First published Tue Feb 9, 2016; substantive revision Wed Oct 28, 2020

The world we inhabit isn’t an undifferentiated bog. Everywhere there’s repetition and, importantly, we can even distinguish different types of repetition. We see one cat and then another cat. But we can also see that our cat is on top of the mat and subsequently notice that the cat from next door is on top of the fence. Repetition in the first sense requires only one thing and then another. By contrast, repetition in the second sense requires two (or more) things and then two (or more) other things. Properties are typically introduced to account for repetition in the first sense, whereas relations are typically introduced to account for repetition in the second sense. There’s cat repetition because there is more than one thing that has a certain property, the property of being a cat. There’s above-and-below repetition because there is more than one thing that bears a certain relation to something else, the relation that holds between two things when one is on top of the other.

It’s doubtful whether the distinction between properties and relations can be given in terms that do not ultimately presuppose it—the distinction is so basic. Nevertheless, there are elucidations on offer that may help us better appreciate the distinction. Properties merely hold of the things that have them, whereas relations aren’t relations of anything, but hold between things, or, alternatively, relations are borne by one thing to other things, or, another alternative paraphrase, relations have a subject of inherence whose relations they are and termini to which they relate the subject. More examples may help too. When we say that a thing \(A\) is black, or \(A\) is long, then we are asserting that there is some property \(A\) has. But when we say that \(A\) is (wholly) inside \(B\) then we are asserting that there is a relation in which \(A\) stands to \(B\).

Be careful though not to be misled by these examples. \(A\) can only be (wholly) inside \(B\) if \(A\) is distinct from \(B\). So the relation in which \(A\) stands to \(B\) if \(A\) is (wholly) inside \(B\) requires a distinct subject from terminus. By contrast, \(A\) can be black without prejudice to anything else. But we cannot infer straightaway that every relation holds between more than one thing because there may be some relations that a thing bears to itself, if, for example, identity is a relation. So we cannot distinguish properties from relations by appealing to the number of distinct things required for their exhibition, since these may be the same, viz. one. Hence the plausibility of thinking that a relation differs from a property because a relation, unlike a property, proceeds from a subject to a terminus, even if the subject and terminus are identical.

Theories of relations add to, subtract from or qualify this basic package of ideas in various ways. But with the distinction between properties and relations in hand we can already do some worthwhile conceptual geography, distinguishing four regions of logical space. (1) Rejection of both properties and relations. (2) Acceptance of properties but rejection of relations. (3) Acceptance of relations but rejection of properties. (4) Acceptance of both properties and relations. (1) amounts to a form of thoroughgoing nominalism and is typically motivated by a blanket aversion to the doctrine that general words like “black” or “before” refer to worldly items, whether properties or relations. By contrast, (2), (3) and (4) amount to different forms of realism, whether about properties and/or relations. Typically they are motivated either by an especial antipathy toward relations (2) or, alternatively, an appreciation of their distinctive utility ((3) and (4)). Here we will focus upon what it is about relations in particular that makes philosophers either love them or hate them.

1. Preliminary Distinctions

To understand the contemporary debate about relations we will need to have some logical and philosophical distinctions in place. These distinctions aren’t to be taken for granted. Part of the development of the debate has consisted in the refinement of precisely these distinctions. But you need to understand how, relatively speaking, things got started.

To begin let’s distinguish between the “degree” or “adicity” or “arity” of relations (see, e.g., Armstrong 1978b: 75). Properties are “one-place” or “monadic” or “unary” because properties are only exhibited by particulars or other items, e.g., properties, individually or one by one. Relations are “many-place” or “\(n\)-adic” or “\(n\)-ary” (where \(n\gt 1)\) because they are exhibited by particulars only in relation to other particulars. A “2-place” or “dyadic” or “binary” relation is exhibited by one particular only in relation to another. A “3-place” or “triadic” or “ternary” relation is exhibited by one particular only in relation to exactly two others. And so on. Some examples. The relation that \(x\) stands to \(y\) whenever \(x\) is adjacent to \(y\) is binary. This is because it takes two things to be adjacent to one another. The relation that \(x\) stands to \(y\) and \(z\) whenever \(x\) is between \(y\) and \(z\) is ternary because it takes three things for one to fall between the other two.

In these terms, a relation can be distinguished from a “relational property”. Whereas a relation is borne by one thing to another thing (possibly, in certain cases, to the same thing), a relational property is the property of bearing a relation to something. Suppose \(a\) bears a relation \(R\) to \(b\). Then \(a\) has the relational property of bearing \(R\) to \(b\) whilst \(b\) has the property of \(a\)’s bearing \(R\) to it. Here \(R\) is binary whilst the relational properties are unary because they are had by single things, \(a\) and \(b\) respectively. For example, marriage is a relation between two people but being married to Cleopatra is a relational property had by Antony whilst being married to Antony is a relational property had by Cleopatra.

A “unigrade” relation \(R\) is a relation that has a definite degree or adicity: \(R\) is either binary or ternary… or \(n\)-ary (for some unique \(n\)). By contrast a relation is “multigrade” if it fails to be unigrade (the expression is owed to Leonard & Goodman 1940: 50). Putative examples include causal, biological, physical, geometrical, intentional and logical relations. Causation appears to be multigrade because a certain number of events may be required to bring about an effect on one occasion, and a different number of events may be required to bring about an effect on another. Similarly, entailment appears to be a multigrade relation because a certain number of premises may be required to entail one conclusion but a different number of premises to entail another. Whether there are any multigrade relations and exactly what it means to be multigrade is a fraught matter (see Armstrong 1978b: 93–4, 1997: 85, 2010: 23–5 and Dixon 2019: 64–7 for arguments against multigrade relations and Morton 1975, Fine 2000: 22, MacBride 2005: 569–93 and Hossack 2007: 45–55 for arguments in favour of them).

Next, let’s draw a preliminary three-fold distinction between binary relations in terms of their behaviour with respect to the things they relate. A binary relation \(R\) is symmetric iff whenever \(x\) bears \(R\) to \(y\), \(y\) bears \(R\) to \(x\). By contrast, \(R\) is non-symmetric iff \(R\) fails to be symmetric. Asymmetric relations are a special case of non-symmetric ones: R is asymmetric iff whenever \(x\) bears \(R\) to \(y\) then \(y\) does not bear \(R\) to \(x\). So whilst all asymmetric relations are non-symmetric, not all non-symmetric relations are asymmetric. Some examples. Whenever \(x\) is married to \(y\), \(y\) is married to \(x\). So the relation in which \(x\) stands to \(y\) when \(x\) is married to \(y\) is a symmetric relation. But if \(x\) loves \(y\), it isn’t guaranteed that \(y\) loves \(x\). Because, alas, sometimes love is unrequited. So the relation in which \(x\) stands to \(y\) when \(x\) loves \(y\) is a non-symmetric relation. But love doesn’t have to go unrequited otherwise far fewer people would get married, only cynics and gold diggers. So this relation isn’t asymmetric. By contrast, the relation in which \(x\) stands to \(y\) when \(x\) is taller than \(y\) is asymmetric because if \(x\) is taller than \(y\) then \(y\) isn’t taller than \(x\). This doesn’t exhaust the logical classification of relations. It’s easy to see that further distinctions will need be drawn. Consider, for example, the between relation. It’s a ternary relation that is symmetric in the sense that if \(x\) is between \(y\) and \(z\) then \(x\) is between \(z\) and \(y\). But the between relation isn’t completely or strictly symmetric because it’s not the case that if \(x\) is between \(y\) and \(z\) then \(y\) is between \(x\) and \(z\). So the distinction between symmetric and non-symmetric relations for \(n\)-ary relations, where \(n \gt 2\), will need to be qualified. (In what follows we restrict ourselves to the more straightforward cases discussed in the philosophical literature on relations. But see Russell 1919: 41–52 for a more wide-ranging discussion of the logical variety of relations.)

Nevertheless, equipped with this three-fold distinction for binary distinction we can now appreciate the significance of one contemporary debate about relations. Our ordinary and scientific views of the world are replete with descriptions of things that are non-symmetrically or asymmetrically related. For this reason, Russell advocating admitting both non-symmetric and asymmetric relations alongside symmetric ones (Russell 1903: §§212–6, 1914: 58–9, 1924: 339). But, more recently, it has been questioned whether it is necessary to admit non-symmetric and asymmetric relations at all, i.e., it has been argued that the world contains only symmetric relations by Armstrong 1997: 143–4; Dorr 2004: 180–7; Simons 2010: 207–1, but for counter-arguments see MacBride 2015: 178–94.

