Quantum Entanglement and Information

First published Mon Aug 13, 2001; substantive revision Tue May 2, 2023

Quantum entanglement is a physical resource, like energy, associated with the peculiar nonclassical correlations that are possible between separated quantum systems. Entanglement can be measured, transformed, and purified. A pair of quantum systems in an entangled state can be used as a quantum information channel to perform computational and cryptographic tasks that are impossible for classical systems. The general study of the information-processing capabilities of quantum systems is the subject of quantum information theory.

1. Quantum Entanglement

In 1935 and 1936, Schrödinger published a two-part article in the Proceedings of the Cambridge Philosophical Society in which he discussed and extended an argument by Einstein, Podolsky, and Rosen. The Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) argument was, in many ways, the culmination of Einstein’s critique of the orthodox Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics and was designed to show that the theory is incomplete. (See the entries on the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument in quantum theory and the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics.) In classical mechanics the state of a system is essentially a list of the system’s properties — more precisely, it is the specification of a set of parameters from which the list of properties can be reconstructed: the positions and momenta of all the particles comprising the system (or similar parameters in the case of fields). The dynamics of the theory specifies how properties change in terms of a law of evolution for the state. In a letter to Max Born, Wolfgang Pauli characterized this mode of description of physical systems as a ‘detached observer’ idealization (see The Born-Einstein Letters, Born, 1992; p. 218). On the Copenhagen interpretation, such a description is not possible for quantum systems. Instead, the quantum state of a system should be understood as a catalogue of what an observer has done to the system and what has been observed, and the import of the state then lies in the probabilities that can be inferred (in terms of the theory) for the outcomes of possible future observations on the system. Einstein rejected this view and proposed a series of arguments to show that the quantum state is simply an incomplete characterization of a quantum system. The missing parameters are sometimes referred to as ‘hidden parameters’ or ‘hidden variables.’

It should not be supposed that Einstein’s notion of a complete theory included the requirement that the theory should be deterministic. Rather, he required certain conditions of separability and locality for composite systems consisting of separated component systems: each component system separately should be characterized by its own properties (its own ‘being-thus,’ as Einstein put it — ‘So-sein’ in German), and it should be impossible to alter the properties of a distant system instantaneously (or the probabilities of these properties) by acting on a local system. In later analyses, notably in Bell’s argument for the nonlocality of quantum correlations, it became apparent that these conditions, suitably formulated as probability constraints, are equivalent to the requirement that statistical correlations between separated systems should be reducible to probability distributions over common causes (deterministic or stochastic) in the sense of Reichenbach. (See the entries on Bell’s theorem and Reichenbach’s common cause principle.)

In the original EPR article, two particles are prepared from a source in a certain ‘pure’ quantum state of the composite system (a state that cannot be expressed as a mixture or probability distribution of other pure quantum states, and cannot be reduced to a pure quantum state of each particle separately). After the particles move apart, there are ‘matching’ correlations between both the positions of the two particles and their momenta: a measurement of either position or momentum on a particular particle will allow the prediction, with certainty, of the outcome of a position measurement or momentum measurement, respectively, on the other particle. These measurements are mutually exclusive: either a position measurement can be performed, or a momentum measurement, but not both simultaneously. The subsequent measurement of momentum, say, after establishing a position correlation, will no longer yield any correlation in the momenta of the two particles. It is as if the position measurement disturbs the correlation between the momentum values, and conversely. Apart from this peculiarity that either correlation can be observed, but not both for the same pair of quantum particles, the position and momentum correlations for the quantum particles are exactly like the classical correlations between two billiard balls after a collision. Classical correlations can be explained by a common cause, or correlated ‘elements of reality.’ The EPR argument is that quantum mechanics is incomplete because these common causes or elements of reality are not included in the quantum state description.

Here is how Schrödinger put the puzzle in the first part of his two-part article (Schrödinger, 1935; p. 559):

Yet since I can predict either \(x_1\) or \(p_1\) without interfering with the system No. 1 and since system No. 1, like a scholar in an examination, cannot possibly know which of the two questions I am going to ask first: it so seems that our scholar is prepared to give the right answer to the first question he is asked, anyhow. Therefore he must know both answers; which is an amazing knowledge; quite irrespective of the fact that after having given his first answer our scholar is invariably so disconcerted or tired out, that all the following answers are ‘wrong.’

