First published Fri Jul 2, 2004; substantive revision Wed Feb 7, 2018

When philosophers, social scientists, and politicians seek to determine the justice of institutional arrangements, their discussions have often taken the form of questioning whether and under what circumstances the redistribution of wealth or other valuable goods is justified. This essay examines the different ways in which redistribution can be understood, the diverse political contexts in which it has been employed, and whether or not it is a useful concept for exploring questions of distributive justice.

1. Distributive Justice and Redistribution

The concept of distributive justice is sometimes understood as the moral assessment of distributions, or as the moral assessment of individual or collective decisions in light of how they affect distributions. Since the publication of Rawls’s “Theory of Justice”, however, discussions of distributive justice have tended to focus more narrowly on the moral assessment of systems of social rules in light of how they affect distributions. These distributions affecting institutions include laws and other social rules governing what kinds of things can be owned (and by whom), how they can be acquired, transferred, relinquished, and forfeited, how markets and the production systems are structured, the manner in which decisions concerning trade policy and the monetary system are made, and so on. Because international institutions such as markets in capital and labor, the structure of property rights, the international trading regimes (including the World Trade Organization), the international financial institutions marked by the agreement of Bretton Woods, and other complex systems of international rules can also be assessed in terms of their effects on distributions, talk of ‘international’ or ‘global’ distributive justice has more recently become more prominent in political theory (Beitz 1979, Caney 2005, Hinsch 2001, Miller 2007).

The concept of redistribution has been invoked extensively in discussions of distributive justice in both the domestic and global context. Indeed, the differences between popular recent approaches to distributive justice, such as libertarianism, prioritarianism, and so-called luck egalitarianism, are sometimes characterized in terms of their attitudes towards redistribution (Scheffler 2003). Even when non-philosophers debate the justice of distributions, or of distribution affecting institutional arrangements, their discussions often take the form of questioning whether and under what circumstances the ‘redistribution’ of wealth is justified. Extreme poverty in developed and developing countries, for example, has led many to question whether affluent people or countries can and ought to ‘help’ or ‘aid’ the poor by redistributing resources to them, and whether they can be compelled by law to do so (for example, through the tax system) (Narveson 2002, 2003).

Given its robust role in discussions of distributive justice, it is unsurprising that disagreements concerning the permissibility of redistribution have often been quite heated. Robert Nozick (1974, p 169) for example, has argued that redistribution in the form of compulsory taxation is “morally on par with forced labor.” And he has famously criticized egalitarian principles of distributive justice, such as Rawls’s difference principle (which categorizes as unjust any national economic order generating inequalities that are not to the greatest benefit of the lowest socio-economic position) on the grounds that they would require extensive redistributive transfers. In this vein, critics of so-called redistributive policies often claim that while individuals may have positive ethical duties to aid poor or unwell persons, it is morally impermissible to compel them to do so through state-administered tax and transfer or other means, unless universal consent for these policies can be secured (Narveson 2001, ch. 17). Egalitarians, on the other hand, have often argued that redistribution through compulsory taxation and other coercively imposed measures is required to meet basic material needs or to promote other valuable social goals, and provide a legitimate, though perhaps not morally costless means of doing so.

This essay aims to clarify and evaluate some of these disagreements by exploring the many different senses in which the concept of redistribution has been used. It also indicates some of the confusions to which equivocation among different senses of this concept has led. It concludes that the use of the concept of redistribution has tended to obscure rather than clarify the true nature of substantive disagreements about distributive justice.

Two kinds of questions concerning redistribution can be identified:

  1. Meaning/Status: What does ‘redistribution’ mean? Does it have a unified and coherent meaning? What kind of a term is ‘redistribution’: Is it purely descriptive, so that we can classify practices as redistributive without evaluating them? Or does the correct application of the term, like democracy, liberty, and perhaps also coercion depend on evaluative judgments?[1] To what kinds of social practices does redistribution refer, and in what sense are these practices redistributive? Does the concept of redistribution provide a helpful framework for understanding and evaluating institutional arrangements, or does it invite confusion?
  2. Moral Significance: Can social practices that are commonly said to involve redistribution be justified? In what contexts and for what purposes is it permissible to adopt these practices? Does the fact that a social practice involves redistribution count for or against it, or does it lack basic moral significance?