Now non-symmetric relations, including asymmetric ones, are typically described as imposing an order upon the things they relate; they admit of what is also called differential application (Fine 2000: 8). This means that for any such non-symmetric \(R\) there are multiple different ways in which \(R\) potentially applies to the things it relates. Why? If the way that loves applies to \(a\) and \(b\) when \(a\) loves \(b\) were no different from the way that loves applies to them when \(b\) loves \(a\), then the loves relation couldn’t be non-symmetric, because otherwise \(a\) couldn’t love \(b\) without \(b\)’s loving \(a\). So we have to distinguish between the two different ways that loves is capable of applying to \(a\) and \(b\). Similarly we can distinguish the six different ways that the ternary between relation potentially applies to three things. By contrast, we’re not required by the same reasoning to distinguish between the different ways in which a (strictly) symmetric relation applies to the things it relates. There’s no corresponding necessity to distinguish the way that the adjacency relation applies to \(a\) and \(b\) when \(a\) is adjacent to \(b\) from the way that the adjacency relation applies to them when \(b\) is adjacent to \(a\) because \(a\) cannot be adjacent to \(b\) without \(b\) being adjacent to \(a\).

Putting the ideas of the last three paragraphs together, philosophers often seek to capture what is distinctive about relations by describing them in the following manner. Unlike properties, binary relations aren’t exhibited by particulars but by pairs of particulars. Similarly ternary universals aren’t exhibited by particulars but by triples of particulars, etc. But, we have seen, non-symmetric relations, including asymmetrical ones, are order-sensitive. So the pairs, triples, etc., of objects that exhibit these relations must be themselves ordered. It is only ordered pairs, ordered triples, more generally, \(n\)-tuples or sequences that exhibit relations (Kim 1973: 222; Chisholm 1996: 53; Loux 1998: 23).

There are a number of reasons we should be wary of characterising relations in such quasi-mathematical terms. First, sequences presuppose order, the difference between a thing’s coming first and thing’s coming second, so cannot be used to explain order without our going around in a tight circle. Second, it’s problematic to try to explain a relation between two things in terms of another thing, a sequence, which is those two things put together in an order (MacBride 2005: 590–2). If a sequence \(s\) (\(=\langle x, y \rangle\)) is conceived as a “one” such that a relation \(R\) is really only a monadic feature of it, \(R(s)\), then it’s mysterious what \(R\)’s holding of \(s\) has to do with \(x\) and \(y\) being arranged one way rather than another with respect to \(R\). If you don’t see the mystery straightaway, reflect that \(s\) may have a monadic feature \(F\), which is, so to speak, only to do with \(s\) itself rather than its members. But if \(R\) and \(F\) are conceived alike, as monadic features of \(s\), isn’t it mysterious that the possession by \(s\) of \(R\) has consequences for \(x\) and \(y\) whereas \(F\) doesn’t? If, alternatively, a sequence is conceived as a “many”, just \(x\) and \(y\), such that \(R\) applies to them directly, then it’s unclear what the appeal to sequences has achieved.

We cannot avoid the difficulties associated with sequences by appealing to the Kuratowski definition of sequences in terms of unordered sets (where, e.g., \(\langle x, y\rangle = \{\{x\}, \{x, y\}\}\)) (or Bergmann’s Kuratowski inspired account of order in terms of ‘diads’, see his 1981: 147). There are indefinitely many other set-theoretic constructions upon which we may rely to model sequences, e.g., Wiener’s, hence the familiar objection that we cannot legitimately fix upon any one such construction as revelatory of the nature of sequences (see Kitcher (1978: 125–6) generalising upon a point originally made by Benacerraf (1965: 54–62)). But there is also the less familiar objection that the Kuratowski definition cannot be used to analyse the order inherent in the sequence \(\langle x, y\rangle\). Compare: we cannot analyse personal identity in terms of memory because it’s built into the what we mean by memory that you can only remember your own experiences, i.e., the very notion that we set out to explain, viz. personal identity, is presupposed by our analysans. Similarly \(\{\{x\}, \{x, y\}\}\) only serves as a model of \(\langle x, y\rangle\) relative to the assumption that the thing that belongs to a singleton member, namely \(\{x\}\), of the first class comes first in the pair \(\langle x, y\rangle\), so the notion of order is presupposed (Hochberg 1981, 2001: 176–7).

The next idea that needs to be introduced is the idea of a converse relation. For any given binary relation \(R\), the converse of \(R\) may be defined as the relation \(R^*\) that \(x\) bears to \(y\) whenever \(y\) bears \(R\) to \(x\) (Fine 2000: 3; van Inwagen 2006: 459). Note that the relationship between a relation and its converse isn’t a matter of happenstance; there’s no possibility of a converse of \(R\) floating free from \(R\) and holding between things independently of how \(R\) arranges them. Rather it’s a more intimate relationship which, if it holds, holds of necessity. For \(x\) to have one to \(y\) is, so to speak, for \(y\) to have the other to \(x\); they neither exist nor can be observed apart from one another but can only be distinguished in thought (Geach 1957: 33). Before and after, above and below are prima facie examples of mutually converse relations. Non-symmetric relations, including asymmetric ones, are distinct from their converses (if they have them). Suppose \(R\) is a non-symmetric relation which \(x\) bears to \(y.\) Then the converse of \(R\) is borne by \(y\) to \(x\). But suppose that \(R\), as it may, fails to be borne by \(y\) to \(x\). Then something is true of the converse of \(R\) that isn’t true of \(R\) itself, viz. that it is borne by \(y\) to \(x\). Hence, the converse of \(R\) must be distinct from \(R\). More generally, whilst a binary non-symmetric relation has only one converse, a ternary one has five mutual, distinct converses, a quadratic relation has 23 converses, etc. The issue of whether relations have converses is another issue to which we will return later.

The next distinction we will need, or more accurately, family of distinctions, is between internal and external relations. What makes them members of a single family is that a relation is internal if its holding between things is somehow fixed by the things themselves or how those things are; external relations are relations whose holding between things isn’t fixed this way. Different versions of the internal-external distinction correspond to different explanations of how internal relations are fixed (Ewing 1934: 118–36; Dunn 1990: 188–192; Hakkarainen, Keinänen & Keskinen, 2019). We don’t need to describe every version of the distinction but here are three that are essential to understanding the contemporary debate.

The first version of the distinction is owed to Moore. According to Moore’s (1919: 47), a binary relation \(R\) is internal iff if \(x\) bears \(R\) to \(y\) then \(x\) does so necessarily. From the internality of \(R\), in Moore’s sense, it follows that if \(x\) exists at all then \(x\) indeed bears \(R\) to \(y\). But if it’s possible that \(x\) exist whilst failing to bear \(R\) to \(y\), then \(R\) is external. The doctrine of the necessity of origin provides one putative example of a relation that’s internal in Moore’s sense. If you essentially come from your biological parents then you could not have existed whilst failing to be their offspring, i.e., the relation of biologically originating from must be internal in Moore’s sense.

The second version of the internal-external distinction is favoured by Armstrong (1978b: 84–5, 1989: 43, 1997: 87–9, van Inwagen 1993: 33–4). According to Armstrong, a relation \(R\) is internal iff it’s holding between \(x\) and \(y\) is necessitated by the intrinsic natures, i.e., non-relational properties, of \(x\) and \(y\); otherwise \(R\) is external. The third version is owed to Lewis. Lewis (1986: 62) advanced the view that an internal relation is one that supervenes upon the intrinsic natures of its relata. But Lewis’s definition of “external” is more involved: \(R\) is external iff (1) it fails to supervene upon the nature of the relata taken separately, but (2) it does supervene on the nature of the composite of the relata taken together.

Suppose that \(x\) is a cube and \(y\) is also a cube. It follows that \(x\) is the same shape as \(y.\) So the relation that \(x\) bears to \(y\) when \(x\) is the same shape as \(y\) is internal in Armstrong’s sense. By contrast, spatio-temporal relations are external (in his sense) because the intrinsic characteristics of \(x\) and \(y\) don’t necessitate how close or far apart \(x\) and \(y\) are. Lewis intends his distinction to classify the same way. If \(x\) is the same shape as \(y\), but \(w\) is not the same shape as z, then there must be some difference in intrinsic nature either between \(x\) and \(w\) or else between \(y\) and \(z\). So the relation that \(x\) bears to \(y\) when \(x\) is the same shape as \(y\) is internal in Lewis’s sense. Lewis also claims that the distance between \(x\) and \(y\) is an external relation because the following conditions are met: (1) \(x\) may be closer to \(y\) than \(w\) is to \(z\) even though \(x\) is an intrinsic duplicate of \(w\), i.e., shares all and only the same intrinsic characteristics, and \(y\) an intrinsic duplicate of \(z\); (2) the distance between \(x\) and \(y\) does supervene upon the nature of the composite \(x+y\). (We’ll return in section 3 to the question whether, as Lewis claims, distance relation supervene upon the nature of composites.) But the relation that \(x\) bears to \(y\) when \(x\) is the same shape as \(y\) isn’t internal in Moore’s sense because, let us suppose, \(x\) might have been spherical whilst \(y\) remained a cube; so it doesn’t follow from the mere fact that \(x\) exists that \(x\) is the same shape as \(y\).

