf. 517a), and does not say that only a democracy could tolerate philosophers.

Still, some readers have tried to bring the Republic’s judgment of democracy into line with the Statesman, where the Stranger ranks democracy above oligarchy. I doubt that Socrates explicit ranking in the Republic should count for less than some imagined implicit ranking, but we might still wonder what to make of the apparent contrast between the Republic and Statesman. Perhaps the difference is insignificant, since both democracies and oligarchies are beset by the same essential strife between the rich (oligarchs) and poor (democrats) (422e–423a). Perhaps, too, the Republic and Statesman appear to disagree only because Plato has different criteria in view. Or perhaps he just changed his mind. The ideal city of the Laws, which Plato probably wrote shortly after the Statesman, accords a greater political role for unwise citizens than the Republic does (see Plato: on utopia).

6. Conclusions about the Ethics and Politics of Plato’s Republic

The Republic is a sprawling work with dazzling details and an enormously wide-ranging influence. But what, in the end, does the work say to us, insofar as we are trying to live well or help our society live well, and what does it say to us, insofar as we are trying to understand how to think about how to live well?

In ethics, the Republic’s main practical lesson is that one should, if one can, pursue wisdom and that if one cannot, one should follow the wisest guides one can find. This lesson is familiar from Plato’s Socratic dialogues: the philosophical life is best, and if one lacks knowledge, one should prefer to learn from an expert. But the Republic characterizes philosophy differently. First, it goes much further than the Socratic dialogues in respecting the power of passions and desires. Wisdom still requires being able to survive Socratic examination (534b–c), but it also explicitly requires careful and extensive habituation of spirited and appetitive attitudes (485a–486b, 519a8–b1), sublimation of psychological energy from spirited and appetitive desires to philosophical desire (cf. 485d), and continued attention to and maintenance of the desires that arise from the non-calculating parts of one’s soul (571d–572b, 589a–b, cf. 416e–417b). Second, as opposed to the Socrates of the Socratic dialogues, who avows ignorance and is content with the belief that the world is well-ordered, the Socrates of the Republic insists that wisdom requires understanding how the world is, which involves apprehending the basic mathematical and teleological structure of things. Third, although the Socrates of the Socratic dialogues practices philosophy instead of living an ordinarily engaged political life, he insists that his life is closer to what the political art demands than the ordinarily engaged life is. According to the Republic, by contrast, the philosopher prefers to be entirely apart from politics, especially in ordinary circumstances (496c–e, 592a, cf. 520a–b).

One facet of this advice that deserves emphasizing is the importance it places on the influence of others. Plato plainly believes that one’s living well depends upon one’s fellows and the larger culture. This is most obvious in the case of those who cannot pursue wisdom for themselves. They will live as well as those who lead them allow. But even those who can pursue wisdom must first be raised well and must later meet with tolerance, which philosophers do not often receive.

The ethical theory the Republic offers is best characterized as eudaimonist, according to which a person should act for the sake of his or her own success or happiness (eudaimonia). Socrates does not argue for this as opposed to other approaches to ethics. Rather, he simply assumes that a person’s success gives him or her conclusive reasons to act, and he argues that success requires acting virtuously. This eudaimonism is widely thought to be an egoistic kind of consequentialism: one should act so as to bring about states of affairs in which one is happy or successful. But there is no reason to suppose that the Republic rejects the identity of eudaimonia and good activity (eu prattein, eupragia) which Socrates often assumes in Plato’s Socratic dialogues (Charmides 171e–172a, Crito 48b, Euthydemus 278e–282d, Gorgias 507c). If the Republic takes this identity seriously, as the function argument of Book One does (354a), it says that virtuous activity is good not because it brings about success, but because it is success. This is also the explicit view of Aristotle and the Stoics, who had considered Plato’s work carefully.