What Schrödinger showed was that if two particles are prepared in an EPR quantum state, where there are matching correlations for two ‘canonically conjugate’ dynamical quantities (quantities like position and momentum whose values suffice to specify all the properties of a classical system), then there are infinitely many dynamical quantities of the two particles for which there exist similar matching correlations: every function of the canonically conjugate pair of the first particle matches with the same function of the canonically conjugate pair of the second particle. So (Schrödinger, p. 559) system No. 1 ‘does not only know these two answers but a vast number of others, and that with no mnemotechnical help whatsoever, at least with none that we know of.’

Schrödinger coined the term ‘entanglement’ to describe this peculiar connection between quantum systems (Schrödinger, 1935; p. 555):

When two systems, of which we know the states by their respective representatives, enter into temporary physical interaction due to known forces between them, and when after a time of mutual influence the systems separate again, then they can no longer be described in the same way as before, viz. by endowing each of them with a representative of its own. I would not call that one but rather the characteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought. By the interaction the two representatives [the quantum states] have become entangled.

He added (Schrödinger, 1935; p. 555):

Another way of expressing the peculiar situation is: the best possible knowledge of a whole does not necessarily include the best possible knowledge of all its parts, even though they may be entirely separate and therefore virtually capable of being ‘best possibly known,’ i.e., of possessing, each of them, a representative of its own. The lack of knowledge is by no means due to the interaction being insufficiently known — at least not in the way that it could possibly be known more completely — it is due to the interaction itself.

Attention has recently been called to the obvious but very disconcerting fact that even though we restrict the disentangling measurements to one system, the representative obtained for the other system is by no means independent of the particular choice of observations which we select for that purpose and which by the way are entirely arbitrary. It is rather discomforting that the theory should allow a system to be steered or piloted into one or the other type of state at the experimenter’s mercy in spite of his having no access to it.

In the second part of the paper, Schrödinger showed that an experimenter, by a suitable choice of operations carried out on one member of an entangled pair, possibly using additional ‘ancilla’ or helper particles, can ‘steer’ the second system into a chosen mixture of quantum states, with a probability distribution that depends on the entangled state. The second system cannot be steered into a particular quantum state at the whim of the experimenter, but for many copies of the entangled pair, the experimenter can constrain the quantum state of the second system to lie in a chosen set of quantum states, where these states are correlated with the possible outcomes of measurements carried out on the entangled paired systems, or the paired systems plus ancillas. He found this conclusion sufficiently unsettling to suggest that the entanglement between two separating systems would persist only for distances small enough that the time taken by light to travel from one system to the other could be neglected, compared with the characteristic time periods associated with other changes in the composite system. He speculated that for longer distances the two systems might in fact be in a correlated mixture of quantum states determined by the entangled state.

Most physicists attributed the puzzling features of entangled quantum states to Einstein’s inappropriate ‘detached observer’ view of physical theory and regarded Bohr’s reply to the EPR argument (Bohr, 1935) as vindicating the Copenhagen interpretation. This was unfortunate, because the study of entanglement was ignored for thirty years until John Bell’s reconsideration of the EPR argument (Bell, 1964). Bell looked at entanglement in simpler systems than the EPR example: matching correlations between two-valued dynamical quantities, such as polarization in a particular direction or spin in a particular direction, of two separated systems in an entangled state. What Bell showed was that the statistical correlations between the measurement outcomes of suitably chosen different quantities on the two systems are inconsistent with an inequality derivable from Einstein’s separability and locality assumptions — in effect from the assumption that the correlations have a common cause. This inequality is now known as Bell’s inequality, and various related inequalities can be derived as a necessary condition for classical or common cause correlations.

