Probability in Medieval and Renaissance Philosophy

First published Mon Dec 29, 2014; substantive revision Sun Nov 5, 2023

Probability-related terminology played an important role in medieval and Renaissance philosophy. Terms such as ‘probable’ (probabilis), ‘credible’ (credibilis) or ‘truth-like’ (verisimilis) were used to assess philosophical claims, qualify uncertain conclusions, gauge the force of arguments and temper academic disagreement. Beyond that, they had a significant impact on the regulation of legal proceedings, moral action and everyday life. The probability-related terminology of the Middle Ages descended from ancient sources such as Aristotle, Cicero and Boethius. There is no precedent, however, for many medieval ways of connecting these terms to rules and principles for legal and practical decision-making.

Medieval scholastic uses of probability evolved into the significantly different probability discourses of early modern scholasticism and humanism, which both were finally eclipsed by modern quantitative notions of probability in the eighteenth century. Much is still unknown concerning these processes, but a fuller understanding can only be approached by accounting for their medieval origins. This background is also important for charting the shifting borders of certainty and uncertainty, or knowledge and opinion, in European philosophy, as well as charting attitudes towards risk in the history of economic thought.

1. Probability: Now and then

Modern notions of probability are quantitative (Hájek 2011). They underlie the representation of probabilities by real (initially: fractional) numbers from the interval between 0 and 1. On this basis, a probability calculus with its own mathematical rules (the Kolmogorov axioms) has arisen.[1] The present mathematics of probability marks the end-point of a development which began in the middle of the seventeenth century with the calculation of chances in games of fortune by Pascal, Fermat, and Huygens. These early calculations were considerably refined in the eighteenth century by the Bernoullis, Montmort, De Moivre, Laplace, Bayes, and others (Daston 1988; Hacking 2006; Hald 2003). Modern conceptualizations of probability emerged at the same time. They evolved around the ideas of a ratio of possibilities, a relative frequency of events, a degree of belief, or a degree of confirmation.

Pre-modern notions of probability were very different (Franklin 2016). No pre-modern notion of probability was numerical. A calculus of probabilities simply did not exist before the seventeenth century.[2] Pre-modern probability was a qualitative predicate mainly applied to propositions (e.g., by calling an opinion probable), but extending to other subject matters as well. The use of the word ‘probable’ in ordinary language still resembles this older usage to some extent (Franklin 2001, 126; Franklin 2013; Hacking 2006, 18). Yet, whereas the mathematics of probability was invented in the early modern era, some continuities in the meaning(s) of probability exist. These continuities will be discussed in Section 6. Until that point, it is best to forget the connotations of modern notions of probability and to approach medieval probability-related terms without modern preconceptions. For their vocabulary, medieval and Renaissance authors could draw on a well-stocked ancient Greek and Roman store of probability-related terms. In consequence, a variety of Latin terms were in use, which are today translated as ‘probable’, ‘plausible’, ‘reputable’ (probabilis); ‘truth-like’, ‘apparently true’ (verisimilis); ‘credible’, ‘worthy of belief’ (credibilis, opinabilis); or ‘most often’, ‘frequently’ (ut frequenter). Modern readers may not always find it obvious that these terms relate to probability; but, in fact, they are highly relevant for its conceptual evolution. Up to the nineteenth century, when philosophers spoke about probability their claims were still often rooted in medieval notions of probability.

Medieval and Renaissance philosophers used probability-related vocabulary; but they did not analyze the underlying concepts in depth, at least in comparison with the thoroughness of their investigations into the notions of knowledge or science (scientia). Probability-related terms were usually introduced in passing, and the most differentiated treatments extended to a folio page at best. Nevertheless, issues of probability were not peripheral to medieval thought. Probability-related terms and concepts played an enormous role in the regulation of everyday conduct and in many arts and sciences. Rhetoric and dialectic were by definition concerned with persuasion, credibility, and probability. Yet medieval thinkers were also highly aware that many claims in jurisprudence, theology, and medicine could not be derived with certainty from indubitable premises. Hence, arguments in these fields had to rely more often than not on probable reasoning. The notorious disagreements between scholastic academics in their fields of inquiry, nourished and represented by the practice of scholastic disputation, further increased the demand for probable reasoning. Wherever disagreement was licit and impossible to extirpate by argument, the claims of all sides counted as merely probable. Since medieval theologians and lawyers were no more in agreement concerning the ascription of sins (or of moral actions) than on other matters, the guidance of human conduct by confessors was also a matter of probability. In this domain, the regulation of decisions of conscience relied on a systematic framework of probable reasoning and decision in conditions of uncertainty. In short, for a satisfactory understanding of the medieval intellectual edifice, inspection of the uses of probability seems indispensable.

This is true for the medieval period, the Renaissance, and in different ways for early modern scholasticism until the eighteenth century. We should not assume, however, that the uses and understanding of probability remained unchanged throughout this long span of time. For this reason, the period from roughly 1200–1500 is singled out here for discussion. It is the period of mature medieval scholasticism and covers much of the Renaissance. In the sixteenth century, the discourse on probability underwent significant changes, on the scholastic as well as the humanist side. This early modern discourse needs to be clearly differentiated from its medieval precursor and is therefore excluded from consideration here (but see the references in Sections 4.3 and 6).

Within the period under consideration, a distinction between scholastic and humanist uses of probability can be made. This is not to say that there was a big divide between them. The same terms were used by scholastics and humanists with similar meanings. The normative and regulatory uses of probability, however, were anchored in scholastic theology and jurisprudence; therefore, they are in the foreground here. At least some Renaissance humanists used probability-related terms differently from the scholastic mainstream; and these differences will be addressed in Section 5.

That the conceptualization of probability was not exclusively a European affair also deserves attention. Many cultures around the world tilled the conceptual field of probability, in antiquity and not least in the medieval era. The question of the extent to which non-Western notions and uses of probability shaped the treatment of probability in the Latin Middle Ages (or vice versa) cannot be answered here; however, some of the scholastic authors discussed below explicitly referred to Islamic sources in their accounts of probability.