We might begin to address these questions by looking more closely at the structure of the concept of redistribution.

The concept of redistribution can be characterized in terms of four parameters. (1) The subjects, such as individual persons or rigidly and non-rigidly defined groups whose holdings of goods are modified through the redistribution; (2) The baseline, the initial distribution of goods to which some other distribution is seen as a redistributive modification; (3) The social mechanism, such as a change in tax laws, monetary policies, or tort law, that engenders the redistribution of goods among these subjects; and (4) the goods, such as income and property (or perhaps opportunities and liberties), that are redistributed through this mechanism.

In assessing whether and how redistribution has occurred, then, the following four questions must be answered:

  1. Among which (if any) subjects did the redistribution take place?
  2. Which (if any) baseline can be defined, of which the present distribution can be seen as a modification?
  3. Through which (if any) social mechanism was the redistribution brought about?
  4. Which (if any) goods have been redistributed?

Redistribution refers to modifications of the holdings of particular persons, collective agents, or groups (as defined in terms of non-resource holding characteristics), or changes in holdings by groups (as defined by resource holdings). Sometimes those from and to whom resources are redistributed are defined as individuals, other times as groups to which individuals are rigidly assigned (for example, Whites and Hispanics), and other times to groups that are defined by their holdings (for example, the top and bottom quintile). We can identify patterns in terms of rigidly identifiable persons (John and Sally) or groups (Whites and Hispanics) or, alternatively, ‘anonymously’ (for example, as a percentile graph or Lorenz curve). We can imagine a scenario in which, pursuant to some institutional reform, the average holdings of the richest quintile and the poorest quintile shift from <5,3> at time t1 to <6,2> at time t2, while the average holdings of Whites and Hispanics or the actual holdings of John and Sally remain unchanged. Whether redistribution has occurred, then, can only be determined relative to the set of subjects that is identified.

Discussions of redistribution are not always very specific about which kinds of subjects they are concerned with, or about the possible significance of the fact that policies will be more or less redistributive depending on how these subjects are defined. Take, for example, the following claim by Harvard economist Richard Freeman (1999, p. 12), who claims that a set of policies he proposes will result in “substantial income redistribution from those who have gained so much in the past 15 to 20 years…for it results in improving the living standards of those now at or near the bottom.” The referent of ‘those’, in both the first and second clauses, could be understood as picking out groups of specific individuals (a set of proper names), or group statistical aggregates (the top or bottom quintile). If the claim refers to groups of particular individuals, then lack of change in the pattern of holdings between the top and bottom income quintiles needn’t mean that no redistribution has taken place. If substantial numbers of people have moved up or down, then redistribution (in this sense) has taken place. My focus in this entry will be on the issue of the baseline, since this seems most fundamental.

2. The Baseline Distribution

Talk of redistribution implies a baseline, some distribution to which another distribution can be compared. We can explore this concept by examining the different baselines that are implicitly or explicitly adopted when people claim that redistribution has taken place. Once these baseline distributions are clarified, questions regarding the meaning and moral significance of redistribution can be more easily addressed.

2.1 Diachronic Redistribution

The baseline distribution can be specified diachronically, in terms of some distribution that held at an earlier time. Economists, for example, often refer to policies as having redistributive effects when they engender a different pattern of holdings than obtained previously. Redistribution of wealth, in this sense, occurs whenever there is a shift in patterns of holdings over time (among some set of subjects) in response to some policy or other social mechanism. On this understanding, we can determine whether redistribution has taken place by identifying (1) a pattern of holdings at time t1 that characterizes the initial distribution; (2) a pattern of holdings at time t2 that characterizes the later distribution; and (3) some policy or other social mechanism that, intentionally or not, caused the change in patterns of holdings between t1 and t2.[2] Let us call redistribution that invokes a diachronically specified baseline ‘diachronic redistribution.’ Diachronic redistribution can be brought about through many different means, including the reform of social institutions (for example, torts, rules governing competition, trade and tax policy, or the structure of markets in capital and labor), changes in the prevailing social ethos, or specific market or other interventions by governments.

2.1.1 Purposive Diachronic Redistribution

Redistribution is often understood more narrowly, referring only to socially caused changes in patterns of holdings over time that are implemented (at least in part) for the very reason that they are likely to bring about these changes.[3] Let us refer to redistribution in this sense as ‘purposive diachronic redistribution.’