The final distinction, or rather, collection of distinctions, which we’ll introduce here and which needs to be borne in mind when considering the recent debate on relations, concerns the existence and identity conditions for relations. Since Lewis it has become commonplace to conceive relations as either “abundant” or “sparse”: according to an abundant conception there is a relation for every arbitrary pair (or triple, or ...) of things whereas according to a sparse conception there are only as many relations as are required to characterise the relational aspects of likeness and difference (Lewis 1986: 61). But this binary distinction doesn’t do justice to the variety of different conceptions of the existence and identity of relations that have been put forward. Distinguish, on the one hand, an a posterori view according to which relations exist only if they are instantiated and whether they are instantiated is an empirical matter (Armstrong 1978a: 76–77) from, on the other hand, an a priori view according to which their existence is settled by purely logical principles, for example strong comprehension principles whereby every open formula determines a corresponding property or relation (Zalta 1988: 46–7; Williamson 2013: 226–7). Whereas the former view might admit space-time separation as a relation (or family of relations) whose instantiation is confirmed by physics, the latter would affirm the existence of a relation corresponding to the open formula “x is a much funnier anarchist than y”. Between these two extremes are views that allow some relations, for example, relative velocities conceived as relations between different things when one has a certain velocity relative to another, to be uninstantiated for the purposes of rounding out scientific theory (Bigelow and Pargetter 1990: 77) and views that allow logically complex relations (RvS, R&S etc.) insofar as they are built up by logical operations from simple relations (R, S etc.) found in nature (Bealer 1982: 9–10).

There is a considerable variety of views concerning the identity conditions for relations. Distinguish, for example, a “coarse-grained” conception, according to which relations are identical just in case they are necessarily equivalent, i.e. identical just in case, as a matter of necessity, they are exhibited by the same pairs, triples... of things, from a “fine-grained” conception, according to which relations are identical just in case they have the same analysis in terms of simpler relations (Bealer 1982: 2–3, Menzel 1993: 62–4). Another approach conceives relations as the same just in case they confer the same causal powers on the pairs, triples... of things related by them. A further approach to relation identity says that, for example, the dyadic relations R and S are identical if their corresponding relational properties (bearing R to a, bearing S to a etc.) are identical, where properties in general (which, recall, are unary) are identical just in case, according to this view, they are “encodings” of the same “abstract object”. The sense of abstract object here is a specialised one: roughly speaking, an abstract object encodes a property by encapsulating what it is to exhibit the property in question (Zalta 1988: 51–52). Even though these different conceptions of the existence and identity conditions for relations yield different results in different cases it is important to also bear in mind that they need not invariably be seen as competing. It may be that they provide different notions of relation relevant to different purposes, for example, whether we are interested in relations because of their role in causation, semantics, intentionality and so on (Lewis 1986: 55–59).

2. Eliminativism, External Relations and Bradley’s Regress

Some philosophers are wary of admitting relations because they are difficult to locate. Glasgow is west of Edinburgh. This tells us something about the locations of these two cities. But where is the relation that holds between them in virtue of which Glasgow is west of Edinburgh? The relation can’t be in one city at the expense of the other, nor in each of them taken separately, since then we lose sight of the fact that the relation holds between them (McTaggart 1920: §80). Rather the relation must somehow share the divided locations of Glasgow and Edinburgh without itself being divided. This may sound peculiar if we assume that middle-sized things like cities, which have locations in a relatively straightforward sense, set a standard for how entities in general ought to behave. But why shouldn’t we admit other kinds of entity that have a different kind of relationship to space and time from such readily located things. Or even go down the route of conceiving relations as abstract, i.e., as “Nowhere and nowhen” (Russell 1912: 55–6). As Lewis reflected, “if the price is right, we could learn to tolerate it” (Lewis 1986: 68). But is the price right? Do the theoretical benefits of admitting relations outweigh the cost of offending pre-theoretic intuition?

Other philosophers have been wary of admitting relations because, they complain, relations are unsatisfactorily characterised, “neither fish nor fowl”, i.e., neither substances nor attributes (Heil 2012: 141, 2016: 130) or "ontologically weird" (Lowe 2016: 111). Now it’s certainly true that \(n\)-adic relations, where \(n\gt 1\), cannot be characterised as either substances or (monadic) attributes. But it only follows that relations are unsatisfactorily characterised if we assume that substances and attributes provide the benchmark for satisfactory characterisation. But we shouldn’t assume this ahead of investigating whether the theoretical benefits of admitting relations outweigh the costs. It’s also been complained that relations are suspect because they depend upon the existence of substances that bear them (Campbell 1990: 108–9) or, as Lowe makes the point, “A ‘relational accident’, if there could be such a thing would not be ‘in’, to at least not be wholly ‘in’, any of its two or more ‘subjects’, nor even wholly ‘in’ the totality of them. I consequently find it hard to conceive what such an entity could really be” (Lowe 2016: 111–2). Of course it’s true that in order for a relation to be borne by one thing to another thing, then those things must exist. But it doesn’t follow that relations don’t exist if nothing bears them. Moreover, it doesn’t follow straightaway from the reflection that to be borne by something a relation needs things to bear it, that relations are suspect. It doesn’t follow any more than it follows from the reflection that to be had by something an attribute needs things to have it, that attributes are suspect. If the price is right we should open our minds to the possibility of things which are neither fish nor fowl but vegetables, i.e., neither substances nor attributes but relations.

In light of the internal/external distinction introduced above, we can distinguish two distinct questions here: (a) should we acknowledge external relations? (b) should we acknowledge internal relations? In the present section our focus will be upon whether to accept or reject external relations, before turning to internal relations in the next.

F.H. Bradley regarded himself the nemesis of external relations, but not only them. Famously, Bradley brought a vicious regress argument against external relations. In his original version (1893: 32–3), Bradley presented a dilemma to show that external relations are unintelligible. Here’s the dilemma. Either a relation \(R\) is nothing to the things \(a\) and \(b\) it relates, in which case it cannot relate them. Or, it is something to them, in which case \(R\) must be related to them. But for \(R\) to be related to \(a\) and \(b\) there must be not only \(R\) and the things it relates, but also a subsidiary relation \(R'\) to relate \(R\) to them. But now the same problem arises with regard to \(R'\). It must be something to \(R\) and the things it related in order for \(R'\) to relate \(R\) to them and this requires a further subsidiary relation \(R''\) between \(R'\), \(R\), \(a\) and \(b\). But positing more relations to fix up the problem is only throwing good money after bad. We fall into an infinite regress because the same reasoning applies equally to \(R'\) and however many other subsidiary relations we subsequently introduce—this is commonly called “Bradley”s Regress’. As Bradley later summed up,

“while we keep to our terms and relation as external, no introduction of a third factor could help us to anything better than an endless renewal of our failure” (Bradley 1935: 643; van Inwagen 1993: 35–6).

So whichever horn of Bradley’s dilemma we choose, whether a relation \(R\) is nothing or something to the things it relates, we cannot make sense of \(R\) relating them. Bradley concluded that we should eliminate external relations from our ontology.

It is often claimed that Bradley’s eliminativism may be addressed by positing a special category of entities, either (1) facts (Hochberg 1978: 338–40; Armstrong 1989: 109–110, 1997: 118–9; Hossack 2007: 41–5) or (2) tropes (Maurin 2010: 321–3; Simons 2010: 201–3). The strategic idea they share is that we can embrace the second horn of Bradley’s dilemma without being stymied by his regress argument. Bradley assumed external relations to be general entities, i.e., universals, capable of relating different things from whatever things they happen to actually relate. It follows from this assumption that the mere existence of \(R\) and the things it relates cannot suffice for \(R\) to relate them, because \(R\) might have been engaged elsewhere relating other things, and this problem will persist however many subsidiary (universal) \(R\)s we introduce. But, it is argued, this problem can be avoided by either positing facts or tropes, which are particular rather than general entities. Both of these purported solutions are open to question. It seems that they presuppose what they set out to show: the capacity of relations to relate (MacBride 2011: 168–72). Why is this?

First, take (1): Hochberg, Armstrong and Hossack argue that the fact that \(a\Rel b\) does indeed suffice for \(R\) to hold between \(a\) and \(b\), because the fact that \(a\Rel b\) cannot exist unless \(R\) does hold between \(a\) and \(b\). So once the fact that \(a\Rel b\) has been admitted into our ontology, the later stages of Bradley’s regress either don’t arise or they harmlessly supervene upon the admission of this fact. But, MacBride counters, this presupposes that Bradley’s argument has already been disarmed. Ask yourself: what is a fact? What distinguishes the fact that \(a\Rel b\) from the mere plurality of its constituents: \(R\), \(a\), \(b\)? Just this: that the constituents of the fact are related. But Bradley’s argument is intended to establish that we cannot understand how it is possible for things to be related. So unless we have already established where Bradley’s argument goes wrong, we cannot appeal to the existence of facts because facts are cast into doubt by his argument too.