2. Medieval probability-related terminology

Terms, such as the Latin probabilis were already in use in the early Middle Ages and can, for instance, be found in Carolingian texts on rhetoric (e.g., Alcuin, Rhetoric, 113). The ancient authorities on the subject were Cicero and Boethius, whereas Aristotle’s most seminal statements on probability-related concepts became known only after the middle of the twelfth century (see Cox and Ward 2006; Fredborg 1988, 150; Greenberg-Pedersen 1984). Particularly significant in this respect were the introduction of Aristotle’s Topics into academic discourse in the middle of the twelfth century (but the full impact was not felt before 1200) and the new translations of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Rhetoric in the thirteenth century.[3] By the end of this century, Aristotle’s definitions had largely (though not entirely) supplanted those of Cicero and Boethius in scholastic thought. The impact of this change should not be exaggerated because the notions of probability held by Cicero and, in particular, Boethius were in significant respects close to those of Aristotle.

The main probability-related terms in this period were probabilis, verisimilis, credibilis, opinabilis, and some expressions indicating frequency such as ut frequenter, ut in pluribus, and frequentius. We need to look carefully at the specific meanings of these words and phrases before proceeding to concepts of probability in a narrower sense.

2.1 Probabilis

Probabilis was the most important probability-related predicate in the Middle Ages (and in the whole scholastic tradition). It is often possible to translate probabilis as ‘probable’ in an ordinary language sense, but attention should be paid to meanings arising from a combination with particular nouns. The predicate probabilis mainly pertained to propositions, sentences, or opinions, but these are not the only meaningful referents. Sometimes persons were described as probable, as in the phrase “the more probable philosophers” (philosophi probabiliores). Thomas Deman (1933, 262) renders this phrase as “the philosophers who deserve most consideration”; but one could also translate it as “the philosophers who are more likely to find the truth”. Signs were also sometimes called probable (signum probabile), as in Silvester de Prierio’s Summa under the heading ‘probabile’. Last but not least, probability was attributed to events, for instance, when Thomas Aquinas, in Summa theologiae II-II, q. 32, 5, 1322, says “according as things probably and generally occur / according to what probably and generally occurs” (secundum ea quae probabiliter et in pluribus occurrunt). As we shall see, however, it is conceivable that all these assertions are elliptic references to the probability of propositions.

A proposition was probable (probabilis) if specific indicators of truth justified assent (i.e., holding it true) or acceptance as a premise for action.[4] The main justifications for judgments of probability will be discussed in more detail in Section 3, on “Scholastic Concepts of Probability”. For the moment, it is enough to say that authority, testimony, a sufficient (but not maximal) appearance of truth, and frequent truth could buttress an ascription of probability.

The most prolific category of probable propositions were opinions in the medieval technical sense of this term. An opinion (opinio) was often defined as a proposition held to be true but which the person holding it feared might be wrong (see Byrne 1968, Franklin 2001). This was only one of several medieval understandings of opinion. Robert Grosseteste (∼1175–1253) reminded his readers that opinio could be understood in three ways.[5] According to the simplest meaning, opinion stood for any cognition characterized by assent; and, in this understanding, propositions expressing knowledge or conviction were also opinions. According to a more proper definition, opinion denoted assent to a proposition with a fear that the opposite might be true. Finally, according to the most precise definitions, opinions were limited to contingent propositions to which assent was given and the opposite of which were somehow feared to be true. Grosseteste’s distinctions show that thirteenth-century scholastics were already aware that the term opinio was used far from uniformly by contemporary authors. That said, it should nevertheless be kept in mind that medieval discussions of the use of probable opinions predominantly operated on the basis of the second meaning of opinio as a proposition to which assent was given and which was accompanied by a fear that the opposite might be true. The fear in question resulted at least in part from an awareness that one’s judgment might be fallible. According to a widely observed medieval ranking of epistemological confidence and doxological firmness, the category of opinion stood below faith or full conviction (fides) and knowledge (scientia).[6] All three epistemic attitudes involved assent, but only faith and knowledge implied full subjective certainty (certitudo).

On this basis, “probable opinion” (opinio probabilis) became a standard term for a class of propositions held to be true, which humans had to be content with in many fields of investigation. In these fields, human fallibility or the changeable nature of the subject matter precluded full knowledge (scientia), and a lack of religious relevance or accepted theological contentiousness prevented the intervention of faith (fides). The scope of this domain was enormous. In philosophical theory, it was the home-ground for dialectical argumentation and dialectical syllogisms (see Section 4.1); on a practical level, it was regulated by counselors of conscience and lawyers.

For the regulation of consciences, another standard term was ‘probable certainty’ (certitudo probabilis). Probable certainty forestalled sin by enabling one to base one’s actions on correct probable reasoning. Since reasoning which went beyond the probable was virtually unattainable in many moral contexts, an agent satisfied her or his epistemic duties by relying on sound probable reasoning, thus acquiring a subjective certainty of having done all that could be expected of an agent to avoid sin (Gardeil 1911; Schuessler 2019, 47). In the opinion of many medieval scholastics, probable reasoning could not generate epistemological certainty; the phrase “probable certainty”, however, sprang from compliance with moral demands (which we would call epistemic duties today) and not from strong conviction based on evidence. Perhaps because of the risk of misunderstanding it implied, ‘probable certainty’ was largely supplanted, from the fifteenth century onward, by the similar concept of ‘moral certainty’ (certitudo moralis), (Franklin 2001, 69; Knebel 2000, 55; Schuessler 2009).

In the field of jurisprudence, the term probabilis was typically combined with presumptions (presumptiones). A probable presumption for or against a culprit was one that in itself did not suffice to incline a reasonable judge to a verdict (only vehement or violent presumptions could achieve that). Nevertheless, probable presumptions had some juridical weight (in contrast to careless presumptions, presumptiones temerariae) and could be aggregated to justify a verdict (Franklin 2001, 43).

In the realm of economics, a distinct lexicon pertaining to risk-taking, with terms such as risk (risicum) and danger of loss (periculum sortis) was in use, and institutions designed for risk, such as insurance contracts, began to emerge (Ceccarelli 2001; Ceccarelli 2021; Zwierlein 2016). Economic risk often found itself associated with the concept of probability (Januard 2023); and moral theological regulations for navigating doubt and probability held normative implications for the legitimacy of engaging in economic risk-taking. It is important to note that this does not imply that the medieval era discouraged risk-taking. Particularly in the late Middle Ages, engaging in economic risk did not necessarily entail moral failure or a likelihood of sin.