Purposive diachronic redistribution is usually associated with (but is certainly not limited to) changes in systems of taxation and property rights. Changes in the structure of markets, the production system, monetary policy, the allocation of public funds for primary and secondary education, or the level of the minimum wage have all been adopted at least partly for the purpose of bringing about changes in the pattern of holdings. In a recent study, for instance, Alberto Alesina et al. (1999) have argued that Italy’s practice of heavily concentrating public sector jobs in the poorer Southern regions is ‘redistributive’ in that it is adopted for the purpose of creating a more egalitarian distribution of economic opportunities between Northern and Southern Italy. Purposive diachronic redistribution involves the successful implementation of institutions and policies whose purpose is to bring about changes in the holdings of different subjects. On this interpretation, determining whether redistribution has taken place involves identifying (1) the holdings of a set of subjects at time t1; (2) the holdings of these subjects after the policy or institutional changes at t2; (3) an agent or set of agents who have enacted the policy or institutional changes that have engendered changes in holdings; and (4) the purposes of these agents in bringing these changes about.

It will not always be easy to identify whether redistribution in this sense has occurred, since the purposes of those who choose and implement policies are often opaque, and also because changes in policies and institutions result from collective decisions involving many agents with diverse and often conflicting purposes. Former U.S. President Clinton’s 1996 minimum wage legislation, for example, appears to have marginally increased the holdings of workers at the bottom quintile of the income distribution. Whether this was an instance of purposive diachronic redistribution is less clear. It may have been part of an overall plan to improve the position of the least advantaged. Or, instead of reflecting a systematic attempt to intervene on behalf of those at the low end of the labor market, the purpose of the legislation may have been to appease organized labor and a generally dissatisfied public. Still other policies may be adopted for the purpose of bringing about changes in the patterns of holdings, but fail to do so, either because of internal flaws in the policies themselves, or because of countervailing pressure from other factors.

2.1.2 Redistribution as Taking

Sometimes redistribution is taken to refer to a particular social mechanism for bringing about changes in holdings overtime — namely, when there has been some prior distribution of resources, and those particular resources have been ‘taken’ away from some of those who initially possessed them and given to others. Let us refer to this second diachronic understanding as ‘redistribution as taking’. Identifying instances of redistribution as purposive taking requires specifying (1) a set of holdings of some rigidly identifiable agents (a, b, c) that obtains at time t1; (2) the set of the holdings of these agents that obtains after the policy or institutional changes have been enacted at time t2; and (3) the agent(s) that have ‘taken’ the holdings of some of these agents and distributed them to other of these agents.

Expropriation is a clear and familiar case of redistribution as taking. Some local government agency, for example, may expropriate a condominium from the Jones family without compensation and subsequently transfer the condominium to the Matua family. In this example, a good that was initially in the possession of some person or persons is taken out of their possession by some agent (perhaps by force or with the threat of force) and given to someone else.[4] Land reform policies and some forms of taxation also appear to involve redistribution as taking. It is worth noting, however, that many purportedly ‘redistributive’ practices do not involve taking. Income tax, for instance, which is commonly thought to involve ‘redistribution as taking’, does not typically confiscate income that was initially in the possession of the taxpayer, since it is usually withheld from pay.[5]

2.1.3 The Status and Moral Significance of Diachronic Redistribution

What kind of concept is redistribution when used in the senses defined above? All of these understandings of redistribution are purely descriptive. We needn’t evaluate a pattern change, a purposive pattern change, or a taking to identify them. These understandings identify distinct but partially overlapping sets of practices and actions as redistributive. Some policies and institutional changes, for example, may involve redistribution in all of these senses. Take, for instance, Taiwan, which, in the course of a decade, radically reduced levels of income inequality — thereby involving a case of diachronic redistribution. Some studies (e.g., Kuo et al. 1984) suggest that these pattern changes were at least partly the intent of a package of policies that included agricultural reform and increased expenditure on health and education — thereby exhibiting purposive diachronic redistribution. And among the most important agricultural reforms were changes in land distribution — thereby involving redistribution as taking.