Bell’s investigation generated an ongoing debate on the foundations of quantum mechanics. One important feature of this debate was confirmation that entanglement can persist over long distances, thus falsifying Schrödinger’s supposition of the spontaneous decay of entanglement as two entangled particles separate. (Free space entanglement of photons has been demonstrated over a distance of 143 km and, using satellites to distribute entanglement, between locations more than 1200 km apart on earth. See Herbst et al 2014 and Yin et al 2017.) But it was not until the 1980s that physicists, computer scientists, and cryptologists began to regard the non-local correlations of entangled quantum states as a new kind of non-classical physical resource that could be exploited, rather than an embarrassment for quantum mechanics to be explained away. For a discussion of entanglement — what it is, why it is conceptually puzzling, and what you can do with it, including a simple proof of Bell’s theorem — see the graphic novel Totally Random: Why Nobody Understands Quantum Mechanics (A Serious Comic on Entanglement), Bub and Bub 2018. For further discussion of entanglement as a physical resource, including measuring entanglement, and the manipulation and purification of entanglement by local operations, see “The Joy of Entanglement” by Popescu and Rohrlich in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller 1998, Bub 2016, and the classic Nielsen and Chuang 2011. Alain Aspect, John F. Clauser, and Anton Zeilinger were awared the 2022 Nobel Prize in physics for their pioneering experiments on entangled photons, validating Bell’s insight and initiating the field of quantum information.

2. Exploiting Entanglement: Quantum Teleportation

Consider again Schrödinger’s realization that an entangled state could be used to steer a distant particle into one of a set of states, with a certain probability. In fact, this possibility of ‘remote steering’ is even more dramatic than Schrödinger demonstrated. Suppose Alice and Bob share an entangled pure state of the sort considered by Bell, say two photons in an entangled state of polarization, where Alice has in her possession one of the entangled photons, and Bob has the second paired photon. Suppose that Alice receives an additional photon in an unknown state of polarization \(\ket{u}\), where the notation ‘\(\ket{\ }\)’ denotes a quantum state. It is possible for Alice to perform an operation on the two photons in her possession that will transform Bob’s photon into one of four states, depending on the four possible (random) outcomes of Alice’s operation: either the state \(\ket{u}\), or a state that is related to \(\ket{u}\) in a definite way. Alice’s operation entangles the two photons in her possession, and disentangles Bob’s photon, steering it into a state \(\ket{u^*}\). After Alice communicates the outcome of her operation to Bob, Bob knows either that \(\ket{u^*}\) = \(\ket{u}\), or how to transform \(\ket{u^*}\) to \(\ket{u}\) by a local operation. This phenomenon is known as ‘quantum teleportation.’ After the teleportation procedure the state \(\ket{u}\) remains unknown to both Alice and Bob.

What is extraordinary about this phenomenon is that Alice and Bob have managed to use their shared entangled state as a quantum communication channel to destroy the state \(\ket{u}\) of a photon in Alice’s part of the universe and recreate it in Bob’s part of the universe. Since the linear polarization state of a photon requires specifying a direction in space (the value of an angle that can vary continuously), without a shared entangled state Alice would have to convey an infinite amount of classical information to Bob for Bob to be able to reconstruct the state \(\ket{u}\) precisely. The amount of classical information associated with a binary alternative, represented as 0 or 1, where each alternative has equal probability, is one binary digit or ‘bit.’ To specify an arbitrary angle as a decimal requires an infinite sequence of digits between 0 and 9, or an infinite sequence of 0s and 1s in binary notation. The outcome of Alice’s operation, which has four possible outcomes with equal probability of 1/4, can be specified by two bits of classical information. Remarkably, Bob can reconstruct the state \(\ket{u}\) on the basis of just two bits of classical information communicated by Alice, apparently by exploiting the entangled state as a quantum communication channel to transfer the remaining information. The idea was first proposed by Bennett et al in 1993. For further discussion of quantum teleportation, see Nielsen and Chuang 2011, or Richard Josza’s article “Quantum Information and its Properties” in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller 1998. Quantum teleportation has been achieved over a distance of around 100 km on earth, and 1400 km between earth and a satellite (Zeilinger, 2018). The development of a quantum internet using satellites to transmit entangled photons will rely on quantum teleportation.

