Lord Shaftesbury [Anthony Ashley Cooper, 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury]

First published Wed Mar 13, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jun 1, 2021

Anthony Ashley Cooper, the third Earl of Shaftesbury, lived from 1671 to 1713. He was one of the most important philosophers of his day, and exerted an enormous influence on European thought throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Shaftesbury received less attention in the twentieth century, but in the twenty-first century there has been a significant increase in scholarship on his work.

Shaftesbury believed that humans are designed to appreciate order and harmony, and that proper appreciation of order and harmony is the basis of correct judgments about morality, beauty, and religion. He was at the forefront of developing the idea of a moral sense, of explicating aesthetic experience, of defending political liberty and tolerance, and of arguing for religious belief based on reason and observation rather than revelation or scripture. Shaftesbury thought the purpose of philosophy was to help people lead better lives. Towards that end, he aimed to write persuasively and for the educated populace as a whole, deploying a wide variety of styles and literary forms.

1. Introduction

1.1 Life and works

Anthony Ashley Cooper lived from 1671 to 1713. His grandfather, the first Earl of Shaftesbury, oversaw his early upbringing and put John Locke in charge of his education. He would eventually come to disagree with many aspects of Locke’s philosophy, but Locke was clearly a crucially important influence on his philosophical development. The two remained friends until Locke’s death. He served in Parliament (before his father died, when he was Lord Ashley) and the House of Lords (after his father died, when he had became the third Earl). Ill health curtailed his political career when he was 30 years old. (The standard biography is Voitle 1984).

The first work he published was an edited collection of sermons by Benjamin Whichcote, in 1698. He wrote an unsigned preface to the sermons in which he praised Whichcote’s belief in the goodness of human beings and urged his readers to use Whichcote’s “good nature” as an antidote to the poisonous egoism of Hobbes and the pessimistic supralapsarianism of the Calvinists.

In 1699, John Toland arranged publication of an early version of the Inquiry concerning Virtue. Shaftesbury later renounced this version of the Inquiry, claiming that it was produced without his authorization, although the details of the episode are unclear.

Most of the works for which Shaftesbury is famous were written between 1705–1710. It was during this period that he rewrote the Inquiry concerning Virtue, or Merit and completed versions of The Moralists: A Philosophical Rhapsody (the first version of which was called The Social Enthusiast, A Philosophical Adventure), A Letter concerning Enthusiasm, Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour, and Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author.

In 1711, Shaftesbury collected his mature writings and added to them extensive notes and commentaries (which he called Miscellaneous Reflections on the preceeding Treatises, and other Critical Subjects), naming the resulting three-volume work Characteristicks of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times. He revised Characteristicks over the course of the next two years, up until his death in 1713. A version with his final changes appeared in 1714.

There have been three recent editions of Characteristicks: a single volume edited and with an introduction and scholarly apparatus by Klein (1999), with modernized spelling and punctuation; two volumes edited and with an introduction and scholarly apparatus by Ayers (1999), with original typography; and three volumes with an introduction by Den Uyl (2001), with original typography, and with the addition of “A Notion of the Tablature, or Judgment of Hercules” and “A Letter concerning Design.” In this entry, I will refer (as ‘C’) to the online-accessible version of Den Uyl’s Liberty Fund edition, citing the volume and original page numbers.

Not all of Shaftesbury’s writings are collected in Characteristicks. Some, such as Second Characters, he intended to publish but did not complete; this might also be true of Chartae Socraticae and Pathologia (see Jaffro, Maurer, and Petit 2013). Others, such as The Adept Ladies, he may have circulated privately but decided not to publish. Still others, such as Askemata, he might have written for personal or therapeutic purposes rather than for public consumption. The most comprehensive collection of Shaftesbury’s published and unpublished writings is the Standard Edition: Complete Works, Correspondence and Posthumous Writings, edited by Wolfram Benda et al. (1981–present).

1.2 Purpose and form of philosophy

According to Shaftesbury, the purpose of philosophy is to make us better people. Philosophy’s job is to help us to improve ourselves—to “regulate our governing Fancys, Passions, and Humours” (C 1.283)—so that we can become wiser, more virtuous, and more organized selves. Philosophy is “Mastership in Life and Manners” (C 3.159; see also 3.303). As Rivers puts it, philosophy for Shaftesbury is “the art of learning to live well” (Rivers 2000a: 87; see Klein 1994: 82). Den Uyl says, Shaftesbury’s “main purpose [is] to encourage, promote, or otherwise foster an environment conducive to the exercise of virtue” (Den Uyl 1998: 282).

Shaftesbury’s belief in the fundamentally “self-improving” (C 2.427) purpose of philosophy leads him to criticize the turgid, analytic methods of the Scholastics and of modern thinkers such as Descartes and Locke (Schneewind 1998: 307 and Rivers 2000a: 87). As one of his characters puts it, philosophy must be rescued from its imprisonment in “Colleges and Cells” where it has been immured by “Empiricks, and pedantick Sophists” (C 2.184). To achieve its proper goals, philosophy needs to assume guises very different from the dry, unmoving texts of Shaftesbury’s predecessors.

Because he thinks that “straightforward discursive writing could have little chances of successfully promoting virtue in a modern context,” Shaftesbury presents his own ideas in “a daunting array of formats” (Den Uyl 1998: 276). These formats include: a letter to a friend, a manual for writers, an epistolary novelistic dialogue, a series of “random” reflections delivered without “Regularity and Order” (C 3.8, 3.2), an argumentative inquiry, and a witty essay that eschews “the Gravity of strict Argument” in favor of the “way of Chat” (C 3.97).

1.3 Features of Shaftesbury interpretation: persuasion, illustrations, unpublished texts

Grean claims that Shaftesbury’s forms are “determined by the means of persuasion” more than argumentative rigor, which poses a challenge for interpretation (Grean 1967: xviii). Carey says, “we cannot look to his work for an argument structured by premises and logical deductions” (Carey 2006: 106). To complicate matters, Shaftesbury adopts different personae in different literary performances, and there are significant interpretative questions about the extent to which we ought to identify the views of Shaftesbury’s first-person narrators with Shaftesbury himself—especially when one persona explicitly distinguishes himself from another (C 2.263 and 3.12; see Marshall 1986; Prince 1996; Chaves 2008). In addition, some commentators take Shaftesbury’s works to be laced with self-distancing irony (Klein 1994: 96–99; Jaffro 2008). This diversity of forms, styles, tones, and personae makes it difficult to attribute to Shaftesbury a single philosophical system of thought. Shaftesbury himself wrote: “The most ingenious way of becoming foolish, is by a System” (C 1.290).

Another noteworthy feature of Shaftesbury interpretation is his use of illustrations. Shaftesbury worked on numerous allegorical illustrations for the second edition of Characteristics, putting tremendous effort into both the overall plan and the minute details of these illustrations and engaging in extensive correspondence with the artists he hired to execute the pictures. He seemed to want his audience to read the illustrations as carefully as the words, their meanings (some readily apparent, others subtle to the point of hiddenness) essential to a full understanding of the text. (The fullest discussion of the illustrations is Paknadel 1974. Rivers 2000a and Müller 2010, 2012, and 2013 also shed light on how the illustrations interact with and enhance the message of Shaftesbury’s text.) Shaftesbury took care, as well, to compose the marginal headings and index to Characteristicks, and his choices in those places can also be cited as evidence for certain interpretative views (see Rivers 2000b). Characteristicks was one of the earliest books in English to have an index.

Yet another issue in Shaftesbury interpretation is the role to give to writings not included in Characteristicks. These include completed works, unfinished versions of projected publications, and correspondence. Perhaps most important in this regard are Shaftesbury’s private notebooks, or Askemata (the definitive version is the Standard Edition; some of the writings from the notebooks are also collected in Regimen, edited by Rand). There is a question, however, of whether Askemata and other unpublished writings constitute a more accurate picture of Shaftesbury’s real views, or whether at least some of those writings should be taken to have served private therapeutic purposes that differ from the stating of his settled, fully considered positions. Shaftesbury has one of his narrators in Characteristicks object to the publication of private ruminations (C 1.162–4), and he himself did not intend for Askemata ever to be published. Moreover, Jaffro has argued that Shaftesbury thought that the private self should be “secreted” from the public self—that there should be a “gap” between them (Jaffro 2008: 349)—which only complicates further the attempt to corral everything Shaftesbury wrote into a systematic, or even fully coherent, single philosophical position.

1.4 Relationship to Stoicism

A closely related question is how best to understand Shaftesbury’s relationship to Stoicism. Stoicism was clearly a major influence on Shaftesbury, but the exact nature of his thought’s relationship to Stoicism is a matter of debate. Some commentators argue that Shaftesbury is essentially a Stoic through and through (Tiffany 1923; see also Sellars 2016 and Stuart-Buttle 2019). Others argue that some of his ideas comport with Stoicism, while others do not (Maurer and Jaffro 2013).

The strong Stoic interpretation emphasizes the unpublished Askemata, which are notebooks in which Shaftesbury engages in a process of self-improvement based on Stoic principles (see Klein 1994: 60 and 81–88; Rivers 2000a: 92; Taylor 1989: 251–2; Gatti 2014). Shaftesbury refers to and quotes Stoic sources throughout Askemata. When he was writing in these notebooks, Shaftesbury seems to have Stoic ideas in the forefront of his mind, and proceeds on the assumption that those ideas are the key to becoming the person he wants to be. As well, Shaftesbury’s unpublished Pathologia is a Latin text that is entirely devoted to an explication of Stoic psychology. Shaftesbury’s unpublished Chartae Socraticae can also be read as an endorsement of Stoicism and a rejection of contemporary philosophy.

The main idea the strong Stoic interpretation believes Shaftesbury emphasizes is an exclusive concern with the state of one’s own soul, which is within one’s own control, and a resultant withdrawing of concern from everything else. This interpretation highlights the many passages in Askemata in which Shaftesbury urges himself to focus only on his internal state, to maintain equanimity, not to allow anything external to disturb his serenity. Shaftesbury’s choice of illustration for the frontispiece of Characteristicks echoes this idea: it’s a ship on a bay and a ray of light on a still dish of water, which is intended to illustrate quotations from Marcus (“What view you take is everything, and your view is in your power. Remove it when you choose, and then, as if you had rounded the cape, come calm serenity, a waveless bay”) and Epictetus (“As is the water-dish, so is the soul; as is the ray which falls on the water, so are the appearances”). (For discussion of this illustration, see Paknadel 1974, 297–8.)

There are, however, aspects of Characteristicks that other commentators have thought to be at odds with the strong Stoic interpretation. Maurer and Jaffro (2013) maintain that Shaftesbury’s concern with the public good and his endorsement of pity do not fit with the Stoic view. Klein’s reading (1994) emphasizes the importance Shaftesbury places on aesthetic beauty, politeness, and manners, and how those might differ from Stoicism. Shaftesbury also refrains from publishing his own thought in the systematic form distinctive of much of Stoic thought (compare to Pathologia).

Defenders of the strong Stoic interpretation suggest that Shaftesbury conceals his true beliefs in order to reach an audience that may not be ready for the unadulterated, austere message of Stoicism. According to this interpretation, for instance, Shaftesbury’s real view is that aesthetic beauty (the beauty of physical things, such as art) is of no value. He only brings aesthetic beauty into his discussion as a decoy or sugar-coating, a ploy to induce a wider audience toward a moral position that would have left them cold if it had been delivered unadorned (see Tiffany 1923; Derhmann 2014; Stuart-Buttle 2019).

An alternative explanation is that Shaftesbury used his unpublished notebooks as a means to work on improving himself with Stoic ideas during psychologically fraught times, but that those notebooks do not necessarily reflect the essence of his true philosophy (see Klein 1994). The essays he worked hard to polish and publish as Characteristicks might be a better reflection of his considered views. Another possibility is that he thought different things at different times: the notebooks might accurately reflect a Stoic orientation at some points in his life, but for all that he still might have held non-Stoic ideas about aesthetics and public concern at other points. In response, the strong Stoic interpretation may contend that even in Characteristicks there are indications (esoteric perhaps, but evident to those who know where to look) that seemingly non-Stoic ideas are but a decoy.

2. Morality

2.1 Virtue and goodness

Shaftesbury maintains that virtue is the promotion of the good of all humankind.

To love the Publick, to study universal Good, and to promote the Interest of the whole World, as far as lies within our power, is surely the Height of Goodness. (C 1.37)

The virtuous person strives to develop an “equal, just, and universal Friendship” with humanity as a whole (C 2.242). This view of virtue is a precursor to Hutcheson’s proto-Utilitarian view that “that Action is best, which procures the greatest Happiness for the greatest Numbers” (Hutcheson 1726: 125). Levy-Eichel also points to Shaftesbury’s coinage of “Moral Arithmetic” (C 2.99) as a crucial part of the pre-history of Utilitarianism, and its use of mathematics in moral subjects (Levy-Eichel 2020). (For further discussion of Shaftesbury’s influence on Utilitarianism, see Driver 2014. For a view of Shaftesbury’s differences from later Utilitarians, see Crisp 2019: 86).

Shaftesbury’s view of virtue is part of his teleological view of goodness. Something is good, according to Shaftesbury, if it contributes to the “Existence or Well-being” of the system of which it is a part (C 2.18). Every animal is a part of its species. A particular animal, say a tiger, is a good member of its species—it’s a good tiger—if it contributes to the well-being of the tiger species as a whole. There is also “a system of all animals,” which consists of the “order” or “economy” of all the different animal species (C 2.19). A good animal is one that contributes to the well-being of “animal Affairs” in general (C 2.19). The system of all animals, moreover, works with the system “of Vegetables, and all other things in this inferior World” to constitute “one system of a Globe or Earth” (C 2.19). So something is a good earthly thing if it contributes to the existence of earthly things in general. And the system of this earth is itself part of a “Universal System” or “a System of all Things” (C 2.20). To be “wholly and really” good a thing must contribute to the good of the universe as a whole (C 2.20). This progression of ever-larger systems is a bit dazzling, and we might wonder how we can know (or even make sense of) whether something is contributing to the well-being of the universe as a whole. But Shaftesbury avoids this problem by discussing in detail only that which makes “a sensible Creature” a good member of its species—by focusing on whether an individual creature is promoting the well-being of its species (C 2.21). Perhaps Shaftesbury believes that a creature that contributes to the well-being of its species will also always contribute to the well-being of the universe as a whole, in which case being a good member of one’s species would be coextensive with being “wholly and really” good.