In other cases it may be unclear whether redistribution occurred in any of these three senses. Take, for example, the question of whether income redistribution occurred in the United States between 1979 and 1987, accepting as true the findings of a U.S. congressional study (released in March, 1989) which claimed that the average family net income of the poorest fifth of the American population declined by over 6 percent from 1979 to 1987, while it rose by over 11 percent for the richest fifth, and that personal income declined by 9.8 percent for the poorest fifth while rising 15.6 percent for the richest fifth.[6] With respect to income quintiles, it seems very likely that diachronic income redistribution occurred between 1979 and 1987 — but only very likely, since it is possible in principle to deny that the income shifts among quintiles were caused by the policies adopted by the Reagan Administration or through other social mechanisms. As noted above, the term ‘redistribution’ is usually taken to require some social mechanism that, whether intentionally or not, causes the shift.

With respect to purposive diachronic redistribution, matters are still less clear, since in the case at hand it is hard to determine whether or not officials in the Reagan Administration intended that their policies should have these effects. And the congressional study provides no information about whether purposive taking occurred, since it refers only to income quintiles, which are non-rigidly defined.

It is hard to see how redistribution in any of the diachronic senses could have any basic moral significance. That is, that some social reform involves redistribution in this sense would not as such count for or against it. Different institutional arrangements, policies, conventions, and individual behaviors will tend to produce different patterns of holdings. Each set of patterns of holdings engendered by changes in these factors can be viewed as redistributive relative to others, and whether a policy is redistributive will depend only on when it is adopted and which policies prevailed beforehand. Surely, some will do better after a policy or institutional change than they fared before it — but this is not in itself an objection to it. Similarly, though we may of course have grounds for criticizing the particular kinds of patterns that public officials intend to bring about, or for finding these policies objectionable on other grounds (for example, if they are intended to discriminate arbitrarily against minorities or other groups that are socially disfavored), the mere fact that a policy is adopted for the purpose of bringing about changes in patterns of holdings does not count for or against it.

Purposive taking may appear to have basic moral significance, such that the fact that a policy involves purposive taking always counts against it. The thought here would be that we tend to develop plans and projects based on things in our physical possession — and it therefore seems wrong to us if these goods are expropriated from us and given to others. But our assessments of takings seem to depend wholly on background facts. With respect to the expropriated condominium discussed above, for example, our assessment of whether or not the Joneses’ rights were violated or infringed, or their interests unfairly harmed would seem to depend on the answers to three interconnected questions:

  1. Did the Jones family acquire the condominium that the government has redistributed through legitimate means?
  2. If the answer to 1 was ‘yes’, did the Jones family acquire a claim to exclusive and enduring use of the condominium?
  3. If the answer to 1 or 2 was ‘no’, was the government agency that carried out the expropriation exercising right authority in so doing?[7]

We can see the relevance of these considerations by imagining contexts in which the Jones family has stolen the condominium, or perhaps signed a time-sharing agreement, which entitle them to exclusive use of it only for two months of each year. Regardless of their deep attachment to the condominium, or the unpleasantness of having physical possessions forcefully expropriated, their interests are not unfairly harmed since they lack valid moral claims to its exclusive and enduring use.

This example shows that whether takings are morally problematic depends not on facts about the initial physical distribution of goods, but on whether these actions take from or give to people or groups things that are rightfully in their possession. The initial possession of goods raises questions about subsequent transfers only if the initial possession is rightful rather than merely physical. Indeed, where possessions have been acquired through unjust processes, purposive takings may be required to restore rightful possession. Hillel Steiner (1994), for example, has recently argued that a bloody history of conquest, theft, and unilateral and disproportionate appropriation of land amounts to the imposition of an unjust distribution of resources that can be remedied only by taking and redistributing resources and, where impracticable, by a ‘redress fund’ that compensates those who are excluded from the use of natural and other resources.

That purposive takings have no basic moral significance can be shown in another way. Some taxes are lawfully withheld from pay while others are lawfully ‘taken’ after income is in the possession of the taxpayer. In either case, people have enduring legal entitlements to their net rather than their gross incomes. Yet it seems that these contingent facts about different income tax systems could not possibly make any significant difference to our normative assessment of them. Whether a tax can be morally justified depends, therefore, not on whether it involves a redistributive taking, but whether it is compatible with a plausible account of the processes by which people can acquire valid moral claims to things. There are, of course, reasons for considering certain economic systems just, and others unjust, but the fact that these systems involve redistribution in the diachronic sense does not in itself seem to be relevant to these assessments.

