Copenhagen Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Fri May 3, 2002; substantive revision Fri May 31, 2024

As the theory of the atom, quantum mechanics is perhaps the most successful theory in the history of science. It enables physicists, chemists, and technicians to calculate and predict the outcome of a vast number of experiments and to create new and advanced technology based on the insight into the behavior of atomic objects. But it is also a theory that challenges our imagination. It seems to violate some fundamental principles of classical physics, principles that eventually have become a part of western common sense since the rise of the modern worldview in the Renaissance. The aim of any metaphysical interpretation of quantum mechanics is to account for these violations.

The Copenhagen interpretation was the first general attempt to understand the world of atoms as this is represented by quantum mechanics. The founding father was mainly the Danish physicist Niels Bohr, but also Werner Heisenberg, Max Born and other physicists made important contributions to the overall understanding of the atomic world that is associated with the name of the capital of Denmark.

In fact Bohr and Heisenberg never totally agreed on how to understand the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics, and neither of them ever used the term “the Copenhagen interpretation” as a joint name for their ideas. In fact, Bohr once distanced himself from what he considered to be Heisenberg’s more subjective interpretation (APHK, p. 51). The term is rather a label introduced by people opposing Bohr’s idea of complementarity, to identify what they saw as the common features behind the Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation as it emerged in the late 1920s. Today the Copenhagen interpretation is mostly regarded as synonymous with indeterminism, Bohr’s correspondence principle, Born’s statistical interpretation of the wave function, and Bohr’s complementarity interpretation of certain atomic phenomena.

1. The Background

In 1900 Max Planck discovered that the radiation spectrum of black bodies occurs only with discrete energies separated by the value , where ν is the frequency and h is a new constant, the so-called Planck constant. According to classical physics, the intensity of this continuous radiation would grow unlimitedly with growing frequencies, resulting in what was called the ultraviolet catastrophe. But Planck’s suggestion was that if black bodies only exchange energy with the radiation field in a proportion equal to that problem would disappear. The fact that the absorption and the emission of energy is discontinuous is in conflict with the principles of classical physics. A few years later Albert Einstein used this discovery in his explanation of the photoelectric effect. He suggested that light waves were quantized, and that the amount of energy which each quantum of light could deliver to the electrons of the cathode, was exactly . The next step came in 1911 when Ernest Rutherford performed some experiments shooting alpha particles into a gold foil. Based on these results he could set up a model of the atom in which the atom consisted of a heavy nucleus with a positive charge surrounded by negatively charged electrons like a small solar system. Also this model was in conflict with the laws of classical physics. According to classical mechanics and electrodynamics, one might expect that the electrons orbiting around a positively charged nucleus would continuously emit radiation so that the nucleus would quickly swallow the electrons.

At this point Niels Bohr entered the scene and soon became the leading physicist on atoms. In 1913 Bohr, visiting Rutherford in Manchester, put forward a mathematical model of the atom which provided the first theoretical support for Rutherford’s model and could explain the emission spectrum of the hydrogen atom (the Balmer series). The theory was based on two postulates:

  1. An atomic system is only stable in a certain set of states, called stationary states, each state being associated with a discrete energy, and every change of energy corresponds to a complete transition from one state to another.
  2. The possibility for the atom to absorb and emit radiation is determined by a law according to which the energy of the radiation is given by the energy difference between two stationary states being equal to .

Some features of Bohr’s semi-classical model were indeed very strange compared to the principles of classical physics. It introduced an element of discontinuity and indeterminism foreign to classical mechanics:

  1. Apparently not every point in space was accessible to an electron moving around a hydrogen nucleus. An electron moved in classical orbits, but during its transition from one orbit to another it was at no definite place between these orbits. Thus, an electron could only be in its ground state (the orbit of lowest energy) or an excited state (if an impact of another particle had forced it to leave its ground state.)
  2. It was impossible to predict when the transition would take place and how it would take place. Moreover, there were no external (or internal) causes that determined the “jump” back again. Any excited electron might in principle move spontaneously to either a lower state or down to the ground state.
  3. Rutherford pointed out that if, as Bohr did, one postulates that the frequency of light ν, which an electron emits in a transition, depends on the difference between the initial energy level and the final energy level, it appears as if the electron must “know” to what final energy level it is heading in order to emit light with the right frequency.
  4. Einstein made another strange observation. He was curious to know in which direction the photon decided to move off from the electron.

Between 1913 and 1925 Bohr, Arnold Sommerfeld and others were able to improve Bohr’s model, and together with the introduction of spin and Wolfgang Pauli’s exclusion principle it gave a reasonably good description of the basic chemical elements. The model ran into problems, nonetheless, when one tried to apply it to spectra other than that of hydrogen. So there was a general feeling among all leading physicists that Bohr’s model had to be replaced by a more radical theory. In 1925 Werner Heisenberg, at that time Bohr’s assistant in Copenhagen, laid down the basic principles of a complete quantum mechanics. In his new matrix theory he replaced classical commuting variables with non-commuting ones. The following year, Erwin Schrödinger gave a simpler formulation of the theory in which he introduced a second-order differential equation for a wave function. He himself attempted a largely classical interpretation of the wave function. However, already the same year Max Born proposed a consistent statistical interpretation in which the square of the absolute value of this wave function expresses a probability density for the outcome of a measurement.

2. Classical Physics

Bohr saw quantum mechanics as a generalization of classical physics although it violates some of the basic ontological principles on which classical physics rests. Some of these principles are:

  • The principles of physical objects and their identity:
    • Physical objects (systems of objects) exist in space and time and physical processes take place in space and time, i.e., it is a fundamental feature of all changes and movements of physical objects (systems of objects) that they happen on a background of space and time;
    • Physical objects (systems) are localizable, i.e., they do not exist everywhere in space and time; rather, they are confined to definite places and times;
    • A particular place can only be occupied by one object of the same kind at a time;
    • Two physical objects of the same kind exist separately; i.e., two objects that belong to the same kind cannot have identical location at an identical time and must therefore be separated in space and time;
    • Physical objects are countable, i.e., two alluded objects of the same kind count numerically as one if both share identical location at a time and counts numerically as two if they occupy different locations at a time;
  • The principle of separated properties, i.e., two objects (systems) separated in space and time have each independent inherent states or properties;
  • The principle of value determinateness, i.e., all inherent states or properties have a specific value or magnitude independent of the value or magnitude of other properties;
  • The principle of causality, i.e., every event, every change of a system, has a cause;
  • The principle of determination, i.e., every later state of a system is uniquely determined by any earlier state;
  • The principle of continuity, i.e., all processes exhibiting a difference between the initial and the final state have to go through every possible intervening state; in other words, the evolution of a system is an unbroken path through its state space; and finally
  • The principle of the conservation of energy, i.e., the energy of a closed system can be transformed into various forms but is never gained, lost or destroyed.

Due to these principles it is possible within, say, classical mechanics, to define a state of a system at any later time with respect to a state at any earlier time. So whenever we know the initial state consisting of the system’s position and momentum, and know all external forces acting on it, we also know what will be its later states. The knowledge of the initial state is usually acquired by observing the state properties of the system at the time selected as the initial moment. Furthermore, the observation of a system does not affect its later behavior or, if observation somehow should influence this behavior, it is always possible to incorporate the effect into the prediction of the system’s later state. Thus, in classical physics we can always draw a sharp distinction between the state of the measuring instrument being used on a system and the state of the physical system itself. It means that the physical description of the system is objective because the definition of any later state is not dependent on measuring conditions or other observational conditions.

Much of Kant’s philosophy can be seen as an attempt to provide satisfactory philosophical grounds for the objective basis of Newton’s mechanics against Humean scepticism. Kant thus argued that classical mechanics is in accordance with the transcendental conditions for objective knowledge. Kant’s philosophy undoubtedly influenced Bohr in various ways, as many scholars in recent years have noticed (Hooker 1972; Folse 1985; Honner 1987; Faye 1991; Kaiser 1992; and Chevalley 1994). Bohr was definitely neither a subjectivist nor a positivist philosopher, as Karl Popper (1967) and Mario Bunge (1967) have claimed. He explicitly rejected the idea that the experimental outcome is due to the observer. As he said: “It is certainly not possible for the observer to influence the events which may appear under the conditions he has arranged” (APHK, p. 51). Not unlike Kant, Bohr thought that we could have objective knowledge only in case we can distinguish between the experiential subject and the experienced object. It is a precondition for the knowledge of a phenomenon as being something distinct from the sensorial subject, that we can refer to it as an object without involving the subject’s experience of the object. In order to separate the object from the subject itself, the experiential subject must be able to distinguish between the form and the content of his or her experiences. This is possible only if the subject uses causal and spatial-temporal concepts for describing the sensorial content, placing phenomena in causal connection in space and time, since it is the causal space-time description of our perceptions that constitutes the criterion of reality for them. Bohr therefore believed that what gives us the possibility of talking about an object and an objectively existing reality is the application of those necessary concepts, and that the physical equivalents of “space,” “time,” “causation,” and “continuity” were the concepts “position,” “time,” “momentum,” and “energy,” which he referred to as the classical concepts. He also believed that the above basic concepts exist already as preconditions of unambiguous and meaningful communication, built in as rules of our ordinary language. So, in Bohr’s opinion the conditions for an objective description of nature given by the concepts of classical physics were merely a refinement of the preconditions of human knowledge.

3. The Correspondence Rule

The guiding principle behind Bohr’s and later Heisenberg’s work in the development of a consistent theory of atoms was the correspondence rule. The full rule states that a transition between stationary states is allowed if, and only if, there is a corresponding harmonic component in the classical motion (CW Vol. 3, p. 479). Bohr furthermore realized that according to his theory of the hydrogen atom, the frequencies of radiation due to the electron’s transition between stationary states with high quantum numbers, i.e. states far from the ground state, coincide approximately with the results of classical electrodynamics. Hence in the search for a theory of quantum mechanics it became a methodological requirement to Bohr that any further theory of the atom should predict values in domains of high quantum numbers that should be a close approximation to the values of classical physics. The correspondence rule was a heuristic principle meant to make sure that in areas where the influence of Planck’s constant could be neglected the numerical values predicted by such a theory should be the same as if they were predicted by classical radiation theory.