Next, take (2). Maurin and Simons argue that if we reject Bradley’s assumption that relations are general entities, i.e. universals, and hold instead that relations are a special class of particular entities, i.e., non-transferable tropes, then we can avoid Bradley’s Regress. What is a relation conceived as a “non-transferable trope”? It’s a relation \(r_1\) that’s borne essentially by the things it relates and which could not have been borne by anything else (Simons 2002/3: 6). Suppose \(r_1\) is borne by \(a\) to \(b\). Then \(r_1\) is a trope in the sense that it is non-repeatable and so is not a “one-over many”, not a universal. And \(r_1\) is non-transferable in the sense that it could not be transferred from one pair of particulars to another, i.e., \(r_1\) could not be borne by \(c\) to \(d\) where \(c \ne a\) and \(d \ne b\). So, necessarily, if \(r_1\) exists then (i) \(a\) and \(b\) exist and (ii) \(a\mathbin{r_1} b\). So in virtue of the manner in which \(r_1\) depends upon the things it relates it follows that the mere existence of \(r_1\) accounts for \(a\) and \(b\)’s being related without having to go down the route of appealing to subsidiary relations to glue them together. But again, this proposal assumes that relations really do relate, and therefore that Bradley’s regress has already been disarmed. By way of analogy, consider the Problem of Evil: the difficulty of theoretically squaring God’s omnipotence, omniscience, omnibenevolence, etc., with the (apparent) fact of unnecessary evil in the world. Of course if God exists then there cannot be any unnecessary evil, i.e., there must be a solution to the Problem of Evil. But we don’t provide a theoretical solution to the Problem by simply positing God. That doesn’t make any easier the theoretical task of squaring what appears to be unnecessary evil with the nature of an omnipotent, omniscient, omnibenevolent deity. Similarly we don’t provide an effective theoretical response to Bradley’s argument by simply positing relational tropes. Positing them doesn’t provide an explanation of how a relation can succeed in relating some things without requiring to be related by a further relation to them.

Bradley’s problem with relations would be resolved if we could achieve a perspective whereby we appreciated that the bearing of a relation isn’t itself a relation or require a further relation, whatever grammar may suggest (Armstrong 1978a: 106–111; Grossman 1983: 167–8; Lewis 2002: 6–7). But we won’t achieve that perspective until we can provide a diagnosis of Bradley’s reasoning that relieves us of the temptation to think that the bearing of a relation is itself a relation.

Bertrand Russell dismissed Bradley’s argument on the grounds that philosophers who disbelieve in the reality of external relations cannot possibly interpret those numerous parts of sciences which appear to be committed to external relations (Russell 1924: 339). Russell’s argument bears comparison to Quine’s famous indispensability argument for mathematics: just as we cannot make sense of scientific discourse without taking seriously those portions irredeemably committed to, e.g., numbers, we cannot make sense of scientific discourse without taking seriously those portions committed to, e.g., spatio-temporal relations (Quine 1981: 149–50). From a methodological point of view, Russell deemed it more likely that an error is concealed somewhere in Bradley’s argument than that modern science should have incorporated so fundamental a falsehood, i.e., portrayed a world of spatio-temporal relations when really there are none. Of course even if we have good or even overwhelming reason to think that Bradley’s argument must be wrong, this doesn’t relieve us of the philosophical responsibility of determining where exactly Bradley slipped up.

3. Reductionism about Internal Relations

What about internal relations? Do we need to acknowledge their existence? We distinguished 3 senses of “internal relation” in our preliminary discussion: internal relations are determined by the mere existence of the things they relate, or internal relations are determined by the intrinsic characters of the things they relate, or internal relations supervene upon the intrinsic characters of the things they relate. So, in one sense or another, it suffices for the obtaining of an internal relation that either the things it relates exist or that the things it relates have such-and-such intrinsic characters. On this basis, some philosophers have concluded that there is no need to admit internal relations as additional pieces of furniture in the Universe (Fisk 1972: 146–9; Armstrong 1978b: 86; Campbell 1990: 99–101; Simons 2010: 204–5; 2014: 314–5; Lowe 2013: 242, 2016: 105–6; Heil 2009: 316–7, 2012: 144–6, 2016: 130, Lowe 2016:102–11, Keinänen 2020). Why do they think this? Truths about internal relations aren’t necessarily equivalent to truths about the things they relate or the intrinsic characters of the things they relate. Nevertheless, all the truths about internal relations are determined by the existence or the intrinsic characters of the things they relate, or supervene upon them. So internal relations are variously declared to be “no addition of being” (Armstrong) or “absent from the fundamental ontology” (Heil) or, more clearly, “there are no such things” (Simons).

Consider an example:

  1. Ben Vorlich, a Scottish mountain, is taller than Ben Vane, its neighbour.
  2. Ben Vorlich is 3094 ft high whilst Ben Vane is 3002 ft.

(1) and (2) aren’t necessarily equivalent because Ben Vorlich might have been taller than Ben Vane even if Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane had had different heights from the ones they actually have, i.e., (2) doesn’t follow from (1). Nevertheless, Ben Vorlich’s being taller than Ben Vane is determined by its having the height it does (3094 ft) and Ben Vane’s having the height it does (3002 ft); it isn’t possible for these mountains to have the heights they do whilst Ben Vorlich fail to be taller than Ben Vane. So the being taller than relation is internal in Armstrong’s sense. This relation is also internal in Lewis’s sense which, recall, relies upon comparison between pairs of a relation’s relata (Lewis 1986: 62). Ben Lomond doesn’t stand to Ben More as Ben Vorlich does to Ben Vane, because Ben Lomond is 3196 ft, Ben More, 3852 ft. Hence Ben Vorlich’s being taller than Ben Vane supervenes, in Lewis’s sense, upon the heights of Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane. So once Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane have been bestowed with their respective heights there is no need to admit a further (internal) relation to account for Ben Vorlich’s being taller than Ben Vane (Campbell 1990: 100, 103; Lewis 1994: 294).

This, broadly speaking, reductionist argument is open to question in a variety of respects. Some philosophers have maintained that it cannot be effective because we literally perceive proportions and other internal relations (Mulligan 1991; Hochberg 2013: 232). These relations must exist, otherwise we couldn’t perceive them. So, they conclude, something must have gone wrong with this argument because it leads to the mistaken conclusion that there aren’t any internal relations out there to be perceived.

More generally, this reductionist argument assumes that if an internal relation \(R\) isn’t required to perform the role of determining that \(R\) holds between the things it relates, because that role has already been discharged by the intrinsic characteristics of the things it relates, then \(R\) doesn’t exist at all or doesn’t constitute “an addition to the world’s furniture” (Armstrong 1997: 87). But from the fact that \(R\) doesn’t fulfill one role it doesn’t follow that it isn’t required to fulfill another. It doesn’t follow because there may still be other good reasons for us to believe that internal relations exist, or constitute “an addition to the world’s furniture”.

To bring the issues here into focus we will need to take on board two further distinctions. First, the distinction between truth-making and ontological commitment. A truth-maker for a statement \(S\) is (at least) something the existence of which determines (necessitates) that \(S\) is true (Armstrong 2004: 5–7). By contrast, something \(x\) is an ontological commitment of \(S\) if, roughly speaking, \(S\) could not be true unless \(x\) existed (Quine 169: 95). Typically, a statement \(S\) incurs ontological commitment to an entity or some entities because we refer to it or quantify over them when we make the statement. It’s easy to run truth-making and ontological commitment together but it’s important to keep them separate. A statement \(S\) cannot be true unless the entities to which \(S\) is ontologically committed exist. So it’s a necessary condition of the truth of \(S\) that the entities to which \(S\) is ontologically committed exist. By contrast, it’s a sufficient condition for the truth of \(S\) that a truth-maker for \(S\) exist because a truth-maker for \(S\) determines that \(S\) is true.

Armed with the distinction between truth-making and ontological commitment, we are now able to state a very general shortcoming of the argument. Let it be agreed that Ben Vorlich’s being the height it is and Ben Vane’s being the height it is together make true the claim that Ben Vorlich is taller than Ben Vane; so no further truth-makers are required for this claim to be true. But it doesn’t follow that we aren’t ontologically committed to the existence of an internal relation between Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane when we make this claim. We surely are ontologically committed to Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane when we make the claim that one is taller than the other even though they’re not themselves truth-makers for this claim. They’re not truth-makers for this claim because they might have existed even though Ben Vane was taller than Ben Vorlich or the same height. But recognising that the class of ontological commitments and the class of truth-makers for a given claim may be different classes opens up the possibility that we may be ontologically committed to an internal relation between Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane even though this relation isn’t a truthmaker for this claim either (MacBride 2011: 162–6).

The second distinction we need is between thick and thin relations (Mulligan 1998: 342–7). Some examples. Thick relations: loves, kills, gives. Thin relations: identity, resemblance, greater than. Thick relations have more of a “material” content and are less “formal” than thin relations. It correspondingly makes more sense to think of thick relations as “topic-neutral”. Thin relations, by contrast to thick relations, are typically internal (see Clementz 2014 and Johansson 2014 for further discussion of the thick/thin distinction).

