First published Fri Jan 14, 2022

Marcus Tullius Cicero (106–43 BCE) is best known to posterity as a prominent statesman and orator in the tumultuous period of the late Roman republic. As well as being a leading political actor of his time, he also wrote voluminously. Among his writings, around a dozen philosophical works have come down to us. Philosophy was a lifelong passion for Cicero. In addition to what one might call his strictly philosophical compositions, much else of what he wrote – including his speeches, works on rhetoric, and a large collection of letters – show evidence of his philosophical interests. In terms of modern scholarship, the value of Cicero’s philosophical work was held, until relatively recently, to lie chiefly in the information it provided about the thought of the leading philosophical schools of his day: Stoicism, Epicureanism and Academic scepticism among them. However, in part because of the creative way in which he engages with his predecessors, he is increasingly studied today as a philosophical thinker of independent interest.

In this entry, it is not possible to do more than offer a brief sketch of some of Cicero’s main philosophical works and ideas. The focus will be on providing a sense of the distinctiveness of his philosophical approach, with particular attention paid to how his philosophical allegiance and method of composition contribute to forming a conception of philosophy that remains worthy of notice.

1. Cicero’s Life and Times

There are a number of good studies of Cicero’s life (e.g. Fuhrmann 1992, Rawson 1994, Tempest 2011); some background knowledge is salient to an understanding of his philosophical outlook. As already mentioned, Cicero lived through a turbulent historical period. Under the strains of empire, the Roman republican system of government had fractured, and was eventually to prove unsustainable. Cicero was both witness to and participant in some of the events that hastened the collapse of republican government and that ushered in, within fifteen years or so of his death, the rule of Augustus, first of the Roman emperors.

Cicero rose to the highest political office in the republic – the consulship – in 63 BCE. His period as consul was both the high-water mark of his political career and a fateful turning-point. While consul, he put down the conspiracy against the republic led by Catiline. But his actions led to his being exiled in 58; and, while he was restored to Rome the following year through the influence of Pompey, he could do little other than contemplate with horror the deterioration of relations between Caesar and Pompey that led to civil war and the ascendancy of Caesar to the dictatorship. Caesar’s assassination in 44 brought only brief respite. Cicero himself was put to death on Mark Antony’s orders in 43.

2. Philosophy and Roman Society

As a staunch republican himself, Cicero frequently despaired of the state of the republic. Writing philosophy provided both consolation and a resource that, at least in more hopeful moments, he believed could help ameliorate the political crisis. One of the things that makes Cicero an interesting philosophical figure is his conviction that philosophy has the potential to change lives and make societies better. This belief in philosophy’s practical purpose explains why much, though by no means all, of Cicero’s philosophical production has a broadly ethical or political orientation.

The social and political backdrop is important in another way too. One of Cicero’s purposes in writing philosophy is to bring the best of the Greek philosophical inheritance to wider Roman attention. That does not, however, mean that his works are simple philosophical manuals to be absorbed uncritically by their readership. A striking feature of Cicero’s philosophical output is that it takes seriously and critically the question of the relation between abstract ideas, on the one hand, and the culture and tradition of particular societies (most saliently, for him, Rome), on the other.

Indeed, Cicero treats this relation as bringing with it a set of distinctly philosophical questions about, for example, the normative weight to be assigned to the deliverances of rational theology as against traditional religious practice (see section 7.3 below), or to the precepts of an abstract ethical theory as against the theory’s liveability in a concrete society (section 7.2 below). His discussions of the leading philosophical theories of his day tend to be used not for the purpose of firm advocacy of one particular set of doctrines or another, but to give his readers the tools to think through positions for themselves. Cicero’s project of disseminating philosophy has the aim of inducing what he saw as the properly philosophical approach, one that is critical and open-minded.

3. Dialogue and the Sceptical Stance

His philosophical compositions bear out this approach in two important and connected ways. Firstly, they are by and large written in dialogue form (see Gorman 2005, Schofield 2008). His adoption of the form in part reflects his admiration for Plato, whom he considered the greatest of all philosophers. Now Cicero’s relation to Plato is a complex one (see Long 1995b, Hösle 2008, Bishop 2019 ch. 2), and his use of the dialogue form differed from Plato’s, manifesting itself principally in opposed set speeches rather than rapid back-and-forth exchanges, though the latter are not completely absent from Cicero’s work (and long speeches are common enough in Plato). We find Cicero also invoking the (now lost) dialogues of Aristotle and of the early Platonist philosopher Heraclides of Pontus as influences on him. Still, his favouring of dialogue over straight treatise shares the Platonic motive of engaging readers in active philosophical enquiry.

The majority of Cicero’s philosophical writings feature a speaker or series of speakers setting out the views held on a core topic (for example, the nature of the gods, or the best way to live) by various philosophical schools, with a critique of those views mounted after each exposition, often by Cicero himself. Thus, in terms of their structure, his works lend themselves not to decisive acceptance or rejection of a particular view, but to a setting out of all sides of an argument so readers can make their own assessment.

This feature reflects, in turn, Cicero’s allegiance to Academic scepticism. Now the extent and nature of this allegiance is a matter of debate (see Glucker 1988, Görler 1995, Thorsrud 2012, Brittain 2016, Wynne 2018) but what matters for present purposes is that the sceptical stance takes it as a mistake to believe that certainty is possible. The most one can do is form a judgement that some particular position is more or less plausible than another, such a judgement itself being revisable in the light of further evidence or argument.

The truly philosophical approach is thus one that refuses to take any philosophical view as settled – including this very one (see section 7.1 below). Cicero thereby sets himself against the approach of the contemporary ‘dogmatic’ schools – in particular, Epicureanism and Stoicism – where dogmatism refers not to positions that are unargued for, but to doctrines regarded by their advocates as settled truth. Cicero’s stance is not one that pits itself primarily against specific doctrines of these schools – the sceptic is entitled to adopt any view as plausible. Rather, what he opposes is a conception of intellectual endeavour as capable of arriving at certainty. The best philosophy is one that fosters critical enquiry; and the nature and role of philosophy must, by the same token, itself be in the critical spotlight.

4. Philosophy and Oratory

Cicero’s main philosophical production can be divided into two chronological periods. The first, from around 54–51 BCE, sees the writing of his two main works of political philosophy, the Republic and the Laws (the latter apparently unfinished), each loosely based on a Platonic archetype, together with his great work on the nature and role of oratory, On the Orator. The second period, during which he composed the greater part of his philosophical oeuvre, occurred in an astonishing two-year burst of creativity towards the end of his life, in 45 and 44. Although Cicero’s writings on oratory (he composed several works on the topic) will not be discussed here, they should not be regarded as entirely distinct from his philosophical writings. That is because the relation between philosophy and oratory was of central importance to him. While this might sound arcane to a modern ear, what it encapsulated for Cicero was the vital question of how philosophy is best communicated.

In the Gorgias, Plato had Socrates mount a passionate attack on rhetoric, by contrast with philosophy, as concerned with mere persuasion rather than truth. For Cicero, as probably the supreme orator of his day, matters could not be that simple. The use of speech to manipulate others for self-serving ends could not, of course, be condoned. But the idea that pure reasoning, divorced from communicative skill, was sufficient to win people round to philosophy struck Cicero as, if anything, even more dangerously misguided. The resources of oratory must be recruited to the vital enterprise of disseminating philosophy to new audiences. Cicero often shows himself acutely conscious of criticism that a practical Roman should so much as attempt to write philosophy. By writing it in a way that was not alienating to its potential audience, he could aspire to draw his critics in despite themselves.