2.2 Synchronic Comparisons

The baseline distribution can also be specified synchronically, by comparing the prevailing distribution to a distribution that would have held had different circumstances obtained. Since circumstance could have differed in many ways, judging whether redistribution in this sense has occurred will require identifying a more specific subjunctive baseline situation that can serve as the basis for these assessments.

With respect to the question of whether the redistribution of income occurred in the U.S. between 1979 and 1987, for example, we might specify the subjunctive baseline scenario in terms of what income distribution would have been like (1) had policy changes, such as tax cuts, reduction of commercial regulations, and increases in military expenditure not been implemented; (2) had there been no income tax; (3) had all persons and groups received what they contributed to production; (4) had all persons received their gross incomes minus what is required to cover the costs of the public benefits that they have received and the value that they have extracted from the commons; or (5) what they would have received had their holdings reflected what they were entitled to.

2.2.1 Unmoralized Subjunctive Baselines

Let us first examine the subjunctively defined baselines (1)-(3). Determining whether redistribution occurred relative to each of these baselines can be extremely difficult in practice, since the counterfactuals upon which they depend are quite complex. This is not always adequately recognized. It is sometimes assumed, for example, that baseline (2) is identical to the pattern of gross (pre-tax) incomes, so that difference between gross and net income will count as redistributed income according to it. But this is mistaken. The presence or absence of income tax will itself substantially influence many market outcomes, including the availability of economic opportunities to persons with different sets of skills and personal characteristics, and the gross incomes that can be earned in different jobs. Had no income tax been in place, altogether different jobs and economic opportunities would most likely have existed, and gross incomes would most likely have been very different.[8] Indeed, it is extremely hard even to venture a guess at what distribution of income would have obtained had there been no income tax.[9] Identifying the set of holdings that would obtain in the subjunctive baseline scenario invoked by (3) is even more problematic. This is because there is no obvious way of determining how much some individual has contributed to production. Even examples that involve one person producing something from a set of raw materials without the help of others — it is not obvious how to separate out how much of the produced good is due to Crusoe’s contribution and how much to the materials themselves. In cases of interdependent production, things become even more difficult, since there is usually no non-arbitrary way of determining the contributions of different factors of production (for example, labor, capital, raw materials, so-called public goods, and so on) that jointly lead to total output. It is sometimes claimed that using a person’s marginal product as a proxy for what they have contributed to production can circumvent these problems. But this, too, is mistaken. First, in conditions where there are increasing or decreasing returns to scale, not everyone will be able to receive what they contribute. Where there are increasing returns to scale, for example, it will be impossible for people to receive what they contribute at the margins since the marginal return is greater than the average. Second, while assessments of the marginal productivity of different inputs can be useful for deciding how to use additional resources so as to maximize profit, they do not show how much each resource has produced as a proportion of the total output.

Putting aside the manifest difficulties involved in characterizing the pattern of holdings that would obtain in these subjunctive baselines, would the fact that redistribution has occurred relative to any of them count for or against them as such? With respect to (1) and (2) the answer is ‘no.’ The mere fact that some policy change leads to a different pattern of holdings than would have obtained had it not been implemented provides no reason to reject it. Similarly, that a pattern of holdings differs from the pattern that would have obtained in the absence of any taxation would not in itself seem to give us reason to look upon the pattern of holdings that obtain with the tax positively or negatively. In both of these cases, our assessment of the policies should be based upon what we take to be their other morally relevant features, such as whether the changes they bring about further disadvantage vulnerable groups, lead to greater suffering, infringe people’s justified claims to things, and so on. (3), on the other hand, may appear to have basic moral significance. For although few would insist that all should receive exactly what they contributed to production, or that valuable social goals ought never to be pursued when they require that some receive more or less than what they contributed, many might feel that an economic system in which people regularly receive much less than what they contribute to production would be unjust.