2.2 Verisimilis

In medieval usage, verisimilis meant what it literally said: that something was ‘truth-like’. This did not, however, imply that the thing was actually close to truth, because it might have only the appearance – possibly spurious or superficial – of truth. Signs, images, and circumstantial evidence were often called verisimilis if they satisfied these conditions. Medieval lawyers spoke of ‘truth-like circumstantial evidence’ (indicia verisimilia), and Albert of Cologne (Logica, 241) maintained that what was ‘truth-like’ resided in ‘signs’ (verisimile est in signis).[7]

Was verisimilis used as a synonym for probabilis by medieval scholastics? Albert (ibid.) claims straightforwardly that “probable things are truth-like” (probabilia … sunt verisimilia).[8] Other scholastic uses of these words suggest instead a mere relation of frequent mutual implication. Probable opinions were usually truth-like because their probability prima facie justified an assumption of truth. Truth-like signs often justified an ascription of probability to an assertion. The widespread combination of probabilis with particular kinds of proposition (Aristotelian endoxa; see Section 3.1) and of verisimilis with signs are nevertheless good reasons to assume that these predicates were not synonymous. The distinction between the terms may reflect established differences in ancient Greek terminology, tying probabilis to pithanon (persuasive, adoptable) and verisimilis to eikos (truth-like). Such differences arguably already pervaded Cicero’s usage of probabilis and verisimilis, although the matter is contentious.[9]

2.3 Credibilis, opinabilis

A proposition was regarded as credibilis or opinabilis if it could legitimately be accepted as one’s opinion. The underlying criteria were often the same as for probabilis. Propositions which did not satisfy the respective criteria were called inopinabilis or improbabilis, and deserved to be rejected by rational and responsible epistemic agents. This meant that improbable propositions ought not to be taken for true or accepted as a premise for action, but not necessarily that they must be regarded as false.[10]

2.4 Frequency terms

A host of frequency terms such as “frequently” (frequenter), “more frequently” (ut frequentius) and “for the most part” (ut in pluribus), or their converses such as “rarely” (ut in paucioribus), often accompanied ascriptions of probability in medieval scholasticism. What frequently or usually happened was prima facie considered to be probable. Scholastic usage of frequency terms followed ancient precedent, most notably Aristotle’s statements of what is true or false “in most cases” (hōs epi to polu). Whether this background in Aristotelian science and methodology justifies the assumption of a medieval frequency concept of probability will be discussed in Section 3.2.

3. Scholastic Concepts of Probability

In some areas of medieval thought, probability-related terms were important for the regulation of decision-making and conduct. In these contexts, the term “probable” (probabilis) took on a specific significance. Whether a merchant wanted to follow an opinion concerning the moral legitimacy of a contract or a lawyer formulated a presumption, it had to be probabilis to possess moral or juridical weight. It is now necessary to discuss the most important medieval understandings of probabilis, grounding them in ancient definitions or precedent.

Until the thirteenth century, the definitions of “probable” by Cicero and Boethius very much shaped the medieval understanding of probability:

That is probable which for the most part usually comes to pass, or which is a part of the ordinary beliefs of mankind, or which contains in itself some resemblance to these qualities, whether such resemblance be true or false. (Cicero, De inventione, I.29.46)

Something is readily believable (probabilis) if it seems true to everyone or to the most people or to the wise – and of the wise, either to all of them or most of them or to the most famous and distinguished – or to an expert in his own field, for example, to a doctor in the field of medicine or to a pilot in the navigation of ships, or, finally, if it seems true to the person with whom one is having the conversation or who is judging it. (Boethius, De topicis, 1180b28)

For Cicero, probability represents the usual course of events, commonly held beliefs, or what resembles them. His characterization of probability thus contains the roots of at least two different concepts of probability. Boethius repeats Aristotle’s definition of an endoxon (see Section 3.1) as a readily believable proposition almost verbatim and calls it probabilis. In this respect, he prepared the way for the reception of Aristotle’s original definition; but note that Boethius addresses the role of experts more explicitly than Aristotle, who in medieval translations summarily refers to sapientes, the wise.[11]

Aristotle replaced Cicero and Boethius as supreme authority on probability in the thirteenth century. This is also the time when medieval probability discourse fully unfolded. For the period from (roughly) 1200 to 1500, it is possible to identify four different concepts of probability: the endoxic, proto-frequentist, testimonial or juridical, and semantic. The number of concepts is, however, a matter of interpretation since it is possible to split up the juridical category of probability further.[12]

The use of probability-related terms was almost certainly wider than the concepts of probability listed above suggest. In philosophical and theological debates, as well as in the regulation of action, probabilis could be used as a predicate for the argumentative support which a proposition had (translatable as “plausible” or “rationally tenable”). In the early modern era, this aspect of medieval probability became explicitly integrated into the definition of a probable opinion (Knebel 2000; Maryks 2008; Schuessler 2019; Tutino 2018). It was not, however, expressly addressed in medieval and, in particular, scholastic characterizations of probability. Here, the focus will be on such characterizations in medieval sources.

3.1 Endoxic (or topical) probability

The most prominent scholastic understanding of probability derived from Aristotle’s notion of endoxon, which shaped the concept of “probable opinion” (opinio probabilis). Aristotle defines endoxon in Topics I, 100b20 as:

[T]hose opinions are reputable [endoxa] which are accepted by everyone or by the majority or by the wise – i.e., by all, or by the majority, or by the most notable and reputable of them.

Boethius and medieval commentators on the Topics translated endoxa as probabilia (“probable things”) or opiniones probabiles (“probable opinions”). In light of the rise of Aristotelianism, it is thus unsurprising that Thomas Aquinas and other scholastics turned to this understanding of probability when they discussed conclusions from uncertain premises:[13]

[P]ropositions are called probable because they are more known to the wise or to the multitude. (Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on the Posterior Analytics, I.8.35)

Many scholastic characterizations or definitions of probability contain an explicit reference to Topics I, such as this one by Gregory of Rimini:

Moreover, since “probable things” mean “what appears true to the many or the wise” according to the Philosopher [i.e., Aristotle] in Topics I, which also agrees with Augustine’s Contra Cresconium, Book III, where he says that things are called probable because “they are endorsed, that is, approved and believed”, [to which] add “to be true”, it follows that approbation by the authority of the wise of this world is a reason which generates probability (ratio probabilis).[14]

As this quotation shows, Augustine’s understanding of probability was thought to coincide with Aristotle’s, a fact that must have buttressed the endoxic notion of probability. Yet, while Augustine is not often referred to in medieval definitions of probability, a reference to Topics I became a commonplace. It seems immediately clear why an endoxic understanding of probabilis led to the modern translations “reputable”, “plausible”, “believable”, “approvable”, or “approved”. Reputability and approval, however, are not necessarily indicators of truth, and therefore the role that endoxa played for Aristotle and for the scholastics needs clarification.