The Bohr-Sommerfeld core model of the atomic structure came into trouble in the beginning of the 1920s due to the fact that it couldn’t handle an increasing number of spectroscopic phenomena. In 1924 Wolfgang Pauli introduced a new degree of freedom according to which two electrons with the same known quantum numbers could not be in the same state. A year later, in 1925, Ralph Kronig, Georg Uhlenbeck and Samuel Goudsmit explained this new degree of freedom by introducing the non-classical concept of electron spin. It has been suggested, however, that Pauli’s proposal meant a lethal blow not only to the Bohr-Sommerfeld model, but also to the correspondence principle because “how to reconcile the classical periodic motions presupposed by the correspondence principle with the classically non-describable Zweideutigkeit of the electron’s angular momentum?” (Massimi 2005, p. 73)

Although the exclusion rule and the introduction of spin broke with the attempt to explain the structure of the basic elements along the lines of the correspondence argument (as Pauli pointed out in a letter to Bohr) Bohr continued to think of it as an important methodological principle in the attempt to establish a coherent quantum theory. In fact, he repeatedly expressed the opinion that Heisenberg’s matrix mechanics came to light under the guidance of this very principle. In his Faraday Lectures from 1932, for instance, Bohr emphasizes: “A fundamental step towards the establishing of a proper quantum mechanics was taken in 1925 by Heisenberg who showed how to replace the ordinary kinematical concepts, in the spirit of the correspondence argument, by symbols referring to the elementary processes and the probability of their occurrence” (CC, p. 48). Bohr acknowledged, however, that the correspondence argument failed too in those cases where particular non-classical concepts have to be introduced into the description of atoms. But he still thought that the correspondence argument was indispensable for both structural and semantic reasons in constructing a proper quantum theory as a generalised theory from classical mechanics.

Indeed, spin is a quantum property of the electrons which cannot be understood as a classical angular momentum. Needless to say, Bohr fully understood that. But he didn’t think that this discovery ruled out the use of the correspondence rule as guidance to finding a satisfactory quantum theory. A lengthy quotation from Bohr’s paper “The Causality Problem in Atomic Physics” (1938) gives evidence for this:

Indeed, as adequate as the quantum postulates are in the phenomenological description of the atomic reactions, as indispensable are the basic concepts of mechanics and electrodynamics for the specification of atomic structures and for the definition of fundamental properties of the agencies with which they react. Far from being a temporary compromise in this dilemma, the recourse to essentially statistical considerations is our only conceivable means of arriving at a generalization of the customary way of description sufficiently wide to account for the features of individuality expressed by the quantum postulates and reducing to classical theory in the limiting case where all actions involved in the analysis of the phenomena are large compared with a single quantum. In the search for the formulation of such a generalization, our only guide has just been the so called correspondence argument, which gives expression for the exigency of upholding the use of classical concepts to the largest possible extent compatible with the quantum postulates. (CC, p. 96)

This shows that, according to Bohr, quantum mechanics, as formulated by Heisenberg, was a rational generalization of classical mechanics when the quantum of action and the spin property were taken into account.

The correspondence rule was an important methodological principle. In the beginning it had mostly a clear technical meaning for Bohr as a principle of theory construction, but later he also recognized it as having a specific interpretative function. Apparently, Bohr’s use of the principle up to Heisenberg’s formulation of quantum mechanics was as a heuristic principle for how to generalize mathematically a coherent theory from classical mechanics, while afterwards he relied on it to support his understanding of the physical meaning of the new theory. In the first situation, the pre-QM, Bohr used the principle dynamically as a methodological principle for generating a new theory (Bokulich & Bokulich 2005). As a methodological principle, it guided physicists to how a coherent theory of quantum phenomena might be achieved, and as a methodological principle, it can be understood as an umbrella principle that applied to different aspects of a formal (syntactical) extension of classical physics depending on the context of discussion. In the second situation, post-QM, his appeal to the correspondence principle had more the character of a vindication of his own interpretation of quantum mechanics. In this post-QM situation, the principle achieved a semantic role in the sense that Bohr saw it as a consequence of the descriptive demand of using classical concepts, and thereby his physical interpretation of the QM formalism in relation to the theory’s description of experimental results.

It is obvious that it makes no sense to compare the numerical values of the theory of atoms with those of classical physics unless the meaning of the physical terms in both theories is commensurable. The correspondence rule was based on the epistemological idea that classical concepts were indispensable for our understanding of physical reality, and it is only when classical phenomena and quantum phenomena are described in terms of the same classical concepts that we can compare different physical experiences. It was this broader sense of the correspondence rule that Bohr often had in mind later on. He directly mentioned the relationship between the use of classical concepts and the correspondence principle in 1934 when he wrote in the Introduction to Atomic Theory and the Description of Nature:

[T]he necessity of making an extensive use … of the classical concepts, upon which depends ultimately the interpretation of all experience, gave rise to the formulation of the so-called correspondence principle which expresses our endeavours to utilize all the classical concepts by giving them a suitable quantum-theoretical re-interpretation. (ATDN, p. 8)

Bohr’s practical methodology stands therefore in direct opposition to Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend’s historical view that succeeding theories, like classical mechanics and quantum mechanics, are incommensurable. In contrast to their philosophical claims of meaning gaps and partial lack of rationality in the choice between incommensurable theories, Bohr believed not just retrospectively that quantum mechanics was a natural generalization of classical physics, but he and Heisenberg followed in practice the requirements of the correspondence rule. Thus, in the mind of Bohr, the meaning of the classical concepts did not change but their application was restricted. This was the lesson of complementarity.

4. Complementarity

After Heisenberg had managed to formulate a consistent quantum mechanics in 1925, both he and Bohr began their struggle to find a coherent interpretation for the mathematical formalism. Heisenberg and Bohr followed somewhat different approaches (Camilleri 2009). Where Heisenberg looked to the formalism and developed his famous uncertainty principle or indeterminacy relation, Bohr chose to analyze concrete experimental arrangements, especially the double-slit experiment. In a way Bohr merely regarded Heisenberg’s relation as an expression of his general notion that our understanding of atomic phenomena builds on complementary descriptions. At Como in 1927 he presented for the first time his ideas according to which certain different descriptions are said to be complementary. Bohr never gave a precise definition of complementarity; however, Simon Saunders (2005) offers a formal reconstruction of complementarity in modern terminology.

Bohr pointed to two sets of descriptions which he took to be complementary. On the one hand, there are those that attribute either kinematic or dynamic properties to the atom; that is, “space-time descriptions” are complementary to “claims of causality”, where Bohr interpreted the causal claims in physics in terms of the conservation of energy and momentum. On the other hand, there are those descriptions that ascribe either wave or particle properties to a single object. How these two kinds of complementary sets of descriptions are related is something Bohr never indicated (Murdoch 1987). Even among people, like Rosenfeld and Pais, who claimed to speak on behalf of Bohr, there is no agreement. The fact is that the description of light as either particles or waves was already a classical dilemma, which not even Einstein’s definition of a photon really solved since the momentum of the photon as a particle depends on the frequency of the light as a wave. Furthermore, Bohr eventually realized that the attribution of kinematic and dynamic properties to an object is complementary because the ascription of both of these conjugate variables rests on mutually exclusive experiments. The attribution of particle and wave properties to an object may, however, occur in a single experiment; for instance, in the double-slit experiment where the interference pattern consists of single dots. So within less than ten years after his Como lecture Bohr tacitly abandoned “wave-particle complementarity” in favor of the exclusivity of “kinematic-dynamic complementarity” (Held 1994).

It was clear to Bohr that any interpretation of the atomic world had to take into account an important empirical fact. The discovery of the quantization of action meant that quantum mechanics could not fulfill the above principles of classical physics. Every time we measure, say, an electron’s position, the apparatus and the electron interact in an uncontrollable way, so that we are unable to measure the electron’s momentum at the same time. Until the mid-1930s when Einstein, Podolsky and Rosen published their famous thought-experiment with the intention of showing that quantum mechanics was incomplete, Bohr spoke as if the measurement apparatus disturbed the electron. This paper had a significant influence on Bohr’s line of thought. Apparently, Bohr realized that speaking of disturbance seemed to indicate—as some of his opponents may have understood him—that atomic objects were classical particles with definite inherent kinematic and dynamic properties. After the EPR paper he stated quite clearly: “the whole situation in atomic physics deprives of all meaning such inherent attributes as the idealization of classical physics would ascribe to such objects.”

Hence, according to Bohr, the state of the measuring device and the state of the object cannot be separated from each other during a measurement but they form a dynamical whole. Bohr called this form of holism “the individuality” of the atomic process. Thereby, he had in mind not only that the interaction is uncontrollable but also that the system-cum-measurement forms an inseparable unity due to the entanglement – although Bohr’s did not use this term (Faye 1991, 1994; Howard 1994, 2004).

Also after the EPR paper Bohr spoke about Heisenberg’s “indeterminacy relation” as indicating the ontological consequences of his claim that kinematic and dynamic variables are ill-defined unless they refer to an experimental outcome. Earlier he had often called it Heisenberg’s “uncertainty relation”, as if it were a question of a merely epistemological limitation. Furthermore, Bohr no longer mentioned descriptions as being complementary, but rather phenomena or information. He introduced the definition of a “phenomenon” as requiring a complete description of the entire experimental arrangement, and he took a phenomenon to be a measurement of the values of either kinematic or dynamic properties.