5. The First Period: Philosophical Politics

5.1 The Republic and Laws

It is perhaps no accident that Cicero’s first two major philosophical works should be in political philosophy, given both the crisis faced by the republican system of government and the need to produce work in a field that would be regarded as suitable for a Roman statesman. But the Republic and Laws (in Latin De Re Publica and De Legibus respectively) are in at least one respect radical nonetheless: together with On the Orator, they introduce the dialogue form into Latin literature. And notwithstanding the influence of Plato, the two works can lay claim to being among the most original parts of Cicero’s philosophy, since each deals to a substantial extent with the government and institutions of a state of which Plato could have had no inkling, namely Rome.

Both works are intensely Roman. The Republic takes as the best kind of state one that, to a large extent, consists in the traditional structures of the Roman republic. The Laws considers the sort of laws that will best maintain or restore those structures. To this extent, they challenge the idea, one that Cicero saw reflected in the utopianism of Plato’s Republic, that political philosophy should proceed in isolation from consideration of actual political structures and societies. Yet, in ways that make their overall message far from straightforward, both are deeply influenced by abstract theory as well, and by questions of how theory, history and practical politics interact.

5.2 The Republic

In the Republic, a work which unfortunately has not come down to us complete (none of its six books survive whole, with large portions missing especially from the last four), Cicero stakes out his position early with an attack on philosophers who argue that one should refrain from public affairs – he means principally Epicureans. The Stoics, in offering a more activist model, present the alternative view. The Stoic philosopher Panaetius, together with the Greek historian Polybius, is named in the main body of the dialogue as having discussed political matters with one of the work’s principal speakers, Scipio (1.34); and the influence of Stoic political thinking is evident in the idea that humans share with gods dominion not just of the place in which they happen to live, but of the Earth and indeed the whole universe (1.19). Yet this cosmopolitan outlook in turn creates tension with the idea, also prominent in the dialogue, of the specialness of Rome, and raises the question of whether Roman exceptionalism can sit comfortably with a view of human beings as citizens of the world.

It is noteworthy that, even before embarking on a discussion of the nature of the state, Cicero is explicit in his preface (1.12) about the need to justify participation in public affairs, a stance that underlines his view that theories of good government are all very well but may be idle unless one makes the case that engaging in the public arena is the right thing to do. Yet, having commended the participant over the theoretician, Cicero goes on to say that he will now appeal to those who are moved by the authority of philosophers, and declares that in their discussions of government such philosophers have themselves discharged a public office.

The debate about the role of philosophy is reflected within the main body of the dialogue as well, and here it becomes if anything clearer that Cicero’s purpose is not to play down philosophy but to play up the practically oriented way of doing political philosophy that he considers appropriate to the subject. At the same time, this enables him to present his writing on the topic as genuine progress over his Greek predecessors. It may, then, come as a surprise to find, in a work of supposedly practical orientation, that prior to Scipio’s main exposition in Book 1 of the different types of political constitution, Cicero depicts a rather lengthy discussion of a cosmological event: the recent apparent sighting of a ‘second sun’ in the sky (1.15).

Scipio, even though he will take the lead role in the discussion of political theory, fulsomely praises the more abstract kinds of study directed at the celestial realm (1.26–28); but he is persuaded by Laelius, another participant, that it is of greater importance now to address terrestrial issues, particularly regarding the best form of government (1.30–34). The debate that Cicero lays out about the investigation of the human versus the divine realm makes the case for the study of both as having value, and intriguingly leaves open the question of the relation between the two: Scipio speaks of how the Earth pales into insignificance beside the heavens, and asserts that there is a universal natural law that has authority over any civil law, so that what has ultimate moral weight is the decree of the wise person who understands the natural law, rather than that of the Roman people (1.27). Similar principles are laid down at 3.33, anticipating the fuller discussion in the Laws. These are pronouncements with a strongly Stoic flavour; and when another participant, Philus, speaks of the Stoic notion that gods and humans share the whole universe as their homeland, he suggests that for that reason cosmology might be relevant to politics in any case (1.19).

By the time that we turn to Scipio’s exposition of the various forms of government, it can be seen that Cicero has used the flexibility of the dramatic dialogue to prime his reader to examine the topic with a critical eye. Scipio’s focus on Rome is a response to the lack of practical awareness that he (or his author) sees infecting Greek models. But if Stoic universalism is correct, such focus on a particular concrete system seems itself to be headed in the wrong direction. And if cosmology is more important than politics, yet too important for politics to ignore, then an exposition that sticks to the human realm – as Scipio’s, as far as we can tell, largely does – is missing something. Cicero thus invites us, in the midst of a work on political theory, to consider how small the human (and within that the Roman) domain is, a thought reinforced in some complex ways in the dialogue’s concluding Dream of Scipio, perhaps the most famous excerpt in all of Cicero’s philosophy (its survival owed to its coming down to us as part of a separate manuscript tradition). In thus giving the work as a whole structural integrity (despite its, for us, truncated condition), Cicero’s framing challenges the reader to maintain a critical perspective on the doing of political philosophy itself.

5.3 The Laws

In Republic 5, Scipio had affirmed that the political leader requires knowledge of justice and of the laws and will have studied their foundations. The discussion of natural law in Laws 1 offers an account of those foundations. The purpose of such an account is to set the parameters within which more concrete laws must fall and be judged. The natural law is god’s law; it is also what human beings who have perfected their reason would follow. Law is to be identified with right reason (1.23), or more specifically with right reason in the realm of what is commanded or forbidden (1.33, 1.42). This, then, is a normative account: it tells us what law, properly speaking, is; and that may be very different from the actual laws that particular states have enacted.

Given the normative character of Cicero’s enquiry, it is not difficult to see why law should be identified with right reason. Rationality, after all, is itself a normative concept. Not every piece of thinking counts as rational, and rationality can be exercised imperfectly and so, at least in principle, perfectly. If one reasons correctly about the relevant matters in the case of what is just and unjust, then it seems fair to conclude that one will enunciate standards against which, for example, actual laws will be required to measure up. Law in the normative sense is ‘what distinguishes just things from unjust’ (2.13).

It is not as obvious why the concept of nature, or the natural, looms large in Cicero’s account of law. One of its main purposes is, again, to stress that he is conducting a normative enquiry. We are, he says, ‘born for justice’, and what is right is a matter not of opinion but of nature (1.28). Here Cicero draws upon a tradition, already going back at least as far as Plato, in which nature stands in contrast with convention. What is merely a matter of convention or opinion is not the same as what is really – ‘by nature’ – the case. Thus the fact that a certain (human-made) law states that something is right or wrong does not mean that its pronouncements are correct.

What is this nature that is thus contrasted with matters of opinion or convention? It is, in the first instance, human nature, as witnessed by Cicero’s statement that ‘we’ are born for justice. We all belong to the same species, and to that extent are all alike (1.29), in particular in our possession of reason, which distinguishes us from other creatures (1.30). This explains the sense of mutual fellowship and union between human beings (1.28) and means that we are formed by nature to share justice and impart it to all (1.33). This does not mean that we necessarily do this. Nature is itself a normative concept, so humans can fail to live up to their own nature, corrupted by the effects of bad habit and opinion (1.29, 1.33). Nonetheless, Cicero argues, if one considers the endowments that humans share, one will conclude that justice is the natural human condition.