We are now equipped state another, more specific gap in the reductionist argument. Whilst Ben Vorlich and Ben Vane’s having the heights they do avoids the need to admit the existence of a thick (internal) relation that Ben Vorlich bears to Ben Vane, this doesn’t avoid the need to admit the existence of a thin (internal) relation. This is because we need to explain why Ben Vorlich’s having the height it does (3094 ft) and Ben Vane’s having the height it does (3004 ft) entails that Ben Vorlich is taller than Ben Vane. The answer is that the thin relation being greater than holds between the number of feet in height that Ben Vorlich has and the number of feet in height that Ben Vane has (Russell 1903: §214; Bigelow & Pargetter 1990: 55–6. So internal relations may not (in general) be required to perform the role of truth-makers for comparative claims. Nonetheless thin internal relations may perform an indispensable role in explaining why the truth-makers for comparative claims are equipped to make such claims true, rather than leaving this a matter of brute inexplicable necessity—because, in this case, the heights of the mountains in question lie in a certain relation of proportion to one another. Similarly Ben Vorlich’s being taller than Ben Vane’s supervenes upon their heights but this is only intelligible because the height of Ben Vorlich is larger than the height of Ben Vane.

This leaves us a choice. Either we can rewind the argument and admit internal relations, whether thick or thin, as additions to the world’s furniture (Bigelow & Pargetter 1990: 56–60). Or we can adopt the more austere view that only admits thin (internal) relations to hold amongst intrinsic characteristics (Mulligan 1998: 347).

The situation may be summed up in schematic terms. There are true comparative claims of the form \(a\Rel b\) which are either determined to be true by, or supervene upon, the intrinsic natures of the things they relate, \(Fa \amp Gb\). Philosophers of a reductionist persuasion have argued that this shows there is no need to admit an internal relation \((R)\) over and above the intrinsic characteristics or monadic foundations of the things related \((F, G)\). But the intrinsic characteristics of the things related only determine the truth of the claim that \(a\Rel b\), or the truth of the claim that \(a\Rel b\) only supervenes upon \(Fa \amp Gb\), because these characteristics stand in an internal relation themselves, \(F \fR G\). Because the monadic foundations, \(Fa\) and \(Gb\), are only empowered to determine that \(a\Rel b\) because \(F\) and \(G\) lie in this internal relation, \(\fR\), it follows that internal relations still perform an indispensable role in our theorising about the world. One line of response to this argument is to deny that the ontological commitments and the truth-makers for a claim might come apart by defining ontological commitment in terms of truth making, by roughly speaking, maintaining that to be is to be a truth-maker, but then an alternative theory of truth will need to be provided for ordinary and formal languages if quantificational structure is never ontologically committing and it unclear whether this can be done (Heil 2016: 129; MacBride 2018: 157).

The case against reductionism about internal relations has proceeded so far from a relatively a priori basis. But there’s also a case to be made against it on a posteriori grounds. Grant for the sake of argument the claim that if a relation is internal then it doesn’t count as an ontological addition. The significance of this claim, when it comes to providing an inventory of the world’s furniture, depends upon the extent to which relational truths have monadic foundations. But relativity theory, quantum theory and even classical mechanics provide an a posteriori basis for doubting that there are very many, if any, \(F\)s and \(G\)s capable of serving as monadic foundations for target \(R\)s, i.e., intrinsic properties to which a significant range of relations may be reduced.

It is often taken for granted by metaphysicians that the fundamental quantities of physics provide a ready source of monadic foundations because physical quantities are intrinsic characteristics. The vision of reality metaphysicians typically ascribe to physics is akin to Lewis’s doctrine of “Humean Supervenience”, according to which there are intrinsic properties which need nothing bigger than a point to be instantiated and there’s no difference without a difference in the arrangement of intrinsic properties over points (Lewis 1986: ix–xvi). And certainly some metaphysicians have endeavoured to make good upon this vision, arguing, for example, that velocity is an intrinsic property (Tooley 1988; Bigelow & Pargetter 1990: 62–82). But not only is this view contentious, there are many other notions in classical mechanics, such as force, stress, strain and elasticity, represented using vectors and tensors, that belie the conception of fundamental physical quantities as intrinsic (Butterfield 2006, 2011).

When we turn from classical mechanics to relativity theory and quantum theory, the a posteriori case against conceiving physical quantities as intrinsic is even stronger. Consider mass and charge, most metaphysicians’ favourite and commonly relied upon examples of intrinsic properties of a piece of matter (in particular a point particle). In relativity theory, mass is identified with energy (“mass-energy”). In a relativistic field theory, such as Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism, the all-pervading electromagnetic field has mass-energy. It also has momentum, stress and other traditionally mechanical properties. So mass is no longer conceived as an intrinsic property of localized lumps of stuff, let alone of point particles. Furthermore, the attribution of mass, momentum, stress, etc., to the electromagnetic field, or to a matter field such as a continuous fluid, depends upon the metrical structure of spacetime. So these quantities are not intrinsic, but, rather, relational properties. They are properties that the radiation or matter field in question has in virtue of its relation to spacetime structure (Lehmkuhl 2011).

In quantum theory there are even fewer candidates for intrinsic properties. Even in elementary quantum mechanics, the closest analogue of a point particle as classically understood (“a quantum particle”) is an all-pervading field, viz. an assignment, for each instant of time, of a (complex) number to every point of space. Here, the mass of the quantum particle cannot be attributed to any single point of space, but must be associated with the whole field, although not in the simple manner of “spreading the mass out” as a classical mass density distribution. (The same remark applies to the quantum particle’s charge.) Turning to quantum field theory: here again, the notion of particle is radically changed from the idea of a classical point particle and from the idea of a quantum particle. There are not various quantum particles, each of them represented by a complex-valued field as above, and each of them, say, electrons. Rather there is a single all-pervading electron field and each electron, as treated in elementary quantum mechanics, is replaced by a unit of energetic excitation of the electron field. The same goes for other types of matter, such as quarks. According to quantum field theory, quarks are really excitations of an all-pervading quark field. Besides, quantum field theory exhibits a second, and fundamentally different, way in which mass and charge fail to be intrinsic properties. This goes under the label of “renormalization”. In short, the mass and charge of a particle à la quantum field theory, i.e., a unit of excitation of an all-pervading field, depends upon the length-scale at which you choose to describe, or to experimentally probe, the field (Butterfield 2014, 2015).

So, to sum up this case against reductionism about relations: there seem to be far fewer (if any) monadic physical properties than the reductionist view needs. But this it is not the only case that has been made. It has also been argued on the basis of quantum entanglement, the fact that the quantum states of entangled particles cannot be described independently of one another, that physics is committed to relations that don’t supervene upon intrinsic properties (Teller 1986). More radically, it has been argued that a consideration of quantum entanglement pushes us towards the metaphysical outlook that there are no intrinsic properties (Esfeld 2004, 2016) or even that there are no objects but only relations (French & Ladyman 2003; Ladyman & Ross 2007: 130–89, Ladyman 2016; for objections see Psillos 2001, 2006, Brinceño & Mumford 2016).

Consider next the related suggestion that spatio-temporal relations are internal relations between, variously, space-time points, regions or events (Simons 2010: 207–8, 2014: 312–4; Simons 2016: 2010: 207–8; Heil 2012: 147; Lowe 2016: 109–111). General relativity makes serious trouble for this suggestion. The thinking behind the suggestion is that it belongs to the essential natures of space-time points, etc., that they bear the catalogue of spatio-temporal relations they do. In philosophy of physics, the view is called “metrical essentialism”, the doctrine that points have their metrical properties and relations essentially (Maudlin 1988). From metrical essentialism it follows that the mere existence of a point, etc., already suffices to determine that it inhabits this network of spatio-temporal relations. Hence, it is argued, there is no need to admit spatio-temporal relations, or at least consider spatio-temporal relations as ontological additions to the furniture of the Universe. But, as well as the a priori concerns already aired, this argument for refusing to admit spatio-temporal relations as ontological additions is encumbered by the a posteriori difficulties of the metrical essentialism it presupposes.

These difficulties for metrical essentialism arise from the fact that in general relativity space-time structure varies from one model, i.e., possible world, to another (Butterfield 1989: 16–27). We cannot leave points or regions to themselves to settle their internal relations, because general relativity denies the idea of a spatial-temporal framework whose make-up is settled independently of the matter or radiation. So there isn’t a stable once-and-for-all class of points or regions which once posited suffice for the purposes of modern physics, hence no stable class of truth-makers that suffice for making all the distance-duration claims true.

It may help to understand this debate about space-time points if we consider the following line of response on behalf of metrical essentialism. According to metrical essentialism, points have their metrical properties and relations, i.e., space-time framework, essentially. So if the space-time framework differs between models then the points must differ between models too. But this view isn’t compromised by the fact, as Butterfield (1989) points out, that in general relativity the space-time framework varies from one model to another; it only follows that the points must vary between these models too. What, however, this line of response fails to take into account is how extremely fragile spatio-temporal relations must be conceived to be when metrical essentialism is combined with general relativity.