3. Quantum Information

Formally, the amount of classical information we gain, on average, when we learn the value of a random variable (or, equivalently, the amount of uncertainty in the value of a random variable before we learn its value) is represented by a quantity called the Shannon entropy, measured in bits (Shannon and Weaver, 1949). A random variable is defined by a probability distribution over a set of values. In the case of a binary random variable, with equal probability for each of the two possibilities, the Shannon entropy is one bit, representing maximal uncertainty. For all other probabilities — intuitively, representing some information about which alternative is more likely — the Shannon entropy is less than one. For the case of maximal knowledge or zero uncertainty about the alternatives, where the probabilities are 0 and 1, the Shannon entropy is zero. (Note that the term ‘bit’ is used to refer to the basic unit of classical information in terms of Shannon entropy, and to an elementary two-state classical system considered as representing the possible outputs of an elementary classical information source.)

Since information is always embodied in the state of a physical system, we can also think of the Shannon entropy as quantifying the physical resources required to store classical information. Suppose Alice wishes to communicate some classical information to Bob over a classical communication channel such as a telephone line. A relevant question concerns the extent to which the message can be compressed without loss of information, so that Bob can reconstruct the original message accurately from the compressed version. According to Shannon’s source coding theorem or noiseless coding theorem (assuming a noiseless telephone line with no loss of information), the minimal physical resource required to represent the message (effectively, a lower bound on the possibility of compression) is given by the Shannon entropy of the source.

What happens if we use the quantum states of physical systems to store information, rather than classical states? It turns out that quantum information is radically different from classical information. The unit of quantum information is the ‘qubit’, representing the amount of quantum information that can be stored in the state of the simplest quantum system, for example, the polarization state of a photon. The term is due to Schumacher (1995), who proved a quantum analogue of Shannon’s noiseless coding theorem. (By analogy with the term ‘bit,’ the term ‘qubit’ refers to the basic unit of quantum information in terms of the von Neumann entropy, and to an elementary two-state quantum system considered as representing the possible outputs of an elementary quantum information source.) An arbitrarily large amount of classical information can be encoded in a qubit. This information can be processed and communicated but, because of the peculiarities of quantum measurement, at most one bit can be accessed. According to a theorem by Holevo, the accessible information in a probability distribution over a set of alternative qubit states is limited by the von Neumann entropy, which is equal to the Shannon entropy only when the states are orthogonal in the space of quantum states, and is otherwise less than the Shannon entropy.

While classical information can be copied or cloned, the quantum ‘no cloning’ theorem (Dieks, 1982; Wootters and Zurek, 1982) asserts the impossibility of cloning an unknown quantum state. To see why, consider how we might construct a classical copying device. A NOT gate is a device that takes a bit as input and produces as output either a 1 if the input is 0, or a 0 if the input is 1. In other words, a NOT gate is a 1-bit gate that flips the input bit. A controlled-NOT gate, or CNOT gate, takes two bits as inputs, a control bit and a target bit, and flips the target bit if and only if the control bit is 1, while reproducing the control bit. So there are two inputs, the control and target, and two outputs: the control, and either the target or the flipped target, depending on the value of the control. A CNOT gate functions as a copying device for the control bit if the target bit is set to 0, because the output of the target bit is then a copy of the control bit: the input 00 produces output 00, and the input 10 produces output 11 (here the first bit is the control and the second bit is the target). Insofar as we can think of a measurement as simply a copying operation, a CNOT gate is the paradigm of a classical measuring device. Imagine Alice equipped with such a device, with input and output control and target wires, measuring the properties of an unknown classical world. The input control wire is a probe for the presence or absence of a property, represented by a 1 or a 0. The target wire functions as the pointer, which is initially set to 0. The output of the target is a 1 or a 0, depending on the presence or absence of the property.