But granting basic moral significance to the set of holdings that would have obtained had all received what they contributed to production is less plausible than it may initially appear.[10] First, the intuition that people should receive in income something close to what they contribute to production seems crucially to depend on the overall background fairness of the social system in which production takes place. If, for example, a society allowed educational opportunities for technical training only to members of certain ethnic groups, or if poorly designed education system puts these opportunities out of reach for the vast majority of people, then the fact that those who received such training might then be able to contribute more to production would not seem to entitle them to proportionally higher incomes. Second, the contribution of some person to total output will depend not only on the value of their labor, but also on the value of the resources that they own. And the claim that owners of resources should receive the marginal contribution of their resources to production is especially problematic: The existing distribution of such resources is tainted by its historical evolution. And the purported moral right to full control over what one owns is rather more tenuous than the moral right fully to control one’s natural endowments. As Sen (1982, p. 4) has put it, “The moral appeal of giving more — in (P.T.) Bauer’s words — to ‘those who are more productive and contribute more to output’ does not readily translate into giving more to ‘those who own more productive resources which contribute more to output’.”

2.2.2 Moralized Subjunctive Baselines

Discussions of redistribution have often focused on the permissibility of levying taxes. And it may therefore be tempting simply to identify the baseline with pretax income. Not all taxes, however, are generally considered redistributive. Indeed, economists and legal theorists have typically distinguished between ‘redistributive’ and ‘benefit’ taxation. Benefit taxes are typically understood (Biehl 1982, Cappelen 2000) as user charges: taxes that are paid to cover the costs of the use of public and private goods, services, and enabling social conditions (for example, security, the legal system, social cohesion, public health) that are secured by the government or taxing authority.

These taxes are, in effect, user charges. Redistributive taxation is also commonly distinguished from Pigouvian (after the economist Arthur Pigou), or what might most aptly called ‘compensation’ taxes, which pay for harms that persons cause to the environment or to other people through their activities.[11] Taxes on carbon emissions, maritime dumping, non-renewable resource extraction, and even currency transactions, have often been characterized in this way. Let us call this understanding ‘redistribution as tax and transfer’.

Determining whether tax-and-transfer has occurred requires identifying (1) the extent of the benefits enjoyed by different people within a social system (or the costs that they have imposed on others); (2) the costs of providing these benefits or averting imposed costs; and (3) the contribution of each person to the provision of social benefits and compensation for costs imposed. Redistributive tax-and-transfer occurs whenever people have paid taxes that are above and beyond what is required to cover the costs of the public benefits that they have received and the costs they have imposed on others.

Sometimes the baseline that is invoked in claims that redistributive policies are undertaken is the set of holdings that would have obtained had they received that to which they were entitled. Redistribution, then, is understood as the transfer of holdings that infringes property rights. In this sense, of course, resources could be redistributed from taxpayers to recipients without the taxpayers ever having these resources in their physical possession at all. Though people normally get a paycheck for their net income, and thus never have access to their gross income, they do, according to some, have a claim to their gross income, and thus the difference between gross and net income represents the transfer of holdings to which they were entitled. We can call this interpretation of redistribution ‘rights-infringing transfers’. Determinations of whether rights infringing transfers have occurred will clearly depend upon an account of the nature and scope of property rights. This requires specifying (1) who has the right; (2) what the right is a right to (the object of the right); and (3) the kinds of obligations that others have to the right-holder as a result of the right.[12]

Would the fact that a practice involves redistribution as tax and transfer or rights’ infringement be of basic moral significance? Most seem to agree that it would. Indeed, the debate between Nozick and his egalitarian critics has generally related to whether a policy’s being redistributive in either of these senses provides a decisive moral reason to reject them. Nozick (1974, p.ix) has (along with other libertarians) claimed that it does, objecting, “The state may not use its coercive apparatus for the purpose of getting some citizens to aid others.” Nozick’s egalitarian critics have insisted that such practices may be a regrettable necessity. Thomas Scanlon (1981, p. 199), for instance, has argued: “It may be true, as Nozick claims, that there is a continuum of interferences extending from taxation to forced labor, each foreclosing a few more options than the preceding. But the fact that there is such a continuum is no reason why we must be indifferent between any two points along it.” And Thomas Nagel (1981, p. 201) adds that “there is a big difference between suddenly expropriating half of someone’s savings and attaching monetary conditions in advance to activities, expenditures, and earnings — the usual form of taxation. The latter is a much less brutal assault upon the person.”