The goodness or evilness of a sensible creature, according to Shaftesbury, is based on the creature’s motives, and not simply on the results of the creature’s actions (C 2.21–22). (As we will see, this leads to the crucial claims that every motive to action involves affection or passion [C 2.40–44], and that reason alone cannot motivate [C 2.28–52, 77–81]). Shaftesbury strongly emphasizes the importance of motive, arguing that if creatures promote the good of the species only because they are forced to or only because promoting the good is a means to other ends, then they are not actually good themselves. Creatures are good only if their motivating affections are directed “primarily and immediately” at the good of the species, not if the connection between their affection and the good of the species is accidental (C 2.26).

Goodness is something that is within the reach of all sensible creatures, not only humans but also non-human animals. A creature is good if its affections promote the well-being of the system of which it is a part, and non-human animals are just as capable of possessing this type of affection as humans. “Virtue or Merit,” on the other hand, is within the reach of “Man only” (C 2.28). That’s because virtue is tied to a special kind of affection that only humans possess. This special kind of affection is a second-order affection, an affection that has as its object another affection. We humans experience these second-order affections because we, unlike non-human animals, are conscious of our own passions. Not only do we possess passions, but we also reflect on or become aware of the passions we have. And when we reflect on our own passions, we develop feelings about them. Imagine you feel the desire to help a person in distress. In addition to simply feeling that desire, you become aware that you are feeling that desire. When you become aware of that, you experience a positive feeling (or “liking”) towards your desire to help. Or imagine you feel the desire to harm a person who has bested you in a fair competition. In addition to simply feeling the desire to harm, you become aware that you are feeling that desire. When you become aware of that, you experience a negative feeling (or “dislike”) towards your desire to harm. These are the kinds of phenomena Shaftesbury has in mind when he writes that

the Affections of Pity, Kindness, Gratitude, and their Contrarys, being brought into the Mind by Reflection, become Objects. So that, by means of this reflected Sense, there arises another kind of Affection towards those very Affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are now become the Subject of a new Liking or Dislike. (C 2.28)

2.2 The moral sense

Shaftesbury calls this capacity to feel second-order affections the “Sense of Right and Wrong” or the “Moral Sense” (C 2.28–36, 2.40–46, 2.51, 2.53, 2.60), although the term is not one he emphasizes or explains in detail (see Rivers 2000a: 124). There is little evidence that he thinks the moral sense is a distinct psychological faculty in the way that Hutcheson did. Nevertheless, Shaftesbury does think that the moral sense (whether one faculty or a less bounded disposition) is that which produces in us feelings of “like” or “dislike” for our own (first-order) affections. When the moral sense is operating properly (when it’s fulfilling its teleological purpose), it produces positive feelings towards affections that promote the well-being of humanity and negative feelings towards affections that detract from the well-being of humanity. The second-order feelings that the moral sense produces can themselves motivate to action, and people are virtuous if they act from those second-order feelings. In contrast, non-human animals, because they lack the powers of reflection necessary for consciousness of their own affections, do not possess a moral sense. So non-human animals are incapable of achieving virtue (C 2.28–31).

Shaftesbury argues that because our sense of morality is a sentiment, it can be opposed only by another sentiment, and not by reason or belief.

Sense of Right and Wrong therefore being as natural to us as natural Affection itself, and being a first Principle in our Constitution and Make; there is no speculative Opinion, Persuasion or Belief, which is capable immediately or directly to exclude or destroy it… And this Affection being an original one of earliest rise in the Soul or affectionate Part; nothing beside contrary Affection, by frequent check and controul, can operate upon it, so as either to diminish it in part, or destroy it in the whole. (C 2.44).

Shaftesbury does acknowledge that the sense of right and wrong requires the reflective capacity to conceptualize motives. A creature who “cannot reflect on what he himself does” cannot have a sense of right and wrong. For this reason, Shaftesbury says that human morality is based on “rational Affections” (C 2.36). But it is still affections that morality is based on. Shaftesbury writes, “So that, by means of this reflected Sense, there arises another kind of Affection towards those very Affections themselves, which have been already felt, and are not become the Subject of a new Liking or Dislike” (C 2.28). Reflection paves the way for the feeling of moral sentiment. But the sentiment—the “Liking or Dislike,” the “Exercise of the Heart” (C 2.30)—is still essential.

Shaftesbury puts affection in the driver’s seat because he believes affection alone can motivate. He never states outright what Hume would explicitly argue for: that reason on its own is motivationally inert. But the Humean claim is implied by what Shaftesbury does say. Throughout the first version of the Inquiry, he attributes every instance of motivation to affection. He says that reason is necessary “to secure a right application of the Affections,” but there he is granting to reason merely the instrumental role of discovering what will best benefit the species (C 2.35). Affection remains that which motivates us to pursue that benefit. Shaftesbury says as well that the motivational force of an affection can be directly opposed only by the motivational force of “contrary Affections” (C 2.44). If a person has a motivating affection, she will “necessarily act according to it” unless it is opposed by some other affection (C 2.52). “[T]here is no speculative Opinion, Persuasion or Belief, which is capable immediately or directly to exclude or destroy” a natural affection (C 2.44). “[N]othing beside contrary Affection, by frequent check and control, can operate upon it, so as either to diminish it in part, or destroy it in the whole” (C 2.44) Shaftesbury acknowledges that beliefs can cause alterations in the affections, and that the altered affections can lead us in directions opposite to those we’d been motivated to follow before. If I come to believe a particularly charismatic person is a great benefactor to humanity, I may then become motivated to emulate behavior of hers to which I would otherwise have been opposed. If I come to believe that a particular group of people is trying to destroy humanity, I may become motivated to attack them in ways that would previously have offended my sense of right and wrong. But belief’s role in motivation is once again instrumental. It operates on my motivation only “indirectly, by the intervention of opposite or of favourable Affections causally excited by any such Belief” (C 2.45). Affection is the source of all motivational force. Belief on its own mounts no motivational push-back. These ideas are a clear influence on Hutcheson and Hume, who also hold that all motivation is sentimental and that therefore morality is based on sentiment.

One of the most intensely debated issues in Shaftesbury scholarship concerns the moral sense. The two main views can be called the constitutive interpretation and the representative interpretation.

The constitutive interpretation holds that morality is constituted by the subjective affective responses of each human. Sidgwick is often cited as a proponent of this interpretation. Sidgwick claims that “Shaftesbury is the first moralist who distinctly takes psychological experience as the basis of ethics” (Sidgwick 1902: 187) and that Shaftesbury thinks morality is based on a “sense [that] may naturally vary from man to man as the palate does” (Sidgwick 1902: 212–13). Sidgwick thought that this subjectivist aspect of Shaftesbury’s view did damage to morality because it undermined the reasons that might be given for being moral. Price thought something similar, contending that Shaftesbury’s focus on “affection” led to his “overlooking entirely … the authority belonging to virtue” (Price 1769: 317). Tuveson is in the same camp, contending that Shaftesbury’s view differed from prior versions of a moral sense (such as Henry More’s) by eliminating the role of reason altogether.

It is the feeling, not reason, which is the right moral judge; it is the emotions, according to the Inquiry, which are the right moral guide. (Tuveson 1948: 258)

In saying this, Tuveson claims that Shaftesburean moral judgments are based on an immediate reaction—an inclining to or recoiling from—and not on a discursively-arrived upon “opinion or formal judgment” (Tuveson 1960: 53; see Filonowiz 1989: 192). Tuveson also claims that Shaftesburean moral judgments do not represent anything in mind-independent reality. According to Tuveson, Shaftesbury thought that “that the value area of the mind must constitute a world to itself, outside the process of cognition” (Tuveson 1960: 54). Those in the constitutive camp may emphasize Shaftesbury’s influence on Hutcheson and Hume, whose sentimentalism is sometimes taken to eschew commitment to mind-independent moral properties.

The representative interpretation holds, in contrast, that the affective responses of Shaftesbury’s moral sense represent moral facts or properties that exist independently of our reactions to them. Irwin advances this view when he claims that Shaftesbury “treats the moral sense as a sign of objective moral properties, not as their metaphysical basis” (Irwin 2008: 369), and that the moral sense has “an indicative (or detective) role.”; According to Irwin, Shaftesbury believes that moral properties have a “logical independence from” our beliefs and judgments about them (Irwin 2015: 866–7). Schneewind also believes that Shaftesbury’s moral sense detects objective moral properties, contending that the moral faculty

is special because through it we become aware of an objective order… The approval and disapproval themselves are feelings, but they reveal that the set of passions being considered either is or is not harmonious. (Schneewind 1998: 302)

Rivers develops a similar view, arguing that our moral faculty enables us to “recognize and respond” to the objective property of harmony (Rivers 2000a: 143; see also 126). Those in the representative camp may emphasize the influence on Shaftesbury of the Cambridge Platonists, whose rationalist moral theories included a clear commitment to the existence of moral properties independent of our reactions (Cassirer 1953: 159–202; Gill 2006: 77–82).

The representative and constitutive camps can both cite passages that pose interpretative challenges to the other side.

In favor of the representative interpretation and challenging for the constitutive are claims Shaftesbury makes that seem to imply that moral properties are independent of human reactions. He maintains, for instance, that what is destructive of the human species can never be

Virtue of any kind, or in any sense; but must remain still horrid Depravity, notwithstanding any Fashion, Law, Custom, or Religion; which may be ill and vitious it-self, but can never alter the eternal Measures, and immutable independent Nature of Worth and Virtue. (C 2.35–36)

He also calls himself a “realist,” and seems to do so in a way that precludes a constitutive reading (see Irwin 2015 and Carey 2006: 98–99 and 130–4). As one of his characters puts it when speaking of the author of the Inquiry:

For being, in respect of Virtue, what you lately call’d a Realist; he endeavours to shew, “That it is really something in it-self, and in the nature of Things: not arbitrary or factitious, (if I may so speak) not constituted from without, or dependent on Custom, Fancy, or Will; not even on the Supreme Will it-self, which can no-way govern it: but being necessarily good, is govern’d by it, and ever uniform with it.” (C 2.267)

Shaftesbury says as well that “the principal End” of Characteristicks is

“To assert the Reality of a Beauty and Charm in moral as well as natural Subjects; and to demonstrate the Reasonableness of a proportionate Taste, and determinate Choice, in Life and Manners.” The Standard of this kind, and the noted Character of Moral Truth [are] firmly establish’d in Nature it-self. (C 3.303; see 1.336)

Those in the representative camp can also claim support from Shaftesbury’s comparison of virtue to beauty. Shaftesbury contends that beauty is a mind-independent, objective property (more on this below). But since aesthetic responses are representative of mind-independent reality, and our moral responses are similar or perhaps identical to our aesthetic responses, it follows that our moral responses are representative as well (Schneewind 1998: 303–4; Carey 2006: 107, 125, and 132–4).

In favor of the constitutive interpretation and challenging for the representative are statements Shaftesbury makes that seem to imply that the basis for virtue is dependent only on human reactions and thus insensitive to any mind-independent fact (Taylor 1989: 256–7; Den Uyl 1998: 90; Gill 2000: 538–47). He says, for instance, that our reason to be virtuous is impervious even to the supposition that we know nothing of the external world.

For let us carry Scepticism ever so far, let us doubt, if we can, of every thing about us; we cannot doubt of what passes within our-selves. Our Passions and Affections are known to us. They are certain, whatever the Objects may be, on which they are employ’d. Nor is it of any concern to our Argument, how these exterior Objects stand; whether they are Realitys, or mere Illusions; whether we wake or dream. For ill Dreams will be equally disturbing. And a good Dream, if Life be nothing else, will be easily and happily pass’d. In this Dream of Life, therefore, our Demonstrations have the same force; our Balance and Economy hold good, and our Obligation to Virtue is in every respect the same. (C 2.173)

In a similar vein he writes,

If there be no real Amiableness or Deformity in moral Acts, there is at least an imaginary one of full force. (C 2.43)

Commentators on either side of the representative-constitutive divide may try to show that passages that seem troublesome for their interpretation do not mean what the other side claims. Towards that end, commentators may try to soft-pedal one set of Shaftesbury’s statements, perhaps emphasizing the different purposes and different personae in Shaftesbury’s writings, or explicating the fuller context of various quotations in a way that reveals that Shaftesbury is not himself endorsing certain claims but rather arguing that even on assumptions he does not accept his main points about virtue will still stand. Jaffro has argued that Shaftesbury consciously changed his mind, or at least decided that he should change how to express his views, moving from an early account that had subjectivist implications to a later account that was more objectivist (Jaffro 2007). Another possible response to this interpretative issue is to hold that Shaftesbury is simply inconsistent, or that he is unaware of the implications of some of his own claims. As Raphael puts it, “The fact is that no coherent view can be extracted from Shaftesbury about the moral faculty or about moral theory in general” (Raphael 1947: 17). Kivy writes,

It has been the opinion of many, from Shaftesbury’s time to our own, that no coherent view emerges; and I am inclined, in the last analysis, to agree. (Kivy 2003: 16)

Darwall (1995) has developed an interpretation of Shaftesbury’s moral sense that does not fit in either the constitutive or the representative camp. According to Darwall, Shaftesbury believes that the normative authority of morality leads to the view that the basis of morality is within each agent, which conflicts with interpretations that hold that the moral sense represents something external. But Darwall also holds that Shaftesbury believes that there is a rationally necessary view of morality that each agent should come to, which conflicts with interpretations that hold that the moral sense produces subjective and contingent emotional experiences. On Darwall’s interpretation, Shaftesbury is concerned with autonomy and rationality in a way that warrants classifying him as a clear precursor to Kant. Den Uyl has raised concerns about Darwall’s interpretation by contending that the moral sense is the source of favorable attitudes rather than the law-like rules of a proto-Kantian rationalist (Den Uyl 1998: 304). Another objection to Darwall’s interpretation can be found in Irwin, who claims that Shaftesbury’s moral sense view is externalist—i.e., that one’s moral sense produces responses that have no necessary connection to one’s motivation or reason to act morally (Irwin 2015: 877 and 880). Darwall’s interpretation, in contrast, requires a strongly internalist reading of Shaftesbury.