Suppose we attempt to use a CNOT gate to copy an unknown qubit state. Since we are now proposing to regard the CNOT gate as a device for processing quantum states, the evolution from input states to output states must be effected by a physical quantum transformation. Quantum transformations are linear on the linear state space of qubits. Linearity of the state space means that any sum or superposition with coefficients \(c_0, c_1\) of two qubit states in the state space is also a qubit state in the state space. Linearity of the transformation requires that the transformation should take a qubit state represented by the sum of two qubit states to a new qubit state that is the sum of the transformed qubit states. If the CNOT gate succeeds in copying two orthogonal qubit states, represented as \(\ket{0},\ket{1}\), it cannot succeed in copying a general linear superposition of these qubits. Since the gate functions linearly, it must instead produce a state that is a linear superposition of the outputs obtained for the two orthogonal qubit states. That is to say, the output of the gate will be represented by a quantum state that is a sum of two terms, where the first term represents the output of the control and target for the first qubit state, and the second term represents the output of the control and target for the second orthogonal qubit state. This could be expressed as \(c_0 \ket{0} \ket{0}\) + \(c_1 \ket{1} \ket{1}\), which is an entangled state (unless \(c_0\) or \( c_1\) is zero) rather than the output that would be required by a successful copying operation (where the control and target each outputs the superposition qubit state \(c_0 \ket{0}\) + \(c_1 \ket{1}\)).

4. Quantum Cryptography

Suppose Alice and Bob are separated and want to communicate a secret message, without revealing any information to Eve, an eavesdropper. They can do this in a classical world if they share a ‘one-time pad,’ a cryptographic key represented by a sequence of random bits at least as long as the number of bits required to communicate the message. In fact, this is the only secure way to achieve perfect security in a classical world. To send a message to Bob, Alice communicates which bits in the key Bob should flip. The resulting sequence of bits is the message. In addition, they would need to have some way of encoding messages as sequences of bits, by representing letters of the alphabet and spaces and punctuation symbols as binary numbers, which could be done by some standard, publicly available scheme.

The problem is that messages communicated in this way are only secret if Alice and Bob use a different one-time pad for each message. If they use the same one-time pad for several messages, Eve could gain some information about the correspondence between letters of the alphabet and subsequences of bits in the key by relating statistical features of the messages to the way words are composed of letters. To share a new key they would have to rely on trusted couriers or some similar method to distribute the key. There is no way to guarantee the security of the key distribution procedure in a classical world.

Copying the key without revealing that it has been copied is also a problem for the shared key that Alice and Bob each store in some supposedly secure way. But the laws of physics in a classical world cannot guarantee that a storage procedure is completely secure, and they cannot guarantee that breaching the security and copying the key will always be detected. So apart from the key distribution problem, there is a key storage problem.

Quantum entanglement provides a way of solving these problems through the ‘monogamy’ of entangled state correlations: no third party can share entanglement correlations between Alice and Bob. Moreover, any attempt by Eve to measure the quantum systems in the entangled state shared by Alice and Bob will destroy the entangled state. Alice and Bob can detect this by checking a Bell inequality.

One way to do this is by a protocol originally proposed by Artur Ekert. Suppose Alice has a collection of photons, one for each entangled pair in the state \(\ket{0}\ket{0} + \ket{1}\ket{1}\) (ignoring the equal coefficients, for simplicity), and Bob has the collection of paired photons. Alice measures the polarization of her photons randomly in directions, \(0, \pi/8, 2\pi/8\) with respect to some direction \(z\) they agree on in advance, and Bob measures the polarizations of his photons randomly in directions \(\pi/8, 2\pi/8, 3\pi/8\). They communicate the directions of their polarization measurements publicly, but not the outcomes, and they divide the measurements into two sets: one set when they both measured polarization in the direction \(\pi/8\), or when they both measured polarization in the direction \(2\pi/8\), and one set when Alice measured polarization in directions \(0\) or \(2\pi/8\) and Bob measured polarization in directions \(\pi/8\) or \(3\pi/8\). For the first set, when they measured the polarization in the same direction, the outcomes are random but perfectly correlated in the entangled state so they share these random bits as a cryptographic key. They use the second set to check a Bell inequality, which reveals whether or not the entangled state has been altered by the measurements of an eavesdropper. (See Ekert, 1991.)