But nature also refers, compatibly, to the nature of the universe as a whole, since on the Stoic theory that Cicero draws upon (a theory set out more fully in Book 2 of Cicero’s On the Nature of the Gods, see esp. 2.73–90), the universe – ‘all of nature’, as Cicero puts it – is governed by god (1.21). God in turn exercises governing power through the activity of right reason, which we humans, at least in our best condition, share with god (1.23). Reason is thus natural, in that it underlies the workings of the universe; and since we possess it too, as the divine element in us, in expressing our human nature it expresses our kinship with the gods as well. Hence Cicero can refer in Book 2 of the Laws to the ‘true and original law’ as identified with the right reason of god (2.10).

Cicero’s thinking seems to be that to regard laws as no more than human artefacts – that is, as not based in nature – is to concede that reward and punishment are the only motivations for obedience. But then it will be the rewards and punishments, not the justice or injustice of the act in question, that will have normative force. But if that is so, then if one calculates correctly that, say, greater utility will arise from breaking than obeying a law, it seems that one has no reason to obey it. What is needed, rather, is a conception of justice as something to be sought, as Cicero puts it, ‘for its own sake’ (1.48). That is, we must think of what is just as having an inherent normative force, to be pursued because it is just. And that means, for Cicero, that justice must be based in nature and not simply a matter of human convention.

Whether or not we find this stance convincing, there is a specific theory of justice that Cicero appears to have in mind as the object of his critique: the Epicurean theory. Epicurus regarded justice as precisely a matter of social agreements concluded with the aim of maximizing utility. One should further note that Cicero’s friend Atticus is, along with Cicero’s brother Quintus, one of Cicero’s two main interlocutors in the dialogue, and that Atticus is an adherent of Epicureanism. His presence seems to emphasize that there is an alternative point of view that is not being given the opportunity to defend itself. Strikingly, Cicero does not even say that he thinks the Epicurean theory is wrong; rather, he bids the Epicureans abstain from all matters of government, which they neither know about nor have wished to know about (1.39). It is true that the Epicureans, unlike the Stoics, generally maintained a quietist outlook and believed that by and large one should not be politically active. But they did have a specific theory of justice. So Cicero seems a little high-handed in excluding them from a conversation featuring that as one of its principal topics.

Epicureans are not the only ones whose views Cicero seems intent on marginalizing in this context. Remarkably, he asks the adherents of the New (that is, sceptical) Academy to ‘be silent’, since their habit of attacking any doctrinal view will cause ‘confusion’ and result in the ruin of Cicero’s ‘elegantly arranged edifice’ (1.39). We have indeed just been reminded that Cicero himself is a follower of the sceptical Academy, with Atticus’ ironical comment that Cicero is of course someone who does not follow his own judgement in debate but the authority of others (1.36). Cicero replies that he indeed does not always accept the authority of others but that he is here trying to establish a foundation for states and cities (1.37).

Should we take Cicero at face value here? Although one can understand that having to deal with opposing views may make it more difficult to establish the kind of basis for systems of law and justice that he has in mind, that could surely apply to any philosophical thesis and any sort of opposition. One might even suppose that attacking an edifice, however elegantly constructed, might lead to a stronger edifice being built. Cicero in fact says that he would like to appease the sceptics and does not dare drive them off (1.39). So why does Cicero attempt just here to stifle debate? Why, in particular, does he draw attention to the fact that that is what he is doing? He need not have mentioned the sceptics, nor for that matter the Epicureans. He need not have chosen Atticus as a participant whom he could then ask not to dispute his basic premise.

Cicero clearly expects his readers to notice these moves. One might say that to announce loudly that one is closing down debate is itself to initiate a debate. Cicero thus uses the notion of uniformity of outlook both to illustrate and critique a crucial feature of the theory he is advocating. The idea of natural law is precisely the idea that there is a universal set of normative principles of equal applicability in all contexts. If that idea is correct, then there is no room for divergence of opinion about what justice is. At the same time, Cicero’s dismissal of the Epicurean and sceptical viewpoints reminds us that, in the real world as opposed to the ideal one of perfected reason, there are competing and critical opinions, and that the universalist theory is itself a product of a particular philosophical school (Stoicism).

On the one hand, then, we have a vision of uniformity, representing a kind of ideal endpoint in which all is organized and measured in accordance with the same basic principles. On the other, we have concrete and divergent voices that embody a range of perspectives and show where we are now and perhaps – though the voices may change – where we will be at any specific historical moment: at some distance from an undisputed endpoint. In the very process of apparent suppression of dissent, Cicero uses the resources of the dialogue form to draw readers into critical participation in his enquiry.

6. The Second Period: An Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Cicero’s second, and most intense, period of philosophical production occurs during the last few years of his life, a period that saw the dictatorship and then assassination of Julius Caesar. The latter event caused Cicero’s political stock to rise briefly but, in the end, brought only futile hope of the restoration of republican government. The political situation, combined with personal tragedy – the death of his daughter Tullia in childbirth – resulted in a remarkable bout of creativity during which Cicero produced substantial works on a wide range of philosophical themes. His ambition, as he puts it in his preface to On the Nature of the Gods (1.7), was to compose nothing less than a comprehensive treatment covering ‘the whole of philosophy’ – a veritable encyclopedia of the subject.

For the purposes of this entry, a more selective approach is adopted. Three late dialogues will be highlighted below, but the late period also saw the composition of two works likely to be relatively familiar to non-specialists: On Duties (De Officiis), concerning practical conduct, and Tusculan Disputations, on the theory of the emotions, together with a trio of works on mainly Stoic themes: On Fate (De Fato), On Divination (De Divinatione) and Stoic Paradoxes (Paradoxa Stoicorum), as well as a pair on specific issues in ethics: On Old Age (De Senectute) and On Friendship (De Amicitia). In what follows, further works from the period on each of three central topics – epistemology, ethical theory and theology – are discussed, in order to offer a representative illustration of the distinctiveness of Cicero’s approach as an Academic sceptic and writer of philosophical dialogues.

6.1 Epistemology

Although it has come down to us in a rather misshapen state, containing portions of two quite different editions of the work, On Academic Scepticism (in Latin Academica) cannot be passed over, since it presents an account of the epistemological viewpoint of the sceptical Academy and so in effect serves as a defence of the method that Cicero employs in much of his philosophical writing. At the same time, Cicero does not present a one-sided picture. In the segment sometimes known (after its leading character) as the Lucullus, critique of the New, or sceptical, Academy is mounted, with Cicero responding on behalf of the sceptic.

Against a position that denies that certainty is attainable, Lucullus argues that intellectual enquiry, which aims at proof, will be hamstrung, since proof requires certainty (2.26). Moreover, the sceptic’s refusal to allow that there can be ‘cataleptic’ impressions – the Stoic technical term for impressions that can be grasped with certainty – will subject the sceptic to the charge of inconsistency (cf. 2.44): the sceptic holds that nothing can be grasped with certainty, but surely the claim that ‘nothing can be grasped with certainty’ must itself be graspable with certainty, or else the sceptic position lacks firm foundation.