Bohr’s more mature view, i.e., his view after the EPR paper, on complementarity and the interpretation of quantum mechanics may be summarized in the following points:

  1. The interpretation of a physical theory has to rely on an experimental practice.
  2. The experimental practice presupposes a certain pre-scientific practice of description, which establishes the norm for experimental measurement apparatus, and consequently what counts as scientific experience.
  3. Our pre-scientific practice of understanding our environment is an adaptation to the sense experience of separation, orientation, identification and reidentification over time of physical objects.
  4. This pre-scientific experience is grasped in terms of common categories like thing’s position and change of position, duration and change of duration, and the relation of cause and effect, terms and principles that are now parts of our common language.
  5. These common categories yield the preconditions for objective knowledge, and any description of nature has to use these concepts to be objective.
  6. The concepts of classical physics are merely exact specifications of the above categories.
  7. The classical concepts—and not classical physics itself—are therefore necessary in any description of physical experience in order to understand what we are doing and to be able to communicate our results to others, in particular in the description of quantum phenomena as they present themselves in experiments;
  8. Planck’s empirical discovery of the quantization of action requires a revision of the foundation for the use of classical concepts, because they are not all applicable at the same time. Their use is well defined only if they apply to experimental interactions in which the quantization of action can be regarded as negligible.
  9. In experimental cases where the quantization of action plays a significant role, the application of a classical concept does not refer to independent properties of the object; rather the ascription of either kinematic or dynamic properties to the object as it exists independently of a specific experimental interaction is ill-defined.
  10. The quantization of action demands a limitation of the use of classical concepts so that these concepts apply only to a phenomenon, which Bohr understood as the macroscopic manifestation of a measurement on the object, i.e. the uncontrollable interaction between the object and the apparatus.
  11. The quantum mechanical description of the object differs from the classical description of the measuring apparatus, and this requires that the object and the measuring device should be separated in the description, but the line of separation is not the one between macroscopic instruments and microscopic objects. It has been argued in detail (Howard 1994) that Bohr pointed out that parts of the measuring device may sometimes be treated as parts of the object in the quantum mechanical description.
  12. The quantum mechanical formalism does not provide physicists with a ‘pictorial’ representation: the ψ-function does not, as Schrödinger had hoped, represent a new kind of reality. Instead, as Born suggested, the square of the absolute value of the ψ-function expresses a probability density for the outcome of a measurement. Due to the fact that the wave equation involves an imaginary quantity this equation can have only a symbolic character, but the formalism may be used to predict the outcome of a measurement that establishes the conditions under which concepts like position, momentum, time and energy apply to the phenomena.
  13. The ascription of these classical concepts to the phenomena of measurements rely on the experimental context of the phenomena, so that the entire setup provides us with the defining conditions for the application of kinematic and dynamic concepts in the domain of quantum physics.
  14. Such phenomena are complementary in the sense that their manifestations depend on mutually exclusive measurements, but that the information gained through these various experiments exhausts all possible objective knowledge of the object.

Bohr thought of the atom as real. Atoms are neither heuristic nor logical constructions. A couple of times he emphasized this directly using arguments from experiments in a very similar way to Ian Hacking and Nancy Cartwright much later. What he did not believe was that the quantum mechanical formalism was true in the sense that it gave us a literal (‘pictorial’) rather than a symbolic representation of the quantum world. It makes much sense to characterize Bohr in modern terms as an entity realist who opposes theory realism (Folse 1986; Faye 1991).

It is because of the imaginary quantities in quantum mechanics (where the commutation rule for canonically conjugate variable, p and q, introduces Planck’s constant into the formalism by qppq = ih/2π that quantum mechanics does not give us a ‘pictorial’ representation of the world. Neither does the theory of relativity, Bohr argued, provide us with a literal representation, since the velocity of light is introduced with a factor of i in the definition of the fourth coordinate in a four-dimensional manifold (CC, p. 86 and p. 105). Instead these theories can only be used symbolically to predict observations under well-defined conditions. Therefore, many philosophers have interpreted Bohr as an antirealist or an instrumentalist when it comes to theories. However, Bohr’s reference to the use of imaginary number in quantum mechanics as an argument for his rejection of a pictoral representation may seem misplaced. The use of imaginary numbers is more a question about the conventional choice of scale whether measurements should be represented in terms of imaginary or real number than an indication of a certain magnitude expressed in terms of these numbers is not real. Dieks (2017) gives a nuanced discussion of Bohr’s argument, and he concludes that in the context of quantum mechanics Bohr saw imaginary numbers to be associated with incompatible physical quantities.

In general, Bohr considered the demands of complementarity in quantum mechanics to be logically on a par with the requirements of relativity in the theory of relativity. He believed that both theories were a result of novel aspects of the observation problem, namely the fact that observation in physics is context-dependent. This again is due to the existence of a maximum velocity of propagation of all actions in the domain of relativity and a minimum of any action in the domain of quantum mechanics. And it is because of these universal limits that it is impossible in the theory of relativity to make an unambiguous separation between time and space without reference to the observer (the context) and impossible in quantum mechanics to make a sharp distinction between the behavior of the object and its interaction with the means of observation (CC, p. 105).

Complementarity is first and foremost a semantic and epistemological reading of quantum mechanics that carries certain ontological implications. Bohr’s view was, to phrase it in a modern philosophical jargon, that the truth conditions of sentences ascribing a certain kinematic or dynamic value to an atomic object are dependent on the apparatus involved, in such a way that these truth conditions have to include reference to the experimental setup as well as the actual outcome of the experiment. This claim is called Bohr’s indefinability thesis (Murdoch 1987; Faye 1991). Hence, those physicists who accuse this interpretation of operating with a mysterious collapse of the wave function during measurements haven’t got it right. Bohr accepted the Born statistical interpretation because he believed that the ψ-function has only a symbolic meaning and does not represent anything real. It makes sense to talk about a collapse of the wave function only if, as Bohr put it, the ψ-function can be given a pictorial representation, something he strongly denied.

Indeed, Bohr, Heisenberg, and many other physicists considered complementarity to be the only rational interpretation of the quantum world. They thought that it gave us the understanding of atomic phenomena in accordance with the conditions for any physical description and the possible objective knowledge of the world. Bohr believed that atoms are real, but it remains a much debated point in recent literature what sort of reality he believed them to have, whether or not they are something beyond and different from what they are observed to be. Henry Folse argues that Bohr must operate with a distinction between a phenomenal and a transcendental object. The reason is that this is the only way it makes sense to talk about the physical disturbance of the atomic object by the measuring instrument as Bohr did for a while (Folse 1985, 1994). But Jan Faye has replied that Bohr gave up the disturbance metaphor in connection with his discussion of the EPR thought-experiment because he realized that it was misleading. Moreover, there is no further evidence in Bohr’s writings indicating that Bohr would attribute intrinsic and measurement-independent state properties to atomic objects (though quite unintelligible and inaccessible to us) in addition to the classical ones being manifested in measurement (Faye 1991).

5. The Use of Classical Concepts

A central element in the Copenhagen Interpretation is Bohr’s insistence on the use of classical concepts both with respect to describing experimental results and endowing quantum formalism with an empirical interpretation. The special cognitive status ascribed to the classical concepts is something Bohr stressed from the very beginning. Here is a quotation from 1934:

No more is it likely that the fundamental concepts of the classical theories will ever become superfluous for the description of physical experience. … It continues to be the application of these concepts alone that makes it possible to relate the symbolism of the quantum theory to the data of experience. (ATDN, p. 16)

Later he expressed the same view in an often quoted passage:

It is decisive to recognize that, however far the phenomena transcend the scope of classical physical explanation, the account of all evidence must be expressed in classical terms. The argument is simply that by the word ‘experiment’ we refer to a situation where we can tell to others what we have done and what we have learned and that, therefore, the account of the experimental arrangement and of the results of the observations must be expressed in unambiguous language with suitable application of the terminology of classical physics. (APHK, p. 39)

Bohr saw the classical concepts as necessary for procuring unambiguous communication about what happens in the laboratory. Classical concepts are indispensable, because they enable physicists to describe observations in a clear common language, and because they are the ones by which the physicists connect the mathematical formalism with observational content.

Over the years, different authors have come up with different explanations of why Bohr thought that classical concepts were unavoidable for the description of quantum phenomena. Here we shall group those explanations in relation to five different philosophical frameworks: 1) Empiricism, 2) Kantianism, 3) Pragmatism, 4) Darwinianism, and 5) Experimentalism.

Empiricism. This view is represented by the logical positivists. They believed that the interpretation of any scientific theory should be grounded in empirical observations. No theory, according the positivists, is cognitively meaningful unless its terms can be connected to terms that are able to express results that would verify that theory. Observational terms refer directly to observable things or observable properties of physical objects, whereas theoretical terms are explicitly defined by correspondence rules connecting them with the observational terms. Hence classical terms, like position and momentum, are exactly such terms that enable physicist to ascribe a physical meaning to quantum mechanics.

Kantianism. Many philosophers and physicists have recognized a strong kinship between Kant and Bohr’s thinking or a direct Kantian influence on Bohr. In the thirties C.F. von Weizsäcker and Grete Hermann attempt to understand complementarity in the light of neo-Kantian ideas. As von Weizsäcker puts it many years later, “The alliance between Kantians and physicists was premature in Kant’s time, and still is; in Bohr, we begin to perceive its possibility”. A series of modern scholars (Folse 1985; Honner 1982, 1987; Faye 1991; Kaiser 1992; Chevalley 1994; Pringe 2009; Cuffaro 2010; Bitbol 2013, 2017; and Kauark-Leite 2017) has also emphasized the Kantian parallels. Although these scholars find common themes, they also disagree to what extent Kantian or neo-Kantian ideas can be used as spectacles through which we may vision Bohr’s understanding of quantum mechanics. On the other hand, Cuffaro (2010) holds that any proper “interpretation of Bohr should start with Kant”, and that “complementarity follows naturally from a broadly Kantian epistemological framework.” Kant’s assumption was that our forms of intuition and our categories of thoughts constitute the transcendental conditions for the possibility of any objective experience. Thus, space and time are referred to as the forms of intuition, and the categories of understanding such as causation, unity, plurality, and totality are the a priori concepts which the mind imposes on the sense impressions that appear in our intuition. In a similar way, it is argued that Bohr saw concepts like space, time, causation, unity, and totality as a priori categories that was necessary for any objective description of quantum phenomena, and that classical physics was an explication and operationalization of these a priori concepts.