Endoxa were important for ancient rhetoric and dialectic. Rhetoric aims at persuasion, and opinions which are generally accepted or backed up by the intellectual reputation of their sources tend to be persuasive. In rhetorical usage, therefore, endoxon and probabilis can be equated to a proposition with “expected persuasiveness”. Dialectic is concerned with disputes and inquiry through the exchange of arguments. Endoxa, in ancient dialectic, were starting, intermediate, and often also endpoints of such activities; and, to this extent, they might be seen as instruments for intellectual training. This, however, would create the wrong impression of the overall role of endoxa in Aristotle’s methodology of the sciences (Haskins 2004; Kraut 2006; Renon 1998). He also takes them to be reasonable starting points for scientific inquiry, as well as material for testing its results. The process of inquiry should select the right endoxa and order them systematically. In this respect, the connection between likely truth and being held true by many or wise people is presumed by Aristotle. There is no guarantee, however, that an endoxon is true, which makes it an apt object of inquiry.

Scholastic usage of opinio probabilis conformed less to the rhetorical and more to the dialectical and methodological roles of endoxa (see also Section 4.1) – even if the opinions in question were applied in oratory and preaching. A scholastic author, in particular from the thirteenth century onward, who called a philosophical position or a theological claim probable alluded to an epistemic quality which justified serious consideration over and above a proposition’s suitability for inducing agreement in hearers. Sensory perception is sometimes mentioned as a basis for probable opinions which are held by all people (“Snow is white”).[15]Apparently, the opinions of the uneducated (rudes) and laymen (idiotae) did not qualify as probable, unless they were observation statements, for which uneducated people had as much competence as the educated. Competence in judging a matter was therefore the key to scholastic ascriptions of probability. The category of the “wisest” in medieval definitions of probability was a stand-in for “expert”, including top-ranking lawyers, theologians, medical doctors and philosophers – or even architects, engineers and other virtuosi of mechanical arts (as in Boethius’s definition of probable opinion). This expert status was acquired through training in a university or with a master. Moreover, an expert counted as such only in his field of expertise.[16] The sapientes to which the definition of probable opinion refers nevertheless had to possess at least some positive non-epistemic traits: they had to be decent (probus) and trustworthy people in order to possess weighty opinions.

The role of authority in the endoxic definition of probability has been widely discussed and criticized.[17] Although the word auctoritas does not occur regularly in definitions of “the probable”, it seems indisputable that these definitions refer to authority as the basis of probability. The authority in question is, in principle, intellectual or epistemic (based on expertise); but the distinction between epistemic and hierarchical authority was always blurry, and the latter could (and often did) prevail in practice. Given the dismal training of parish priests, this was surely often the case because the uneducated were called on to accept the opinions of their parish priest or confessor (Thomas Aquinas, Quodlibetales, III, q. 4, 2, 47; and Antoninus, Summa, I, 3, 10, 64). Moreover, scholastic reliance on institutional indicators for competence may have impeded a clear distinction between epistemic and hierarchical authority, since epistemic authority was to some extent tied to hierarchical success in academia. Students, for instance, were prima facie expected to believe the opinions of their professors (i.e., masters).

The distinction between hierarchical and epistemic authority should not be confused with the distinction between external and internal reasons for holding a proposition true. Endoxic probability seems to be entirely based on the opinions of others and thus on external (or indirect) reasons for holding a proposition true. (Internal or direct reasons are those a person herself can assess.) Yet some difficulties with the view that medieval probability was wholly external and thus authority-based deserve to be addressed. Endoxic probability was not the only concept of probability in medieval scholasticism, and others were (as we shall see) more open to internal reasons. Moreover, an expert might claim probability for his own judgment – something not excluded by the definition of endoxon. Nevertheless, agents were often asked to conform to the opinion of a qualified majority (“the larger and more reasonable part”, maior et sanior pars) of competent evaluators.[18] This requirement shows that the endoxic understanding of probable opinions was indeed skewed towards external authority.[19]

3.2 Proto-frequentist probability

Hacking (1975) famously claimed that frequentist conceptions of probability largely arose as a side-product of the seventeenth century revolution in probability. Historians of ideas quickly identified the weaknesses in Hacking’s thesis (Brown 1987; Daston 1988; Garber and Zabell 1979). An understanding of probability as what happens most of the time or for the most part (hōs epi to polu) can already be found in Aristotle and the scholastics. The frequentist notion of probability therefore seems to possess a long pre-modern history.[20] Unfortunately, things are far more complicated. Modern frequentism arose as a complex of ideas in the nineteenth century, perhaps evolving only in the twentieth century into a full-fledged conception of probability (Gillies 2000, 88–113). Hence, early modern uses (such as Jacob Bernoulli’s) of the relative frequency of occurrences in a sequence of events are not yet frequentist in the modern sense. Medieval (and ancient) uses of ut frequenter considerations differ, in turn, from early modern (proto-)frequentism (see Schuessler 2019, chap. 12). Having made this point, in what follows, proto-frequentism will be used without the qualification “medieval”.

As has been shown, medieval readers could have gleaned frequentist ideas from Cicero even before the rise of Aristotelianism in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries. Cicero stipulates that probabilis can mean “for the most part”, and medieval authors who followed him therefore held a proto-frequentist conception of probability. Later on, such a conception was often derived from the works of Aristotle. Did this make any difference? Let us look at four examples:

  1. It is sufficient that you obtain a probable certainty, which means that in most cases (ut in pluribus) you are right and only in a few cases (ut in paucioribus) are you wrong. (Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae II-II, q. 70, 2)[21]
  2. It is not probable that, among the vast number of the faithful, there would not be many people who would readily supply the needs of those whom they hold in reverence because of the perfection of their virtue. (Thomas Aquinas, Summa contra gentiles, lib. 3, 135, 19, 187)
  3. But, from some pre-existing causes future effects do not follow necessarily, but usually. For instance, in most cases (ut in pluribus) a perfect human being results from the insemination of a mother by a man’s semen; sometimes, however, monsters are generated, because of some obstruction which overcomes the operation of the natural capacity. (Thomas Aquinas, Summa contra gentiles, lib. 3, 154, 11, 243)
  4. Hence, in this proposal we have men and women, who at age 25 buy a life-long annuity for a price which they recover within eight years and although they can die within these eight years it is more probable that they live twice the time. In this way what happens more frequently and is more probable is to the advantage of the buyer. (Alexander of Alessandria, Tractatus de usuris, c. 72, Y f. 146r)[22]

Passage (i) should not be understood as granting probable certainty (certitudo probabilis) whenever a person is more often right than wrong. The few exceptions mentioned ought to be really exceptional in order to allow for a probable certainty, which was deemed sufficient for blameless moral action. Probable certainty was thus a threshold rather than a frequency concept.