If the sceptics have their own counterpart of a criterion of truth, in terms of the notion of plausibility, they must surely regard that notion as beyond dispute if it is to play its allotted role (2.29). Given the importance of correctly identifying the proper basis for one’s decisions and actions, it cannot for the sceptic be merely plausible, but must be certain, that plausibility is the right criterion. Sceptics are thus impaled on a dilemma: their system undermines itself by being either inconsistent (if ‘nothing can be grasped’ is graspable) or ineffectual (if it is not graspable).

Lucullus continues to take aim at the notion of plausibility that features as the sceptics’ criterion for determining what we accept and do (2.32); but he approaches it in a way that might seem to beg the question, asking how the sceptic can maintain a criterion of truth and falsehood if truth and falsehood are indistinguishable (2.33). It seems as if the sceptic could reply that they do not in fact have such a criterion. They do not, unlike their dogmatic opponents, claim to pronounce one thing true, another false. What they can do – what, if they are right, is the most one can do – is identify one thing as plausible, another as implausible.

Lucullus has an interesting riposte to this, which involves questioning the intelligibility of being able to determine what is plausible and what is not without a criterion for determining what is true and what is not. He points out that in rejecting the cataleptic impression, the sceptic does not allow that there are impressions distinctively marked out as truth-bearing. But if so, it follows that there is no difference between true and false, in the sense that there is nothing about a given impression that will mark it out as true rather than false. So, says Lucullus, ‘there will be no criterion’ (2.34). In other words, without a means of determining which is true, no impression will be more deserving of credence than any other.

Moreover, the notion of plausibility is, logically, tied to the notion of truth: what is plausible is what ‘resembles truth’, in Latin veri simile, the phrase Cicero uses as an alternative for probabile to represent the concept of plausibility. If something is plausible, then it is likely (though not certain) to be true. But the sceptics by their own admission have no criterion for determining what is true. Hence, they have no way of judging something as likely to be true, since that presupposes a standard of truth against which the purported plausibility would be judged.

Cicero responds by sketching a distinction, made by the sceptical philosopher Clitomachus, of two ways in which one might withhold assent: by refraining (a) from ‘completely’ assenting to anything, and (b) from approving or disapproving. The wise sceptic will never completely assent to any impression but will ‘approve’ those that are plausible and ‘disapprove’ those that are not. One will then be able to act on the basis of those impressions one approves, without having entirely assented to them (2.104).

The distinction has an air of sophistry about it, but it corresponds reasonably well to the way we actually make decisions. Take a simple case of my deciding whether to drink the tap water in my glass. It looks and smells healthy, there seems nothing to suggest otherwise. Nonetheless it might always be the case that it is unhealthy. I ‘approve’ the impression that it is healthy and drink the water, while accepting that it cannot, strictly speaking, be certain but at most plausible that the water is healthy; hence I do not ‘completely’ assent to the impression. If it turns out to be unhealthy, my original impression was not mistaken, because I only took it to be plausible, rather than true, that the water was healthy, which is consistent with its being unhealthy. Thus the wise sceptic can act on the basis of mere plausibility while in an intelligible sense not getting things wrong.

Cicero suggests that even the Stoic sage will follow many things on the basis of plausibility, if life is to be possible at all (2.99); and his point, I take it, is supposed to apply not just in case it turns out that there are no cataleptic impressions, but even in those (presumably frequent) situations where such impressions, should they exist, are not present. The wise still have to live. Indeed, if one includes the crucial refinement made by the leading sceptical philosopher Carneades as part of the plausibility criterion – namely that the impression must be ‘unimpeded’ (2.104) – then we seem to have a way of addressing Lucullus’ point that to have a notion of plausibility, or being likely to be true, depends on one’s having a prior notion of truth as such.

What does ‘unimpeded’ mean? Cicero spoke at 2.99 in terms of there being nothing that presents itself in opposition to the plausibility of the impression. Take the example of the water again. It looks healthy in my glass, it comes from a generally reliable source (my tap), there is nothing to indicate that it is not healthy – nothing, therefore, ‘impeding’, or presenting itself in opposition to, the plausibility of the impression that it is healthy. Say, further, that I then hear on the radio a news report that the water supply in my area has been contaminated. At this point there is something opposing – undercutting, one might say – the plausibility of the impression that the water is healthy and I would not therefore drink it.

How does this tell against Lucullus’ criticism? It suggests that, rather than plausibility being dependent on truth, we might build a notion of truth upon that of unimpeded plausibility. Take the water case once again. What would it mean to be able to identify as true the impression that ‘this water is healthy’? It could be argued that its truth would be a matter of there being nothing to oppose the impression of plausibility – no ‘defeaters’, as it were. Say, then, that I turn on the radio and hear no news reports pertaining to my water; but being the ultra-cautious type I send the water to a lab for testing. It turns out that the sample is laden with harmful microbes. There is thus something opposing the plausibility of the impression that the water is healthy.

It seems as if one could move towards a notion of truth by utilising the condition that there is nothing opposing an initial impression that things are a certain way – in the water case, no news report, no adverse lab results, and so forth. This would still be a notion of truth as something possessed fallibly. But the sceptic can now speak of identifying some things as true (rather than as simply plausible) and others as the contrary (2.111). Carneades at any rate is not trying to provide an equivalent of the Stoic notion of infallible truth-possession. His ‘unimpeded’ condition is a refinement designed to give a criterion of reasonable action in the absence of such a notion. What one can do, using Carneades’ method, is start with the impression of something’s being the case and approach, but never reach, a position of certainty. It is a question of increasing the likelihood of correctness, not eliminating completely the possibility of error.

If so, then Cicero can likewise reject Lucullus’ assertion that the sceptic must (inconsistently) hold their own theory of plausibility as certain. He reiterates Carneades’ view that the theory, like any other claim, could at most have the status of plausibility by the very terms of the theory (2.110). Seen in the light of the ‘unimpeded’ condition, plausibility now looks a more robust notion than it may have appeared, and so the resting of one’s whole procedure for decision and action on such a basis looks correspondingly less fragile, though of course it is still fallible. But scepticism deserves to be rejected not if it cannot claim certainty for its guiding principle, but if it fails to apply to itself the same standards of critical scrutiny that it does elsewhere.

In perhaps Cicero’s most technical work, he rarely allows us to lose sight of what purpose the technicality serves. Lucullus had ended his speech in critique of scepticism by addressing Cicero himself, making what looks like a light-hearted jest that Cicero supports a philosophy that keeps things in the dark despite his having brought the most deeply hidden matters to light (2.62). He refers to the uncovering by Cicero of Catiline’s conspiracy, a plot whose nature and significance remain a matter of debate, but whose thwarting Cicero refers to often and takes to represent his having more or less single-handedly saved the republic from catastrophe.

The punning contrast of obscurity and illumination that Lucullus employs thus has a serious point, reminding us that what turns on the sometimes abstruse epistemology is the vital practical question of whether the sceptical viewpoint allows there to be a proper basis for decision and action, especially on the political stage. Roman – and of course not just Roman – politicians, including Cicero himself and those whom he might hope to win over to the sceptical cause, must at times take life-and-death decisions.

One of the most controversial aspects of Cicero’s actions against Catiline was the execution without trial of five of the alleged co-conspirators, an act that ultimately led to Cicero’s exile. Is mere likelihood sufficient to justify the weight of one’s actions in such cases? Should not certainty be the only proper basis? And is a criterion of plausibility even intelligible without a notion of certainty? Whatever we think of Cicero’s answers to these questions, he leaves us in no doubt about why the questions matter. Even at its most abstract, philosophy’s relation to the concrete and practical lies at the heart of his enterprise.