Pragmatism. Some scholars have advocated for a more pragmatic explanation of Bohr’s thesis concerning the indispensability of classical concepts. Here the interpretation focuses on how we experimentally get to know something about atoms. We find out about atoms by interacting with atomic systems, not by picturing them, and the interaction are accounted for in terms of experiential categories. The pragmatists typically reject the a priori status of the mind’s categories as they take them to be contingent. From a physical perspective it is a simple matter of facts that we need classical language to understand our scientific practise; it does not require any philosophical justification (Dieks 2017). Likewise, Dorato (2017) compares Bohr’s indispensable thesis to Peter Strawson’s descriptive metaphysics according to which we all share a common conceptual scheme about the experiential world which cannot be given a further justification. Also Folse notes, in a comparison between Bohr and I.C. Lewis, that classical concepts reflect our empirical needs and shared interests and may eventually change if these needs and interests change (Folse 2017). The common language together with the development of a physical clarification of some basic empirical concepts gave us the classical physics because such an improved language enables us to communicate in an unambiguous and objective manner about our observations. As Bohr puts it: “... even when the phenomena transcend the scope of classical physical theories, the account of the experimental arrangement and the recording of observations must be given in plain language, suitably supplemented by technical physical terminology. This is a clear logical demand, since the very word ”experiment“ refers to a situation where we can tell others what we have done and what we have learned.” (APHK, p. 71). The use of classical concepts to grasp the world is beneficial for understanding each other. Such empirical concepts provide us with an objective description of the function and outcome of physical experiments.

Darwinism. In several places Bohr speaks about the classical concepts as embodied in our common language, which is adapted to account for our physical experiences. The selection of the word “adapted to” seems to indicate that Bohr relied on Darwin’s theory of natural selection in his search for an explanation. The classical concepts are indispensable for the description of our experience because we are forced by nature to use a common language that is adapted to reporting our visual experiences, which again is a result of humans’ adaptation to their physical environment (Faye, 2017). Apart from Bohr’s use of the word “adapted to”, Bohr’s former assistant Leon Rosenfelt, who was an ardent defender of Bohr’s complementarity, explicitly suggests that “the complementary logic” is due to human evolution: “I suspect the development of a computing and communication system like our brain demands about that complexity of organization which has been reached by our own species in the course of evolution” (Rosenfeld, (1961 [1979]), p. 515). Natural selection installs certain permanent visual cognitive schemes in our predecessors, and this cognitive adaptation explains why these schemes, later reflected in our common language, gain a privileged epistemic status, and keep this status in physics in terms of refined classical concepts.

Experimentalism. Camilleri (2017) calls Bohr the philosopher of experiment. Others such as Perovic (2013) have also suggested that Bohr was more occupied by understanding the outcome of quantum experiments than by interpreting the quantum formalism. This view is substantiated in Perovic (2021) where he points to traditional induction as Bohr’s methods of constructing hypotheses from experimental data, just as he argues that this fact is a prerequisite for understanding Bohr’s view on correspondence and complementarity. However, Camilleri proposes in his paper that the challenge Bohr was facing was that, on the one hand, experimental observation requires a sharp separation of the experiment and the observed object, and, on the other hand, because of what we today call entanglement, “it is no longer possible sharply to distinguish between the autonomous behaviour of a physical object and its inevitable interaction with other bodies serving as measuring instruments” (CC, p. 84). So, according to Camilleri, Bohr solved this challenge by making a distinction between the function and the structure of an experiment.

Bohr’s central insight was that if a measuring instrument is to serve its purpose of furnishing us with knowledge of an object – that is to say, if it is to be described functionally – it must be described classically. Of course, it is always possible to represent the experimental apparatus from a purely structural point of view as a quantum-mechanical system without any reference to its function. However, any functional description of the experimental apparatus, in which it is treated as a means to an end, and not merely as a dynamical system, must make use of the concepts of classical physics. (Camilleri, 2017, pp. 30–31)

This analysis explains not only why Bohr thought that classical concepts were indispensable for interpretational purposes, but also indicates why he thought that properties like momentum, position, and duration could be attributed only to an atom object in relation to a specific experimental arrangement. As Dieks (2017) mentions while denying any deeper philosophical motivation on Bohr’s part: the use of classical concepts is part of the laboratory life. “This classical description is basically just the description in terms of everyday language, generalized by the addition of physics terminology, and it is the one we de facto use to describe our environment” (Dieks 2017). But because of quantum of action, symbolized by Planck’s constant, the function of experiments that supply the physicists with exact information about space-time coordinations is incompatible with experiments whose function it is to supply them with exact information about energy and momentum.

Indeed, there are both similarities and overlaps between some of the proposed explanations concerning the indispensability of classical concepts. Yet, not all of the suggested explanations can be true. Even though the aim of Bohr’s effort is to give an empirical interpretation of the quantum formalism, his empiricism is different from that of the logical positivists. He does not seek to reduce terms concerning theoretical entities to terms about sense-data or purely perceptual phenomena. He insists only that the empirical evidence physicists collect from their experiments on atomic objects has to be described in terms of the same concepts which were developed in classical mechanics in order for them to understand what the quantum theory is all about.

Nevertheless, the various explanations all give us some hints into the complexity of Bohr’s thinking concerning the description of physical experiments. At different times, he seems to put emphasis on one aspect rather than another, depending on the specific context of discussion. Sometimes he was occupied with the interpretation of experiments, sometimes with the relationship between actual experiments and the formulation of quantum mechanics. In emphasizing the necessity of classical concepts for the description of quantum phenomena, Bohr might have been influenced by Kantian-like ideas or neo-Kantianism (Hooker, 1994). But if so, he was a naturalized or a pragmatized Kantian. The classical concepts are merely explications of common-sense concepts that are already a result of our perceptual adaptation to the world. These concepts and the conditions of their application determine the conditions for objective knowledge. The discovery of the quantization of action has revealed to us, however, that we cannot apply these concepts to quantum objects as we did in classical physics. The use of classical concepts in the domain of quantum mechanics has to be restricted with respect to their use in classical mechanics. Now kinematic and dynamic properties (represented by conjugate variables) can be meaningfully ascribed to the object only in relation to some actual experimental results, whereas classical physics attributes such properties to the object regardless of whether we actually observe them or not. In other words, Bohr denied that classical concepts could be used to attribute properties to a physical world in-itself behind the perceptual phenomena, i.e. properties different from those being observed. In contrast, classical physics rests on an idealization, he said, in the sense that it assumes that the physical world has these properties in-itself, i.e. as inherent properties, independent of their actual observation.

6. The Interpretation of the Quantum Formalism

Classical concepts serve the important function of connecting the quantum mechanical symbolism with experimental observations. If one accepts that Bohr’s grasp of physics began with his understanding of the role of physical experiments, this understanding had strong implications for his empirical interpretation of the quantum formalism. The modern scholarly debate has taken Bohr to be an instrumentalist, an objective anti-realist (Faye 1991), a phenomenological realist (Shomar 2008), or a realist of various sorts (Folse 1985, 1994; Favrholdt 1994; MacKinnon 1994; Howard 1994, 2004; Zinkernagel 2015, 2016). But very often the various participants do not give an exact specification of how they understand these terms and how these terms apply to Bohr’s thinking. The whole discussion becomes confused because different authors use terms like “realism” and “antirealism” differently in relation to Bohr. For instance, Faye (1991) holds that Bohr is an entity realist but a non-representationalist concerning theories. Therefore he calls Bohr an objective antirealist. In contrast, Folse (1986) who also sees Bohr as both a entity realist and a theoretical non-representationalist calls him a realist. Moreover, Bohr himself would probably refuse to put any such labels on his own view.

It is certain that Bohr regarded atomic objects as real (ATDN, p. 93 and p. 103). Their existence has been confirmed by countless experiments. Hence, phrased in a modern terminology Bohr might be classified as an entity realist in the sense that experiments reveal their classical properties in relation to an experimental set-up. Such a view does not fit traditional instrumentalism where the introduction of unobservable entities is a logical construction in order to classify various empirical observations together. But entity realism corresponds with objective anti-realism, phenomenological realist, and all other forms of realism because it does not indicate anything about one’s attitude towards theories. A further issue is then how to interpret a physical theory. Does or doesn’t the quantum formalism, according to Bohr, represent the world over and above being a tool for prediction?

Here are four statements which seem to show that Bohr was an instrumentalist concerning scientific theories in general and the quantum formalism in particular.

  1. The purpose of scientific theories “is not to disclose the real essence of phenomena but only to track down, so far as it is possible, relations between the manifold aspects of experience” (APHK, p. 71).
  2. “The ingenious formalism of quantum mechanics, which abandons pictorial representation and aims directly at a statistical account of quantum processes …” (CC, p. 152).
  3. “The formalism thus defies pictorial representation and aims directly at prediction of observations appearing under well-defined conditions” (CC, p. 172).
  4. “The entire formalism is to be considered as a tool for deriving predictions of definite and statistical character …” (CC, p. 144).

In these four statements Bohr mentions the absence of “pictorial representation” twice in relation to the quantum formalism. The term “pictorial representation” stands for a representation that helps us to visualize what it represents in contrast to “symbolic representation”. A pictorial representation is a formalism that has an isomorphic relation to the objects it represents such that the visualized structure of the representation corresponds to a similar structure in nature. Conversely, a symbolic representation does not stand for anything visualizable. It is an abstract tool whose function it is to calculate a result whenever this representation is applied to an experimental situation. With respect to the formalism of quantum mechanics it is particularly one’s interpretation of the wave function that determines whether one thinks of it symbolically as a tool for calculation of statistical outcomes or thinks of is as representing a real physical field.

In a close reading of the Como-paper, Dennis Dieks reaches the conclusion that “The notion that the lecture is meant to promulgate an instrumentalist interpretation of quantum theory according to which the whole formalism possesses only mathematical and no physical descriptive content is thus immediately seen to sit uneasily with the textual evidence.” (Dieks 2017, p. 305). In other words, Dieks goes against the more general interpretation of Bohr according to which Bohr only believed that the wave function formalism is a mere tool for prediction. Hans Halvorson (2019) expresses a similar view as Dieks does, arguing that even though Bohr used the word symbolic it should not be understood as if the wave function were “nonrepresentational” or “uninterpreted”. Halvorson thinks that we should read “symbolic” as philosophers do in the continental tradition going back to Kant, and he suggests with reference to Pringe (2014) that there might be parallels to Ernst Cassirer’s view on symbols. Just because Bohr writes off quantum formalism as a pictoral representation, it still gives us some insight into physical reality.

In the argument for his reading, Dieks points to another of Bohr’s argument against seeing Schödinger’s wave function as representing anything real. This argument concerns the fact that the wave function in quantum mechanics cannot represent a three-dimensional entity.