2.3 Motivation, egoism, and hedonism

Throughout his works, Shaftesbury attacks a view of human motivation that he associates with Hobbesian and voluntarism. Some commentators have thought that the view of human motivation Shaftesbury advances in these anti-Hobbesian and anti-voluntarist passages is ardently non-egoistic—i.e., that Shaftesbury believes that human agents can be motivated by considerations other than self-interest (Den Uyl 1998; Schneewind 1998; Irwin 2008; Carey 2006). Other commentators have argued that Shaftesbury himself holds an egoist view of human motivation—that he thinks every human’s actions are motivated by self-interested desires—and that his attacks on Hobbes and the voluntarists are directed only at what he takes to be an incorrect view of self-interest (Sidgwick 1902; Peach 1958; Trianosky 1998; Grote 2010; Crisp 2019, 78). Still other commentators have claimed that Shaftesbury is inconsistent, opposing egoist views of human motivation in some passages and assuming them in other passages (Martineau 1886: 508; Wiley 1940: 74).

Those who interpret Shaftesbury as an anti-egoist point to passages in which he argues that theories that rely exclusively on selfish motivation cannot explain plainly observable human behavior. In Wit and Humour, Shaftesbury attacks those who

wou’d new-frame the human Heart; and … reduce all its Motions, Balances and Weights, to that one Principle and Foundation of a cool and deliberate Selfishness. (C 1.116)

In fact, Shaftesbury argues, careful observation reveals that humans are motivated by many non-selfish considerations.

[W]hoever looks narrowly into the Affairs of it, will find, that Passion, Humour, Caprice, Zeal, Faction, and a thousand other Springs, which are counter to Self-Interest, have as considerable a part in the Movements of this Machine. There are more Wheels and Counter-Poises in this Engine than are easily imagin’d. ’Tis of too complex a kind, to fall under one simple View, or be explain’d thus briefly in a word or two. The Studiers of this Mechanism must have a very partial Eye, to overlook all other Motions besides [selfishness]. (C 1.115)

People exhibit non-selfish “Civility, Hospitality, Humanity towards Strangers or People in distress” (C 1.118). Their concern for

Relations, Friends, Countrymen, Laws, Politick Constitutions, the Beauty of Order and Government, and the Interest of Society and Mankindnaturally raise a stronger Affection than any which was grounded upon the narrow bottom of mere Self. (C 1.117)

Indeed, even those tendencies that are most destructive are usually based in sociable, non-selfish concerns. War and social disruption are usually caused not by selfishness but by a powerful concern for party or clan. It is love and fellowship for those in one’s group that lead to widespread conflict, not self-love.

In short, the very Spirit of Faction, for the greatest part, seems to be no other than the Abuse or Irregularity of that social Love, and common Affection, which is natural to Mankind. For the Opposite of Sociableness is Selfishness. And of all Characters, the thorow-selfish one is the least forward in taking Party. (C 1.114–15)

Some have tried to show that all of these seemingly sociable tendencies result only from “a more deliberate, or better-regulated Self-love” (C 1.118). But (according to Shaftesbury) such views either fail to explain what people actually do or collapse into tautology (C 2.226–7).

Against Hobbes himself, Shaftesbury presents a pleasantly ironic ad hominem argument. If Hobbes had truly been entirely concerned with his own self-interest, he would never have publicly advanced the view that people are motivated entirely by self-interest. He would, rather, have spoken “the best of human Nature” so that he could “the easier abuse it” (C 1.94). But Hobbes did not behave in this way. He tried to convince people of the selfishness of human beings precisely because he wanted to help humans beings, even though this conduct placed him at great peril. His very advancement of the selfish thesis refutes it. That

good sociable Man, as savage and unsociable as he wou’d make himself and all Mankind appear by his Philosophy, expos’d himself during his Life, and took the utmost pains, that after his Death we might be deliver’d from the occasion of these Terrors. He did his utmost to shew us … that there was nothing which by Nature … drew us to the Love of what was without, or beyond our-selves: Tho the Love of such great Truths and sovereign Maxims as he imagin’d these to be, made him the most laborious of all Men in composing Systems of this kind for our Use; and forc’d him, notwithstanding his natural Fear, to run continually the highest risk of being a Martyr for our Deliverance. (C 1.89–90)

According to Shaftesbury, both Hobbes and the voluntarists believed that the only motive humans have to be moral is that a powerful being will reward them for virtue and punish them for vice. The Hobbesian’s rewards and punishments are meted out by the sovereign, the voluntarist’s by God. Were it not for this powerful being’s rewards and punishments, according to Shaftesbury’s understanding of Hobbesianism and the voluntarism, humans would have no motivating reasons to be moral. In an oft-cited letter, Shaftesbury places Locke in the same category as Hobbes and the voluntarists, condemning the lot of them for reducing all moral motivation to these selfish concerns. (For discussion of this letter and Shaftesbury’s philosophical relationship to Locke, see Carey 2006: 98 and 138; Stuart-Buttle 2019: 90-105). Central to much of Shaftesbury’s account of morality, in contrast, is the claim that people are virtuous only to the extent that they are motivated by something other than selfish concern to gain reward and avoid punishment (C 2.23, 2.25, 2.60, 2.66). According to Shaftesbury, virtue consists not in the actions people perform, but in their motives for performing them. And the motive with which we identify virtue is concern for humanity, not selfishness. Shaftesbury emphasizes this point by drawing attention to the difference between knaves and saints. In order to be motivated to do the right thing, knaves “stand in need of such a rectifying Object as the Gallows before their eyes,” but someone truly honest will not have such a need.

And if a Saint had no other Virtue than what was rais’d in him by the same Objects of Reward and Punishment, in a more distant State; I know not whose Love or Esteem he might gain besides, but for my own part, I shou’d never think him worthy of mine. (C 1.127)

We judge saints to be virtuous because we think they are motivated by something other than the selfishness of the knave. If we came to believe that the saints were motivated by self-interest as well (e.g., by desire for reward in the afterlife), we would no longer judge them to be virtuous. As Shaftesbury puts it,

If the Love of doing good, be not, of it-self, a good and right Inclination; I know not how there can possibly be such a thing as Goodness or Virtue. (C 1.98)

Shaftesbury maintains, further, that stressing reward and punishment is actually counterproductive to the promotion of virtue. This is because a stress on reward and punishment tends to crowd out or obliterate the intrinsic concern for the good of the species that is essential to true virtue. He writes,

I Have known a Building, which by the Officiousness of the Workmen has been so shor’d, and screw’d up, on the side where they pretended it had a Leaning, that it has at last been turn’d the contrary way, and overthrown. There has something, perhaps, of this kind happen’d in Morals. Men have not been contented to shew the natural Advantages of Honesty and Virtue. They have rather lessen’d these, the better, as they thought, to advance another Foundation. They have made Virtue so mercenary a thing, and have talk’d so much of its Rewards, that one can hardly tell what there is in it, after all, which can be worth rewarding. (C 1.97; see also 2.33–34 and 39–40)

People who dwell on reward and punishment are more likely to become overly concerned with their own “Self-good, and private Interest,” which must “insensibly diminish the Affections towards publick Good, or the Interest of Society and introduce a certain Narrowness of spirit” (C 2.58). Stressing reward and punishment cannot make people more virtuous, and it may very well make them less so (C 1.97–98, 2.52–56). It is for this reason that Shaftesbury has one of his characters in The Moralists say that the author of the Inquiry

endeavors chiefly to establish Virtue on Principles, by which he is able to argue with those who are not as yet induc’d to own a God, or Future State. If he cannot do thus much, he reckons he does nothing. (C 2.266–7)

Shaftesbury here seems to anticipate the “overjustification hypothesis” of Lepper, Greene, and Nisbitt (1973).

In his discussions of Hobbes and the voluntarists, then, Shaftesbury seems to be attacking the view that humans are motivated only by self-interest and, relatedly, that self-interest is the only reason for us to be moral. This anti-egoist reading can also point to Shaftesbury’s aesthetic views, which center on the idea that our love of beauty is entirely non-selfish (see Stolnitz 1961a and b). Shaftesbury makes this seemingly anti-egoistic aesthetic point when he distinguishes the entirely non-selfish appreciation of a thing’s beauty from the self-interested desire to own or command that thing (2.396–7).

Other commentators, however, interpret Shaftesbury as an egoist, and even a hedonist egoist, as someone who holds that every human action is motivated by the agent’s desires for his or her own pleasure (Sidgwick 1902: 185; Peach 1958; Trianosky 1978; Grote 2010; for discussion of Shaftesbury and hedonist view, see Crisp 2019, 84–5 and 91). A crucial text for the egoist reading is the beginning of Book 2 of the Inquiry, where Shaftesbury writes

We have consider’d what Virtue is, and to whom the Character belongs. It remains to inquiry, What Obligation there is to Virtue; or what Reason to embrace it. (C 2.45)

Shaftesbury goes on to argue that being moral is in every person’s own best interests—that one will be happier if one is virtuous rather than vicious. As he sums up his argument in the conclusion of the Inquiry,

Thus have we endeavour’d to prove what was propos’d in the beginning… To be wicked or vitious, is to be miserable and unhappy… On the other side; the Happiness and Good of Virtue has been prov’d. (C 2.98–99)

And again:

That to yield or consent to any thing ill or immoral, is a Breach of Interest, and leads to the greatest Ills”: and, “That on the other side, Every thing which is an Improvement of Virtue, or an Establishment of right Affection and Integrity, is an Advancement of Interest, and leads to the greatest and most solid Happiness and Enjoyment.” (C 2.100).

This performance in the Inquiry is the basis for interpretations that claim that Shaftesbury believes that the only salient answer that could be given to the question, Why be moral?, is that being moral is in one’s own self-interest—and, more generally, that Shaftesbury thinks that self-interest is the only ultimate reason for action.

How do egoistic interpretations handle the many texts in which Shaftesbury attacks selfish theories of morality and human nature? Some have come to the exasperated conclusion that Shaftesbury is simply inconsistent, sometimes assuming egoism sometimes opposing it (Martineau 1886: 508; Wiley 1940: 74). Others have argued that Shaftesbury’s criticisms of selfish theories do not conflict with an overall egoistic interpretation. Grote (2010) maintains that when Shaftesbury attacks Hobbes, the voluntarists, and other “selfish” theorists, he is not attacking the view that self-interest is the only reason to be virtuous but rather is attacking the view that externally-bestowed rewards and punishments are the only reasons to be virtuous. According to Grote, what Shaftesbury means to show is that virtue has decisive “natural advantages”—that being virtuous will make one happier regardless of what anyone else may do to you. Shaftesbury’s opponents, on this reading, are those who claim that the relevant self-interested considerations are the rewards and punishment meted out by God or sovereign. The crucial contrast is between, on the one hand, the arbitrariness of the rewards and punishments of the voluntarist God and the Hobbesian sovereign and, on the other hand, the naturalness of the internal mental enjoyments that come from being virtuous—not the contrast between self-interested and non-self-interested motives.

Such is how egoistic interpretations attempt to explain away what many have taken to be Shaftesbury’s attacks on egoist explanations of human behavior. How do anti-egoist interpretations attempt to explain away the efforts Shaftesbury makes in Book 2 of the Inquiry to show that virtue’s conduciveness to one’s own happiness is reason to embrace it? Schneewind denies Shaftesbury ever tries “to bribe the reader into becoming virtuous, by showing that it pays” (Schneewind 1998: 308). According to Schneewind, in Book 2 of the Inquiry Shaftesbury is

trying to show that the natural world—the realm in which the natural good of happiness exists—is such that it makes sense for us to act morally within it. (Schneewind 1998: 308)

Irwin argues that virtuous Shaftesburean agents have an immediate aversion to vice that is based on a kind of aesthetic disgust-reaction rather than a reflective calculation about what will benefit them in the long run (Irwin 2008: 357).

Irwin also thinks we can find in Shaftesbury elements of a eudaimonist theory, according to which “it is reasonable to examine the contribution of virtue to happiness” because “the pursuit of happiness [is] the pursuit of rational structure and harmony”—which does not collapse into the Hobbesian egoist view that we should be virtuous because it maximizes our pleasure (Irwin 2008: 357). Den Uyl also locates in Shaftesbury something akin to “a classical virtue ethics” (Den Uyl 1998: 292). Crisp thinks “Shaftesbury’s account is Aristotelian,” in that one’s happiness is one’s chief good but the virtuous person “recognizes that their good itself consists in virtuous activity, which will itself involve direct concern for the good of others for their own sake” (Crisp 2019: 79). Filonowicz argues that virtue and happiness are so closely identified in Shaftesbury that it distorts his view to claim that we seek one as a mere means for the other. Shaftesbury is not trying to show

that we are required to be moral by the sheer personal utility of being so… [H]is point, rather, [is] that questions of expected overall benefit or less will seem moot to anyone who has actually achieved, and so experienced, moral health or harmony of affection. Virtue is experienced as being its own reward. (Filonowicz 2008: 86)

On the eudaimonist interpretation of Shaftesbury, virtue benefits its possessor, but the person who possesses virtue does not do the right thing because she thinks it will make her happy. To possess virtue is to be committed to certain values, and it’s those values that motivate the virtuous person, not the self-interested benefits that may result. Indeed, a virtuous person will sacrifice what are typically considered benefits to self in order to live up to those values. Caring about other people is not merely a means to some distinct pleasurable experience. Caring about other people for their own sakes is itself essential to, is constitutive of, the experience of living well. Virtue is intrinsically choice-worthy. Annas (2008) has shown the same combination of claims—that virtue consists of caring non-instrumentally about certain kinds of conduct that are objectively proper for human beings, and that the reason to be virtuous is that it will lead to the best life—is present in many eudaimonist views.

In his Essay on the Passions, Hutcheson addresses the same question that non-egoist interpretations of Shaftesbury must face in light of Shaftesbury’s arguments for the coincidence of virtue and interest—i.e., if virtue is non-self-interested, why show that virtue is in everyone’s self-interest? Hutcheson writes,

It may perhaps seem strange, that when in this Treatise Virtue is supposed disinterested; yet so much Pains is taken, by a Comparison of our several Pleasures, to prove the Pleasures of Virtue to be the greatest we are capable of, and that consequently it is truest Interest to be virtuous. (Hutcheson 1742: viii)

Hutcheson goes on to maintain that while virtue does consist of truly non-selfish concern for humanity, it is still useful to show that virtue does not conflict with happiness, as that will prevent people from believing in a conflict between the two ends that would constitute a great obstacle to virtue. It seems possible that Shaftesbury was anticipating this Hutchesonian thought (a thought that Hutcheson attributes to Shaftesbury) when arguing in Book 2 of the Inquiry for the coincidence of virtue and happiness.