Passage (ii) refers to the high likelihood that at least some among a large number of people will possess a desired trait. This is a proto-statistical statement, but it does not show that probability means frequent occurrence. The claim that, among a large number of people, some will have a rare trait can easily be believed – depending on the trait in question – by a multitude or by “the wise”. Consequently, ut in pluribus claims might often have been indicators of endoxic probability rather than expressions of an independent concept of probability.

Passage (iii) postulates a natural regularity. Sexual conception usually results in “perfect” (as opposed to deformed or “monstrous”) offspring. This ut in pluribus claim refers to a majority of occurrences, but its background in Aristotelian natural philosophy is significant. Scholars debate whether Aristotle’s understanding of “for the most part” judgments is equivalent to a frequentist concept of probability (Judson 1991; Kraut 2006; Winter 1997). Aristotelian “for the most part” judgments imply much more in terms of law-like or natural connections than can be captured by mere reference to relative frequencies. It is therefore plausible to assume the same for medieval Aristotelians, in particular for those who wrote about natural processes.

Passage (iv) is probably closest to implicit statistical reasoning and refers, not by chance, to an economic context. The passage quoted deals with fairness requirements between buyers and sellers of life annuities. A lump sum payment of a buyer and his or her (widows liked to buy annuities) uncertain stream of income require an equitable balance. The uncertainty or risk in question pertains to the possible death of the owner of an annuity; and it is claimed that persons who are 25 years old will probably live more than eight further years. It may be apt to speak in this case of a probability of more than 0.5 for further survival. Medieval considerations concerning insurance or annuities show that numerical probability was never too far away, which adds to our amazement that this step did not occur before the seventeenth century. Passage (iv), however, contains two probability-related terms: the buyer is favored by what occurs more often (frequentius) and is more probable (probabilius). Kantola assumes that the words frequentius and probabilius are synonymous here, as in several other cases in which they occur together.[23] Yet why would scholastic authors repeat two synonymous words if one would do? The combined use of “frequent” and “probable” often occurs in matter of fact contexts (as in our example) which require no rhetorical flourishes. There is no apparent need for emphasis through a repetition of synonyms. A plausible answer is that the two terms are not, in fact, synonymous and that frequency justifies an ascription of probability, although probability means something else. It would make sense to combine both terms precisely because frequency justifies a probability ascription in the given case, but only probability confers legitimacy on actions or contracts. In short, frequent occurrence might only have served as indicator of endoxic probability for medieval scholastics. The frequency of events may have prima facie justified the assumption that everyone, a majority or the experts will believe that the events in question will occur.

Should proto-frequentism therefore be dropped as a genuine concept of probability? This step would be premature as long as the interpretation of medieval ut frequenter statements is still being debated. Continuity with ancient notions of probability also suggests that we should tread carefully. For this reason, proto-frequentism is included here among the medieval concepts of probability.

3.3 Testimonial and juridical probability

Testimonial probability arises from the testimony of witnesses. It is one of the two kinds of probability which Silvester de Prierio listed in his Summa summarum (the other is endoxic probability): “‘Probable’ is used in two ways. First as the opposite of hidden, that is, what is proved by witnesses …”[24] The rapid growth of jurisprudence after the twelfth century nourished a great interest in witness testimony.[25] It was very difficult to rely on circumstantial evidence in medieval jurisprudence; so the testimony of witnesses was in many ways the key to a court decision. A complicated system of “half proofs” and proofs was designed to safe-guard the rationality of juridical procedures (Evans 2002; Franklin 2001, 15; Rosoni 1995, 89). Moreover, even outside the narrow confines of jurisprudence, witness testimony played an important role. Thomas Aquinas, for instance, described a certainty sufficient for action:

And yet the fact that in so many it is not possible to have certitude without fear of error is no reason why we should reject the certitude which can probably be had [quae probabiliter haberi potest] through two or three witnesses … (Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae, II-II, q. 70, 2, 1488)

Thomas’s remark alludes to the norm that the testimony of one eye-witness confers probability on an assertion, whereas the (uncontested) testimony of two or more witnesses creates probable certainty.

A related but wider field for using the predicate “probable” in juridical terminology was the classification of presumptions. A “probable presumption” (probabilis presumptio) had some force in inclining a judge towards or against a verdict (Hubert 2009; Motzenbäcker 1958, 120, 159). Moreover, witness testimony was just one kind of evidence which could render a presumption probable. Probability could also result from “truth-like circumstantial evidence” (indicia verisimilia), as this statement from Huguccio documents: “Probable is what is accepted because of common human opinion or truth-like circumstantial evidence (indicia).”[26] Huguccio’s reference to common opinion shows that endoxic probability was also relevant in the law courts.[27] Nevertheless, the treatment of signs and indicia as probability generating evidence, which was strongly promoted by scholastic jurists, created an important precedent for connecting the notion of probability to the direct evidence of an observer.