Bohr himself tells us that his second argument, about the dimensionality of configuration space, is the most important one: “above all there can be no question of an immediate connexion with our ordinary conceptions because... the wave equation is associated with the so-called co-ordinate space.” In other words, the Schrödinger wave in the case of a many-particle system cannot be a physical wave in three-dimensional space (which would be an “ordinary conception”) since it “lives” in a high-dimensional mathematical space. (Dieks 2017, p. 308)

Then Dieks argues that even though this is an argument against wave function realism, it is not an argument that excludes the wave function from containing information about the quantum world. Dieks compares this argument to the one that denies phase space realism. “We can consistently deny the physical reality of phase space and still be realists with respect to particles. So we should not mistake Bohr’s argument for the symbolic character of the wave function for an argument in favor of instrumentalism tout court” (Dieks 2017, p. 308). The difference between classical many-particles system placed in a phase space and a system of quantum objects placed in the configuration space is, however, that the description of many particles in phase space can be decomposed into a description of single particles in three-dimensional physical space, whereas the sum of the quantum waves associated with many particles in configuration space yields yet another superimposed quantum wave, which cannot be decomposed into a description of single particles in three-dimensional space. Dieks then continues to show how the structural features of the quantum formalism guided Bohr in his interpretation of quantum mechanism. Likewise, he argues that Bohr’s pronouncements on the meaning of quantum mechanics should first of all be seen as responses to concrete physical problems, rather than as expressions of a preconceived philosophical doctrine. His analysis results in a finding that Bohr’s qualitative interpretation is in line with modern non-collapse theories.

7. Misunderstandings of Complementarity

Complementarity has been commonly misunderstood in several ways, some of which shall be outlined in this section. First of all, earlier generations of philosophers and scientists have often accused Bohr’s interpretation of being positivistic or subjectivistic. Today philosophers have almost reached a consensus that it is neither. There are, as many have noticed, both typically realist as well as antirealist elements involved in it, and it has affinities with Kant or neo-Kantianism. The influence of Kant or Kantian thinking on Bohr’s philosophy seems to have several sources. Some have pointed to the German tradition from Hermann von Helmholtz (Chevalley 1991, 1994; Brock 2003); others have considered the Danish philosopher Harald Høffding to be the missing link to Kantianism (Faye 1991; Christiansen 2006; and Pringe 2020). A dissenting opinion is Favrholdt (1992).

But because Bohr’s view on complementarity has wrongly been associated with positivism and subjectivism, much confusion still seems to stick to the Copenhagen interpretation. Don Howard (2004) argues, however, that what is commonly known as the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics, regarded as representing a unitary Copenhagen point of view, differs significantly from Bohr’s complementarity interpretation. He holds that “the Copenhagen interpretation is an invention of the mid-1950s, for which Heisenberg is chiefly responsible, [and that] various other physicists and philosophers, including Bohm, Feyerabend, Hanson, and Popper, hav[e] further promoted the invention in the service of their own philosophical agendas” (p. 669).

More recently, Mara Beller (1999) argued that Bohr’s statements are intelligible only if we presume that he was a radical operationalist or a simple-minded positivist. In fact, complementarity was established as the orthodox interpretation of quantum mechanics in the 1930s, a time when positivism was prevalent in philosophy of science, and some commentators have taken the two to be closely associated. During the 1930s Bohr was also in touch with some of the leading neopositivists or logical empiricists such as Rudolph Carnap, Otto Neurath, Philip Frank, and the Danish philosopher Jørgen Jørgensen (Faye and Jaksland 2021a). Although their anti-metaphysical approach to science may have had some influence on Bohr (especially around 1935 during his final discussion with Einstein about the completeness of quantum mechanics), one must recall that Bohr always saw complementarity as a necessary response to the indeterministic description of quantum mechanics due to the quantum of action. The quantum of action was an empirical discovery, not a consequence of a certain epistemological theory, and Bohr thought that indeterminism was the price to pay to avoid paradoxes. Never did Bohr appeal to a verificationist theory of meaning; nor did he claim classical concepts to be operationally defined. But it cannot be denied that some of the logical empiricists rightly or wrongly found support for their own philosophy in Bohr’s interpretation and that Bohr sometimes confirmed them in their impressions (Faye 2008).

Second, many physicists and philosophers see the reduction of the wave function as an important part of the Copenhagen interpretation. This may be true for people like Heisenberg. But Bohr never talked about the collapse of the wave packet. Nor did it make sense for him to do so because this would mean that one must understand the wave function as referring to something physically real. Only if one can interpret a quantum measurement as an interaction between an instrument and an object, whose state is literally represented by Schrödinger’s wave function, and therefore taken to contain all potential values of observation, does it make sense to claim that the measurement forces the object to manifest one of these potential vales. Indeed, such a literal interpretation of the state vector implies that these values are somehow intrinsically present in the object with a certain probability all at once. In contrast, Bohr believed that particular kinematical and dynamical properties are relational because their attribution to a quantum system makes sense only in relation to a particular experimental set-up and therefore that these numerical properties could have a specific value only during a measurement.

Third, Bohr flatly denied the ontological thesis that the subject has any direct impact on the outcome of a measurement. Hence, when he occasionally mentioned the subjective character of quantum phenomena and the difficulties of distinguishing the object from the subject in quantum mechanics, he did not think of it as a problem confined to the observation of atoms alone. For instance, he stated that already “the theory of relativity reminds us of the subjective character of all physical phenomena” (ATDN, p. 116). Rather, by referring to the subjective character of quantum phenomena he was expressing the epistemological thesis that all observations in physics are in fact context-dependent. There exists, according to Bohr, no view from nowhere in virtue of which quantum objects can be described.

Fourth, although Bohr had spoken about “disturbing the phenomena by observation,” in some of his earliest papers on complementarity, he never had in mind the observer-induced collapse of the wave packet. Later he always talked about the interaction between the object and the measurement apparatus which was taken to be completely objective. Thus, Schrödinger’s Cat did not pose any riddle to Bohr. The cat would be dead or alive long before we open the box to find out. What Bohr claimed was, however, that the state of the object and the state of the instrument are dynamically inseparable during the interaction. Moreover, the atomic object does not posses any state separate from the one it manifests at the end of the interaction because the measuring instrument establishes the necessary conditions under which it makes sense to use the state concept.

It was the same analysis that Bohr applied in answering the challenge of the EPR-paper. Bohr’s reply was that we cannot separate the dynamical and kinematical properties of a joint system of two particles until we actually have made a measurement and thereby set the experimental conditions for the ascription of a certain state value (CC, p. 80). Bohr’s way of addressing the puzzle was to point out that individual states of a pair of coupled particles cannot be considered in isolation, in the same way as the state of the object and the state of the instrument are dynamically inseparable during measurements. Thus, based on our knowledge of a particular state value of the auxiliary body A, being an atomic object or an instrument, we may then infer the state value of the object B with which A once interacted (Faye 1991, pp. 182–183). It therefore makes sense when Howard (2004, p. 671) holds that Bohr considered the post-measurement joint state of the object and the measuring apparatus to be entangled as in any other quantum interaction involving an entangled pair.

Finally, when Bohr insisted on the use of classical concepts for understanding quantum phenomena, he did not believe, as it is sometimes suggested, that macroscopic objects or the measuring apparatus always have to be described in terms of the dynamical laws of classical physics. The use of the classical concepts is necessary, according to Bohr, because by these we have learned to communicate to others about our physical experience. The classical concepts are merely a refinement of everyday concepts of position and action in space and time. However, the use of the classical concepts is not the same in quantum mechanics as in classical physics. Bohr was well aware of the fact that, on pains of inconsistency, the classical concepts must be given “a suitable quantum-theoretical re-interpretation,” before they could be employed to describe quantum phenomena (ATDN, p. 8).

8. The Divergent Views

The Copenhagen interpretation is not a homogenous view. This insight has begun to emerge among historians and philosophers of science over the last ten to fifteen years. Both James Cushing (1994) and Mara Beller (1999) take for granted the existence of a unitary Copenhagen interpretation in their social and institutional explanation of the once total dominance of the Copenhagen orthodoxy; a view they personally find unconvincing and outdated partly because they read Bohr’s view on quantum mechanics through Heisenberg’s exposition. But historians and philosophers of science have gradually realized that Bohr’s and Heisenberg’s pictures of complementarity on the surface may appear similar but beneath the surface diverge significantly. Don Howard (2004, p. 680) goes as far as concluding that “until Heisenberg coined the term in 1955, there was no unitary Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics.” The term apparently occurs for the first time in Heisenberg (1955). In addition, Howard also argues that it was Heisenberg’s exposition of complementarity, and not Bohr’s, with its emphasis on a privileged role for the observer and observer-induced wave packet collapse that became identical with that interpretation. Says he: “Whatever Heisenberg’s motivation, his invention of a unitary Copenhagen view on interpretation, at the center of which was his own, distinctively subjectivist view of the role of the observer, quickly found an audience” (p. 677). This audience included people like David Bohm, Paul Feyerabend, Norwood Russell Hanson, and Karl Popper who used Heisenberg’s presentation of complementarity as the target for their criticism of the orthodox view. However, it should also be mentioned that in later work, Feyerabend (1968, 1969) was one of the first philosophers who gave a painstaking analysis of complementarity in order to clear up the myth of it being unintelligible. Feyerabend urged philosophers and physicists to go back to Bohr and read him carefully.

Following up on Don Howard’s research, Kristian Camilleri (2006, 2007) points to the fact that complementarity was originally thought by Bohr (in his Como-paper) to exist between the space-time description and the causal description of the stationary states of atoms — and not between different experimental outcomes of the free electron. So the formulation of complementarity was restricted to the concept of stationary states because only there does the system have a well-defined energy state independent of any measurement. This observation deserves general recognition. But when Bohr rather soon thereafter began analysing the double slit experiment in his discussion with Einstein (1930), he had to extend his interpretation to cover the electron in interaction with the measuring apparatus.

Camilleri then shows how Heisenberg’s view of complementarity, in spite of Heisenberg’s own testimony, radically differs from Bohr’s. As Heisenberg understood complementarity between the space-time description and causal description, it holds between the classical description of experimental phenomena and the description of the state of the system in terms of the wave function. A quotation from Heisenberg (1958, p. 50) shows how much he misunderstood Bohr in spite of their previously close working relationship.