While the difference between classical and quantum information can be exploited to achieve successful key distribution, there are other cryptographic protocols that are thwarted by quantum entanglement. Bit commitment is a key cryptographic protocol that can be used as a subroutine in a variety of important cryptographic tasks. In a bit commitment protocol, Alice supplies an encoded bit to Bob. The information available in the encoding should be insufficient for Bob to ascertain the value of the bit, but sufficient, together with further information (supplied by Alice at a subsequent stage when she is supposed to reveal the value of the bit), for Bob to be convinced that the protocol does not allow Alice to cheat by encoding the bit in a way that leaves her free to reveal either 0 or 1 at will.

To illustrate the idea, suppose Alice claims the ability to predict advances or declines in the stock market on a daily basis. To substantiate her claim without revealing valuable information (perhaps to a potential employer, Bob) she suggests the following demonstration: She proposes to record her prediction, before the market opens, by writing a 0 (for ‘decline’) or a 1 (for ‘advance’) on a piece of paper, which she will lock in a safe. The safe will be handed to Bob, but Alice will keep the key. At the end of the day’s trading, she will announce the bit she chose and prove that she in fact made the commitment at the earlier time by handing Bob the key. Of course, the key-and-safe protocol is not provably secure from cheating by Bob, because there is no principle of classical physics that prevents Bob from opening the safe and closing it again without leaving any trace. The question is whether there exists a quantum analogue of this procedure that is unconditionally secure: provably secure by the laws of physics against cheating by either Alice or Bob. Bob can cheat if he can obtain some information about Alice’s commitment before she reveals it (which would give him an advantage in repetitions of the protocol with Alice). Alice can cheat if she can delay actually making a commitment until the final stage when she is required to reveal her commitment, or if she can change her commitment at the final stage with a very low probability of detection.

It turns out that unconditionally secure two-party bit commitment, based solely on the principles of quantum or classical mechanics (without exploiting special relativistic signaling constraints, or principles of general relativity or thermodynamics) is impossible. See Mayers 1997, Lo and Chau 1997 and Lo’s article “Quantum Cryptology” in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller 1998 for further discussion. (Kent 1999 has shown that one can implement a secure classical bit commitment protocol by exploiting relativistic signaling constraints in a timed sequence of communications between verifiably separated sites for both Alice and Bob.) Roughly, the impossibility arises because at any step in the protocol where either Alice or Bob is required to make a determinate choice (perform a measurement on a particle in the quantum channel, choose randomly and perhaps conditionally between a set of alternative actions to be implemented on the particle in the quantum channel, etc.), the choice can delayed by entangling one or more ancilla particles with the channel particle in an appropriate way. By suitable operations on the ancillas, the channel particle can be ‘steered’ so that this cheating strategy is undetectable. In effect, if Bob can obtain no information about the committed bit, then entanglement will allow Alice to ‘steer’ the bit to either 0 or 1 at will.

In 2022 the US National Institute of Standards and Technology (NIST) announced a suite of encryption protocols designed to be secure against attacks by a quantum computer: NIST Announces First Four Quantum-Resistant Cryptographic Algorithms.

5. Quantum Computation

Quantum information can be processed, but the accessibility of this information is limited by the Holevo bound (mentioned in Section 3). David Deutsch (1985) first showed how to exploit quantum entanglement to perform a computational task that is impossible for a classical computer. Suppose we have a black box or oracle that evaluates a Boolean function \(f\), where the arguments or inputs of \(f\) are either 0 or 1, and the values or outputs of \(f\) are also 0 or 1. The outputs are either the same for both inputs (in which case \(f\) is said to be constant), or different for the two inputs (in which case \(f\) is said to be balanced). Suppose we are interested in determining whether \(f\) is constant or balanced. Classically, the only way to do this is to run the black box or query the oracle twice, for both arguments 0 and 1, and to pass the values (outputs of \(f\)) to a circuit that determines whether they are the same (for ‘constant’) or different (for ‘balanced’). Deutsch showed that if we use quantum states and quantum gates to store and process information, then we can determine whether \(f\) is constant or balanced in one evaluation of the function \(f\). The trick is to design the circuit (the sequence of gates) to produce the answer to a global question about the function in an output qubit register that can then be read out or measured.