Regardless of whether or not Shaftesbury is accurately characterized as egoistic, he clearly does contend that virtue conduces to one’s happiness and vice to one’s misery—that “Virtue and Interest may be found at last to agree” (C 2.16). And he develops a psychological explanation for this agreement. Central to this explanation is his distinction between pleasures of the body and pleasures of the mind. Shaftesbury argues that a person’s happiness depends more on mental pleasures than on bodily pleasures. He then seeks to show that living virtuously is by far the best way to gain the crucially important mental pleasures (C 2.47–73). Shaftesbury bases much of his argument for the connection between virtue and happiness on the idea that the mental pleasures are within one’s own control, insulated from the vicissitudes of “Fortune, Age, Circumstances, and Humour” (C 2.434). As one of Shaftesbury’s characters rhetorically asks,

How can we better praise the goodness of Providence, than in this, ‘That it has plac’d our Happiness and Good in things We can bestow upon ourselves’? (C 2.435; see 2.228–34)

In arguing for the importance of the mental pleasures, Shaftesbury also develops a view of the difference between higher and lower pleasures—and of the superiority of the former—that clearly anticipates Mill’s use of that distinction in chapter 2 of Utilitarianism (C 2.228–34; see Crisp 2019, 88–91).

One of the most famous claims in Characteristicks is that beauty and good are one and the same (C 2.399, 415, 422). Many commentators have criticized this claim for being obscure, confused, or incoherent (Brown 1751, 162; Martineau 1886, 498; Albee 1916, 183; Tiffany 1923, 667; Bernstein 1977, 325; Filonowicz 2008, 101–2; Crisp 2019, 83–84). But in the context of The Moralists, the claim turns out to be a straightforward statement of Shaftesbury’s view that a person will be happiest if she makes moral beauty (i.e., virtue) her highest priority. The claim that beauty and good are one and the same, in other words, is Shaftesbury’s way of expressing in the The Moralists the Inquiry’s conclusion that “Virtue is the Good, and Vice the Ill of every–one” (C 2.177). (See Gill 2021. See also Axelsson 2019, 208.)

Much of the interpretative discussion of Shaftesbury’s response to the question, Why be moral?, has focused on Book 2 of the Inquiry. But Shaftesbury discusses the issue in Wit and Humour and Soliloquy as well, asking in the later: “Why shou’d a Man be honest in the dark?” (C 1.125). Shaftesbury suggests that a person who asks this question is already lost to virtue—that someone who cares about virtue for its own sake won’t need another reason to act virtuously, and that someone who needs another reason doesn’t have what it takes to be truly virtuous in the first place. Shaftesbury also suggests that we should be honest even in the dark (i.e., virtuous even when we will not be punished for vice) because such conduct is a necessary condition for having an identity or unified self at all (C 1.283–4). The importance of developing a (unified) self is a striking, recurring theme in Shaftesbury’s writings, and he suggests that helping one to develop such a self is the raison d’etre of philosophy (see Mijuskovic 1971, Winkler 2000, Purviance 2004, and Jaffro 2014; more on this below).

An additional response Shaftesbury offers to “why be moral?” is to equate a commitment to morality to the love of beauty (Brown 1995; Gill 2014). He writes,

[A] real Genius, and thorow Artist, in whatever kind, can never, without the greatest unwillingness and shame, be induc’d to act below his Character, and for mere Interest be prevail’d with to prostitute his Art or Science, by performing contrary to its known Rules… Be they ever so idle, dissolute, or debauch’d; how regardless soever of other Rules; they abhor any Transgression in their Art, and wou’d chuse to lose Customers and starve, rather than by a base Compliance with the World, to act contrary to what they call the Justness and Truth of Work.

“Sir”, (says a poor Fellow of this kind, to his rich Customer) “you are mistaken in coming to me, for such a piece of Workmanship. Let who will make it for you, as you fansy; I know it to be wrong. Whatever I have made hither to, has been true Work. And neither for your sake or any body’s else, shall I put my hand to any other”.

This is Virtue! real Virtue, and Love of Truth; independent of Opinion, and above the World. This Disposition transfer’d to the whole of Life, perfects a Character, and makes that Probity and Worth which the Learned are often at such a loss to explain. For is there not a Workmanship and a Truth in Actions? (C 1.261–2)

Here Shaftesbury points out that we readily accept the possibility of artists remaining committed to their art, regardless of the external rewards that may result from betraying it. We don’t think such artists need an answer to the question, “Why produce excellent works rather than poor ones?” because we understand their valuing the art as an end in itself. But one’s life—one’s character and conduct—can be, or can fail to be, morally beautiful. And the commitment people who appreciate moral beauty have to instantiate it can have the same force on their conduct as an artist’s commitment to produce excellent works. Some might think that connecting morality and beauty in this way minimizes or undermines the importance of morality. But given Shaftesbury’s realist view of beauty—and his equating of beauty and truth—no such thing follows on his account. Just as a true artist never considers producing bad art, a truly honest person “never deliberates” about whether to be honest. “He acts from his Nature, in a manner necessarily, and without Reflection. . . . He can’t deliberate in the Case of a plain Villainy” (C 1.81). Shaftesbury is here describing a commitment to virtue that seems to be closer to traditional deontological views, in that it has a non-negotiable, overriding practical authority. Like a traditional deontologist, Shaftesbury thinks the virtuous person will do the right thing regardless of any other consequences that may result. Moral reasons have a practical authority that is intrinsic to them, not the result of their being commanded or of their being instrumental to any other end. But Shaftesbury differs from many traditional deontologists in the role he gives to sentiment. Traditional deontologists believe that rationality alone grounds morality’s authority. Shaftesbury’s non-negotiable commitment to morality, in contrast, is based in the sentiment. Shaftesbury’s picture of an impassioned and dedicated artist models a commitment to doing what’s right that is based in sentiment but is nonetheless categorical.

As I mentioned above, some commentators take Shaftesbury to be not only egoistic but also hedonistic, attributing to him the view that the ultimate practical justification is always pleasure for the agent (Grote 2010; Martineau 1886, 508; Peach 1958; Trianosky 1978; see also Crisp 2019, 84–5). Book 2 of the Inquiry seems to provide evidence for this reading, as Shaftesbury argues there that the reason to be virtuous is that it will make us happiest, and the reasons he gives for its making us happiest often involve the virtuous life’s producing greater quantity and quality of pleasure (see C 2.99–105, 126–130, 147–154, 168–177).

There are, however, numerous other places in Chararacteristicks where Shaftesbury explicitly rejects that pleasure is the true or ultimate measure of choice-worthiness. He ridicules those who “rate Life by the Number of Exquisiteness of the pleasing Sensations” (C 1.123). He holds that the truly virtuous person has a non-negotiable commitment to virtue that defies hedonistic weighing (C 1.129–30, 1.133, 1.261–2). He dismisses as absurd the proverb “That Tastes are different, and must not be disputed” (C 2.228). He explicitly contends “that Pleasure is no rule of Good,” because we judge which pleasures are and are not worth pursuing (C. 1.309; see also 2.249–50). I shouldn’t fancy things “as I please”; rather I should “learn to fansy, to admire, to please, as the Subjects themselves are deserving” (C 1.339). My rule of choice should not be “because I please” (C 1.339). I should ask, “is this Pleasure right?” (C 1.340). The question is not whether something pleases, but “whether we are rightly pleas’d” (C 2.227). Only some pleasures are really good, not all of them (C 2.229–30). We should define the choice-worthiness of pleasures by whether they are good; we shouldn’t define goodness by pleasure. The only sense in which it’s true that pleasure is what we always seek is the empty tautological sense according to which pleasure is just defined as that which “we think eligible” (C 2.227; see also 2.233–34).

How does Shaftesbury’s rejection of pleasure as the measure of choice-worthiness square with his seeming reliance in Book 2 of the Inquiry on virtue’s superiority at producing pleasure? Perhaps the eudaimonist reading explained above accounts for the combination of his claims that the virtuous person acts for non-self-interested reasons and that the virtuous person has a more pleasurable life than the vicious. Alternatively, the hedonistic interpretation might read the criticisms of pleasure as actually criticisms only of physical pleasures, not of mental pleasures. Another possibility is that Shaftesbury changed his mind. In the Inquiry, which he wrote early in his career, he emphasized pleasure. In The Moralists, Common Sense, and Soliloquy, which he wrote later, he de-emphasized pleasure, indicating a move away from an early hedonistic view.

3. Self, identity, and liberty

Shaftesbury discusses self and identity throughout Characteristicks. There are different views of how those discussions relate to traditional philosophical questions about personal identity.

In The Moralists, Shaftesbury contends that there is no physical or mental element that persists through a person’s entire life, yet it seems that one can remain the same self even amid all those changes. A person is a single thing, retaining an identity throughout the years. But that identity cannot consist of physical matter, as every particle of a person changes over time. The ‘Stuff … of which we are compos’d’, says Theocles, ‘wears out in seven, or, at the longest, in twice seven Years, [as] the meanest Anatomist can tell us. Now where, I beseech you, will that same One be found at last, supposing it to lie in the Stuff it-self, or any part of it? For when that is wholly spent, and not one Particle of it left, we are Our-selves still as much as before’ (C 2.350). Nor can a person’s identity be based on any idea or emotion, as all of a person’s ideas and emotions change as well. There’s no single mental item that has the constant existence that would be needed to fund a person’s identity. So since a person remains “one and the same, when neither one Atom of Body, one Passion, nor one Thought remains the same,” his identity must be based on “a Sympathy of Parts” (C 2.351). His identity must consist of an overall organization, of a “simple Principle: of which all the person’s different aspects partake (C 2.352).

Hume was dismissive of Shaftesbury’s claims in The Moralists about the identity, writing ”If the reader is desirous to see how a great genius may be influenc’d by these seemingly trivial principles of the imagination ... let him read my Lord Shaftesbury’s reasonings concerning the uniting principle of the universe, and the identity of plants and animals [in] his Moralists, a Philosophical Rhapsody: (Hume 1739–40: It seems, however, that Hume did learn something about personal identity from The Moralists. For Hume’s own view, like Shaftesbury’s, relies on the idea that there is no single “constant and invariable” mental item that can fund personal identity: compare Hume’s Treatise and C 2.350–51. Of course Hume and Shaftesbury draw opposite conclusions, with Shaftesbury moving from the premise that there is no constant and invariable physical or mental item to the conclusion that personal identity must consist of something other than a physical or mental item, and Hume moving to the conclusion that there is no personal identity.

Thiel attributes to Shaftesbury the metaphysical position that the self, that which constitutes the identity of a person, is a simple immaterial substance (Thiel 2011: 241–2). Jaffro distinguishes “between a normative sense of ‘being oneself’ or ‘remaining the same person’, and the metaphysical sense, that is, personal identity,” and argues that Shaftesbury is more concerned with the former (Jaffro 2014: 158). Winkler (2000) and Purviance (2004) pursue a similar line, arguing that Shaftesbury does not intend to provide an answer to the metaphysical question of personal identity. Shaftesbury’s interest in selves and identity, on this view, is practical rather than metaphysical. His concern is to explain a sense of self and identify that is a moral achievement—namely, the achievement of internal harmony of all one’s psychological principles, both at one moment and through time. On these readings, the important point is that achieving this synchronic and diachronic internal harmony ought to be a person’s fundamental goal, and Shaftesbury intends to give his readers guidance on how to achieve it.

Jaffro (2014) and Boeker (2018) elaborate on the practical aspect of Shaftesbury’s view. Jaffro and Boeker both emphasize the importance of self-control, where that involves the higher, reasonable aspect of one’s self determining one’s actions rather than the lower, appetites and passions (see also Crisp 2019: 88). Jaffro contends that Shaftesbury has a three-stage position on the self-control a persistent practical self requires. The first stage is a naïve belief that one can simply decide to act from her higher principles and succeed at it. The second stage is an avoidance strategy, which involves changing circumstances so that the lower appetites and passions cannot find room to play as large a role in one’s actions. The third stage is Stoic self-transformation, which involves changing one’s soul so that appetites and passions no longer pull in a different direction from the higher parts. Jaffro suggests that Shaftesbury believes that the third stage of self-transformation is accessible only to the supremely intellectual few, and that most people can only aspire to the second stage of avoidance (see also Stuart-Buttle 2019: 102). Boeker argues, in contrast, that Shaftesbury believes that all humans can engage in a journey toward the third stage, and that Characteristicks is intended to exhort them along on that journey.

Closely related to Shaftesbury’s positions on identity and self are his views of personal liberty. There is dispute about whether Shaftesbury advances a position on the philosophical question of free will and determinism. His view of the laws of nature seem to suggest that he believes in a determinist universe, but Grean (1967) suggests that when he discusses evil he might be allowing a Pelagian exception for free will. According to Grean, Shaftesbury “argues that providence has granted us the power to know and obtain what is good, and to know and avoid what it is evil. It is up to us to make use of these powers, to be men in the true sense—autonomous agents of Deity itself” (Grean 1967: 90; see also Axelsson 2019: 189). Woldt believes, in contrast, that Shaftesbury holds a compatibilist conception of free will (2014: 143–5). Boeker (2018) argues that Shaftesbury’s texts do not include enough substances on the issue to attribute to him one position or another. (See also Crisp 2019: 78.)

Boeker (2019) maintains that what Shaftesbury is interested in is positive freedom, or self-mastery. On this view, a person is free when she acts from her highest and most reasonable principles, rather than her lower appetites and passions. Many parts of Characteristicks do seem to involve this idea of a person’s comprising two competing parts. These includes the story of Hercules choosing virtue over pleasure (C 3.347–392), the story of two brothers battling for a football (C 1.187), the self-dialogue of Soliloquy (C, 1.156-59), and the story of a nobleman who faces loss of control to sexual desire (C 1.176–88). All these stories make the point that to be free is for one’s higher part to win out over one’s lower part (see also Crisp 2019, 75–76).