Bohr uses the concept of ‘complementarity’ at several places in the interpretation of quantum theory … The space-time description of the atomic events is complementary to their deterministic description. The probability function obeys an equation of motion as did the co-ordinates in Newtonian mechanics; its change in the course of time is completely determined by the quantum mechanical equation; it does not allow a description in space and time but breaks the determined continuity of the probability function by changing our knowledge of the system.

So, where Bohr identified the causal description with the conservation of energy, Heisenberg saw it as the deterministic evolution of Schrödinger’s ψ-function. In other words, Heisenberg, in contrast to Bohr, believed that the wave equation gave a causal, albeit probabilistic description of the free electron in configuration space. It also explains why so many philosophers and physicists have identified the Copenhagen interpretation with the mysterious collapse of the wave packet. The transition from a causal description in terms of the evolution of the ψ-function to a classical space-time description is characterized by the discontinuous change that occurs by the act of measurement. According to Heisenberg, these two modes of description are complementary.

In another study Ravi Gomatam (2007) agrees with Howard’s exposition in arguing that Bohr’s interpretation of complementarity and the textbook Copenhagen interpretation (i.e. wave-particle duality and wave packet collapse) are incompatible. More recently, Henderson (2010) has come to a similar conclusion. He makes a distinction between different versions of Copenhagen interpretations based on statements from some of the main characters. On one side of the spectrum there is Bohr who did not think of quantum measurement in terms of a collapse of the wave function (for a contrasting view see Jens Hebor 2005; and partly Zinkernagel 2016); in the middle we find Heisenberg talking about the collapse as an objective physical process but thinking that this couldn’t be analyzed any further because of its indeterministic nature, and at the opposite side Johann von Neumann and Eugene Wigner argued that the human mind has a direct influence on the reduction of the wave packet. Unfortunately, von Neumann’s dualistic view has become part of the Copenhagen methodology by people opposing this interpretation.

9. The Measurement Problem

Some physicists and philosophers of science see the measurement problem as a real puzzle with respect to the Copenhagen interpretation. On the one hand, we have that the wave function evolved deterministically according to Schrödinger’s equation as a linear superposition of different states; and the other hand an actual measurement always detect one definite state. To be or not to be in a superposition; that’s the question.

Apparently, we are living in a quantum world since everything is constituted by atomic and subatomic particles. Hence classical physics seems merely to be a useful approximation to a world which is quantum mechanical on all scales. Such a view, which many modern physicists support, can be called quantum fundamentalism (Zinkernagel 2015, 2016). It can be defined as a position containing two components: (1) everything in the Universe is fundamentally of quantum nature (the ontological component); and (2) everything in the Universe is ultimately describable in quantum mechanical terms (the epistemological component). Thus, we may define quantum fundamentalism to be the position holding that everything in the world is essentially quantized and that the quantum theory gives us a literal description of this nature. The basic assumption behind quantum fundamentalism is that the structure of the formalism, in this case the wave function, corresponds to how the world is structured. For instance, according to the wave function description every quantum system may be in a superposition of different states because a combination of state vectors is also a state vector. Now, assuming that both the quantum object and the measuring apparatus are quantum systems that each can be described by a wave function, it follows that their entangled state would likewise be represented by a state vector. Then the challenge is, of course, how we can explain why the pointer of a measuring instrument enters a definite (and not a superposition) position, as experience tells us, whenever the apparatus interacts with the object. In a nutshell this is the measurement problem.

The Copenhagen interpretation is often taken to subscribe to a solution to the measurement problem that has been offered in terms of John von Neumann’s projection postulate. In 1932 [1996], von Neumann suggested that the entangled state of the object and the instrument collapses to a determinate state whenever a measurement takes place. This measurement process (a type 1-process as he called it) could not be described by quantum mechanics; quantum mechanics can only described type-2 processes (i.e., the development of a quantum system in terms of Schrödinger’s equation). In his discussion of the measurement problem, von Neumann then distinguished between (i) the system actually observed; (ii) the measuring instrument; and (iii) the actual observer. He argues that during a measurement the actual observer gets a subjective perception of what is going on that has a non-physical nature, which distinguishes it from the observed object and the measuring instrument. However, he holds on to psycho-physical parallelism as a scientific principle, which he interprets such that there exists a physical correlate to any extra-physical process of the subjective experience. So in every case where we have a subjective perception we must divide the world into the observed system and the observer. But where the division takes place is partly arbitrary. According von Neumann, it is contextual whether the dividing line is drawn between the description of the observed object (i) and the measuring instrument together with the observer (ii) + (iii), or it is drawn between the description of the observed object together with the measuring instrument, i.e., (i) + (ii), and the observer (iii). In other words, von Neumann argues that the observer can never be included in a type 2-process description, but the measuring instrument may sometime be part of a type 2-process, although it gives the same result with respect to the observed object (i). An important consequence of von Neumann’s solution to the measurement problem is that a type 1-process takes place only in the presence of the observer’s consciousness. Furthermore, even when von Neumann considers the situation in which the descriptions of (i) and (ii) are combined, he talks about the interaction between the physical system (i) + (ii) and an abstract ego (iii) (Neumann 1932 [1996], Ch VI). Therefore, the mind seems to play an active role in forming a type 1-process, which would be incompatible with psycho-physical parallelism.

Indeed, within philosophy of mind one cannot consistently maintain both psycho-physical parallelism and the existence of an interaction between the brain and the mind. So it is no wonder that Eugene Wigner (1967) followed up on the suggestion of the mind’s interaction by proposing that what causes a collapse of the wave function is the mind of the observer. But Wigner never explained how it was possible for something mental to produce a material effect like the collapse of a quantum system. The measuring problem led to the famous paradox of Schrödinger’s cat and later to the one of Wigner’s friend. Although von Neumann’s and Wigner’s positions are usually associated with the Copenhagen Interpretation, such views were definitely not Bohr’s as we shall see in a moment.

Quantum fundamentalists must indeed be ready to explain why the macroscopic world appears classical. An alternative to von Neumann’s projection postulate is the claim that the formalism should be read literally and that measurements (classical outcomes) do not describe the world as it really is. But there are ontological cost, which is significant to some. In one interpretation the world divides into as many worlds as there are possible measurement outcomes each time a system is observed or interacts with another system. Other fundamentalists had hoped that the decoherence program might come up with an appropriate explanation. The decoherence theory sees entanglement to exist not only between object and the measurement but also as something which includes the environment. If Bohr had known the idea of decoherence, he would probably have had no objection to it, as several authors have pointed to decoherence as a natural dynamical extension of his view that measurements is an irreversible amplification process (Schlosshauer and Camilleri 2015, 2017; Bächtold 2017, Tanona 2017; and Dieks 2017). However, it is generally agreed that decoherence does not solve the measurement problem (Bacciagaluppi 2016; Zinkernagel 2011). This might seem as if von Neumann’s projection postulate has to be reintroduced as a dynamical factor to explain why one and only one measurement result appears. However, as Dieks (2017) argues, Bohr’s interpretation could be understood as a non-collapse interpretation, since “the superposition does not have an empirical meaning independently of its interpretation via classically described experiments, so no replacement by another mathematical state is needed. We just have to interpret the formulas correctly.” In spite of that there is no general agreement to what extent Bohr opposed quantum fundamentalism.

Time and again Bohr emphasized that the epistemological distinction between the instrument and the object is necessary because this is the only way one can functionally make sense of a measurement. The epistemic purpose of a measuring instrument is to yield information about an object separated from the instrument itself. It is also generally agreed that Bohr didn’t treat the classical world of the measuring instrument as epistemically separated from quantum object along the line of a microscopic and macroscopic division. Where the line is drawn is a matter of convenience. Thus, Bohr sometimes included parts of the measuring instrument into the system to which the quantum mechanical description should be applied. In one place Bohr gave the following characteristics of the situation:

In the system to which the quantum mechanical formalism is applied, it is of course possible to include any intermediate auxiliary agency employed in the measuring processes. Since, however, all those properties of such agencies which, according to the aim of the measurement, have to be compared with corresponding properties of the object, must be described on classical lines, their quantum mechanical treatment will for this purpose be essentially equivalent with a classical description. The question of eventually including such agencies within the system under investigation is thus purely a matter of practical convenience, just as in classical physical measurements; and such displacements of the section between object and measuring instruments can therefore never involve any arbitrariness in the description of a phenomenon and its quantum mechanical treatment. (Bohr, CC, p. 104)

This is an important passage because it indicates that Bohr believed that quantum mechanics has a universal applicability in the sense that it can be used to describe macroscopic objects as well. It also tell us that whether or not parts of the macroscopic measuring apparatus are treated as a part of the quantum object depends on pragmatic or contextual conditions, but their quantum mechanical treatment should result in a description that corresponds to a similar classical description. Based on quotes like the one above, Don Howard (1994) concludes that Bohr was not only an ontological quantum fundamentalist but in fact also a sort of an epistemological one. He believes that one can make Bohr’s requirement that measuring apparatus and the experimental results have to be described in ordinary language supplemented with the terminology of classical physics consistent with ontological quantum fundamentalism. According to him, Bohr never considered the measuring instrument as a classical object. Moreover, he thinks that this implies that Bohr had to understand the use of classical concepts differently from what scholars usually think. He reinterprets Bohr in terms of quantum states called “mixtures”. Howard believes that with respect to an experimental context in which an instrument interacts with an object, Bohr didn’t understand them as being in an entangled state but being separated in a mixture state. The consequence would be that the instrument and the object exist in a definite quantum state since such a state could be represented as a product of the wave function for the instrument and for the object.

But, as Maximilian Schlosshauer and Kristian Camilleri (2008 (Other Internet Resources), 2011) have pointed out, this does not solve the measurement problem. Howard does not explain under which circumstances one can move from a quantum system-cum-measuring apparatus being in a non-separable state to a mixture of separated states. Therefore one cannot be sure that the measuring apparatus is in a definite state and its pointer in a definite place. Some philosophers seem to argue that Bohr was an ontological but not an epistemological quantum fundamentalist. For instance, “Bohr believed in the fundamental and universal nature of quantum mechanics, and saw the classical description of the apparatus as a purely epistemological move, which expressed the fact that a given quantum system is being used as a measuring device” (Landsman 2007); and in a similar vein: “One is left with the impression from Bohr’s writings that the quantum-classical divide is a necessary part of the epistemological structure of quantum mechanics” (Schlosshauer and Camilleri 2008 (Other Internet Resources), 2015). So Klaas Landsman (2006, 2007) accepts Howard’s suggestion that Bohr is an ontological quantum fundamentalist but he rejects that Bohr should be considered an epistemological quantum fundamentalist. Landsman argues that Bohr held that the measuring instrument should be described in classical terms since the results of any measurement like in classical physics would always have a definite value. However, Landsman agrees that Bohr understood all objects as essentially quantum mechanical objects.