3.4 Semantic probability

Aristotle tied the notion of probability to questions of necessity and contingency. The probable did not follow with necessity but only contingently (and for the most part) from the nature of things. In medieval scholasticism, this connection was often stated in semantic terms. Boethius of Dacia called probability: “a property which disposes (habilitans) but does not necessitate a subject to the partaking of a predicate”.[28] Probability is here a degree of participation of a predicate in a subject. Full participation under all conditions stands for necessity; participation under most conditions (for the most part) leads to probability. The semantic notion of probability as conditioned participation of a predicate in a subject is thus closely related to the proto-frequentist interpretation discussed above. It is, however, formally distinct as a notion of probability, not least because some scholastics addressed it as such. Peter Richeri, Topica Aristotelis (A. 37), I q. 2, 117ra–118ra, referred to Boethius (the ancient one, not the medieval philosopher of Dacia) in this context:

Yet Boethius defines probable things differently in his Topics I: probable things are those to which the mind readily acquiesces, although it does not possess a firmness of truth in them, as in this proposition: “If she is a mother, she loves [her child].” With respect to this explication, it should moreover be known that a proposition is called probable when its subject contains a property which disposes, but does not necessitate, it to partake of the predicate ….[29]

The semantic relation to which Richeri refers is not explicit in Boethius’s definition. What mainly matters here, however, is Richeri’s use of a semantic notion of probability. Albert of Cologne displays the same notion in connection with a perception-based explanation; such propositions are held true by everyone, the most, or the wise.[30] The less sense-based and the more intellectual a perception is the more is it restricted to the wise and the thoughtful, according to Albert. Interestingly, he acknowledges Arabic sources for this view (Albert Logica, I, 1, 2, 241; Bach 1881; Cortabarria Beita 1953). He does not mention a specific source, but this hint uncovers an important connection indicating that medieval Islamic philosophy, theology, and law were no less based on probability than their Christian counterparts (Black 1990, 108; Daiber 1990, 218; Miller 1984, 55).

Nicolas of Autrecourt offers an alternative perspective on the contrast between complete and partial participation. Nicolas posits that perfect knowledge corresponds to the full appearance of an object, whereas probability represents a degree of approaching this completeness. Certainty, in turn, arises when there exists a sufficiently high degree of completeness in the object’s manifestation (Grellard 2005, 93; Salvestrini 2022, 968).

4. Further aspects of medieval probability

4.1 The dialectical syllogism

Syllogisms are patterns of logical argumentation. A syllogism with merely probable premises was called dialectical in medieval and Renaissance philosophy. Since dialectic was the “art of rational disputation” or “controversial inquiry” (ars disserendi), and disputation was a characteristic activity of universities in the Middle Ages, argumentation with probable propositions possessed an enormous significance for medieval thought. It is also characteristic of logic-fed scholasticism that probable reasoning was mainly conceived as logical deduction from probable premises.[31] After the rise of Aristotelianism, these premises were mostly framed as endoxa. Thomas Aquinas writes:

The dialectician is concerned only with proceeding from propositions which are as acceptable as possible. These are propositions which seem true to most people and especially to the wise. (Thomas Aquinas, Posterior Analytics, I, 31, 3, 142)

It is not, however, clear whether authors who summarily refer to probable premises only intend endoxa in their definitions of dialectical syllogism, or whether they operate, like Albert of Cologne, with a broader notion of probable premise. Albert (Logica, I, 4, 2, 278) speaks with respect to the dialectical syllogism about premises which are always or most often (in pluribus) true. There was also some discussion about the epistemic status of the argumentative scheme of the dialectical syllogism and the conclusions from probable premises. The common assumption was that the dialectic syllogism is an indubitably valid deductive scheme, but that probable premises produce only probable conclusions or opinions (Buridan, Quaestiones, 19; Buridan, Summulae, 347).

Ockham offers some remarkable comments in Summa logicae III.1.1 concerning probability in the dialectical syllogism.[32] Like many others, Ockham assumes that the dialectical syllogism starts from merely probable propositions (probabilia), which he characterizes as endoxa. Yet he then claims that probable propositions are true and necessary, even though they are not per se or derivatively known to be true with certainty (probabilia sunt illa, quae cum sint vera et necesseria, non tamen per se nota, nec ex per se notis syllogizabilia, nec etiam per experientiam evidenter nota, nec ex talibus sequentia). Probability, thus, hinges on an epistemically deficient state of an observer. However, a dialectical syllogism need not produce uncertainty in an observer since it need not produce fear of error but can instead engender firm conviction in its conclusion.[33] Ockham deviates here from some familiar scholastic assumptions concerning probability. His probabilia cannot be probable opinions in the third sense of Grosseteste (see above), which are by definition contingent. The conclusion of a dialectical syllogism is also not necessarily a probable opinion because then it would be accompanied by fear of error. This cluster of sentences is nevertheless all Ockham has to say about probability in the Summa logicae (and Burley, Buridan, and others say even less in their logical works). No deeper analysis concerning the role of probabilia in his philosophy or theology ensues, and his uncommon remarks apparently did not spark any discussion by others.[34] Elsewhere in his work, Ockham judges specific philosophical theses to be probable or more probable in the same way as other scholastic authors did. If his short comments on probabilia in the Summa logicae offer a glimpse of the deeper modal and ontological ramifications of probability, they also document that these ramifications were hardly pursued by medieval scholastics.[35]

However important dialectical syllogisms may have been for medieval disputation, it should also be recognized that action-planning in conscience was conceived as deduction from (partly) probable premises. The dialectical syllogism therefore provided a logical basis for moral decisions and served as a tool for moral theology.

The humanist dialectic of the Renaissance shared many assumptions concerning the dialectical syllogism with the scholastics, but some authors developed a different understanding of dialectic. These developments will be discussed in Section 5.

4.2 Order relations between probabilities

Pre-modern probability was not a number or ratio, but mainly a binary property which a proposition either had or did not have. Yet pre-modern probability was also an ordinal concept. Some propositions were regarded as more probable (probabilior, probabilius) than others. More probable opinions were a subclass of probable opinions. Consequently, an opinion had at least to be probable in order to be more probable than another opinion. In line with these premises, strict order relations (i.e. “>” and “<”) for opinions were common in medieval and Renaissance philosophy. In the Middle Ages, attributions of equal probability did exist but seemed to be less widespread.[36] An equilibrium between opposing reasons led to doubt (dubium). However, it is important to note that the ethical principles guiding decisions in a state of doubt were distinct from those applied when choosing between probable opinions.

4.3 Both-sided probability

Scholastic authors often ascribed probability at the same time to a proposition and its negation or to a proposition and a counter-proposition which was logically incompatible with it. A proposition could even be regarded as more probable (probabilior) without its negation losing probability. In fact, calling an opinion more probable than another regularly implied that the other was also probable, because comparison and choice between probable alternatives was intended.