4. Aesthetics

4.1 Beauty

Beauty is at the center of Shaftesbury’s aesthetics. Shaftesbury discusses the beauty of literature, music, and painting. He takes the primary instances of physical beauty to be features of the natural world. Shaftesbury’s characters in The Moralists dismiss the beauty of gardens, arguing for the superiority of naturalness or wildness over the artifice and “formal Mockery of princely Gardens” (C 2.393–4). But Shaftesbury himself was a great lover of gardens, and the gardens he himself planned were more formal than they were wild or natural. For fascinating discussions of Shaftesbury’s views of gardening and their influences, see Leatherbarrow (1984), Liu (2008), Fleming (2014), and Myers (2010 and 2017).

Shaftesbury’s conception of beauty has metaphysical and epistemological components. Metaphysically, beauty consists of “Unity of Design” (C 3.349). Anything that has multiple parts that can be in unity with each other can be beautiful. An artwork can be beautiful, a machine can be beautiful, a natural object can be beautiful, nature as a whole can be beautiful, a human character can be beautiful. Shaftesbury uses various words to describe this property: “harmony,” “proportion,” “regularity,” “order,” “balance,” “symmetry.” His idea that this is what beauty consists of seems deeply indebted to Aristotelian and Stoic conceptions of the fine and the beautiful.

Epistemologically, we discern beauty through experience of a positive affection. We experience a positive “internal Sensation” when we hear musical harmonies, when we observe a proportionate building, when we appreciate the balance of nature, when we witness fully integrated characters (C 2.285). “Nor can [one’s mind] with-hold its Admiration and Extasy, its Aversion and Scorn, any more in what relates to one than to the other of these Subjects” (C 2.29). We have a “taste” for unified wholes. We have a “liking” for harmony and a “dislike” of its contrary. We have an emotional sensibility that’s tuned to standards of order, regularity, and balance.

A question for Shaftesbury is whether his metaphysical view of the property of beauty is conceptually prior to his epistemological view of our discernment of beauty, or vice versa. We might, in other words, ask him: in a world in which we were built to like disharmonious things, would we all be wrong about what is beautiful (metaphysics prior), or would disharmonious thing be in fact beautiful (epistemology prior)? Shaftesbury’s texts may not provide a perfectly clear answer to this question, but there is certainly evidence that he would want to say that the metaphysics is prior. For he wanted to be a “Realist in Morality,” where realism involves “immutable” and “eternal Measures” of morality that are independent of any mind (C 2.267; 2.36). Such mind-independent moral measures are necessary for Shaftesbury’s refutation of what he takes to be the pernicious subjectivism of Hobbes and the despicable voluntarism of the Calvinists. And he explicitly equates the metaphysical status of moral beauty with the beauty of objects. Here’s a passage in which he makes an emphatic statement that seems to affirm the mind-independence of beauty in general and of moral beauty in particular.

Harmony is Harmony by Nature, let Men judg ever so ridiculously of Musick. So is Symmetry and Proportion founded still in Nature, let Mens Fancy prove ever so barbarous, or their Fashions ever so Gothick in their Architecture, Sculpture, or whatever other designing Art. ’Tis the same case, where Life and Manners are concern’d. Virtue has the same fix’d Standard. The same Numbers, Harmony, and Proportion will have place in Morals; and are discoverable in the Charactersand Affections of Mankind; in which are laid the just Foundations of an Art and Science, superior to every other of human Practice and Comprehension. (C 1.353)

The standards of beauty have an existence that is independent of human responses, distinct from any “human Practice and Comprehension.” Even if we responded totally differently than we actually do, the same sounds would be beautifully harmonious, the same structures would be beautifully symmetrical, and the same characters would be beautifully integrated.

But there’s a problem with this affirmation of the mind-independence of beauty. Shaftesbury relies on the idea that harmony will be harmony and symmetry will be symmetry regardless of how humans respond to advance the idea that virtue will be virtue regardless of how humans respond. But this line of thought seems to involve an illicit slide between non-normative and normative understandings of the key terms. It may be reasonable to grant that there are non-normative properties of harmony and symmetry that have a mind-independent existence—that some sounds would be harmonious and some objects would be symmetrical regardless of whether there were any human minds, or how human minds responded to them. But to say those sounds and objects are beautiful is to invoke a normative component. It’s to imply that the harmonious and the symmetrical are more valuable, are in some sense better than the dissonant and the lopsided. And Shaftesbury has given us no reason to accept that harmony and symmetry would continue to be normatively superior even if human minds were constructed to respond negatively to them and positively to dissonance and lopsidedness. Shaftesbury might have given us reason to believe there would be a non-normative difference between unified and disunified objects regardless of how anyone responds to them. But that’s not what he needs to establish the mind-independence of beauty as something normative. What he needs is to show that unity would be more valuable, would be better than disunity, even if our sensibility was constructed to respond positively to the disunified. The comparison with the non-normative properties of harmony and symmetry doesn’t help with that.

4.2 Aesthetic experience

Aesthetic responses, for Shaftesbury, involve some kind of affective reaction, but there is interpretative disagreement about the extent to which that affective reaction is immediate or reflective. In some passages, Shaftesbury seems to suggest that our sense of beauty operates immediately, like our sensations of color.

No sooner the Eye opens upon Figures, the Ear to Sounds, than straight the Beautiful results, and Grace and Harmony are known and acknowledg’d. (C 2.414)

The Shapes, Motions, Colours, and Proportions of [Bodys, or the common Subjects of Sense] being presented to our Eye; there necessarily results a Beauty or Deformity, according to the different Measure, Arrangement and Disposition of their several Parts. (C 2.28–9; see also 2.285)

Stolnitz takes these passages to show that for Shaftesbury “Aesthetic response is ‘immediate,’ in the sense that it takes place without discursive reflection” (Stolnitz 1961b: 198; see also 1961a: 112). In other passages, however, Shaftesbury emphasizes the need for extensive cultivation and reflection in order to pass accurate aesthetic judgment (see Glauser 2002: 45).

Taste or Judgment … can hardly come ready form’d with us into the World… Use, Practice and Culture must precede the Understanding and Wit of such an advanc’d Size and Growth as this. A legitimate and just Taste can neither be begotten, made, conceiv’d, or produc’d, without the antecedent Labour and Pains of Criticism. (C 3.164)

Shaftesbury goes on to offer an extensive defense of critics, maintaining that the kind of discursive attention they give to art is necessary for artistic improvement and full appreciation (C 3.165–9). Such passages have led other commentators to conclude that correct aesthetic taste for Shaftesbury requires well-cultivated reflective, discursive abilities (Rivers 2000a: 126–9; Darwall 1995: 186; Townsend 1982: 210–12).

Shaftesbury clearly distinguishes between a person’s appreciating the beauty of an object and a person’s appreciating the benefits an object can produce for him or herself. He writes, for instance, of the obvious difference between the enjoyment of the beauty of an ocean or landscape, on the one hand, and the desire to command these things and gain advantage from them, on the other (C 2.396–7). He also contends that the pleasure we experience when coming to appreciate beauty is

of a kind which relates not in the least to any private Interest…, nor has for its Object any Self-good or Advantage of the private System. The Admiration, Joy, or Love, turns wholly upon what is exterior, and foreign to our-selves. (C 2.104)

A person who is truly responding to beauty does not consider the desirable consequences that may be associated with a beautiful object but rather responds favorably to the object “for its own sake” (C 2.59), based purely on “the Excellence of the Object” (C 2.273). Such a person’s response is not sensitive to external circumstances but results merely from “seeing and admiring” (C 2.43).

On the basis of these passages, Stolnitz argues that Shaftesbury lays the groundwork for the idea that aesthetic responses are essentially “disinterested” (Stolnitz 1961a and b; see also Glauser 2002 and Savile 2002.) Shaftesbury, according to Stolnitz, was the first to develop this concept, which “is nowhere to be found in classical and medieval aesthetics. It is Shaftesbury who claims the distinction of being the first thinker to bring the phenomenon of disinterestedness to light and analyzing it” (Stolnitz 1961a: 100). Appreciation of beauty, on this view, has nothing to do with thoughts about any instrumental purpose a work of art may serve, not to do with the promotion of ends of any kind. Someone might value an artwork because it will improve morals, or make money, or teach history, or inspire religious adoration. But its aesthetic value is utterly distinct from any of those. “Aesthetic perception looks to no consequences ulterior to itself” (Stolnitz 1961a: 108). According to this idea, which Stolnitz takes to be the defining feature of modern aesthetic theory, an aesthetic response is a response solely to the intrinsic features of an object, independent of any other type of consideration, such as the object’s utility to the perceiver or to society, its moral value, or its capacity to increase knowledge. Aesthetics, on this view, is autonomous, self-contained, impersonal, non-instrumental. Stolnitz is careful (in a way that some of his critics have failed to note) not to claim that Shaftesbury himself held exactly this aesthetic view. What Stolnitz claims, rather, is that Shaftesbury’s distinguishing of perceptions of beauty and judgments of self-interest was a crucial influence on the disinterested aesthetic views that would come later, even if Shaftesbury himself also held views that did not fit with those later views (Stolnitz 1961a: 100 and 108).

Numerous commentators have argued against the view that Shaftesbury advances the notion of aesthetic disinterestedness (see Townsend 1982; Rind 2002; Mortensen 1995; Arregui and Arnan 1994; White 1973; Axelsson 2019: 180–4). In contrast, they take Shaftesbury to hold that the value of aesthetic beauty is entirely instrumental. On this anti-Stolnitzian view, Shaftesbury intends to contrast an appreciation of an object’s beauty only with certain vicious or selfish concerns, not with all non-aesthetic considerations whatsoever. An appreciation of beauty, on this reading of Shaftesbury, is “not to be identified with luxury, covetousness, avarice, ostentation, and similar … immoral qualities” (Mortensen 1994: 637; see also Rind 2002: 72–3). But an appreciation of beauty can and should involve consideration of virtue and the improvement of moral character. Townsend says that Shaftesbury does not ever truly give “disinterestedness a special significance. It is not really proposed as any kind of test, nor does it characterize a special class of perceptions or judgments. It is much more important to Shaftesbury to determine what our true interests are” (Townsend 1982: 211). The editors of the Standard Edition write in their preface to the volume on Shaftesbury’s aesthetics, “for Shaftesbury the enjoyment of art was never to be an end in itself, but had always to serve a moral purpose (Second Characters: 18). Derhmann says that Shaftesbury believed that ”Art is merely the means to a further end,“ where that end is moral improvement” (2014: 48). In explicit attack on Stolnitz, Mortensen writes, “On the contrary, Shaftesbury’s aim was to situate the contemplation of art within a morality acceptable to his contemporaries” (1994: 631). According to Mortensen, Shaftesbury’s goal was to give a “moral defense of the appreciation of art,” according to which art appreciation is justified by its capacity to improve moral character.

Stolnitz paints Shaftesbury as facing forward, toward the modern view of art for art’s sake.“[T]he work of art must be evaluated in respect of its intrinsic structure and significance, not as a moral vehicle”; when we are in the aesthetic realm, “the ethical question withdraws” (Stolnitz 1961a: 99 and 107). According to these other commentators, Shaftesbury affirms the intrinsic value of virtue; art has only the instrumental value of promoting virtue. They paint Shaftesbury as looking backward, to Stoicism. (See Tiffany 1923; Dehrmann 2014; for discussion, see Axelsson 2019.

Shaftesbury contends that all appreciation of beauty is appreciation of mind. When we respond positively to beautiful objects, what we are really responding to is the mind that designed them, not the physical stuff itself. “[T]here is no Principle of Beauty in Body,” he says. “[T]he Beautifying, not the Beautify’d, is the really Beautiful” (C 2.404–5; see also 2.426). Shaftesbury also places all beauty in a three-part hierarchy. The lowest order of beauty belongs to “the dead Forms”—physical things such as manmade works of art and natural objects (C 2.406). The second order of beauty belongs to human minds, or “the Forms which form, that is, which have intelligence, action, and operation” (C 2.406). The third order of beauty belongs to that “which forms not only such as we call mere Forms, but even the Forms which form” (C 2.408). This highest, most supreme and sovereign beauty, belongs to God, who has created everything in the world, including human minds (see Kivy 2003: 12, Den Uyl 1998: 294). With his hierarchy, Shaftesbury expresses the idea that the beauty of human minds is superior to the beauty of physical objects, and that the beauty of God’s mind is superior to the beauty of human minds, although his reasons underlying this idea are not perfectly clear.

Adherents of the instrumentalist interpretation take Shaftesbury’s points about beauty of mind and the hierarchy as evidence that Shaftesbury thinks physical objects are not really beautiful at all, and that we should aspire to care only about the beauty of minds (see especially Tiffany 1923). On this view, the beauty of objects (including all art) is merely an early stage of appreciation of beauty that the wise person eventually leaves behind. Against this interpretation, however, Glauser argues that Shaftesbury’s notion of beauty-as-unity implies that material things can truly be beautiful, even if Shaftesbury’s characters sometimes seem to suggest otherwise. According to Glauser’s interpretation of Shaftesbury, because a material thing really can possess a unified form, a material thing really can have the property of beauty. It may be a less significant kind of beauty than the beauty of a mind, but it can be beauty nonetheless. Because works of art “are temporarily beautified by their respective principles, they do have beauty, although in some lesser measure” (Glauser 2002: 30). Glauser thinks that in the passages that seem to assert that material things cannot possess beauty the character of Theocles has been “carried away by his own rhetoric.” Other times, Shaftesbury rightly affirms that physical things can be beautiful, such as when he has Theocles say that that “which is beautify’d, is beautiful only by the accession of something beautifying” (C 2.404) and that what we admire is “Mind, or the Effect of Mind” (C 2.405).