Metaethically, the Republic presupposes that there are objective facts concerning how one should live. Much of its account of these facts sounds naturalist. After all, Socrates uses the careful study of human psychology to reveal how our souls function well or ill, and he grounds the account of what a person should do in his understanding of good psychological functioning. Socrates’ particular deployment of this general strategy suggests that good actions are those that sustain the virtuous soul (443e) and that the virtuous soul is the one with a maximally unified set of commitments (443d–e, cf. 534b–c). Whether this is plausible depends upon what careful study of human psychology in fact shows. It depends in particular on whether, as a matter of fact, the actions that we would pre-theoretically deem good sustain a coherent set of psychological commitments and those that we would pre-theoretically deem bad are inconsistent with a coherent set of psychological commitments. Ethical naturalism such as this still awaits support from psychology, but it has not been falsified, either.

Although this naturalist reading of the Republic is not anachronistic—Aristotle and the Stoics develop related naturalist approaches, and Plato had naturalist contemporaries in a hedonist tradition—Plato himself would not be content to ground his account of good actions on empirical facts of human psychology. On his view, actions are good because of their relation to good agents, and agents are good because of their relation to goodness itself. But goodness itself, the Good, transcends the natural world; it is a supernatural property. This commits Plato to a non-naturalist version of ethical realism, which modernity’s creeping tide of naturalism threatens to wash away. But non-naturalism in ethics will retain some appeal insofar as the other ways of trying to explain our experiences of the moral life fail to answer the serious objections they face.

The take-home lessons of the Republic’s politics are subject to special controversy. In the sections above, I take what Socrates says about the ideal and defective cities at face value, but many readers believe that this is a mistake. Some think that Plato does not intend the Republic as a serious contribution to political thought, because its political musings are projections to clarify psychological claims crucial to the ethical theory that Plato does seriously intend (Annas 1999, Annas 2000). Others think that Plato intends political lessons strikingly different from what is suggested by the face value of Socrates’ words.

One can concede that the Republic’s politics are a reflection of its moral psychology without thinking that they are merely that. In antiquity, starting with Aristotle, Plato’s Republic was recognized as part of a large genre of politically serious works, many of them inspired by Sparta (Menn 2005), and Socrates’ explicit claims about the ideal and defective constitutions were taken seriously as political proposals.

Moreover, one can concede that the Republic calls into question many of its political proposals without thinking that Plato means to cancel them or suggest other, radically different political advice (cf. Clay 1988). It is striking that Socrates is ready to show that it is better to be just than unjust before he has even said that the just and wise person must be a philosopher and that the just city must be ruled by philosophers (444e–445a). It is also striking that Adeimantus enthusiastically endorses the idea of “holding the women and children in common” (424a) and then later asks Socrates to explain it (449c–450a). And it is striking that Socrates recognizes that Greeks would ridicule his proposal that women take up the arts of war (452a). But Plato might signal for his readers to examine and re-examine what Socrates says without thereby suggesting that he himself finds fault with what Socrates says.

But still some readers, especially Leo Strauss (see Strauss 1964) and his followers (e.g., Bloom 1968 and Bloom 1977), want to distance the Republic’s take-home political message from Kallipolis. They typically appeal to three considerations that are supposed to indicate Plato’s awareness that the political ideal is impossible or ruinous. First, they note that the philosophers have to be compelled to rule the ideal city. But this involves no impossibility. The founders of the ideal city would have to make a law compelling those educated as philosophers to rule (cf. section 2.3 above), but founders could make such a law. If philosophers have to be compelled to sustain the maximally happy city, one might wonder why anyone would found such a city. But one might wonder why anyone was inspired to compose the Oresteia, as well. People sometimes do remarkable things. Second, Straussian readers appeal to the ideal city’s predicted demise, and they assert that the rulers’ eventual inability to calculate “the marriage number” (546a–547a) shows an ineliminable conflict between the eros in human nature and the mathematical perfection of a political ideal. But it is also possible to blame the anticipated degeneration on sense-perception (see 546b2–3), not calculation, and to see in Kallipolis’ demise a common fact of life for perceptible entities (546a2). After all, Socrates does not say that eros makes the creation or maintenance of Kallipolis impossible. Finally, the Straussians note that Kallipolis is not sketched as an ideal in a political treatise, exactly, but proposed by Socrates in a long dramatic conversation, which includes twists and turns that come after he stops discussing Kallipolis. This is true, and it renders difficult inferences from what is said in the Republic to what Plato thinks. But it does not provide any reason for thinking that Plato rejects the ideal that Socrates constructs in the Republic.