Both sides of this debate err, however, by simply assuming that welfare and other social programs are redistributive in either of these senses. It is often claimed, for example, that welfare and other social programs are clear examples of tax-and-transfer, because such programs are usually funded by revenues that are raised from those who will seldom, if ever, make use of them. But this assumes an overly narrow understanding of how people can benefit from such programs. In particular, it overlooks the indirect benefits that these programs provide to those who fund them. Programs that provide a decent social minimum, for example, may protect those who fund them from higher crime rates, or promote higher growth rates, a better educated labor force, and other social goods that benefit them in many ways (Murphy & Nagel 2003, Chapter 4). Suppose, however, that those who pay taxes that support a social minimum can insulate themselves from the risks of crime, or are unaffected by the other social benefits engendered by these programs. Would this show that the taxes that they pay to support these programs are redistributive? Perhaps, but it could also be plausibly claimed that insofar as they do not support such programs, their remaining taxes help to support a set of institutional arrangements that harm those that suffer from significant deprivations. Take, for example a social system that features a market economy whose structure tends to produce significant inequality and poverty. Under this system, many lack — through no fault of their own — access to basic educational opportunities, health care, and the foodstuffs required for them to meet their minimal nutritional needs. Some would argue that insofar as those who are extremely badly-off are not compensated or efforts are not made to provide them with enhanced opportunities, they are harmed by the social system. Those who support the social system by paying taxes, complying with its rules, and through other means are thus harming, rather than merely failing to benefit, less advantaged participants. Taxes that ensure that persons can meet their basic human needs may therefore need to be added to the economic system lest its imposition constitute a harming of the poor (Pogge 2002). This point has been emphasized in the work of political theorists who have framed demands for distributive justice in terms of predistribution (Hacker 2011, O’Neill and Williamson 2012, Thomas 2017). These theorists call for corrective action to offset what he regards as the cost of policy shifts that have worked to the benefit of the very wealthy while undermining the position of the disadvantaged, for instance by reducing their organizing rights. In this context, tax and transfer could be seen as compensating for regressive changes in the predistribution of rights which would otherwise harm disadvantaged people.

To take an international example, some have supported James Tobin’s (1996) proposal for a tax on international currency exchanges on the grounds that capital markets are currently structured in a way that makes significant shocks and financial crises more frequent and more painful than they need be, often causing grave and lasting harm to poorer and more vulnerable economies. A tax on these transactions is not, according to this view, redistributive, since its purpose is to correct for and minimize harms that these markets can engender if left unregulated. Along these lines, a Tobin-inspired proposal is the ‘Robin Hood Tax’ on risky financial transactions, which is gaining momentum in the UK and other countries (see the link to Robin Hood Tax in the Other Internet Resources section). Similar claims have been made on behalf of resource extraction, fuel, carbon, and even global income taxes.

The policy proposals mentioned above are quite controversial. They suggest, however, that the very concept of benefit and compensatory taxation is a rather complex idea, presupposing a baseline against which specific policies and institutional arrangements can be seen to benefit or harm persons. Several baselines can be invoked in making such comparisons, including what people would have had in a ‘state of nature,’ in a laissez-faire scheme, within an order in which people’s basic needs are met insofar as possible, and so on. Different baselines will yield different verdicts about these arrangements. And since none of the baselines is obviously more ‘natural’ or ‘neutral’ than others, moral reasons must be adduced for treating one or another of them as the appropriate benchmark for assessing the magnitudes of harm and benefit that a particular institutional order engenders. Whether we judge institutional arrangements to have harmed or benefited some agent — and therefore whether or not the taxes that these and other agents pay are redistributive — depends upon our substantive normative assessments regarding how these arrangements should be designed.