However, one could argue that Howard and Landsman miss the epistemic nature of Bohr’s view on ontological issues. Apparently, Bohr might say that quantum mechanics is correctly understood a theory of measurement, a theory about how the quantum world appears to us, and not how this world is in itself. Bohr mentioned more than once that physics is not about finding the essence of nature but about describing the phenomena in an unambiguous way. In the foreground of Bohr’s thinking was the (1) the need of classical concepts for the description of measuring results; (2) non-separability due to the entanglement of the system and the measuring instrument; (3) the contextual nature of the measurements of complementary properties; and (4) the symbolic character of the quantum formalism. One has to take all four components into consideration if one wants to understand Bohr’s solution to the classical-quantum problem.

According to this understanding of Bohr as an empirical realist but a transcendental idealist, we are in quantum mechanics confronted with the “impossibility of any sharp separation between the behavior of atomic objects and the interaction with the measuring instruments which serve to define the very conditions under which the phenomena appear” (APHK, p. 210). This is definitely a non-classical feature which is described by quantum mechanics alone. In his response to the EPR-paper, Bohr strongly rejected that this form of interaction could be regarded as a mechanical influence. The influence was on the conditions of description, i.e. the experimental conditions under which it makes sense to apply classical concepts. But during a measurement we need to separate the system from the measuring instrument and the environment for pragmatic reasons. The pragmatic reasons seem to be reasonably clear. The outcomes of whatever experiment always yield a definite value, so the entanglement of object and the measurement instrument described by the quantum formalism only lasts epistemically until the interaction between object and instrument stops. The quantum formalism can predict the statistical outcome of these interactions but it cannot say anything about the trajectory of objects.

Bohr’s firmness about the use of classical concepts for the descriptions of measurement can be seen as his response to the measurement problem. This problem arises from the fact that quantum mechanics itself cannot account for why experiments on objects in a state of superposition always produce a definite outcome. Hence if one does not argue for spontaneous collapse of the wave function, hidden variables, or many worlds, one needs to supplement quantum mechanics with a classical description of measuring instruments in terms of clocks and rods. Henrik Zinkernagel (2015, 2016) may seem to get close to Bohr’s view when he argues that Bohr not so much solved the measuring problem as he dissolved it. According to his interpretation, Bohr believed in a quantum world, but only relative to a particular classical description and a certain classical world. The distinction between classical and quantum (both ontic and epistemic) is contextual. He thinks that the measurement problem is ultimately a consequence of ontological quantum fundamentalism (that everything is quantum). Because if everything is quantum – and correctly described by quantum formalism (what else would it mean to call everything quantum?) – then a measurement ends up in a superposition whether we describe the apparatus classical or not. One could say with Zinkernagel that Bohr believed all objects can be treated as quantum objects, but they cannot all be treated as quantum objects at the same time. Borrowing a conception from the two Russian physicists, Landau and Lifshitz, Zinkernagel claims that only some parts of the measuring device are entangled with the object in question, but those parts which are not entangled exists as a classical object. Depending on the context, objects cannot be treated as quantum objects in those situations in which they acts as measuring apparatuses. In these situations the classical treatment of the measuring device provides us with a frame of reference of space and time with respect to which an atomic object has a position, and, mutatis mutandis, with respect to which it has energy and momentum. Such a frame of reference is necessary for our ability to define and measure a particular property. In Bohr’s own words: “in each case [of measurement] some ultimate measuring instruments, like the scales and clocks which determine the frame of space-time coordination on which, in the last resort, even the definitions of momentum and energy quantities rest, must always be described entirely on classical lines, and consequently kept outside the system subject to quantum mechanical treatment” (CC, p. 104). What characterizes a frame of reference is that it establishes the conditions for the ascription of a well-defined position or a well-defined momentum, and treated classically measuring instruments act exactly as frames of reference. The implication is that Bohr did not exclude the application of quantum theory to any system. Every system can in principle be treated quantum mechanically, but since we always need a frame of reference to describe experimental outcomes, not all systems can be treated quantum mechanically at once.

In this debate Dorato (2017) stresses the fact that by making explicit reference to Einstein’s presentation of his special theory of relativity, Bohr regarded quantum mechanics as a theory of principle. This explains both Bohr’s epistemic reliance on the domain of classical physics and his ban of any attempt to construct classical objects from quantum objects. Despite this position Dorato argues that in order to justify his entity realism and anti-instrumentalist interpretations, Bohr also needed to postulate something ontologically distinct from the realm of quantum mechanics, a claim that creates the well-known problem of defining in a non-ambiguous and exact way the cut between the classical and the quantum realm. By following Zinkernagel, he claims that this problem is somewhat softened by Bohr’s contextualist theory of measurement. However, Bohr’s holism, according to which the measuring device and quantum object are in state of entanglement, is in objective tension with Bohr’s thesis of an ontological distinction, especially in virtue of the fact that by referring to the interaction between the quantum and the classical system as an irreversible physical process, Bohr seems to need a constructive approach to quantum mechanics that he wants to avoid.

Nonetheless, the question is to what extent Bohr really believed that the classical world is not only epistemically but also ontologically different from the quantum world? If he did not make an ontological distinction, there would be no contradiction between his epistemic view that the outcome of measurement needs to be described classically but that the apparatus ontologically is just as much a quantum object as the object under investigation. So when Bohr regarded quantum mechanics as a rational generalization of classical physics, he always thought of it as a way to secure the epistemic validity of quantum mechanics and not a way to save a classical ontology. Directly addressing Zinkernagel’s analysis, Dieks (2017) strongly argues that there can be little doubt that Bohr believed that quantum mechanics is universal in the sense that Heisenberg’s indeterminacy relation applies to both micro- and macroscopic systems due to the quantum of action. Classical mechanics is a mathematical approximation. Moreover, Bohr believed for epistemic reasons that we had to use classical language because this language is a refinement of our everyday language, which is adapted to describe our sensory experience and therefore the only language that can endow the quantum formalism with an empirical content. Hence, according to Dieks, Bohr assumed that it is only an epistemic necessity to describe “some systems classically in order to have a pragmatic starting point for the treatment of other systems.” Bohr’s demand of using classical concepts for epistemic reasons has no implications for his view that macroscopic objects are quantum objects. Measuring devices are not classical objects even though we need classical concepts to describe our general physical experiences and the outcome of quantum experiments. So Dieks concludes that the interaction between the measuring device and the quantum object determines, in the classical textbook examples, whether position or momentum talk can be carried over to the quantum object that is measured. The measuring device itself, if macroscopic and under ordinary circumstances (so that it really is a measuring device that can be used by us) allows both position and momentum talk in its own description. The measurement interaction determines which correlations are forged with the micro-world.

10. Complementarity, Decoherence, and Probabilities

Everyone agrees that decoherence does not provide physicists with an explanation of why a measurement selects one particular value rather than another given all the statistically possible values represented by the wave function. But the question is still open regarding in what way Bohr thought that any measuring process rests on a dynamical interaction between the quantum system and the measuring apparatus, in spite of the fact that a descriptive separation between them had to be made if the value offered by the measuring apparatus has to be a recording of the quantum system. The closest Bohr came to such a dynamical interaction was when he maintained that the measuring process leaves an irreversible mark on the instrument. In spite of such remarks, Bohr never discussed his interpretation in modern terms of “entanglement” or “decoherence”.

While Schrödinger coined the term “entanglement”, Howard (2021) argues that the word refers to an unavoidable feature of quantum mechanics, which most physicists recognized from the very start. Einstein for one already realized this in connection his concept of light quanta with respect to the photoelectric effect. Bohr’s formulation of entanglement was the uncontrollable interaction between the object and the measuring apparatus. For instance, when Bohr presented his view on complementarity in Como 1927 he wrote:

the quantum postulate implies that any observation of atomic phenomena will involve an interaction with the agency of observation not to be neglected. Accordingly, an independent reality in the ordinary physical sense can neither be ascribed to the phenomena nor to the agencies of observation. (ATDN, p. 54)

As Howard (2021) points out, we know that the interaction Bohr here talked about, is not the one Heisenberg had in mind when he presented his electron microscope in which light used to detect the electron disturbs the electron. Such an explanation was exactly the suggestion that Bohr, in his discussion with Heisenberg, had turned against before the latter published his classical paper on the indeterminacy relation.

However, Bohr’s formulation has often been misread as giving support to a classical form of disturbance, and the expression “uncontrollable interaction” may have misled Einstein and other physicists to believe that quantum mechanics was incomplete, because to be considered as an disturbance such an interaction may be thought to change a pre-existing value. The first time Bohr publicly distanced himself from such a disturbance interpretation of interaction between the object and the instrument was in his reply to the EPR-paper. In this case, the entanglement under consideration is no longer the one between an object and the measuring instrument but between two subsystems A and B. Nonetheless, presenting an experiment in which an object first passes either a fixed or a movable single slit diaphragm, and then another diaphragm with a double slit, Bohr showed with his example how the outcome of particular measurement on subsystem A influences the outcome of measurement on B. (If the first diaphragm is fixed in order to measure the object’s position, one observes on the screen behind the second diaphragm an interference pattern, but if first diaphragm is movable in order to determine through which one of the two slits the object travelled, the interference pattern disappears).

Of course there is in a case like that just considered no question of a mechanical disturbance of the system under investigation during the last critical state of the measuring procedure. But even at this stage there is essentially the question of an influence on the very conditions which define the possible types of predictions regarding the future behavior of the system. (CC, p. 80)

Here Bohr explicitly denied that the uncontrollable interaction involves any form of disturbance, which is otherwise characteristic of well-separated objects in classical states. The uncontrollable interaction he had in mind was what in modern term is a state in which the system and the measuring instrument is entangled. The entanglement between the object and the measuring apparatus prevents the object as well as the detector from having a well-defined, independent state. Hence, the entanglement prompted Bohr to think that the use of classical concepts depended on the experimental context and that was therefore complementary.