In fact, Socrates expresses several central political theses in the Republic that appear in other Platonic dialogues, as well, especially in the Gorgias, Statesman, and Laws. First, the best rulers are wise. Second, the best rulers rule for the benefit of the ruled, and not for their own sake. Third, a city is highly unlikely to have the best rulers, in part because there is a gulf between the values of most people and the values of the wise. Fourth, the greatest harm to a city is disagreement about who should rule, since competing factions create civil strife. So, fifth, a central goal of politics is harmony or agreement among the citizens about who should rule. Last, harmony requires that the city cultivate virtue and the rule of law. The consistency of these messages across several Platonic dialogues might well make us so bold as to think that they are the take-home message of the Republic’s politics.


Guide to Reading

The standard edition of the Greek text is Slings 2003. The full Greek text also appears with an excellent commentary in Adam 1902. Good translations into current English include Allen 2006, Bloom 1968, Grube 1992, Reeve 2004, and especially Rowe 2012, but Shorey 1935–1937 also holds up well.

Readers coming to the Republic for the first time should appreciate Blackburn 2006, but to wrestle with the text’s claims and arguments, they will benefit most from Annas 1981, Pappas 1995, and White 1979. Other valuable monographs include Nettleship 1902, Murphy 1951, Cross and Woozley 1964, Reeve 1988, Roochnik 2003, Rosen 2005, Reeve 2013, and Scott 2015, and many helpful essays can be found in Cornelli and Lisi 2010, Ferrari 2007, Höffe 1997, Kraut 1997, McPherran 2010, Notomi and Brisson 2013, Ostenfeld 1998, and Santas 2006.

The Republic is central to Plato’s ethical and political thought, so some of the best discussions of it are contained in more general studies of Platonic ethics and politics. See especially Annas 1999, Bobonich 2002, Irwin 1995, Klosko 2007, Mackenzie 1986, Monoson 2000, Pradeau 2002, Samaras 2002, Schofield 2006, and Vasiliou 2008, and the relevant essays collected in Benson 2006 and Fine 2008.

Readers wondering about the context in which the Republic was written will find an excellent introduction in Ferrari 2000. They should also seek out Adkins 1960, Balot 2001, Balot 2006, Carter 1986, Dover 1974, Menn 2005, Ober 1998, and Meyer 2008, and the following essay collections: Balot 2009, Key and Miller 2007, Rowe and Schofield 2000, and Salkever 2009.

I have sprinkled throughout the essay references to a few other works that are especially relevant (not always by agreement!) to the points being discussed, but these references are far from complete. For an excellent bibliographical guide that is much more thorough than this, see Ferrari 2007.

Works Cited

  • Ackrill, J.L., 1997, “What’s wrong with Plato’s Republic?” in his Essays on Plato and Aristotle, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 230–251. (NB that this essay only appears in the paperback edition, issued in 2001 without any notice of a second edition or fresh copyright.)
  • Adam, J. (ed.), 1902, The Republic of Plato, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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The author thanks Ryan Balot, Richard Kraut, Casey Perin, and Eric Wiland for their comments on an early draft, and the many readers of the earlier versions, some anonymous, who sent suggestions for improvement. He would also like to express more general gratitude to those with whom he studied the Republic when he was in college and graduate school, including Arthur Adkins, Liz Asmis, Allan Bloom, Chris Bobonich, Rachana Kamtekar, Ralph Lerner, and Ian Mueller.

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