Consider again the quantum CNOT gate, with two orthogonal qubits \(\ket{0}\) and \(\ket{1}\) as possible inputs for the control, and \(\ket{0}\) as the input for the target. One can think of the input control and output target qubits, respectively, as the argument and associated value of a function. This CNOT function associates the value 0 with the argument 0 and the value 1 with the argument 1. For a linear superposition of the orthogonal qubits with equal coefficients as input to the control, and the qubit \(\ket{0}\) as the input to the target, the output is the entangled state \(\ket{0} \ket{0}\) + \(\ket{1} \ket{1}\) (ignoring the coefficients, for simplicity). This is a linear superposition in which the first term represents the argument 0 and associated value 0 of the CNOT function, and the second term represents the argument 1 and associated value 1 of the CNOT function. The entangled state represents all possible arguments and corresponding values of the function as a linear superposition, but this information is not accessible. What can be shown to be accessible, by a suitable choice of quantum gates, is information about whether or not the function has certain global properties. This information is obtainable without reading out the evaluation of any individual arguments and values. (Indeed, accessing information in the entangled state about a global property of the function will typically require losing access to all information about individual arguments and values.)

The situation is analogous for Deutsch’s function \(f\). Here the output of \(f\) can be represented as either \(\ket{0} \ket{0} + \ket{1} \ket{0}\) or \(\ket{0} \ket{1} + \ket{1} \ket{1}\) in the ‘constant’ case, or \(\ket{0} \ket{0} + \ket{1} \ket{1}\) or \(\ket{0} \ket{1} + \ket{1} \ket{0}\) in the ‘balanced’ case. The two entangled states in the ‘constant’ case are orthogonal in the 4-dimensional two-qubit state space and span a plane. Call this the ‘constant’ plane. Similarly, the two entangled states in the ‘balanced’ case span a plane, the ‘balanced’ plane. These two planes, representing two alternative quantum disjunctions, are orthogonal except for an intersection or overlap in a line, representing a product (non-entangled) state, where each qubit separately is in the state \(\ket{0} + \ket{1}\). It is therefore possible to design a measurement to distinguish the two alternative disjunctive or global properties of \(f\), ‘constant’ or ‘balanced,’ with a certain probability (actually, 1/2) of failure, when the measurement yields an outcome corresponding to the overlap state, which is common to the two cases. Nevertheless, only one query of the function is required when the measurement succeeds in identifying the global property. With a judicious choice of quantum gates, it is even possible to design a quantum circuit that always succeeds in distinguishing the two cases in one run.

Deutsch’s example shows how quantum information and quantum entanglement can be exploited to compute a disjunctive or global property of a function in one step that would take two steps classically. While Deutsch’s problem is rather trivial, there now exist several quantum algorithms with interesting applications, notably Shor’s factorization algorithm for factoring large composite integers in polynomial time (with direct application to ‘public key’ cryptography, a widely used classical cryptographic scheme) and Grover’s database search algorithm. Shor’s algorithm achieves an exponential speed-up over any known classical algorithm. For algorithms that are allowed access to oracles (whose internal structure is not considered), the speed-up can be shown to be exponential over any classical algorithm in some cases, e.g., Simon’s algorithm. For more on quantum computing and quantum algorithms, see Nielsen and Chuang 2011, Barenco’s article “Quantum Computation: An Introduction” in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller 1998, Bub 2006 (Section 6), Abhijith et al 2022, as well as the entry on quantum computing.

Note that there is currently no proof that a quantum algorithm can solve an NP-complete problem in polynomial time (see the entry on computational complexity theory for the concept of an NP-complete problem), so the efficiency of quantum computers relative to classical computers could turn out to be illusory. If there is indeed a speed-up, it would seem to be due to the phenomenon of entanglement. The amount of information required to describe a general entangled state of \(n\) qubits grows exponentially with \(n\). The state space (Hilbert space) has \(2^n\) dimensions, and a general entangled state is a superposition of \(2^n\) \(n\)-qubit states. In classical mechanics there are no entangled states: a general \(n\)-bit composite system can be described with just \(n\) times the amount of information required to describe a single bit system. So the classical simulation of a quantum process would involve an exponential increase in the classical informational resource required to represent the quantum state, as the number of qubits that become entangled in the evolution grows linearly, and there would be a corresponding exponential slowdown in calculating the evolution, compared to the actual quantum computation performed by the system.