6.2 Ethical Theory

Cicero’s principal work on ethical theory, On Ends or On Moral Ends (in Latin De Finibus), offers perhaps the most vivid example of his use of the sceptical method to engage critically with questions about the nature of philosophy itself. The title abbreviates a longer Latin title (De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum) whose meaning – literally, On Ends of Goods and Evils – raises puzzles of its own (on which see Allen 2014), but refers, to simplify a little, to the question of what are the highest goods, the attainment of which will bring about a happy human life. Cicero considers three leading ethical theories of his day: Epicureanism, which proposes that pleasure is the highest good; Stoicism, which holds that virtue is not just the highest but the only good; and the theory of the so-called Old Academy, which, while including goods other than virtue within its conception of the supreme good, ranks virtue higher than the rest. The structure of the work is once again dialogical: for each theory, Cicero puts into the mouth of a proponent an exposition of that theory, followed by a critical response delivered by Cicero himself.

Cicero allows himself a head start on the exposition of Epicurean hedonism by its proponent Torquatus with an initial, critical outline of the theory in Book 1. At 1.23–24 he appeals to the behaviour of two of Torquatus’ ancestors, both stern military men who treated their sons harshly (execution for cowardice and banishment for taking bribes, respectively), behaviour which in Cicero’s view can only be explained by their having put the wider public interest ahead of their own pleasure, contrary to Epicurean prescription.

Cicero chooses examples that, in combining military with family, evoke core ancient Roman values. Torquatus then defends his ancestors’ behaviour in terms compatible with Epicurean theory. Focusing in particular on the first Torquatus, he argues that he acted to uphold his authority at a time of war, and therefore to enhance his own security and so, ultimately, pleasure. More striking than the details of Torquatus’ explanation is that he feels the need to give it. Why could he not have said that his ancestors were misguided and that it took later generations to see the Epicurean light? Torquatus says explicitly that he has no reason to fear that he cannot ‘accommodate’ his ancestors to the Epicurean view (1.34). That he rises to Cicero’s challenge in this way indicates that ancestral behaviour has normative force for him: his ancestors must be read as acting from (what he considers) the correct motives.

Interestingly, it appears that Torquatus’ own father was an Epicurean, whom Torquatus evidently admired. He reports with enthusiasm his father’s rebuttal of a Stoic argument against hedonism (1.39); and, though this is not said explicitly, perhaps was influenced by his father in adopting Epicureanism himself. Cicero thus slyly reinforces the sense that ancestral piety is an ineliminable part of the value system that Torquatus shares. He has induced Torquatus to agree that it would be a problem for the validity of Epicurean ethics if it did not sit comfortably with the norms of Roman culture. The reader is thus encouraged to reflect on whether, and if so how, the abstract and general features of an ethical theory are to fit with outlooks and practices which, at least in part, carry normative weight precisely because they represent adherence to a particular tradition: a strategy that Cicero further deploys in his more lengthy critique of Epicurean ethics in Book 2 (see Inwood 1990).

However difficult it might be for Torquatus himself, it seems open to an Epicurean to respond that they have no obligation to simply accept Roman values as authoritative. Epicurean theory is professedly a radical one that sees most humans as having been corrupted by false values. What, then, should we, as non-Roman readers, make of Cicero’s discussion? Even if we accepted that he demonstrates an incompatibility between Roman and Epicurean values, it is not clear that this should have any hold on us. We are surely both able and entitled to assess the Epicurean case on its own merits. On the other hand, we are no less the inheritors of cultural assumptions and outlooks than the Romans, even if ours are different, and even if the ‘we’ implied are a great and diverse plurality. Disentangling a thing’s ‘own merits’ from the values we bring to an encounter with it is neither a simple nor perhaps a viable task.

This is not of course to say that our perspectives cannot be changed by such philosophical encounters. Ethical theory, particularly of the professedly radical sort that many ancient philosophers propounded, would hardly have a point if that were the case; and Cicero’s project of communicating such theories would be equally unintelligible in that light. But coming to a theory from outside of any perspective is unintelligible. What Cicero’s holding up of Epicurean ethics against the canvas of Roman tradition conveys is a point about how ethical theory in particular must conform, not so much to specific values and traditions, as to certain basic elements of what makes us human, without which it would be hard to discern how an ethical theory could have purchase on us at all: above all, perhaps, our status as social creatures shaped by our relation to specific histories and traditions.

When it comes to Stoic theory, as laid out next by its spokesman Cato the Younger, things look more promising. Cato was historically the arch-defender of the traditional values of the Roman republic, while Stoicism, with its emphasis on the supremacy of virtue and the value of political participation, seems on the face of it to conform to the Roman way much more readily than Epicureanism does. Nonetheless, the stringency of Stoic theory, which holds that virtue is the only good thing, and vice the only bad thing, and takes virtue not to admit of degrees – without complete virtue one is not virtuous at all – allows Cicero to mount his critique.

He invites us to consider whether the Stoics have a theory which, in the terms they express it, can be proclaimed in those contexts that define the sphere of public life for a Roman: courts, assembly, Senate house, and battlefield. A lawyer, observes Cicero, could not credibly conclude the case for the defence by declaring that the punishments of exile and confiscation were not evils, but merely to be ‘rejected’ (the Stoic technical term for aversion toward things that nonetheless cannot affect one’s happiness); nor could an orator announce, with Hannibal at the gates, that captivity, enslavement, and death were no evils (4.22). Moreover, the Senate would not be able to speak of Scipio Africanus’ triumph as having been won by his valour, since he did not meet the standards of perfection required, in Stoic terms, for virtue (4.22).

This sort of objection seems especially damaging for the Stoics, with their emphasis on agency and public participation. In effect Cicero argues that the Stoics can have their integrity, or their theory, but not both. They cannot express their doctrines about virtue in public contexts without incurring ridicule or incomprehension. What they are left with, according to Cicero, is hypocrisy: the use of ordinary language in public, their own language in their writings (4.22).

Whether or not Cicero is fair to the detail of Stoic and Epicurean ethics, his aim, as exemplified by the dialogical structure, is to provoke debate. In particular, his readers are invited to consider to what extent ethical theory must be answerable to social reality. Is not an ethical theory that cannot be lived consistently thereby flawed as a theory? In keeping with this question, Cicero moves next to a theory that seems on the face of it rather more congenial to lived experience, with an exposition by his interlocutor Piso of the ethics of the Old Academy, broadly in line with what we now think of as Aristotelian ethics.

Crucially, this theory recognises a plurality of goods. Piso holds that virtue is sufficient for happiness but that there are also bodily goods such as health and freedom from pain, the possession of which, when added to virtue, will render the subject not just happy, as virtue on its own does, but ‘supremely happy’ (5.71). Cicero wonders whether treating such things as goods will not simply mean adopting the view of Aristotle’s distinguished successor Theophrastus who, while providing a good deal of the resources for Piso’s account (5.12), also acts as something of an outlier for having claimed that no life could be happy if caught up in pain or misfortune (5.77).