Today most philosophers agree that ontologically, Bohr was a quantum fundamentalist, holding that the quantum mechanical description applies to microscopic as well as macroscopic objects. However, he also insisted that measuring results should be described in classical terms due to the epistemic separation we have to make between the entangled object and the measuring instrument. This is how we can communicate our observation. The question then arises: how is it that the world appears in a classical manner?

In 1970 quantum mechanics was enriched with a new notion when Hans Dieter Zeh (1970) introduced ‘decoherence’. Since then, many physicists have taken part in developing this notion, and today the processes behind decoherence plays a huge role; for instance, in the construction of quantum computers. The view behind decoherence is that quantum mechanics rules all the way up and down but that any object is always interacting with a very large number of environmental degrees of freedom such that the interference terms corresponding to macroscopically distinct states disappear. In other words, we do not see Schrödinger’s cat in a superposition in which it is both dead and alive.

Camilleri and Schlosshauer (2015) and Schlosshauer and Camilleri (2017) have argued that Bohr’s philosophy and the insights brought about by decoherence theory may not just coexist peacefully. Decoherence may also be seen as supplying the dynamical justification for the distinction that Bohr held to be epistemically necessary, between the “classical system” serving as the measuring apparatus and the “quantum object.” However, Howard (2021) goes a step further as he argues that Bohr believed as part of his view of complementarity that Schrödinger’s dynamics of pure joint states of the object-instrument-environment interaction is statistically and observationally equivalent to the context-dependent mixture over eigenstates picked out by measurements. Howard therefore argues: (1) complementarity and decoherence assume that quantum is ontologically fundamental; (2) classicality emerges from quantum behavior; and (3) decoherence confirms Bohr’s view that measurement is a practical irreversible process where information dissipates through the observed system due to the fact that decoherence produces a single macroscopic mark. His conclusion is that the “environmentally-induced decoherence (which is not really decoherence, but only a semblance thereof) was, all along, the real point toward which Bohr was gesturing with the doctrines of complementarity” (p. 171). Hence, Howard concludes that decoherence is not only in agreement with complementarity, but complementarity is a consequence of the fact that quantum mechanics with the Born rule is a statistical theory and so is the decoherence dynamics, and therefore we cannot expect that decoherence should be able to explain a specific determinate outcome of a measurement. However, he also concludes that the context-dependent mixture he reads into Bohr’s view provides us with “the sought-for simulacrum of classicality”. Whether Bohr would support the last remark that the classical world is an epistemic illusion is certainly debatable.

Howard’s reading seems to rest on an understanding of Schrödinger’s wave function as having a representational role of referring to dynamical quantum states. However, Bohr never seems to have spoken about quantum states other than in connection with the stationary states of an atom. From the very beginning, Bohr focused on the transition probabilities of Heisenberg’s matrix mechanics more than on Schrödinger’s wave mechanics, a view that did not change after the interpretation of the wave function in terms of the Born rule. Consider the following statements by Bohr:

According to the two alternative procedures, quantum mechanical calculations may be performed either by representing the variables with matrices with elements referring to the individual transitions between two states of the system or by making use of the so called wave equation, the solutions of which refer to these states and allow us to derive probabilities for the transitions between them. The entire formalism is to be considered as a tool for deriving predictions of definite or statistical character, as regards information obtainable under experimental conditions described in classical terms and specified by means of parameters entering into the algebraic or differential equations of which the matrices or the wave-functions, respectively, are solutions. These symbols themselves, as is indicated already by the use of imaginary numbers, are not susceptible to pictorial interpretation; and even derived real functions like densities and currents are only to be regarded as expressing the probabilities for the occurrence of individual events observable under well defined experimental conditions. (CC, pp. 143–144)

Here Bohr equates matrices and wave functions because these two sets of mathematical symbols both express probabilities in quantum mechanics in the form of predictions of measurement outcomes. Following David Wallace (2016) in distinguishing between representational and probabilistic interpretations of quantum states, Jeffery Bub (2017) argues that Bohr interpreted them probabilistically, which the above quotation seems to support.

Bohr’s primary insight was to see that quantum mechanics is quite unlike any theory we have dealt with before in the history of physics, and so explanation in such a post-classical theory can’t be the sort of representational explanation we are familiar with in a theory that is commutative or Boolean at the fundamental level.

As Bub (2016) explains, “quantum probabilities can’t be understood in the classical or Boolean sense as quantifying ignorance about pre-measurement value of observable” (p. 223). Thus, when Heisenberg constructed his matrix mechanics, he realized that kinematical and dynamical quantities in quantum mechanics are non-communitive. This implies, according to Bub, that these properties must be described by a family of “intertwined” Boolean algebras, each member corresponding to a set of commuting observables, where intertwinedness excludes the possibility of constructing a more inclusive Boolean algebra. Although Bohr did not speak about complementarity in terms of Boolean algebras, Bub suggests that this is exactly what Bohr had in mind when he insisted that we needed to use classical terms in the description of measurement outcomes. On the macroscopic level, depending on the experimental context, the various outcomes belong to incompatible Boolean frames; on the microscopic level randomness and entanglement rules, something which quantum mechanics explains in terms of probabilistic constraints on events depicted through the geometry of Hilbert space.

This information-theoretic interpretation of complementarity, according to Bub (2022), abstains from introducing decoherence to explain quantum probabilities, which are ‘perfectly new and sui generis aspects of physical reality’ and ‘uniquely given from the start’, as von Neumann had pointed out. In addition to this, Bub (2017) argues that “The collapse, as a conditionalization of the quantum state, is something you put in by hand after observing the actual outcome. The physics doesn’t give it to you.” This might well be Bohr’s view. No matter what, the divergences between the various analyses show that there is no consensus about how Bohr’s view on complementarity and measurement plays out with respect to one’s favorite quantum foundation.

11. New Perspectives

After the 1950s a number of alternative interpretations to Bohr’s complementarity were articulated and they all found their proponents among physicists and philosophers of science. The Copenhagen interpretation started to lose ground to other interpretations such as Bohm’s interpretation, the many worlds interpretation, the modal interpretation and the decoherence interpretation, which have been more in vogue the last couple of decades. But parallel with the growing awareness of the essential differences between Bohr’s and Heisenberg’s understanding of quantum mechanics several philosophers of science have revitalised Bohr’s view on complementarity. Around the millennium a new recognition of the Copenhagen interpretation has emerged.

Rob Clifton and Hans Halvorson (1999, 2002) argue that Bohm’s interpretation of quantum mechanics can be seen as a special case of Bohr’s complementarity interpretation if it is assumed that all measurements ultimately reduce to positions measurement. Originally Jeffrey Bub and Clifton (1996) were able to demonstrate (given some idealized conditions) that Bohr’s complementarity and Bohm’s mechanics fall under their uniqueness theorem for no-collapse interpretations. Clifton and Halvorson improve this result by showing that Bohr’s idea of position and momentum complementarity can be expressed in terms of inequivalent representations in the C*-algebraic formalism of quantum mechanics. It turns out that either position or momentum are dynamically significant, but it is not permissible to assume that position and momentum are both dynamically significant in any single context. From these assumptions they conclude that Bohm’s hidden variables are none other than the “value states” that the complementarity interpretation postulates if position measurement were always dynamically significant, but this metaphysical restriction is not, as their results indicate, demanded by the physics. Rather, Clifton and Halvorson (1999) and Halvorson (2004) believe that complementarity may give us a realist interpretation of quantum field theory.

Philosophers have also started to explore the idea of decoherence in relation to Bohr’s view about “the inseparability of the behavior of the object and the interaction with the measuring instrument” or “the uncontrollable interaction between the atomic system and measurement apparatus.” (Schlosshauer and Camilleri 2011, 2017; Camilleri and Schlosshauer 2015; Bächtold 2017; and Tanona 2017). Although Bohr assumed that the measuring apparatus is altogether a quantum mechanical system, he nevertheless believed that the instrument could be approximately described by classical theory. Among the scholars just mentioned there is a general agreement that the notion of decoherent is coherent with Bohr’s view about the quantum-classical division and adds a dynamical explanation of quantum-to-classical transition which Bohr’s own exposition lacked. Also attempts to clear up the structural relationship between Bohr’s view and Hugh Everett’s “relative state”-interpretation have been carried out; a relationship which at some points is much closer than usually thought (Bacciagaluppi 2017).

Another insight into Bohr’s view of complementarity is due to Michael Dickson (2001, 2002). By using the contemporary theory of reference frames in quantum theory, he proves that Bohr’s response to the EPR thought-experiment was in fact the correct one. Moreover, he also maintains that Bohr’s discussions of spin, a property much less frame dependent than position and momentum, were very different from his discussions of the latter, and based on these differences he offers a Bohrian account of Bell’s theorem and its significance.

A re-assessment of Bohr’s philosophy of quantum mechanics is made by Whitaker (2004) on the basis of Clifton and Halvorson’s and Dickson’s works and in the light of quantum information theory. Besides these attempts to apply Bohr’s notion of complementarity to the contemporary discussions of the interpretation of quantum mechanics and quantum field theory there is an ongoing attempt to understand Bohr’s idea of symbolic representation (Tanona, 2004a, 2004b) and his notion of complementarity with respect to trends in post-modern philosophy and general epistemology such as poststructuralism, deconstructivism, feminism and cultural studies (Honner 1994; Plotnitsky 1994; Barad 2007; and Katsumori 2011). Faye and Jaksland (2023b) offers a critical discussion of Barad’s interpretation of Bohr.


References to Work by Bohr

CW Bohr, N. (1972–2006), Collected Works, Vol. 1–12, Amsterdam: Elsevier.
ATDN Bohr, N. (1934/1987), Atomic Theory and the Description of Nature, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. I, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
APHK Bohr, N. (1958/1987), Essays 1932–1957 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. II, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
Essays Bohr, N. (1963/1987), Essays 1958–1962 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. III, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
CC Bohr, N. (1998), Causality and Complementarity, supplementary papers edited by Jan Faye and Henry Folse as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. IV, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.

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