The social practices that are sometimes said to involve rights infringing transfers include compulsory taxation that is used to pay for welfare, social programs provided for the poor and unemployed, and foreign development aid. It is somewhat curious that many critics of conservative and libertarian positions seem to agree that taxation involves redistribution through violation (or at least infringement) of property rights — while maintaining that this is nevertheless justified given the importance of other social goals.[13] Indeed, defenses of the welfare state have typically represented taxation for welfare programs as a form of state-administered infringement of property rights — or ‘enforced charity’. These judgments depend, however, on highly specific (and contentious) understandings of economic justice and the processes that give rise to valid entitlements. They seem to suppose, for example, that people have valid moral claims to their gross incomes. A more robust egalitarian critique of these claims would question whether gross income provides the appropriate benchmark for judging whether rights-infringing transfers have occurred. U.S. citizens have a right only to their net incomes, not their gross incomes. They are legally obligated not to evade payment of income tax. The choice of a tax scheme does not reflect a commitment to infringing property rights to serve social goals; indeed, no individual or government agency may interfere with the (legal) use of net income. Rather, the tax scheme reflects a commitment to fixing the content of the rules that determine valid property rights in a particular way. That is, the income tax is part of the process that fixes the initial (normatively relevant) distribution, to which the right-holder is completely entitled.[14] The income tax does not represent redistribution, since this takes for granted some different initial distribution of rightful holdings (and thus a right with a different object: in this case, gross income).[15] Indeed, consideration of social goals such as general economic security, for instance, often figure in the design of an economic system, including its monetary policies and tax rates, but these same goals seldom figure in justifications of infringements of rights (for example, the repossession of goods that have come to be held by legal means within that system) (Murphy & Nagel 2003, Pogge 1989). Once we have fixed the content of our economic ground rules (according, of course, to some account of justice), they cannot be viewed as ‘redistributive’ in the rights-infringing sense. Rather, they ought to be viewed as governing how economic benefits and burdens are rightfully distributed in the first place. This is just a specific instance of the general distinction, stressed by Rawls (2001), between the use of forward-looking considerations in justifying a practice (or, in this case, an institutional design) and using those same considerations to justify infringement of the rules of an ongoing practice.

The considerations above do not in themselves show, as Liam Murphy and Thomas Nagel (2003) have argued, that “Taxes do not take away from taxpayers what is antecedently theirs; pretax income has no status as a moral baseline for the purpose of evaluating the justice of the tax system.” Indeed, libertarians and others can still make out their case that rights-infringing redistribution has occurred by specifying and justifying entitlement producing rules that, if accepted, would grant pretax income significance as a moral baseline. They may argue, for example, that gross incomes have moral significance because they show the value of one’s contribution to social cooperation as assessed by others, or because they represent (at least roughly) differentials in what individuals contribute to total production.[16]

By employing the concept of redistribution, both libertarians and their egalitarian critics make it appear that laissez-faire institutions are natural and define the baseline distribution. They seem therefore to share the conviction that egalitarians seek to revise these distributions ex post through redistributive transfers. But this presupposes that the libertarians are correct in their specification of entitlement producing processes that produce the initial distribution. The fact that particular forms of taxation are often seen as redistributive in this sense is due to a tacit presupposition that a very specific kind of free-market scheme should serves as a morally privileged benchmark.[17] Those who find that only a more egalitarian set of social arrangements is ethically defensible will (symmetrically) view the distributions that come about pursuant to a lasses-faire market scheme as involving rights infringing redistribution. Here again, the debate is better understood as concerning what the correct predistribution of right ought to be (O’Neill and Williamson 2012).

3. Conclusion

There are, no doubt, reasons for considering certain economic systems just, and others unjust, but it has turned out to be difficult to use the concept of redistribution to mark out differences between them. Redistribution in any of the three diachronic senses, and in either of the unmoralized synchronic senses appears to lack basic moral significance. Redistribution as tax and transfer or as rights infringement may indeed have basic moral significance. The classification of policies and institutional arrangements as redistributive in either of these senses, however, has been shown to depend on our moral assessment of these practices, and cannot thus be used as a basis for such assessments.

But couching discussions of distributive justice in terms implied by redistribution smuggles in associations of forceful takings and rights infringements, which are not obviously appropriate in the context of evaluating social programs funded through taxation, or to discussions of reforms of the global economy. Moreover, focusing on the permissibility of ‘helping’ and ‘aiding’ poorer people through ‘redistributive’ transfers seems tacitly to accept the existing distribution of holdings as a morally unproblematic benchmark. This focus will tend to privilege the status quo, and foster resistance to more egalitarian social arrangements.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


This essay has benefited greatly from comments from Alejandra Mancilla, Joanna Picciotto, Joel Rosenthal, Lydia Tomitova and Jeremy Waldron. I am particularly grateful to Thomas Pogge and Sanjay Reddy for their extensive written criticisms of an earlier version.

Copyright © 2018 by
Christian Barry <>

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