Cicero asks Piso to consider whether, even if one were to allow that a single misfortune might not affect the happiness of the virtuous, an accumulation of them would: could someone wracked by pain, disease, and other misfortunes plausibly be thought of as happy, let alone happiest? (5.84). Shrewdly turning against him the Aristotelian method of canvassing the views of both the many and the wise, to which Piso had appealed at 5.63 in support of his view of the supremacy of virtue, Cicero declares that ordinary folk would deny, and experts be unsure, that someone being tortured could be happy (5.85). Piso responds by giving a more worked-out ‘lexical’ account of the relation between virtue and the other goods, so as to underpin his view that virtue suffices for a happy (even if not for the happiest) life: the smallest amount of excellence of character is ranked ahead of all bodily goods; and no foul-but-pleasant action is better than any honourable-but-painful one (5.93). Virtue can thus be equated with happiness, while happiness can be enhanced through the addition of other goods (5.95).

One might think, however, that this theoretical tightening comes at a cost. The advantage of Piso’s originally looser pluralism is that it accords with the views about value of those who, as Cicero puts it, have never come across a philosopher even in a painting (5.80). Piso is allowed to reiterate the criticism – indicating its importance for Cicero – that the Stoics adopt one set of terms in real life and another in the lecture room (5.89). But when Piso asks disapprovingly whether philosophers should speak in a different way from human beings (5.89), it is hard to avoid the thought that in his case the terminology of the street now dresses a more rigid substance. In becoming full-fledged theory, his discourse is in danger of losing what made it distinctive and attractive as an account of the good human life.

Cicero does not tell us which, if any, of the ethical theories that he discusses we should adopt. Matters are left explicitly unresolved at the close of On Ends (5.95–6). Cicero, however, not only offers us tools to think through the issues for ourselves, but in so doing, utilises the series of expositions and critiques that he lays out to raise pertinent questions, befitting the sceptical stance, about the status of ethical theory itself.

6.3 Theology

Cicero’s manifesto to write, in what proved to be his last period of literary production, encyclopedically about philosophy, is set out in the preface to his work of philosophical theology On the Nature of the Gods. The daunting task he sets himself is linked by him to the specific approach of the Academic sceptic. He cites with approval the example of Carneades, who by challenging Stoic theology aroused in people a desire to discover the truth (1.4). Cicero will take this one step further and aspire to examine critically all the relevant theories about the gods. His conception of a worthy philosophical encyclopedia is therefore much more than a dutiful trotting out of who thought what. His aim is to subject all available views to scrutiny.

In Cicero’s view this approach fits the questions of theology particularly well, given the many and varied differences of opinion that exist about the nature of the gods. It may be, he declares, that none of the positions are correct; certainly, no more than one can be (1.5). The reader is thus put on notice that any view might in principle be overturned, and it is perhaps no surprise that Cicero says he will need to respond to critics who claim that sceptical philosophy, rather than providing illumination, ‘floods things with darkness’ (1.6).

In response, he says that upon the verdict reached about the nature of the gods will depend our assessment of the whole moral and material apparatus of religion, including by implication traditional Roman religion – indeed the examples he lists suggest that this is primarily what he has in mind (1.14). When he speaks, at the very start of the work, of its subject being one that was vital ‘for the regulation of religion’ (1.1), one might easily read that conservatively: we investigate the gods in order better to maintain the religious status quo. Now, however, it seems that our investigation is to be open, our sense of what (if any) is the correct religion awaiting the outcome of enquiry into the nature of the gods.

The greater part of Book 1 is given over to an exposition of Epicurean theology by Cicero’s spokesman Velleius, followed by a critique from the work’s representative of Academic scepticism, Cotta – Cicero also portrays a younger version of himself as holding mainly a listening brief at the discussion. Books 2 and 3 consist respectively of exposition (by Balbus) and critique (by Cotta) of Stoic theology, which, in stark contrast to the Epicurean version, has god managing the workings of the universe down to the smallest detail.

The Epicurean gods, on Velleius’ telling, live a life of utter tranquility. They have no business to attend to; they simply take pleasure in their own wisdom and virtue, secure in the knowledge that their bliss will be everlasting (1.51). Since they have no troubles, they are not involved in the laborious business of creating or governing the universe, which arises and is sustained by the clustering of atoms in the void; they likewise have no concern with the travails of human life (1.52–54). This does not, however, mean that they are not rightly objects of piety and reverence: we worship the sublimity of their nature (1.56).

We can discern a coherent, if hardly uncontroversial, theological account here. Having previously criticised his opponents for not setting out a clear roster of divine attributes, Velleius is at pains to do that himself. The gods are, in a nutshell, immortal, beautiful and happy, with the corollaries of happiness meaning that they are virtuous and wise as well. Happiness is inconsistent with making or having trouble, so god is completely and everlastingly tranquil and at rest, enjoying the bliss of that state. Underlying this account is what one might call a negative principle: god must not exhibit any weakness or imperfection. If we now consider the maxim of Epicurus that Velleius cites about the blessed and eternal, its unfolding of what such a state implies is framed entirely negatively: it does not have troubles or make trouble for others, nor is it in the grip of anger or partiality since each is a sign of weakness (1.45). We might agree that the concept of god has to be that of a perfect being. And conceiving of perfection in terms of a lack of negative qualities is one way to substantiate what perfection might mean.

The Epicurean viewpoint also has implications for how we are to consider the relation between god and religion. Velleius’ insistence on an anthropomorphic conception of god (1.46–8) is, in part, motivated by a desire to do justice to the traditional Greek picture of the gods – and, for that matter, the traditional Roman one, which shared an anthropomorphic conception with, and was deeply influenced by, the Greek inheritance. Equally, however, Velleius takes aim at traditional poetic representations of the gods as badly behaved humans on a larger scale. There is, in a correct conception of divinity, no place for war, strife, lust, anger or other violent emotions (1.42). And Velleius has little time for ordinary people’s views about the gods, which he dismisses as ‘mired in the greatest inconsistency through their ignorance of the truth’ (1.43).

Cicero’s agile use of the dialogue form is manifest in Cotta’s response. He picks up on an aspect of the Epicurean method as Velleius had described it, namely that we must infer the existence of the gods from the fact that everyone has a conception (if often a distorted conception) that the gods exist. Cotta is happy for present purposes to grant the existence of god, while registering his dissatisfaction with both the idea that the belief is universally held, and the notion that, if it were, this would justify inferring its truth.

However, Cotta also says that while it might be difficult to deny the existence of the gods in a public assembly, it should be easy to do so in the sort of meeting they are currently having (1.61). He later adds the thesis that anthropomorphic gods were either thought up by philosophers to encourage ordinary people to turn from vice to worship or were a product of a superstition that considered that the worship of concrete images allowed access to the gods themselves (1.77). He then presses the idea that the non-interventionist gods of the Epicureans are fatal to religion (1.116–7, 1.121), while characterising under the same heading, as ‘utterly destructive of religion’, those who claim that the notion of immortal gods is a fiction invented by the wise to lead people unsusceptible to reason to do, through religion, their duty (1.118). Cotta does not say that this analysis of the origin of the gods is incorrect; rather, he implies that its public dissemination would undermine the very aim that the analysis posits as an explanation.