For some modern commentators, this impugns an understanding of “probable” as readily affirmable or adoptable. It seems to be a minimum requirement of being affirmable that a proposition x is judged to be more likely true than false, that is, having probability p(x) > 0.5. Since a proposition and its negation cannot both have p > 0.5, they cannot both be affirmable at the same time. The scholastics, of course, did not operate with such numerical considerations. For them, “both-sided probability” (as one might call it) resulted naturally from the endoxic concept of probability. A proposition and its negation can both be held true at the same time by different experts.[37]

It is not possible, of course, to assume both-sided probability based on a proto-frequentist or semantic understanding of probability. Contradictory sentences cannot both be most often true. Yet this problem did not impugn medieval ascriptions of both-sided probability in academic debates or in the practice of the confessional, which usually explicitly or implicitly proceeded on the basis of the endoxic understanding of probability.

There are two different ways in which an evaluator can consider a proposition as more probable and a counter-proposition as probable at the same time. First, the evaluator can believe that more and/or better experts hold x true than y, although y is approved by a sufficient number of experts to count as probable.[38] Second, the evaluator may consider a proposition as more probable according to her own weighing up of the reasons, while the counter-proposition is considered probable because it is the opinion of many or weighty experts.[39] Both options show that there is no obvious logical problem with the assumption that two incompatible propositions can both be regarded as rationally affirmable.[40] This does not, however, invalidate the claim that only one of the propositions can be rationally affirmed at a given time and by a given person from her own standpoint. The person in question can, it seems, only rationally affirm what she regards as more probable than its negation. Consequently, regarding a rival opinion as probable means considering it as affirmable by others – or, in modern terminology, by one’s epistemic peers.[41] This insight is an important step towards opinion pluralism and the conceptualization of reasonable disagreement, and it is significant that it is in nuce implied in the both-sided probability of medieval scholastics (Schuessler 2014).

The epistemological difficulties of both-sided probability (and of reasonable disagreement between competent reasoners) were not, however, analyzed in depth by medieval scholastics. Nor did they investigate how an epistemology of acceptance of probable opinions as premises for action differs from one which assumes assent or affirmation of the opinions in question. All this happened much later in the scholastic tradition, in the seventeenth century; but this is another story (Deman 1936; Knebel 2000; Schuessler 2019; Schwartz 2019; Tutino 2018). The developments in question were linked to the rise of a new scholastic doctrine called probabilism in the seventeenth century. Probabilism, as understood at the time (the modern understanding of the term is quite different), legitimizes a specific way of using probable opinions.[42] It is not synonymous with any kind of probabilistic reasoning. However, we need not deal with scholastic probabilism any further because the doctrine did not exist in the period now under consideration. It is sometimes attributed to medieval authors, but such ascriptions should be contested and, in any case, should not be accepted without deeper discussion for authors who wrote before 1500.

4.4 Subjectivity and objectivity

The question of whether medieval forms of probability were subjective or objective has long puzzled modern researchers (Kantola 1994). It is difficult to come up with an answer, not least because medieval authors did not employ the (characteristically modern) terminology of subjectivity and objectivity with respect to judgments of probability.[43] Nevertheless, the discussion above of medieval uses of probability-related terms sheds some light on matters of subjectivity and objectivity.

As has been shown, probabilis or verisimilis were predicates for the qualitative support a body of evidence gave to the truth of a proposition or the fittingness of a sign. We have already seen what kinds of evidence for probability were accepted at the time. A subjective aspect of probability ascriptions thus consisted in a belief obtained by the supporting relationship in a particular case. An objective aspect depended on the actual existence of the supporting basis.

This kind of objectivity does not make probability a feature of the world or a theoretical construct based on facts of nature. Such stronger forms of objectivity underlie, for instance, a true proto-frequentist understanding of probability.[44] If probability means “what frequently happens”, probability will often derive from objective features of the world. If frequent occurrence of x is only an indicator for the affirmability of sentences about x, medieval proto-frequentist probability is not strongly objective in this way. Nevertheless, at least the medieval semantic notion of probability seems to be objective in the strong sense. A proposition, the predicate of which mostly inheres in its subject, is at least in some cases objectively probable on ontological grounds from a scholastic point of view. Facts of nature determine the degree to which predicates inhere in a subject, so that it becomes objectively probable that a mother loves her child.

Moreover, medieval probability ascriptions were in significant respects inter-subjectively testable – and it is characteristic of scholasticism to assume that communities are in a position to assess individual claims of rationality.[45] Propositions can be identified as semantically probable through the common use of terms. A communitarian basis also existed for the endoxic notion of probability, which in principle derives from observable majorities or a shared ascription of wisdom or expertise. Endoxic probability could thus become an instrument of social (and moral) control. Yet, although collective control of endoxic probability ascriptions may have existed, it was never absolute in the period under discussion. Often, no consensus concerning the relative weight of experts existed; and it therefore remained contentious which side was “larger and more reasonable” (maior et sanior) or even whether a proposition was supported by enough leading experts to count as probable. On these grounds, some perspectival variation became possible. Walter Burley wrote that a thing can be probable to one person and improbable to another.[46] This statement shows that a limited multi-perspectival variety of probability ascriptions was acknowledged in the late Middle Ages.

5. Probability in the Renaissance

The Renaissance is considered here as a cultural movement which bridged two historical epochs, the Middle Ages and early modernity. There is notorious disagreement on the temporal boundaries of the Renaissance. One familiar view is that it covers the period from the middle of the fourteenth century to the end of the sixteenth. The Renaissance is closely linked to the rise of humanism as a style of thought, and humanism is often conceived of as a rival and antagonist of scholasticism. Recent scholarship has found less clear-cut boundaries between humanism and scholasticism than were formerly assumed, and this is also true for humanist and scholastic uses of probability-related terms. The whole range of Latin probability-related words was used by Renaissance humanists and medieval scholastics alike, with roughly similar meanings based on ancient precedent. In the period from 1200–1500, there were no great debates on probability; and what Renaissance authors, like their contemporaries, had to say about the subject fills a few lines at most in their works. Nonetheless, the differences between humanist and scholastic uses of probability should be noted.