6. Interpretative Remarks

Deutsch (1997) has argued that the exponential speed-up in quantum computation, and in general the way a quantum system processes information, can only be properly understood within the framework of Everett’s ‘many-worlds’ interpretation (see the entries on Everett’s relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics and the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics). The idea, roughly, is that an entangled state of the sort that arises in the quantum computation of a function, which represents a linear superposition over all possible arguments and corresponding values of the function, should be understood as something like a massively parallel classical computation, for all possible values of the function, in parallel worlds. For an insightful critique of this idea of ‘quantum parallelism’ as explanatory, see Steane 2003.

An alternative view emphasizes the non-Boolean structure of properties of quantum systems. The properties of a classical system form a Boolean algebra, essentially the abstract characterization of a set-theoretic structure. This is reflected in the Boolean character of classical logic, and the Boolean gates in a classical computer. From this perspective, the picture is entirely different. Rather than ‘computing all values of a function at once,’ a quantum algorithm achieves an exponential speed-up over a classical algorithm by computing the answer to a disjunctive or global question about a function (e.g., whether a Boolean function is constant or balanced) without computing redundant information (e.g., the output values for different inputs to the function). A crucial difference between quantum and classical information is the possibility of selecting an exclusive disjunction, representing a global property of a function, among alternative possible disjunctions — for example, the ‘constant’ disjunction asserting that the value of the function (for both arguments) is 0 or 1, or the ‘balanced’ disjunction asserting that the value of the function (for both arguments) is the same as the argument or different from the argument — without determining the truth values of the disjuncts.

Classically, an exclusive disjunction is true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true. Deutsch’s quantum circuit achieves its speed-up by exploiting the non-Boolean structure of quantum properties to efficiently distinguish between two disjunctive properties, without determining the truth values of the relevant disjuncts (representing the association of individual inputs to the function with corresponding outputs). The point of the procedure is to avoid the evaluation of the function for specific inputs in the determination of the global property, and it is this feature — impossible in the Boolean logic of classical computation — that leads to the speed-up relative to classical algorithms. (For quantum logic not specifically in relation to quantum computation, see the entry on quantum logic and quantum probability).

Some researchers in quantum information and quantum computation have argued for an information-theoretic interpretation of quantum mechanics. In his review article on quantum computation, Andrew Steane (1998, p. 119) makes the following remark:

Historically, much of fundamental physics has been concerned with discovering the fundamental particles of nature and the equations which describe their motions and interactions. It now appears that a different programme may be equally important: to discover the ways that nature allows, and prevents, information to be expressed and manipulated, rather than particles to move.

Steane concludes his review with the following radical proposal (1998, p. 171):

To conclude with, I would like to propose a more wide-ranging theoretical task: to arrive at a set of principles like energy and momentum conservation, but which apply to information, and from which much of quantum mechanics could be derived. Two tests of such ideas would be whether the EPR-Bell correlations thus became transparent, and whether they rendered obvious the proper use of terms such as ‘measurement’ and ‘knowledge’.

There has been considerable research in the framework of so-called ‘generalized probability theories’ or ‘Boxworld’ on the problem of what information-theoretic constraints in the class of ‘no signaling’ theories would characterize quantum theories. See Brassard 2005, van Dam 2005, Skrzypczyk, Brunner, and Popescu 2009, Pawlowski et al. 2009, Allcock et al. 2009, Navascues and Wunderlich 2009, Al–Safi and Short 2013, Ramanathan et al 2010, and Ringbauer et al (2014) for interesting results along these lines. Chiribella and Spekkens 2016 is a collection of articles based on a conference at the Perimeter institute of Theoretical Physics in Waterloo, Canada on new research at the interface of quantum foundations and quantum information. See Fuchs 2014 and the entry on quantum-Bayesian and pragmatist views of quantum theory for a discussion of QBism, a radically subjectivist information-theoretic perspective.


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