Take a possible world which is truly described by a dynamical theory of space-time (i.e., described by general relativity and any likely successor to it). Now take a second possible world which differs from the first only with respect to a tiny change, on a millimeter scale as regards length, and on a milligram scale as regards mass. This involves altering spatio-temporal relations throughout the entire universe. Hence it’s a consequence of metrical essentialism that in the second possible world, all space-time points are non-identical to those in the first. But surely it’s implausible that such a small adjustment should add up to such a world-altering difference (thanks here to Jeremy Butterfield).

We are now in a position to evaluate David Lewis’s claim that whilst distance relations fail to supervene on the intrinsic characters of the things they relate, there is nevertheless a different way in which relations of distance do supervene on intrinsic character:

If, instead of taking a duplicate of the electron and a duplicate of the proton, we take a duplicate of the whole atom, then it will exhibit the same electron-proton distance as the original atom. Although distance fails to supervene on the intrinsic nature of the relata taken separately, it does supervene on the intrinsic nature of the composite of the relata taken together – in this case the composite hydrogen atom. (1986: 62)

This remark has suggested to some philosophers that we can do away with relations generally because we need only posit the composites upon whose intrinsic nature the relation supervenes (Parsons 2009: 223–5). But Lewis’s view and the more general form of reductionism inspired by it encounter a dilemma. Either (1) the composite is just the proton and electron taken together. But then the distance between them fails to supervene upon the intrinsic character of the composite, because there are duplicates of the proton and duplicates of the electron that vary in distance. Or (2) the composite is more than just the proton and electron, i.e., the proton and electron related together in some (external) way. But then we haven’t gotten rid of external relations in favour of internal ones but only presupposed them.

Can this dilemma for Lewis be sidestepped by the following manoeuvre? Suppose the composite is the mereological fusion of the proton and the electron. Then can’t we say that the fusion has its intrinsic character, and the distance relation between the parts of the fusion supervenes on this character?

But this can’t be enough to say. We don’t really have any idea of what the intrinsic properties of fusions are because the axioms of mereology are silent about the intrinsic characters of fusions. So we don’t really have any idea of whether the distance relations of their parts supervene upon their properties. Perhaps fusions don’t have much, if any, intrinsic character! Since we don’t know much about these things, we’re not in a position to rule out the possibility of a duplicate of Lewis’s proton-electron fusion being a fusion that has parts which are a different distance apart than the original proton and electron Lewis described.

Of course, there’s no logical bar to putting forward a theory that posits a rich supply of fusions whose intrinsic natures are such that the distance relations that hold between the parts of these fusions supervenes upon their intrinsic characters. But why believe such a theory? It’s difficult to see how the supervenience of distance relations upon intrinsic characters of fusions could ever be explained (’superdupervenience’), because it’s difficult to see how an intrinsic property \(F\) of one thing \(X\) can intelligibly give rise to an external relation \(R\) between two other things \(x\) and \(y\), even if \(x\) and \(y\) are parts of \(X\).

Finally, in the light of the foregoing discussion, Lewis’s view is open to an objection from physics: there is no absolute fact of the matter about the distance between the electron and proton independently of facts about the physical fields more generally, e.g., the electromagnetic field and the electron field, i.e., facts concerning what is happening elsewhere. So the distance relation of the electron and fusion cannot supervene upon the intrinsic character of the proton-electron fusion. It follows that distance relations cannot be external in Lewis’s sense.

4. The Nature of Relations: Order and Direction

Supposing they exist, what is the nature of relations, whether internal or external? It is the crucial feature of binary non-symmetric relations, which distinguishes them from binary symmetric relations, or, more generally, distinguishes relations which fail to be strictly symmetric from strictly symmetric ones, that they bestow order upon the things they relate. Non-symmetric relations do so, because they admit of differential application, i.e., for any such relation there are multiple ways in which it potentially applies to the things it relates. So, in particular, for every binary non-symmetric \(R\), \(a\Rel b \ne b\Rel a\). But can we say anything more about how it is possible for non-symmetric relations to admit of differential application? More generally, can we say anything discursive about the origins of order?

According to what is sometimes called the “standard” account of non-symmetric relations, we can (Russell 1903: §94; Grossman 1983: 164; Paul 2012: 251–2). A non-symmetrical relation \(R\) has a direction whereby it travels from one thing to another. What distinguishes \(a\Rel b\) from \(b\Rel a\) is that \(R\) runs from \(a\) to \(b\) in the former case and \(b\) to \(a\) in the latter. So differential application is possible because non-symmetric relations have direction, i.e., because non-symmetric relations run one way, rather than another, amongst the things they relate. (See Johansson 2011 for an argument that ‘direction’ is really a cluster term covering different logical and intentional notions.)

The standard account faces the serious objection that it is liable to over-generate relations, specifically converse ones, giving rise to an over-abundance of states that results from the holding of converse relations (Fine 2000: 2–5; cf. Russell 1913: 85–7; Castañeda 1975: 239–40; Armstrong 1978b: 42, 94; for related puzzles arising out of the commitments of Armstrong 1997, see Hochberg 1999: 157–60, Cross 2000 and Newman 2002). Employing the notion of direction that the standard account uses to explain order, we can define the converse of a non-symmetric \(R\) as the relation \(R^*\) that runs from \(b\) to \(a\) whenever \(R\) runs from \(a\) to \(b\). But once given this notion of a (distinct) converse, it is difficult to deny that \(R\) has a converse. This is because it would be arbitrary to admit the existence of \(R\) whilst denying its converse (or vice versa). Hence, the standard view is committed to the general principle,

(Converses) Every non-symmetric relation has a distinct converse.

But the admission of converse relations threatens to conflict with two plausible sounding principles about the number of states that arise from the holding of non-symmetric relations and their converses.

(Identity) Any state that arises from the holding of a relation \(R\) is identical to a state that arises from the holding of its converse \(R^*\).

(Uniqueness) No one state arises from the holding of more than one relation.

Support for Identity is garnered from intuitions: that the cat’s being on top of the mat is the very same state as the mat’s being underneath the cat, that Obama’s being taller than Putin is the very same state as Putin’s being shorter than Obama, and so on. Uniqueness is based upon more overtly theoretical grounds. States are often conceived as complexes of things, properties and relations. They are, so to speak, metaphysical molecules built up from their constituents, so states built up from different things or properties or relations cannot be identical. Hence it cannot be the case that the holding of two distinct relations give rise to the same state.

Now one problem with the standard view is that Converses, Identity and Uniqueness form an inconsistent triad, assuming there are non-symmetric relations. Take the cat’s being on top of the mat. Identity dictates that this state is the very same state as the mat’s being under the cat. But if there is only one state in play here, Uniqueness tells us that this state can only arise from the holding of one relation. So the relation that holds between the cat and the mat in virtue of which the cat is on top of the mat must be identical to the relation that holds between the cat and the mat in virtue of which the mat is underneath the cat. But this conflicts with Converses which tells us these relations are distinct.

In the face of this inconsistency a number of theoretical options are open to us. If we wish to maintain the standard view that non-symmetric relations have direction then something has to give. (1) Either we can give up Identity, Uniqueness, or both, or we can ditch Converses. Indeed it has been argued that Converses should be ditched anyway because it gives rise to a special kind of semantic indeterminacy: we cannot establish by our use of a sign for a binary non-symmetric relation \(R\) that we mean to pick it out rather than its converse \(R^*\). This is because we can shift the referent of a predicate from a given relation to its converse whilst leaving undisturbed the truth conditions of the statement in which the predicate occurs by making compensating adjustments to the manner in which the names flanking the predicate are interpreted (Williamson 1985: 252–55, 1987; van Inwagen 2006: 458–68 but see Liebesman 2013 for a reply to Williamson). But whether Converses is ditched to avoid semantic indeterminacy, or because Converses, Identity and Uniqueness form an inconsistent triad, or for some other reason, the link between Converses and the standard view will have to be broken. (2) Alternatively we can jettison Converses but throw out the standard view with it. But if that’s the option we choose, then we will have to go back to the drawing board to provide a fresh account of differential application that doesn’t appeal to direction.

There is certainly room for development if we go down route (1). The intuitions that provide evidence for Identity are, like intuitions generally, considered by many philosophers to be relatively weak sources of evidence, because there may be all variety of psychological, historical and sociological forces responsible for our holding this or that view to be intuitive which have little to do with whether the view is true or credible. There’s also a tradition of conceiving states or facts as capable of being analysed into more than one collection of constituents, i.e., a tradition that denies Uniqueness (Frege 1884: §64; Hodes 1982; see Macbride 2007: 54–55 and Liebesman 2014 for counterarguments to Fine’s assumption; but see Leo 2013 for a view which denies uniqueness for states).