We are back to the question of the relation between one’s theory and one’s public pronouncements. On this occasion, Cotta’s own stance may seem both cynical and hypocritical: to maintain social order one must suppress one’s own views, while reserving frankness for private gatherings of the philosophically minded. Yet here the formal difference between Cicero the author and Cotta the character is important. If, within the dramatic setting of On the Nature of the Gods, the gathering is indeed as Cotta describes, its embedding in a written work that Cicero intends to be read more widely blurs the line between private and public on which the charge of hypocrisy rests. If Cotta can be convicted of hypocrisy, it is less clear that Cicero is open to the same charge. He has let the cat out of the bag, and in so doing raised the vital question, for any reader, of the extent to which unrestricted frankness of speech can co-exist with the maintenance of social order.

The Stoic theology expounded next by Balbus seems less immediately vulnerable to these practical concerns; here there is a parallel with the respective treatments of the schools’ ethical theories in On Ends. Indeed, while Velleius relied on a relatively technical and abstract approach in his exposition of the Epicurean view, Balbus offers in Stoicism a theology that seems targeted rather specifically at a Roman audience, and this in two distinct ways. First, the less technical presentation encourages readers who are unwilling or unable to enter the more tangled thickets of philosophical theory to engage with the basic ideas. Second, it promises to appeal to a Roman sense of specialness and pride in their nation by portraying the gods themselves as certifying that attitude through the interest they take in the wellbeing of Rome.

Thus, having separated out ‘our [Roman] people’ as bearers of the belief in gods’ existence, Balbus proceeds to declare that the ever-increasing strength (as he sees it) of religious belief is no accident given the way the gods have concretely manifested their power. He then cites examples, from both distant and more recent Roman military history, of gods seen fighting on the side of Rome, or acting as messengers of Roman victory (2.6). He follows this up with tales of how divine premonitions were sent by the gods to warn Rome away from impending disaster, with dire consequences when they were ignored (2.7–8).

In fact, Balbus’ lengthy speech both begins and ends with the placing of Rome at the forefront of divine providence. Towards the close of his speech, having argued for the thesis that the care of the gods is, to be sure, directed at the whole human race (2.164), he then gradually zooms in, first to the specific regions of the world, with Europe listed first; then to particular cities, with Rome listed first; and finally to individuals, all of whom happen to be Romans who achieved significant military success (2.165), though there is a nod to Greece and the Homeric heroes to bring up the rear.

Hence, in terms of the structure of his speech, one of the chief points of theological doctrine that distinguishes the Stoic view from the Epicurean – namely that the gods are concerned with human wellbeing and actively promote it – becomes, in Balbus’ hands, the notion that this providential outlook has Rome not as its exclusive but certainly as its primary focus. On the face of it, this seems like a shrewd strategy: a Roman audience is, perhaps, more likely to be won over by an account that shows the gods as Rome’s best friend than by one that shuns any notion of divine favour.

Yet there is also, from the point of view of the dramatic context, something peculiar about this approach. Balbus, it is true, is conversing with a group of staunch Romans. But they are also Romans whose philosophical sophistication has been emphasised. Is recounting tales of divine support for the Roman enterprise really the best way to persuade such an audience of the truth of one’s philosophical position? The short answer, of course, is that Cicero’s intended audience is wider and no doubt on average less philosophically sophisticated than the interlocutors at the scene. But there is a bit more going on than this.

In Book 1 Velleius’ lucidity of exposition was pointedly contrasted by Cotta with more typical Epicurean obscurity (notably in Epicurus himself) in a way that seemed to warn that change of style does not necessarily leave substance untouched. Balbus in turn speaks of the advantages of his own full and rich style over the more compressed argumentative method found in the Stoic theoreticians, in particular Stoicism’s founder Zeno of Citium. But he does so in a way calculated by Cicero to raise our suspicions: my style of presentation, says Balbus, flows like a river; and just as flowing rivers avoid being polluted much better than do enclosed pools, so too my stream of eloquence will dilute a critic’s protestations, while a closely reasoned argument cannot so easily protect itself (2.20).

This is surely intended by Cicero to seem disquieting. If arguments need a cloak of rhetorical eloquence to save them from refutation, then the ideas in support of which those arguments are advanced might, on reflection, appear less, not more, convincing. Balbus then gives a brief list of some of Zeno’s succinct deductive arguments in favour of the universe being intelligent, wise, happy and eternal, and therefore divine (2.21). So even as Balbus tells us that a more flowing presentation has a better chance of evading the ‘calumnies’ of the Academic critics (2.20), we as readers are offered the chance by Cicero to exercise our critical judgement on some concrete arguments, while reflecting, in equally critical vein, on the issue of how philosophy can be communicated without either the alienation of excessive technicality or the distortion of an overly smooth rhetoric.

The issue is then shown to have particular pertinence when religion is to the forefront. In his response to Balbus, Cotta, who also held the Roman office of priest, picks up on Balbus’ plea, at the end of Book 2, that Cotta support Stoic doctrine, by asserting that by this was no doubt meant that he should uphold the ancestral beliefs about the gods and about religious practice – and, he adds, no discourse will ever turn him away from such beliefs (3.5). As a Roman aristocrat of distinguished ancestry and as a priest, it behooves Cotta to accept ancestral precedent even without rational argument; but, since Balbus is a philosopher, the latter ought to give such argument in defence of his claims (3.6). For Cotta, ancestral authority suffices for his belief that the gods exist (3.7, 3.9), whereas Balbus, since he ‘despises authority’, must fight using reason alone. So, in responding to him, Cotta will pitch his own reason against Balbus’ (3.9).

It seems rather alarming that Cotta the avowed sceptic should tell us that he accepts positions on authority rather than through reason and imply that he (unlike Balbus) is no philosopher. One has some sympathy with Balbus’ riposte that, if Cotta is already convinced that the gods exist, why should he want anything from him? (3.7). Of course, Cotta as a proponent of scepticism is prepared to use the weapons of reason against a philosopher. But one suspects that there is more to his disclaimers than a sly false modesty designed to provoke Balbus. We might think that appeal to authority is, in the religious case, very much to the point.

Religions are not free-floating products of reason. They are based on tradition and the establishment of authority. Tradition of course is itself a product of evolution over time. But once something can be talked of as a religion, it already has in place structures and a history that can be seen to be reasonably deep-rooted and which, although it can evolve, must retain a sense of connection with those roots. In the religious context, tradition rather than reason is the principal authority, whether that be located in founding figures or documents, in time-honoured ceremonies and rituals, or in leaders who can claim to inherit the mantle of authority via their own devotion to the tradition – in the Roman context, the high priests whom Cotta affirms that he defers to on religious matters, rather than Stoic theorists (3.5).

Cotta has put his finger on something important about the role of authority in religion. If one calls the authority of tradition into question, then one risks having no religion left. And if one of the purposes of religion is, from a practical point of view – both in the Roman context and surely more widely – the promotion of a sense of social cohesion and communal identity, then to challenge tradition is to threaten those objectives. So Cotta’s remarks on authority are not an evasion of Balbus’ closing challenge, but an acknowledgement of what it means to have a religious commitment in the first place. Cotta’s position here has plausibly been seen (Wynne 2019, 167) as an inspiration for fideism, the view that faith or tradition is a justificatory source of religious belief independent of reason.

We might nonetheless wonder whether Cotta can compartmentalise things so straightforwardly as to be governed by tradition from the point of view of his religious and Roman identity, and by reason when it comes to philosophical discourse. Here Cotta’s implication that he is not a philosopher perhaps recognises something crucial about the nature of reason. The problem is not exactly that one might have different approaches in different contexts; in principle, that might be a perfectly sensible way to proceed. It is, rather, that if one demonstrates by reason that, for example, the gods do not exist, then the gods do not exist. Reason is not a compartment in which one can store a certain set of beliefs or conclusions that need not carry over to other areas of one’s life. It is an integral part of the claim of reason that its claim is a universal one.