Whatever the best interpretation may be of Shaftesbury’s view of aesthetic responses, Mortensen (1994) does marshal plentiful evidence that one of Shaftesbury’s chief goals was to advance a concept of good “taste” that would improve the moral character of British gentlemen. Klein (1994) expands on this idea, showing how Shaftesbury sought to develop the concepts of taste, manners, and politeness in such a way as to provide a moral foundation for British life that would supplant the outdated and unsatisfactory institutional supports of church and court. Den Uyl (1998) also explicates Shaftesbury view of the moralizing effects of the perception of beauty, pointing to Shaftesbury’s claims that

to be a Virtuoso … is a higher step towards the becoming a Man of Virtue and good Sense, than the being what in his Age we call a Scholar (C 1.333)


Thus are the Arts and Virtues mutually Friends; and thus the Science of Virtuoso’s and that of Virtue it-self, become, in a manner, one and the same. (C 1.338)

5. Politics

5.1 How political is Characteristicks?

In recent years, a number of commentators have highlighted Shaftesbury’s political commitments and their role in his philosophy. Klein (1994) was one of the earliest and most developed attempts to chart the political in Shaftesbury’s thought. Jaffro (2018), Müller (2018), Jost (2018), and Axelsson (2019, 223–38) have made similar points (see also Williams 2005, 234). Shaftesbury was, of course, the grandson of the first Earl of Shaftesbury, and the family was strongly associated with the Whig Party. Shaftesbury himself (when he was Lord Ashley) was a Whig member of the House of Commons from 1695–1698. After his father’s death in 1699 he assumed the Earldom and entered the House of Lords, while continuing to play a role in Whig electoral efforts of 1701 (and, to a lesser extent, of 1705).

Klein argues that Characteristicks was largely motivated by Shaftesbury’s anti-Tory politics. Klein highlights Shaftesbury’s endorsement of the 1688 revolution, of religious toleration, of a balance of power between Parliament and monarch, and—most centrally—of extensive liberty. Klein says that Shaftesbury’s goal “was a program of education in which the moral and literary would be combined to produce virtuous public action. Shaftesbury was designing a Whiggism that was civic and humanist.” Klein argues that Shaftesbury’s discussion of “imposture” in A Letter concerning Enthusiasm was an attack on Tory religious views. Klein also cites a 1710 letter in which Shaftesbury says that in the third volume of Characteristicks he intended “to attack and provoke a most malignant party,” and goes on to express the hope that his work will destroy that party’s hold on English academics, religion, and culture (Regimen 432).

Jaffro (2018) argues that Shaftesbury takes “balance” to be the ideal of both a political constitution and a human’s psychological make-up. And Jaffro argues the value Shaftesbury places on balance is an implicit commitment to Harrington’s political program in The Commonwealth of Oceana.

Jost (2018) and Müller (2018) both find esoteric political messages in Shaftesbury’s work. According to Jost, Shaftesbury’s exhortation to of divide oneself into two for self-reflection is an implicit endorsement of the Whig party over the Tories. Müller argues that Shaftesbury’s attack on religion based on selfish reward in the afterlife is an implicit attack on Tory tyranny.

Questions have been raised about how political in general and partisan in particular Shaftesbury’s Characteristicks is (Gill 2020). Shaftesbury seems at times to be repudiating partisanship, arguing for an identification with all people that rises above political squabbles. Many of his central positions on beauty and morality may not involve any clear political commitments. And while in some letters Shaftesbury vociferously attacks Tories, in others he claims that he doesn’t think of himself as powerfully aligned with any political party (Regimen 366–67).

5.2 Liberty and ridicule

An overriding feature of Shaftesbury’s political thinking is the importance of “Liberty in general” (C 3.314). In a letter, he said that “the Triumph of Liberty” is “the hinge and Bottom of all three [volumes of Characteristicks] and of the whole Work it self” (see Klein 1994: 124). He opposes absolutism and tyranny in all forms, arguing vociferously for free public discourse and toleration of different religious practices. He tries to show that control by church and court is not necessary—is in fact counterproductive—to the virtue, sociability, and politeness of citizens (see Klein 1994: 124–135 and 195–7; Den Uyl 1998: 310; Carey 2006: 126). On Klein and Müller’s readings (discussed above), proper attention to Shaftesbury’s commitment to liberty and to the weakening of the control of church and court reveals that Characteristicks is fundamentally a pro-Whig, anti-Tory tract (Klein 1994: 125; Müller 2013 and 2014a).

Den Uyl argues that Shaftesbury does not think the state can or should actively promote virtue (Den Uyl 1998: 310–315). Schneewind makes a similar point when he writes, “The virtuous agent is not created by the political structure he inhabits. He brings his character to it” (Schneewind 1998: 309; see also 295–8, 307–9). The best political course, consequently, is for the state to allow as much liberty as possible, because that is most likely to give individuals their own opportunity to fashion morally beautiful characters. Political liberty creates the conditions for virtue, even if politics cannot promote virtue itself. (For possibly countervailing evidence see C 2.36–7, where Shaftesbury might be suggesting that proper civic laws can promote virtue).

Müller argues that Shaftesbury’s commitment to liberty is grounded in his fundamental moral position that virtue consists not merely of performing certain actions but of acting from the right motives (Müller 2012 and 2013; see C 2.12–15, 32, 38). A person who benefits others only because she thinks she will be rewarded if she does so, and will be punished if she does not, does not possess virtue. Her beneficence is virtuous only if it is motivated by concern for others, not by selfish considerations external to others’ welfare. Thus, even if the authorities of church and court can institute rewards and punishments that may induce certain kinds of behavior, they will have done nothing to promote virtue.

Shaftesbury believes that a free exchange of ideas will produce the same benefits for the intellectual world that a “Free-Port” produces for commerce, and he maintains that

Wit will mend upon our hands and Humour will refine it-self; if we take care not to tamper with it, and bring it under Constraint. (C 1.64)

Shaftesbury contends as well that the more liberty there is in a society, the greater its advancements will be in politeness, understanding, and the arts. “All Politeness is owing to Liberty,” he writes.

We polish one another, and rub off our Corners and rough Sides by a sort of amicable Collision. To restrain this, is inevitably to bring a Rust upon Mens Understandings. ’Tis a destroying of Civility, Good Breeding and even Charity it-self, under pretence of maintaining it. (C 1.64–5)

About the arts he writes,

’Tis easy … to apprehend the Advantages of our Britain [over states with less liberty] and what effect its establish’d Liberty will produce in every thing which relates to Art. (C 1.219)

Justness of Thought and Style, Refinement in Manners, good Breeding, and Politeness of every kind, can come only from the Trial and Experience of what is best. Let but the Search go freely on, and the right Measure of every thing will soon be found. (C 1.10)

On this basis Den Uyl attributes to Shaftesbury a belief in the efficacy of a “marketplace of ideas” to “promote truth and the reformation of character” (Den Uyl 1998: 314; see also Darwall 1995: 186).

One of the most conspicuous elements of Shaftesbury’s belief in the benefits of free speech and other forms of liberty is his “Test of Ridicule” (C 1.11). He argues that the state should allow the people to engage in public ridicule because it will ultimately expose the problems in faulty views and leave unscathed the strengths of reasonable views. As Lund (2012) and Amir (2016) point out, Shaftesbury never says explicitly that ridicule is the test of truth, but he makes statements that are very similar to that. He writes, “I am sure the only way to save Mens Sense, or preserve Wit at all in the World, is to give Liberty to Wit” (C 1.19). Also: “Truth … may bear all Lights” (C 1.61) and “Nothing is ridiculous except what is deform’d” (C 1.128). Ridicule will reveal the ridiculousness of things that really are ridiculous, but no lasting “Ridicule can lie against Reason” (C 1.11). Reasonable positions will always be able “to endure a Ridicule wrongly plac’d” because while people may be “frighted out of their wits”, they will never “be laugh’d out of ‘em” (C 1.96). True ideas will not be harmed by ridicule, while false ideas will. One of Shaftesbury’s prime examples of truth and reasonableness being able to withstand ridicule is Socrates, toward whom ridicule was directed but to whom ridicule did not stick (C 1.32). His prime example of ridicule undermining what really is ridiculous is the use of humor and wit to mock fanatical religious views. Indeed, ridicule is the very best way to deal with unhinged religious fanatics. For while governmental restriction on those enraptured by “superstition and enthusiasm” is likely only to inflame their ardor, witty ridicule (such as puppet shows) will work to deprive such views of the opposition they need to thrive, inevitably leading to their withering in the face of the reasonable and sober (C 1.18).

Amir (2016) argues that Shaftesbury’s optimism about ridicule’s capacity to undermine falsity and only falsity is based on his metaphysical view that what is true is harmonious. According to Amir, without the belief that everything that is true is harmonious, and that all deformity fails to capture truths of God’s creation, Shaftesbury’s optimism about the test of ridicule will appear unmotivated and naive.

Shaftesbury does not, however, propose unlimited free speech. While he is in favor of a good-humored ridicule, he also thinks there is a vicious kind of ridicule that does not serve the purposes of truth—although it is not always clear what principled distinction he draws between on the one hand “genteelest Wit” and “true Raillery,” and on the other “scurrilous Buffoonery” and “Malignity hid under Humanity” (C 1.63, 1.65; Klein 1995, 138). The former works as a test of truth, but the latter does not. The latter may thus be subject to legal penalty: “If men are vicious, petulant, or abusive; the Magistrate may correct them” (C 1.10). This raises the question of whether Shaftesbury can produce an account of the right kind of ridicule. He seems to believe that the right kind of ridicule is motivated by a genuine and good-humored concern for truth and public good, while the wrong kind is not. But it is far from clear that this will give us a principled method for determining which speech should be allowed and which should not.

Carroll (2018) shows that Shaftesbury supported various restrictions on speech and publication throughout his political career. He might have been opposed to pre-publication censorship, but he was not opposed to post-publication penalties that would serve as a deterrent. As a result, Carroll maintains, we should not take Shaftesbury’s defense of speech to be an argument for a completely open public sphere. (See also Müller 2013 and Chavez 2008.)

Even for speech he takes to be a legitimate contribution to worthwhile discourse it is not clear how expansive a realm of freedom Shaftesbury has in mind. Sometimes he suggests that completely free discussion is appropriate only within a club for elites, and not amid the hurly-burly of the hoi polloi. As he writes in Wit and Humour,

For you are to remember (my Friend!) that I am writing to you in defence only of the Liberty of the Club, and of that sort of Freedom which is taken amongst Gentlemen and Friends, who know one another perfectly well. And that ’tis natural for me to defend Liberty with this restriction, you may infer from the very Notion I have of Liberty it-self. (C 1.75)

(For discussion of Shaftesbury’s view of the “club” and the public, see Carey 2006: 128 and Chaves 2008: 54.)

5.3 Toleration

Shaftesbury’s commitment to liberty extends to toleration of religious difference (see Carey 2006: 144–5 and Klein 1994: 137). His reasons for this are consonant with his reasons for thinking the best the state can do with regard to personal morality is create the conditions for people to achieve virtue on their own. Just as it is impossible to force people to virtue because virtue essentially involves acting from reasons other than external reward and punishment, so too is it impossible to force people to true religious devotion because true religious devotion essentially involves an inward feeling of love—“the disinterested Love of God” (C 2.271), the “love of God for his own sake” (C 2.58)—and not merely the kind of external behavior that can be enforced. Forcing people to love God is no more possible than forcing someone to romantically love another person (C 1.17–19). In fact, attempts to force religious uniformity—“a hopeful Project!” Shaftesbury sarcastically calls it—are bound to failure, likely resulting only in in the further corruption of people’s characters (C 1.19).

But a new sort of Policy, which extends it-self to another World, and considers the future Lives and Happiness of Men rather than the present, has made us leap the Bounds of natural Humanity; and out of a supernatural Charity, has taught us the way of plaguing one another most devoutly. It has rais’d an Antipathy which no temporal Interest cou’d ever do; and entail’d upon us a mutual Hatred to all Eternity. (C 1.18–19)

Restrictions on religious practices are likely to be as counterproductive as attempts to enforce virtue. Shaftesbury is not, however, opposed to state-established religion. “People shou’d have a Publick Leading in Religion,” he writes.

For to deny the Magistrate a Worship, or take away a National Church, is as mere Enthusiasm as the Notion which sets up Persecution. For why shou’d there not be publick Walks, as well as private Gardens? (C 1.17)

5.4 Criticism of social contract theory

Shaftesbury rejects Hobbesian social contract theory. He argues that the selfish beings Hobbes described in his state of nature bear no resemblance to humans as they actually are. He takes the theory to be based on the claim that humans originally existed in a state of nature that was an unsociable war of all against all. Such a picture is flatly contradicted by the facts of human nature as Shaftesbury understands them. Our innate constitution compels us toward society. Our inborn “Facultys” move us directly toward “Fellowship or Community” (C 2.317). Sociability is as natural to humans—as inextricably built into human nature—as self-interest (C 2.78; 2.318-19).

Shaftesbury also argues that there is an incoherence in Hobbes’s combination of the claims that it is not wrong to kill or maim other humans in the state of nature and that the original compact justifies allegiance to government:

’Tis ridiculous to say, there is any Obligation on Man to act sociably, or honestly, in a form’d Government; and not in that which is commonly call’d the State of Nature. For, to speak in the fashionable Language of our modern Philosophy: “Society being founded on a Compact; the Surrender made of every Man’s private unlimited Right, into the hands of the Majority, or such as the Majority shou’d appoint, was of free Choice, and by a Promise.” Now the Promise it-self was made in the State of Nature: And that which cou’d make a Promise obligatory in the State of Nature, must make allother Acts of Humanity as much our real Duty, and natural Part. Thus Faith, Justice, Honesty, and Virtue, must have been as early as the State of Nature, or they cou’d never have been at all. The Civil Union, or Confederacy, cou’d never make Right or Wrong; if they subsisted not before. He who was free to any Villany before his Contract, will, and ought to make as free with his Contract, when he thinks fit. The Natural Knave has the same reason to be a Civil one; and may dispense with his politick Capacity as oft as he sees occasion: ’Tis only his Word stands in his way—A Man is oblig’d to keep his Word. Why? Because he has given his Word to keep it—Is not this a notable Account of the Original of moral Justice, and the Rise of Civil Government and Allegiance! (C 1.109–110; see also 2.310–321)

Shaftesbury’s argument is in the form of a dilemma. Either promises in the state of nature have obligatory force, or they do not. If promises in the state of nature do have obligatory force, then Hobbes can account for our obligation to obey government but only by abandoning his story about a state of nature in which violence toward others is not wrong. For someone who acknowledges that promises are naturally obligatory will have no grounds for denying that other things are naturally obligatory as well: “If in original and pure Nature, it be wrong to break a Promise, or be treacherous; ‘tis as truly wrong to be in any respect in human, or any way wanting in our natural part towards human kind” (C 1.110). If, on the other hand, Hobbes claims that promises do not have obligatory force in the state of nature, then he has to abandon his account of our obligation to obey government. For if a promise in the state of nature has no obligatory force, and if the only difference between a knave in the state of nature and knave in the commonwealth is that the latter made a promise in the state of nature, then the commonwealth-knave is no more in violation of his obligations than the nature-knave.