Alternatively we may leave Identity and Uniqueness in place but question whether the standard view really does give rise to Converses. According to one line of thought (Russell 1913: 86–7), it would be arbitrary for us to choose from the inside, so to speak, one binary non-symmetric relation at the expense of its converse. But, it may be argued, this doesn’t preclude nature choosing for us from the outside, providing an externalist rather than an internalist foundation for admitting a non-symmetric relation but not its converse. Nevertheless, even if Converses is ditched there is another obstacle to the standard view, namely that it appears to give rise to questions about direction for which there are no sensible answers, even if doesn’t over-generate converse relations and states to house them (MacBride 2014: 5–7, 9–10). Consider the states, (a) Antony is married to Fulvia and (b) Antony is to the left of Fulvia. If these states arise from their respective relations travelling from one thing they relate to another, then there must be a fact of the matter about which things proceed from and which to. So, we may ask, do they both proceed from the same thing or do they proceed from different things? It doesn’t seem that there could be a sensible answer to this question and so we should avoid an account of differential application that commits us to there being such recherché and undetectable facts of the matter. (But note that whilst many philosophers have felt the pull of these kind of intuitive considerations, others have argued that is is necessary to introduce ordinal properties or relations to impose structure upon relational facts. For example, Hochberg posits “ordering relations” (Hochberg 1987, 1999: 180–81) whilst Tegtmeier posits “ordinators”, such as “coming first” and “coming second” in a fact (Tegtmeier 1990, 2004, 2016).)

What are the options if we go down route (2)? Some philosophers have suggested that if we ditch Converses then we will have to give up non-symmetric relations altogether (van Inwagen 2006: 453). But this presupposes that the only way to account for the distinctive feature of non-symmetric relations, viz. differential application, is to appeal to the standard view. However, philosophers that go down this second route endeavour to account for differential application by different means than direction and thereby earn the right to hold onto non-symmetric relations. We can distinguish three broad strategies for explaining differential application without direction, namely (1) positionalism, (2) anti-positionalism, and (3) primitivism, although this does not exhaust the range of possibilities considered in the literature (consider, for example, the view that relations are properties of sequences discussed above (sec. 1).

First, positionalism may be roughly sketched as the view that an \(n\)-ary relation has \(n\) argument positions, where argument positions are conceived as themselves entities, and, crucially, there is no intrinsic order to the argument places of a relation; neither argument position of a binary relation is the first or the second, etc. (Castañeda 1972, 1975; Williamson 1985: 257; Grossman 1992: 57; Armstrong 1997: 90–1; Cross 2002: 219–223, Fine 2000: 10–16; Orilia 2011; Gilmore 2013). In the case of a binary non-symmetric relation \(R\), this amounts to the idea that \(R\) is associated with two further entities, % and #, its argument positions, and \(R\) holds between two given relata \(a\) and \(b\) relative to an assignment of objects to % and #. The difference between \(a\Rel b\) and \(b\Rel a\) (differential application) is then explained in terms of the different relative assignments of \(a\) and \(b\) to % and #: \(a\) to % and \(b\) to # in one case, and \(b\) to % and \(a\) to # in the other. But since the argument positions do not themselves exhibit any significant order or direction, there is no basis here for introducing converses, i.e., relations that differ only with respect to their direction of travel.

Different versions of positionalism vary with regard to \((i)\) the nature of argument positions, crucially upon whether they can be shared by different relations, and \((ii)\) the variety of argument positions, whether there are different kinds of position specifically suited to different kinds of relata, and \((iii)\) the complexity of the relation whereby things are assigned to positions. According to Orilia’s onto-thematic role view, positions are capable of recurring in different relations and suited by their nature to different sorts of filling (Orilia 2011, 2014, Paolini Paoletti 2016, 2018b sec. 2, and for an earlier version inspired by Leibniz, Orilia 2008). For example, the loves relation has agent and patient roles, roles which also recur in the hates relation. Other more complex relations involve more and different roles, for example, theme, location, instrument, goal etc. Orilia’s idea is that the schedule of ontological roles belonging to relations should be informed by the linguistic programme of identifying thematic roles in natural language because this helps us to provide informative generalisations about what different relations have in common (see Davis 2011 for a helpful introduction to the thematic role literature in linguistics).

By contrast, other versions of positionalism conceive of positions as unique to the relations in which they figure. Some positionalists of this stripe conceives of each position as being assigned a unique occupant (Gilmore 2013). But others whilst sharing the assumption that positions are unique to the relations in which they figure, also maintain that it is a mistake to assume that there is a 1-1 correspondence between positions and their occupants. So this version of positonalism conceives relations more liberally as having positions capable of being assigned several distinct occupants at once (see, for example, Armstrong 1997: 91, Yi 1999: 169; Fine 2000: 17, MacBride 2005: 588). Further sophistication is added by the idea that positions can be occupied by a number of things varying between fixed limits (Hazen&Taylor 1992: 376, 390, Dixon 2018: 207) and by the suggestion that the assignment of things to positions should also be relative to a number to allow for one and the same thing to simultaneously occur more than once in the same position (Dixon 2018: 213–6).

A different line is taken by Donnelly’s relative positionalism, according to which positions are a kind of “relative property” (Donnelly 2016). Donnelly takes being north as an example of a relative property: a property because it is had by one thing but only relative to something else, in this case a location. Her basic idea is that corresponding to each n-ary relation R is a package of relative properties (as many as n factorial properties) such that when n things instantiate R they instantiate these properties relative to one another (Donnelly 2016: 91). It is a distinctive feature of the view that by positing for each relation a bespoke package of relative properties which models the logical character of the relation in question, relative positonalism is able to handle relations of arbitrary complexity, including symmetric and partially symmetric relations (Donnelly 2016: 88–96, Dixon 2019: 56–67). By contrast, the onto-thematic role approach doesn’t provide a once and for all recipe for positing roles but takes this to be a matter to be settled by systematic “ontological investigation” into the character of relations as we find them (Orilia 2014: 296–301 but see objections from MacBride 2014: 11–12, Ostertag 2019: 1492–5).

There are two immediate challenges faced by the different versions of positionalism. Can the account be generalized to cover all relations? If, for example, the binary symmetric relation that holds between two things \(a\) and \(b\) whenever \(a\) is next to \(b\) has two argument positions, £ and $, then there should be two possible ways of assigning \(a\) and \(b\) to £ and $. But this means (absurdly) that there are two different ways for \(a\) and \(b\) to be next to one another, i.e., symmetric relations admit of differential application too! Orilia’s onto-thematic role approach handles this kind of case by conceiving of thematic roles as “intra-repeatable” (Orilia 2014: 294), so there is only one role or position in play in this relation (£ = $) and so the possibility of different assignments to different roles or positions doesn’t arise. Similarly, Dixon’s “pocket” theory handles this case by conceiving the next to relation as having only one pocket. But, as Fine (2000: 17–18, 2007: 58–9) and MacBride (2007: 36–44) argue, and as Dixon (2018: 31, n.21) acknowledges, this kind of strategy doesn’t straightforwardly extend to more complex partially symmetric relations such as being arranged clockwise in a circle in that very order, or, playing-tug-of-war. Accordingly Orilia (2011: 6–9, 2014: 296–301) proposes a programme of analysis whereby more complex relations are reduced to simpler ones that the onto-thematic role approach can accommodate. By contrast, relative positionalism can handle these kinds of partially symmetric relations without any analysis (Donnelly 2016: 88–96, Dixon 2019: 56–67), but not multigrade relations which lack a fixed arity n, hence cannot be modelled by a n! package of relative properties (Donnelly 2016: 94, Dixon 2019: 59) (For further criticisms of positionalism see Hochberg 1999: 153, 2000: 40–1).

The more general challenge that faces the different versions of positionalism is whether we have a better understanding of positions and the assignment relation that the different versions of positionalism propose, than we do of the relations that positions and assignment are used to explain (Fine 2000: 16; MacBride 2014: 11–12; Orilia 2014: 302–3). Consider, for example, Donnelly’s claim that the application of n-ary relations needs to be explained in terms of packages of n! relative properties. One problem, acknowledged by Donnelly (2016: 98), is the ontological cost of having to trade in each relation for so many properties. Another problem concerns why relative properties of a given package cannot be instantiated independently of one another but only relative to other properties belonging to that package, even though each relative property is meant to be unary. The obvious explanation is that such properties aren’t unary at all but to be explained in terms of an underlying relation (Bigelow & Pargetter 1990: 55, MacBride: 2000: 83). So saying that one thing x has a property relative to something else y having another relative property etc is more perspicuously rendered by saying that x bears a relation to y.