The tension between reason and tradition is not, then, to be resolved simply by carving out, for example, separate spaces for religion on the one hand and philosophy on the other. At the same time religion itself has something important to tell us about the nature of belief. When Cotta scoffs at Balbus’ assertion, from his main speech, that the tales of gods appearing to us in human form provide evidence of their existence, Balbus responds by saying that surely ancient authority must carry some weight with Cotta. To this Cotta replies, along previous lines, that Balbus is offering ‘hearsay when what I ask for is reason’ (3.13). Balbus, as before, owes Cotta a rational defence of Stoic claims even if Cotta’s own beliefs do not, and are apparently not required to, rest on such a defence.

This contrast between beliefs based on hearsay and on rational justification invites us to consider what it would be like if the latter were given the unrestricted scope that it seems to demand. Cotta’s hiving off to the realm of the philosopher the task of giving rational explanations suggests that the role of reason might, in fact, have its limits. If, for example, rational justification were the only acceptable basis for holding a belief, it is difficult to imagine that one would hold many, or any, beliefs at all. Certainly, many if not most of our beliefs are ones that we simply find ourselves with – acquired on the authority of ‘hearsay’, whether that be parents, friends, books, teachers, religious leaders, public figures, or any other source that may not necessarily have offered a strict rational justification for claims that we come to believe.

Now the beliefs that we do come to hold can then be subject to rational scrutiny; this notion is at the core of the sceptical approach that Cotta, and of course Cicero himself, espouse. But to make sense even of this it seems that we have to take some beliefs as given in order to find a perspective from which to rationally assess others. A project in which all one’s beliefs are simultaneously subject to the test of rational justification is incoherent. And from a practical point of view, if we only acted on the basis of those beliefs that had been subject to, and survived, rational scrutiny, we would scarcely act at all.

If so, then it is not simply a case of religion deferring to reason. Beliefs we hold without the legitimation of reason have a necessary place. The upshot seems to be that religious beliefs, insofar as they either are not or cannot be subject to rational defence, are more representative than one might have supposed of the beliefs we hold more generally. In this regard, On the Nature of the Gods is not uncharacteristic of Cicero’s whole approach to philosophy: he uses his characters’ debates both to advertise the virtues of rational enquiry, and to suggest that those virtues reach right the way up, as perhaps they should, to the status of rational enquiry itself.

7. Cicero and Bernard Williams

There is no space here to explore in any detail the question of Cicero’s later reception. The influence of his philosophical approach on his great eighteenth-century successor, David Hume, particularly in matters of theology and religion, is, however, well-documented (see e.g. Fosl 1994, Stuart-Buttle 2020). So it seems appropriate instead to juxtapose that approach, albeit briefly, with the work of one of the most noted Anglophone philosophers of the twentieth century, Bernard Williams. Insofar as there are discernible points of contact between the two thinkers, readers may be in a better position to ‘place’ Cicero’s philosophical project which, in its context of Roman politics and Hellenistic philosophical debate, is liable to appear a little recondite to contemporary eyes.

Like Williams, then, Cicero engages deeply with his philosophical predecessors not principally as a historical exercise but as a creative way of doing, and communicating, philosophy. Like Williams, he is concerned to explore the scope and limits of philosophical theory, especially ethical theory, in relation to the character of lived human experience. Both thinkers take the view that theory tends to fall short in accounting for how one should live in practical contexts and for the place of integrity in an agent’s life. Each combines a belief in the power of philosophy to illuminate with a marked scepticism about some of the claims that philosophy makes for itself. Not unconnectedly, the two thinkers show great care in the way they write philosophy; both evince a distaste for technicality for its own sake.

It is an irony in the history of philosophy that Williams himself, during a discussion of ancient scepticism, refers to Cicero, in passing, as a ‘third-rate’ thinker (2006, 33). If the affinities with Williams sketched here are anywhere near the mark, readers may be motivated to explore, by engaging with Cicero’s philosophical work themselves, whether that verdict is entirely just.


Primary Literature

All of Cicero’s works are available with Latin text and facing English translation in the Loeb Classical Library series. A selection of translations and commentaries on individual works is given below:

  • Annas, Julia and Raphael Woolf, 2001, Cicero, On Moral Ends, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brittain, Charles, 2006, Cicero, On Academic Scepticism, Translated with Introduction and Notes, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co.
  • Douglas, A. E., 1985, Cicero, Tusculan Disputations I, edited and translated with Notes, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
  • –––, 1990, Cicero, Tusculan Disputations II and V, edited and translated with notes, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
  • Griffin, M. T. and E. M. Atkins, 1991, Cicero, On Duties, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Graver, Margaret, 2002, Cicero on the Emotions: Tusculan Disputation 3 and 4, translated with commentary, Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press.
  • Powell, J. G. F., 1990, Cicero, On Friendship and the Dream of Scipio, edited and translated with introduction and notes, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
  • Rudd, Niall and Jonathan Powell, 1998, Cicero, The Republic and the Laws, translated with introduction and notes, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sharples, R. W., 1991, Cicero: On Fate & Boethius: The Consolation of Philosophy, edited and translated with introduction and commentary, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
  • Walsh, P. G., 1998, Cicero, The Nature of the Gods, translated with introduction and notes, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wardle, David, 2006, Cicero, On Divination Book 1, translated with introduction and commentary, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wright, M. R., 1990, Cicero, On Stoic Good and Evil: De Finibus 3 and Paradoxa Stoicorum, edited and translated with introduction and commentary, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
  • Zetzel, James, 2017, Cicero, On the Commonwealth and On the Laws, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2nd edition.

Secondary Literature

There is a growing literature on Cicero as a philosopher. Set out below is a selection, with an emphasis on more recent scholarship, intended to serve as an accessible overview of resources that readers may find helpful in tackling Cicero’s thought. For those new to his philosophy, useful orientation may be found in the collections of essays edited by Powell 1995, Nicgorski 2012, and Atkins and Bénatouïl 2021; and in the pieces by Powell 2007, Schofield 2013, and Zetzel 2013.

  • Allen, James, 2014, “Why There Are Ends of Both Goods and Evils in Ancient Ethical Theory”, in M.-K. Lee (ed.), Strategies of Argument: Essays in Ancient Epistemology, Ethics, and Logic, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 231–54.
  • Alonso, Fernando, 2013, “Cosmopolitanism and Natural Law in Cicero”, in F. Contreras (ed.), The Threads of Natural Law: Unravelling a Philosophical Tradition, Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 27–36.
  • Altman, William, 2008, “Tullia’s Secret Shrine: Birth and Death in Cicero’s De Finibus”, Ancient Philosophy, 28: 373–93.
  • Annas, Julia, 1989, “Cicero on Stoic Moral Philosophy and Private Property”, in M. T. Griffin and J. Barnes (eds.), Philosophia Togata I: Essays on Philosophy and Roman Society, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 151–73.
  • –––, 2013, “Plato’s Laws and Cicero’s De Legibus”, in M. Schofield (ed.), Aristotle, Plato and Pythagoreanism in the First Century BC, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013, pp. 206–24.
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