Humans are naturally sociable. Society is humankind’s natural condition.

In short, if Generation be natural, if natural Affection and the Care and Nurture of the Offspring be natural, Things standing as they do with Man, and the Creature being of that Form and Constitution he now is; it follows, “That Society must be also natural to him; And That out of Society and Community he never did, nor ever can subsist”. (C 2.318–19)

Social contract theory, according to Shaftesbury, is based on false views of human psychology.

6. Innate Ideas

Shaftesbury resists Locke’s attack on innate ideas, particularly as it applies to morality. Shaftesbury maintains that the “main scope and principal end” of Characteristicks is “to assert the Reality of a Beauty and Charm in moral as well as natural Subjects” (C 3.303), and he believes that Locke’s rejection of innate ideas undermines that moral reality. Locke’s rejection of innate ideas, as Shaftesbury sees it, implies that our moral ideas must be nothing but the result of custom and instruction, and that they are therefore relative to the contingent events of each person’s own society and upbringing. But morality, if it exists, must be based in a uniform nature. Morality is natural or it is nothing at all. And Locke’s rejection of innate ideas implies that morality is not natural. (For discussion of Shaftesbury’s attack on Locke’s view of innate ideas, see Carey 2006, 98–99; Uehlein 2017; and Stuart–Buttle 2019: 90–102. Stuart-Buttle responds to Spellman (1998: 201), who argues that Shaftesbury badly misinterprets Locke.)

Because the word ‘innate’ is ambiguous and controversial, Shaftesbury chooses to affirm the naturalness of morality in other terms (C 2.411–12). “Implanted” is a word he uses often, contending that a “sense of Right and Wrong” (C 2.60), a “Principle of Virtue” (C 2.38), and “original ideas of goodness” (C 1.33) are implanted in every human. He also speaks of our “Pre-conceptions, or Pre-sensations” of morality, which are ideas, principles, and affections that possess moral content but do not originate in experience (C 2.412–3; see also 2.307; 2.25–6). Another word he uses to express his opposition to Locke’s anti-nativism is ‘anticipation,’ as when he writes,

[W]e cannot resist our natural Anticipation in behalf of Nature; according to whose suppos’d Standard we perpetually approve and disapprove, and to whom in all natural Appearances, all moral Actions (whatever we contemplate, whatever we have in debate) we inevitably appeal. (C 3.214; see also 2.45, 2.412; 2.420; 3.214)

His point here is that we base our moral judgments on a standard that we recognize prior to (or in anticipation of) any of our particular experiences. Similarly, he says that we have a “Prepossession of the Mind, in favour of this moral Distinction” (C 2.44). The distinction that is important to Shaftesbury is between aspects of human life that are based in instincts or natural tendencies, and aspects that result from artifice, culture, and instruction (C 2.411). Shaftesbury’s main contention is that many morally significant aspects of human life fall in into the first category rather than the second. We naturally care for children. We naturally seek company and prefer sociability to solitariness. We naturally form groups bound by “Love of a common City, Community, or Country” (C 2.308–9). We naturally find some types of conduct beautiful and virtuous, and others not so.

But while Shaftesbury claims that all humans naturally (or instinctively) possess (or are imprinted with) a sense of right and wrong (a principle of virtue, original ideas of goodness), he also believes that a great deal of cultivation and refinement is necessary in order to develop correct and proper judgment (C 1.190–1). Virtue and good taste may be natural, but it turns out that a proper education is needed for most people to achieve them. How can Shaftesbury both insist on the naturalness of morality and beauty, and contend for the need of intensive critical moral and aesthetic reflection? Carey has argued that Shaftesbury believes this apparent problem can be dissolved by the Stoic concept of prolepsis (Carey 2006: 110–116). Prolepses are notions that do “not depend on or derive from instruction or experience” (Carey 2006: 112). But prolepses are merely mental anticipations, not fully formed concepts—they are pre–conceptions—and as such they can be poorly developed and misapplied. To give prolepses their most complete form and to apply them properly, practice and cultivation are necessary. Shaftesbury can thus hold that ethics requires the “right application of the Affections” (C 2.35), and he can attribute mistaken ethical judgments to a “Defect in the application of that unavoidable Impression and first natural Rule of Honesty and Worth” (C 3.303–4).

7. Religion

7.1 Anti-voluntarism

Central to Shaftesbury’s religious views is a rejection of the voluntarist claim that morality is determined by divine will. If God’s will determined morality, Shaftesbury argues, it would be meaningless to praise God for being moral.

For whoever thinks there is a God, and pretends formally to believe that he is just and good, must suppose that there is independently such a thing as Justice and Injustice, Truth and Falshood, Right and Wrong; according to which he pronounces that God is just, righteous, and true. (C 2.49–50)

Anyone who believes it is meaningful to love God because of God’s virtue must believe that morality is prior to God’s will.

Against the voluntarists, Shaftesbury maintains that God’s will is determined by morality. As Theocles (of The Moralists) says of the position advanced by the author of the Inquiry,

[I]n respect of Virtue, what you lately call’d a Realist; he endeavours to shew, “That it is really something in it-self, and in the nature of Things: not arbitrary or factitious, (if I may so speak) not constituted from without, or dependent on Custom, Fancy, or Will; not even on the Supreme Will it-self, which can no-way govern it: but being necessarily good, is govern’d by it, and ever uniform with it”. (C 2.267)

There are certain things we know to be necessarily true, such as that a contradiction cannot hold and that it must be wrong to punish one person for a different person’s wrongdoing. But voluntarism has the contrary—and thus absurd—implications.

If the mere Will, Decree, or Law of God be said absolutely to constitute Right and Wrong, then are these latter words of no significancy at all. For thus if each part of a Contradiction were affirm’d for Truth by the supreme Power, they wou’d consequently become true. Thus if one Person were decreed to suffer for another’s fault, the Sentence wou’d be just and equitable. And thus, in the same manner, if arbitrarily, and without reason, some Beings were destin’d to endure perpetual Ill, and others as constantly to enjoy Good; this also wou’d pass under the same Denomination. But to say of any thing that it is just or unjust, on such a foundation as this, is to say nothing, or to speak without a meaning (C 2.50)

Evident here is Shaftesbury’s belief that our certainty about some things (including our certainty that the conduct supralapsarian Calvinists attribute to God is wrong) is sufficient basis for the rejection of all theologies that place God’s will prior to morality. In passages such as this, Shaftesbury manifests a profound affinity with the Cambridge Platonists (see Cassirer 1953: 159–202; Rivers 2000a: 88; Gill 2006: 12–29 and 77–82).

As we have seen, Shaftesbury also argues that belief in voluntarism has significantly deleterious moral effects. If you believe certain actions are wrong only because God arbitrarily commands you not to perform them, then your overwhelming reason for not performing those actions will be the self-interested desire to avoid God’s punishment. But if that self-interested desire becomes your overwhelming motivation, it will crowd out and eventually destroy the other-loving motives that are essential to your own virtue and happiness (C 2.55–6, 2.58–9; see also 1.97, 2.48–50, 2.267).

7.2 Criticism of revelation: miracles, scripture, fanatical enthusiasm

Shaftesbury’s own position on religious belief has negative and positive aspects. The negative aspect is opposition to belief based on revelation. The positive aspect is affirmation of a perfectly good God based on observation of the natural order.

Shaftesbury argues against reliance on revelation in the form of miracles, of scripture, and of (certain types of) enthusiastic experiences.

Shaftesbury holds that the occurrence of miracles would contradict rather than support proper theological belief. The essential feature of the observable world on which proper theological belief is based is its order, the operation of myriad different systems according to elegant and harmonious natural laws. But a miracle is an occurrence that violates that order, something defined as a contradiction of natural law. As such, a miracle would undermine belief in a Creator who works by “just and uniform” laws (C 2.334). A miracle would evince not a single great and good God but “either the Chaos and Atoms of the Atheists, or the Magick and Daemons of the Polytheists” (C 2.335–6). As Theocles says in The Moralists to a character who has made a plea for miracles:

For whilst you are labouring to unhinge Nature; whilst you are searching Heaven and Earth for Prodigys, and studying how to miraculize every thing; you bring Confusion on the World, you break its Uniformity, and destroy that admirable Simplicity of Order, from whence the One infinite and perfect Principle is known. (C 2.335)

Even if a miracle could establish the existence of a being with unusual power, it would not prove that such a being had the qualities of perfect goodness we should rightly attribute to God.

For what tho innumerable Miracles from every part assail’d the Sense, and gave the trembling Soul no respite? What tho the Sky shou’d suddenly open, and all kinds of Prodigys appear, Voices be heard, or Characters read? What wou’d this evince more than “That there were certain Powers cou’d do all this?” But “What Powers; Whether One, or more; Whether Superior, or Subaltern; Mortal, or Immortal; Wise, or Foolish; Just, or Unjust; Good, or Bad”: this wou’d still remain a Mystery; as wou’d the true Intention, the Infallibility or Certainty of whatever these Powers asserted (C 2.334)

Belief in beings with unusual powers is not the same thing as true theism, which is belief in a perfectly good—perfectly orderly—God (C 2.6).

Shaftesbury raises multiple objections to religious views that claim to be based solely on the revealed word of scripture. It is claimed that those who write scripture are divinely inspired. But even if they are divinely inspired, they must still write in human language. And the translation from divine inspiration to human language opens up space for interpretation and criticism.

’Tis indeed no small Absurdity, to assert a Work or Treatise, written in human Language, to be above human Criticism, or Censure. For if the Art of Writing be from the grammatical Rules of human Invention and Determination; if even these Rules are form’d on casual Practice and various Use: there can be no Scripture but what must of necessity be subject to the Reader’s narrow Scrutiny and strict Judgment; unless a Language and Grammar, different from any of human Structure, were deliver’d down from Heaven, and miraculously accommodated to human Service and Capacity. (C 3.229)

At least as problematic for the claim to base religion entirely on scripture is the great diversity of texts for which claims of divine inspiration have been made. There have been many different versions of the scriptural stories through the centuries. And human decisions—decisions that can be examined, explained, critiqued, questioned—have led to some texts being deemed canonical, complete, and perfect and others apocryphal, partial, inaccurate. As Carey puts Shaftesbury’s point,

How can we establish the text itself, distinguishing the apocryphal from the canonical corpus of writings, given the range of manuscripts, transcripts, copies, and textual traditions associated with different sects, each of which adopts an alternative version when it comes to power? (Carey 2006: 144)

Even if we can all agree on one text, moreover, we must still apply it to our own lives in order to determine how to live according to its teachings. And such application once again opens up a space that can be filled only by interpretation. Perhaps we will accept one person’s interpretation above all others, but then we are basing our religion on that person’s judgment and not on scripture alone.

If we follow any One Translation, or any One Man’s Commentary, what Rule or Direction shall we have, by which to chuse that One aright? (C 3.324)

Shaftesbury’s point is not that scripture should be ignored (although see Stuart-Buttle 2019: 93). It is that any use anyone ever makes of scripture will necessarily involve “his own Discernment, and Understanding”—either one’s own judgment of which text to privilege and how best to interpret it, or one’s own judgment that somebody else’s judgment about those things is best (C 3.72). Shaftesbury maintains, as well, that the best interpretations will be those that are deeply informed by extra-scriptural knowledge of the history, tradition, and language—“collateral Testimony of other antient Records, Historians, and foreign Authors”—of the times in which scriptural texts were first composed and complied (C 3.236). To truly understand scripture, we must approach it the way we would approach any other ancient text. The result will be

a nicely critical Historical Faith, subject to various Speculations, and a thousand different Criticisms of Languages and Literature. (C 3.72)

Such criticism, far from undermining respect for the word of God, is “necessary to the Preservation and Purity of Scripture” (C 3.316).

Shaftesbury also opposes religion that purports to be based entirely on direct revelation of an enthusiastic experience. Enthusiasts (or, rather, the kinds of enthusiasts Shaftesbury opposes; below we will discuss enthusiasm he approves of) are those who base their religious views on what they claim to be their immediate spiritual experiences of God. Such experiences are passionate, emotional, non-rational. And while Shaftesbury does not deny that true contemplation of the divine has an emotional component, he argues that we cannot determine merely from the character of a passionate experience itself whether it is the result of divine inspiration or human distemper. A single individual in a cave can make noises that, because of echoing and darkness, cause a group of people to feel great fear and thus give them to believe they are under threat from a huge gang of monsters. Their feeling of fear—their panic—is certainly real, but that feeling does not on its own constitute proof of the belief about what caused it. In the same way, a group of people can experience some powerful emotion that they attribute to the experience of God, but the power of the emotion itself is no proof of the divine cause. For

there are many Panicks in Mankind, besides merely that of Fear. And thus is Religion also Panick; when Enthusiasm of any kind gets up. (C 1.16)

Shaftesbury thus describes enthusiastic experiences as internal “commotions” that may be one of

those Delusions which come arm’d with the specious Pretext of moral Certainty, and Matter of Fact. (C 1.44)

Enthusiasm is wonderfully powerful and extensive … [and] … it is a matter of nice Judgment, and the hardest thing in the world to know fully and distinctly… Nor can Divine Inspiration, by its outward Marks, be easily distinguish’d from it. For Inspiration is a real feeling of the Divine Presence, and Enthusiasm a false one. But the Passion they raise is much alike. (C 1.52–53)

Scary noises in a dark cave can produce the same feeling of fear, whether they are caused by many monsters or one trickster. The feeling itself does not constitute proof that the feeler’s belief about the cause is correct.