Both the standard view and the different versions of positionalism assume that the differential application of a non-symmetric relation \(R\) with respect to \(a\) and \(b\) is to be explained “locally” in terms of \(R\), whether its direction or argument positions, and the things it relates, \(a\) and \(b\). Anti-positionalism is the doctrine, due to Kit Fine, which eschews direction and argument positions and explains differential application by abandoning the assumption that differential application is to be explained locally (Fine 2000: 20–32). According to anti-positionalism, the difference between \(a\Rel b\) and \(b\Rel a\) arises from how these states are inter-connected with other states that arise from \(R\) holding of other relata. So order is not a feature of given state capable of being isolated, but only emerges over a totality of states to which \(R\) gives rise. What distinguishes \(a\Rel b\) from \(b\Rel a\) is that inter-connectedness with other states such as \(c\Rel d\). Pay special attention to the relative arrangement of the schematic names in the following sentence. Whereas the state \(a\Rel b\) is a completion of \(R\) by \(a, b\) in the same manner as \(c\Rel d\) is a completion of \(R\) by \(c, d\), the state \(b\Rel a\) isn’t. The state \(b\Rel a\) is a completion of \(R\) by \(b\), \(a\) in the same manner as \(c\Rel d\) is a completion of \(R\) by \(c, d\) (Fine 2000: 21). However, Fine doesn’t take the notion of two states being put together “in the same manner” as primitive, but explains this in terms of a substitution relation. To say that a state \(s\) is a completion of relation \(R\) by \(a_1, a_2 \ldots, a_n\) in the same manner as a state \(t\) is completion of \(R\) by \(b_1, b_2 \ldots, b_n\) is to say that \(s\) is completion of \(R\) by \(a_1, a_2 \ldots, a_n\) that results from simultaneously substituting \(a_1, a_2 \ldots, a_n\) for \(b_1\), b\(_2 \ldots, b_n\) in \(t\) (and vice versa) (Fine 2000: 25–6). Fine goes on to suggest that the notion of simultaneous substitution of many objects may be defined, under certain conditions, in terms of the single substitution of one object (Fine 2000: 26 n. 15). Converses is avoided because the notion of direction, in terms of which the distinction between converse relations is drawn, is eschewed. This is because substitution is doing all the work.

Fine’s version of anti-positionalism has certain limitations, including the assumption that states arising from a single relation have a unique composition and that substitution operates on objects rather than occurrences of objects. Leo (2013) provides a more fully developed version of anti-positonalism that addresses these limitations from a more formal point of view. According to Leo, relational complexes are structured perspectives on states ‘out there’ in reality, relational complexes have occurrences of objects, and different complexes of the same relation may correspond to the same state. It is key to this approach that substitution is a primitive operation taking a complex and an assignment of objects to the occurrences of objects in the complex as input and returning another complex as output. For example, for the complex of Anthony’s loving Cleopatra, substituting Abelard for the occurrence of Anthony and Eloise for the occurrence of Cleopatra results in the complex of Abelard’s loving Eloise. Substitution is identified in terms of basic principles governing substitutions, in particular a composition principle, which forms the heart of an antipositional theory of relations (Leo 2013: 363; for further developments and defence of this version of anti-positionalism, see Leo 2008a, 2008b, 2010, 2014, 2016).

By abandoning the assumption that differential application is to be explained locally, anti-positionalism in effect tells us that we’re misconceiving the logical form of our ordinary relational judgements. Contrary to their surface form, relational judgements always have a suppressed argument position for other states, by which means the state we are making a judgement about is implicitly compared to another. The following two objections arise (MacBride 2007: 47–53). First of all, anti-positionalism presupposes a non-symmetric relation of substitution to explain differential application. But this suggests that the explanation anti-positonalism provides involves a circularity because it uses a non-symmetric relation, substitution, whose differential application is take for granted. Take the state \(a\Rel b\). The result of substituting \(a\) for \(b\) is the state \(a\Rel a\); where the result of substituting \(b\) for \(a\) is the state \(b\Rel b\). The outcomes are different so the substitution relation must be order sensitive. Secondly, anti-positionalism entails that there cannot be lonely binary relations, i.e., relations which only hold of exactly two things. But prima facie we should be able to distinguish \(a\Rel b\) from \(b\Rel a\) even if \(R\) holds between nothing except \(a\) and \(b\), Antony’s loving Cleopatra from Cleopatra’s loving Antony even if the world is otherwise loveless (see, for replies to these objections, Fine 2007: 59–62, Wieland 2010: 487–93, Leo 2014: 279–81).

The third strategy, primitivism, seeks to avoid the difficulties that threaten positionalism and anti-positionalism by taking the radical step of asking us to reconfigure our explanatory settings. It’s a familiar thought that we cannot account for the fact that one thing bears a relation \(R\) to another by appealing to a further relation \(R'\) relating \(R\) to them—that way Bradley’s regress beckons. To avoid the regress we must recognise that a relation is not related to the things it relates, however language may mislead us to think otherwise. We simply have to accept as primitive, in the sense that it cannot be further explained, the fact that one thing bears a relation to another. But, according to primitivism, it is not only the fact that one thing bears a (non-symmetric) relation \(R\) to another that needs to be recognised as ultimate and irreducible. How \(R\) applies, whether the \(a\Rel b\) way or the \(b\Rel a\) way, needs to be taken as primitive too (MacBride 2014: 14–15). The difficulties encountered by attempts to provide an analysis of differential application provide corroborative evidence for primitivism. Does refraining from providing an analysis of differential application constitute shirking an obligatory task for systematic philosophy? Hardly. Remember what Lewis correctly said about predication: “Not every account is an analysis” (Lewis 1983: 352). What we need, according to this third strategy, is a form of realism committed to the existence of relations but which denies that the manner of their application, their differential application, can be further explained.

One of the most intriguing features of the debate about relations and differential application is that there is no single sense in which the different views we have considered seek to “explain” or “account” for differential application. They all run on different explanatory settings. Some think there is a genuine problem to do with the capacity of relations to differentially apply which needs to be explained by any successful theory of relations. Hence, because he thinks there is a genuine problem here, Hochberg claims that the question which any adequate theory of relations must answer “is about how the order is ontologically grounded in facts” (Hochberg 2001: 178). But others think that there isn’t a problem of differential application at all, much less one that requires an ontological analysis of relations or facts. This means that the debate cannot be reduced to simply an exchange of opinions about which view explains the most at the least cost.

For example, positionalists typically maintain that their positing roles, slots, pockets and relative properties enables them to answer what they take to be obligatory questions about why each relation applies the way it can and why some relations are capable of applying differently from the ways others can (Dixon 2019: 68). So the different ways that the relations between and adjacency are capable of applying is explained by positionalists in terms of the different ontological structures attributed to these relations, i.e. their number of roles or positions and the nature of the relation that assigns things to roles or positions. By contrast, anti-positionalists and primitivists deny that such questions about why relations have the capacity to differentially apply need answering at all. As Fine describes his own version of anti-positionalism, “It is a fundamental fact for [the anti-positionalist] that relations are capable of giving rise to a diversity of completions in application to any given relata and there is no explanation of this diversity in terms of a difference in the way the completions are formed from the relation and its relata” (Fine 2000: 19).

However, the explanatory differences between the parties to the debate run deeper than merely whether they think the capacity of relations to differentially apply is open to informative explanation. Whilst Fine takes the capacity of relations to differentially apply as primitive, Fine also holds that it is necessary to provide an account of wherein the difference consists between two states which arise from the same constituents: “Yet clearly the state of Anthony’s loving Cleopatra and the state of Cleopatra’s loving Anthony are distinguishable; they are not merely two indiscernible ”atoms“ within the space of states. But if these states are not to be distinguished by how they derive from the given relation and its relata, then how are they to be distinguished?”(Fine 2000: 20). Fine’s answer, as we have seen, is spelled out in terms of substitution. But Leo’s version of anti-positionalism has different explanatory settings again. He doesn’t engage with metaphysical questions about wherein the difference between states consists and instead provides principles of substitution intended to explicate rather than explain the differential application of relations (Leo 2013: 361–8). And primitivism, we have seen, takes the fact that relations admit of differential application as unanalysable too but also takes the difference between states arising from the same constituents as primitive (MacBride 2014: 8, cf. van Fraassen 1982). The dispute about relations and differential application continues because it remains to be established which questions about relations are genuine and which are pseudo-problems.

In conclusion, it should be emphasised that nothing written here is intended to imply that there is just one problem of order (differential application). It’s plausible that there are several problems in the vicinity, whether logical, metaphysical or epistemological and they will require different if co-ordinated solutions.


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I am grateful to Stephen Barnett and especially Jeremy Butterfield for close advice concerning the physics and philosophy of physics dealt with in this entry. For further discussion of the material in this entry, I am grateful to Helen Beebee, Chris Daly, Bill Demopoulos, Scott Dixon, Cian Dorr, Kit Fine, Berta Grimau, Herbert Hochberg, Frederique Janssen-Lauret, Sam Lebens, Joop Leo, Stephan Leuenberger, Kevin Mulligan, Francesco Orilia, Gary Ostertag, Laurie Paul, Jonathan Schaffer, Stewart Shapiro, Peter Simons, Tim Williamson, and Ed Zalta. The material in this entry formed the basis for a course on relations at Glasgow University and I’d like to thank the students for their many helpful comments and suggestions.

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