Humanist concern with probability was largely stimulated by attempts to clarify the relationship between rhetoric and dialectic. A second, but related, field in which probability-terms became important for humanists was the translation, recovery, and interpretation of ancient texts, such as Aristotle’s Topics or Quintilian’s Institutio oratoria. Yet the renewed attention to the texts of Cicero and Quintilian, or those of Aristotle’s Greek commentators, in the fifteenth century does not seem to have produced an immediate challenge to scholastic usages of probability. In general, the terms probabilis or probabilitas appear to have been less central for humanists than for scholastic (moral) theology and jurisprudence. Many humanists prolifically used the word probabilis, but some shunned it and spoke instead of worthiness of belief (credibilitas). This may often signal not much more than a predilection for the Latin of some ancient author. A contrast to scholastic usage can at best be expected from authors who intended to make a break with scholastic dialectic such as Lorenzo Valla and Rudolph Agricola (Mack 1993, 31, 146; Nauta 2009, 233; Spranzi-Zuber 2011, 65).

Lorenzo Valla (Repastinatio, 253) attacked scholastic dialectic, referring to worthiness of belief and belief-worthy things (credibilia) rather than to probability and probabilia. He follows Quintilian’s (the complete text of the Institutio oratoria was rediscovered in the Latin West in 1416) division of belief-worthiness into very firm (firmissimum), strongly disposed (propensius), and not ill-disposed (non repugnans).[47] Credibility and truth-likeness are also related to the modal category of possibility. Valla assumes degrees of possibility. Something can be very or slightly possible. Only propositions qualified as very possible were worthy of belief and truth-like (verisimilis). In this context, Valla never once uses the word probabilis. But he approvingly quotes Cicero’s connection of argumentation with probable (probabilis) invention in Book 3 of his Repastinatio dialecticae, where he gets down to dialectic and logic after much previous analysis of language. On the whole, Valla’s probability-related concepts do not seem to differ too starkly from the semantic and proto-frequentist notions of probability (or belief-worthiness) which he shared with the scholastics.

Rudolph Agricola, another humanist innovator, put the word probabilis center stage in his path-breaking reinterpretation of dialectic. For him, dialectic was the art of speaking with probability on whatever issue. This definition appears traditional enough, but Agricola (De inventione dialectica, 210) explicitly distanced himself from Aristotle’s endoxon as the basis for probability in dialectic. As has been noted by modern scholars, “speaking with probability” is a feature of a process for Agricola rather than one grounded in a property of propositions used in a dialectical syllogism. Probability arises from the argumentative quality (argumentosus), aptness (aptus), and fittingness (consentaneus) of a reasoning process (Agricola, De inventione dialectica, 210, 306; Mack 1993, 170; Spranzi-Zuber 2011, 89). This directs dialectic away from the reliance on authority implied by Aristotle’s definition of reputable opinion. It is also significant that Valla and Agricola focus on the production of conviction (fides) instead of mere opinion. They thus seem to call for more rhetorical persuasion or for higher epistemological standards in dialectic’s quest for truth. It is difficult, however, to develop an uncontentious interpretation of what Agricola exactly meant by his peculiar, but undoubtedly influential, view of probability. In sixteenth-century century humanist discourse on probability, Agricola’s dialectic was a key innovation, as were the new interest in Aristotle’s Topics, the rise of a Protestant tradition of dialectic, and much more. Together with advancements in early modern scholasticism, these developments provide a justification for ending the present survey around 1500.

6. Preview of early modern and modern probability

Medieval and Renaissance notions of probability largely derived from the same ancient sources and remained related to each other through interchanges between scholastics and humanists. Yet soon after 1500, pre-modern probability discourse began to assume a new shape. Although the many differences between medieval and early modern scholastic and humanist uses of “the probable” cannot be summarized here, they should not be underestimated. Above all, at the end of the sixteenth century, the Aristotelian endoxon gave way in moral theology to a two-tiered definition of probability as either intrinsic (based on known reasons) or extrinsic (based on the opinions of others). How much such innovations fostered the rise of numerical probability in the middle of the seventeenth century is still largely an open question. Knebel (2000) and Schuessler (2019) show that it is reasonable to assume a significant contribution by early modern scholasticism. Maryks (2008) claims that the humanist precedent prompted the Jesuits to introduce the distinction between internal and external probability. At present, however, the cross-pollinations between early modern humanism and scholasticism are scarcely better understood than the developments leading to the invention of numerical probability.

In any case, the notions of probability of many philosophers, from Descartes and Locke to Kant, recognizably rely on a stock of meanings with roots in Renaissance humanism and medieval scholasticism. The philosophers in question deviated notably from this stock, but so did their scholastic contemporaries. The modernization of probability therefore occurred along a broad front of schools, trends and traditions in the seventeenth century. It is instructive to relate the four medieval concepts of probability listed above to their modern successors. On the modern side, three major groups of interpretations or concepts of probability have emerged (Hájek 2011):

  • quasi-logical approaches: probability as a measure of objective evidential support;
  • degree-of-confidence or degree-of-belief approaches: probability as a measure of subjective graded belief or confidence;
  • feature-of-the-world approaches: probability as a measure for undetermined features of the world.

The first category mainly contains classical and logical concepts of probability.[48] Classical concepts define probability through the equal possibility of states of affairs. Logical concepts focus on evidential support for the truth of propositions. The most prominent variants of the second category are Bayesian theories of probability and mathematical representations of subjective expectation. The last category comprises frequentist and propensity interpretations of probability.[49] For frequentists, probability is the limit of a relative frequency in a series of events; for the propensity view, it is an irreducible feature of the physical world.

Medieval notions of probability exhibit parallels to all modern groups of probability concepts. Endoxic and juridical probability are species of quasi-logical probability because they arise from evidential support for holding a proposition true. Endoxa, that is, probable opinions of others, are evidence for holding a proposition true. The witness testimony and indicia of juridical notions of probability are also, of course, kinds of evidence. The second category of modern interpretations of probability is related to medieval probability understood as a specific amount of confidence in the truth of a proposition. It is the confidence that characterizes opinions as the lowest rank of an epistemological order leading via fides (standing for fully confident belief or faith) to knowledge. Finally, probability is a feature of the world in modern propensity views, as well as for the medieval semantic notion of probability. Whether this also holds for proto-frequentist probability is, as indicated, a matter of interpretation.

Conspicuously lacking in the period from 1200–1500 is an ancestor of the “classical” notion of probability, grounded on the equal possibility of events. This, then, seems to be a genuinely modern interpretation of probability.[50]


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I would like to thank Jill Kraye and Robert Pasnau for comments and helpful suggestions.

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