7.3 Natural religion, the argument from design, and justified enthusiasm

The central feature of the positive aspect of Shaftesbury’s religion is belief in a perfectly good God based on an argument from design. (At C 2.364–5, he suggests that it is possible to give an a priori argument for the existence of God as well). Proper attention to the magnificent order of natural phenomena, Shaftesbury argues, leads inevitably to the conclusion that the world was created by a perfect being. If we found a perfectly designed piece of architecture on a desert island, we would conclude that a mind had formed it even if we could see no intelligent being in the area. Just so, Shaftesbury argues, we must conclude that a mind has formed the world as a whole, even though such a mind is not present to our senses. Shaftesbury develops this argument most fully in The Moralists, in which Theocles convinces Philocles that perfect theism follows from an understanding of nature as a whole (C 2.284–5, 2.340–393). Everything is “fitted and join’d” together, Theocles contends, each contributing to the “Order, Union, and Coherence of the Whole” (C 2.287). “All we can see either of the Heavens or Earth, demonstrates Order and Perfection” (C 2.291). “All things in this world are united” in a “universal system” (C 2.287). And

having recogniz’d this uniform consistent fabric, and own’d the Universal System, we must of consequence acknowledg a universal Mind. (C 2.290)

Shaftesbury contends that such considerations—the argument from design—constitute a rational basis for theism. They provide “abundant Proof, capable of convincing any fair and just Contemplator” (C 2.288).

Shaftesbury also insists, however, that essential to true religion is a passionate love for the Divine and its creation. Shaftesbury’s religion consists not merely of a calm belief in a creator-God but also of a passionate “Admiration” of the world’s “Majesty or Graudure,” of something that “captivates the Heart” (C 3.31–2). Indeed, in what may seem like a surprising twist, Shaftesbury says that in fact the truly religious frame of mind, because it reaches beyond calm understanding, is a kind of enthusiasm. The writer of A Letter concerning Enthusiasm, after ridiculing enthusiasts throughout, eventually claims to have “justify’d Enthusiasm, and own’d the Word” and signs off as “your Enthusiastick Friend” (C 1.55; see also 2.206–10, 368–376, 218–9, 124, 220, 394; 3.22, 33). It seems that Shaftesbury wants to develop a religious view that is neither entirely passionate (like the fanatics he ridicules in A Letter) nor entirely rational (like the Deists he was sometimes associated with). This raises the question of how the passionate and rational elements of Shaftesbury’s religion fit together.

Müller (2010a) argues that for Shaftesbury the passionate element is necessary because rationality cannot fully establish the existence of a perfectly good God. Liu (2004), and McAteer (2016) are in substantial agreement. Reason alone, on this view, cannot get us all the way to perfect theism. The extra distance can be traversed only by an emotional aesthetic response to the beauty of creation. Müller writes,

In contemplating the beauty of nature, fancy transcends the limits of the human mind and ascends into the infinite, imagining the harmonious concatenation of causes. Theocles’ sublime meditations do not attempt to produce logically sound arguments; they are allegorical verbal paintings of the deity’s creation. The order of the divine cosmos, its inherent goodness, does not lend itself to strict philosophical investigation so that its “Mysterious Beauty” (C 2.393) cannot be rationally understood by human beings. (Müller 2010: 224)

There are “secret truths of divine creation” that we can appreciate only through non-rational means (Müller 2010: 224). Müller argues for this interpretation through an account of Shaftesbury’s theodicy, i.e., his response to the seeming evils in a world supposedly created by a perfectly good, omnipotent God. According to Müller, Shaftesbury contends that belief in such a God implies that no real evil can truly exists. All evil is merely apparent. Everything in the world is actually entirely good. But this position cannot be established rationally. Indeed, according to Müller, this position is “anti-rational” (Müller 2010: 227). We can only come to accept it through an emotional aesthetic response—an imaginative “Conceit of something majestick” (C 3.30), an “Extasy” (C 1.36)—to the beauty of the world.

Grean, in contrast, takes Shaftesbury to advance a more thoroughly rational basis for perfect theism (Grean 1967: 19–36). On Grean’s interpretation, an enthusiastic passion is “fair and plausible” only if it is tethered to a thoroughly rational theological understanding, not if it goes beyond such an understanding. Such a reading emphasizes statements such as the following from Philocles:

Nor cou’d God witness for himself, or assert his Being any other way to Men, than “By revealing himself to their Reason, appealing to their Judgment, and submitting his Ways to their Censure, and cool Deliberation” (C 2.333).

Theocles also seems to eschew the need for any non-rational means to theism when he says that observation provides “abundant Proof, capable of convincing any fair and just Contemplator, of the Works of Nature” (C 2.288). In addition, Shaftesbury condemns the idea that a person should ever believe anything not supported by “an impartial Use of his Reason” or that is “too hard for his Understanding” (C 1.35). Contemplation of the order of things is “the only means which cou’d establish the sound Belief of a Deity” (C 2.333). Without fully rational belief, “Theology must have no Foundation at all” (C 2.269).

Shaftesbury does believe that true theism involves an emotional response—that a truly religious frame of mind includes something more than simply a calm, rational belief in Deity (at which the Deists might have been satisfied to stop). But on Grean’s interpretation, that additional emotional element is added to rational belief, not something that is needed to carry us to a belief that reason alone cannot reach. The model for this kind of emotional element is the profound aesthetic pleasure that a mathematician may experience upon coming to understand an elegant proof, or that a biologist may experience upon coming to understand the perfect organization of a complex set of features of an organism or ecosystem (C 2.17 and 2.43). The profound aesthetic pleasure of the mathematician and the biologist does not go beyond understanding but, rather, is entirely posterior to, dependent on it (C 2.374–5).

It is true—as Müller, Liu, and McAteer point out—that Shaftesbury thinks there are certain things that appear to us to be bad or evil, things that we cannot understand how to reconcile with a perfectly good and all-powerful God. But there is in Shaftesbury an attempt at a rational argument for the conclusion that even those things are actually for the best (C 2.288–92, 2.363–5). There are numerous features of the world whose purpose we have not initially understood. Over time, however, we have come to see the purpose that many of those things serve, achieving a rational realization that what had initially seemed bad or evil is in actuality entirely to the good. But since we have had so many of these experiences in the past—of initially not understanding a thing and its appearing to us to be bad or evil, and of then coming to understand it and realizing that it is in fact good—it is reasonable to conclude that those things we currently do not understand and that appear to us as evil are also actually for the best. Imagine you know a very brilliant person. In the past she has done things you initially did not understand the rationale for at all. But in time you eventually came to see that those things were perfectly planned and executed, and you now realize that they were exactly the right things to have done (even if you hadn’t been able to see that initially). Now imagine that this person does something in the present that you do not understand the rationale for. Your past experience gives you reasonable grounds for trusting that in fact she has perfect justification for what she is doing—that her actions really are for the best, even if you currently cannot see the reasons for them. Given the finiteness of our minds and the infiniteness of God’s, it is only to be expected that God acts in certain ways we cannot understand. But in the past we have had so many experiences of examining natural objects we initially did not understand and coming to see the harmonious workings of all their wondrous mechanisms, it is reasonable to believe that those things we currently do not understand are in fact for the best. As Shaftesbury puts it,

Now, in this mighty Union, if there be such Relations of Parts one to another as are not easily discover’d; if on this account the End and Use of Things does not every-where appear, there is no wonder; since ’tis no more indeed than what must happen of necessity: Nor cou’d supreme Wisdom have otherwise order’d it. For in an Infinity of Things thus relative, a Mind which sees not infinitely, can see nothing fully. (C 2.288)

7.4 Virtue and belief in God

Another significant feature of Shaftesbury’s religious views is his position on the relationship between virtue and belief in God. This is the topic with which Shaftesbury begins the Inquiry, telling us that his goal is

to inquire what Honesty or Virtue is, consider’d by it-self; and in what manner it is influenc’d by Religion: how far Religion necessarily implies Virtue; and whether it be a true Saying, That ‘it is impossible for an Atheist to be virtuous, or share any real degree of Honesty, or Merit. (C 2.7)

It is in the context of addressing this question that Shaftesbury develops his ideas of the moral sense—i.e., his view that within every human is the means to understand morality and act in accord with it—and the conclusion he draws from this is that one’s capacity to realize virtue is independent of one’s religious belief. Our moral sense naturally leads us to virtue (C 2.16–18 and 25–6), and atheism does nothing at all to damage that natural tendency (C 2.27). Shaftesbury thus denies “that it is impossible for an Atheist to be virtuous,” contending instead that some

who have paid little regard to Religion, and been consider’d as mere Atheists, have yet been observ’d to practice the Rules of Morality, and act in many Cases with such good Meaning and Affection towards Mankind, as might seem to force an Acknowledgment of their being virtuous (C 2.4)

Rivers has suggested that establishing the independence of religion and morality is one the most important aspects of, and perhaps the primary motivation for, Shaftesbury’s development of the moral sense (Rivers 2000a).

Shaftesbury does believe, however, that religious belief can affect one’s moral sense and one’s motivation to be moral. Belief in a perfectly good God promotes virtue in a number of ways. For

nothing can more highly contribute to the fixing of right Apprehensions, and a sound Judgment of Sense of Right and Wrong, than to believe a God who is ever, and on all accounts, represented such as to be actually a true Model and Example of the most exact Justice, and highest Goodness and Worth. (C 2.51)

And when God is represented as having

a Concern for the good of All, and an Affection of Benevolence and Love towards the Whole; such an Example must undoubtedly serve (…) to raise and increase the Affection towards Virtue. (C 2.56)

Shaftesbury also says that belief in a perfect God increases one’s motivation to be moral because one will have a strong wish to please the Supreme Being and because one will be better able to withstand misfortune and hardship, which are important respects in which theism conduces to virtue in a way atheism does not (C 2.56–77). In contrast, belief in an immoral God, which Shaftesbury calls ‘daemonism,’ will have deleterious effects, promoting vice at the expense of virtue. For religious zeal based on belief in a capricious and violent god will promote cruelty and barbarity (C 2.13; 2.35–6; 2.47–49).

[W]here a real Devotion and hearty Worship is paid to a supreme Being, who in his History or Character is represented otherwise than as really and truly just and good; there must ensure a Loss of Rectitude, a Disturbance of Thought, and a Corruption of Temper and manners the Believer. His Honesty will, of necessity, be supplanted by his Zeal, whilst he is thus unnaturally influenc’d, and render’d thus immorally devout. (C 2.50–51)

Religion”, Shaftesbury concludes, “is capable of doing great Good, or Harm” to one’s moral character, while atheism does not have an effect “in either way” (C 2.51).

8. Sex and related issues

Commentators have recently brought attention to issues of sex and gender in Shaftesbury’s work. Shaftesbury frequently contrasts female with male characteristics, almost always with the purpose of elevating the latter and lowering the former (see C 1.24, 1.75, 1.149, 1.193–5, 1.214–5, 2.16, 2.35, 2.154, 2.161, 2. 186, 2.191; Second Characters 225). Trumbach argues for a “homosexual reading” of Shaftesbury’s Askemata (1998: 441). Klein says Shaftesbury’s letters suggest “homosexual longings and attachments” that social convention and obligation kept him from acting on (Klein 2004). Branch (2006: 264) also finds suggestions of homosexuality in his writing. Klein (2004) and Tierney-Hynes (2015) both emphasize the “homosocial” character of Shaftesbury’s view of elevated human society, such as in the friendship between Theocles and Philocles of The Moralists. Tierney-Hynes also detects in Soliloquy extended comparisons of writing and sex-acts, exploring in particular a comparison between the self-reflection Shaftesbury recommends to writers and masturbation. Barker-Benfield and Branch find in Shaftesbury’s writings “a repression of male behavior” (Barker-Benfield 1992, 112) that leads to “an aggressive sexualization of philosophy,” culminating in “a metaphorical sexual assault on the ‘Deity’” (Branch 2006, 10). Müller (2010b) seeks to discredit all these readings by arguing that they misinterpret key passages by failing to take into account the surrounding features of Shaftesbury’s own texts, the early eighteenth-century context in which Shaftesbury was writing, and the ancient Greek subjects (such as Plato and Socrates) Shaftesbury was discussing. Voitle’s view of Shaftesbury’s letters accords with Müller’s reading (Voitle 1984: 242-244).


Primary Sources

The most comprehensive collection of Shaftesbury’s writings is Standard Edition: Complete Works, Selected Letters and Posthumous Writings, edited by Wolfram Benda et al., Stuttgard-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1981–present. Information on the Standard Edition can be found at: http://www.dozenten.anglistik/phil.uni-erlangen.de/shaftesbury/standard.html.

For detailed lists of all of Shaftesbury’s writings—published, unpublished and in translation—see:

Characteristicks of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times

Recent editions:

  • Characteristicks of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, edited and with an introduction by Philip Ayers (in two volumes), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. This edition includes A Notion of the Historical Draught or Tablature of the Judgment of Hercules and A Letter concerning Design.
  • Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, edited and with an introduction by Laurence E. Klein (in one volume), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • [C] Characteristicks of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, with a forward by Douglas Den Uyl (in three volumes), Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 2001. This edition includes A Notion of the Historical Draught or Tablature of the Judgment of Hercules. Liberty Fund edition available online

Characteristicks comprises six works. Versions of the first five (but not of the concluding Miscelleneous Reflections) were published earlier:

  • An Inquiry Concerning Virtue, in two Discourses, 1699.
  • A Letter Concerning Enthusiasm, 1708.
  • The Moralists, a Philosophical Rhapsody, 1709.
  • Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour, 1709.
  • Soliloquy: or, Advice to an Author, 1710.

Other notable works by Shaftesbury

  • Askemata, Standard Edition II,6, edited by Wolfram Benda et al., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 2011.
  • Second Characters, Standard Edition I,5, edited by Wolfram Benda et al., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 2001.
  • “Preface” in Select Sermons of Dr Whichcot. In Two Parts, London, 1698.
  • Paradoxes of State, Relating to the Present Juncture of Affairs in England and the Rest of Europe, London, 1702.
  • A Notion of the Historical Draught or Tablature of the Judgment of Hercules, London, 1713.
  • “A Letter concerning Design.” The Present State of the Republick of Letters, February 1728, pp. 93–106.
  • Chartae Socraticae: Design of a Socratick History Standard Edition II, 5, edited by Wolfram Benda et al., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 2007.
  • Pathologia, in “Pathologia, a Theory of the Passions,” translated and edited by Laurent Jaffro, Christian Maurer, and Alain Petit, History of European Ideas, 39 (2013): 221–240.
  • The Life, Unpublished Letters, and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury, Author of the “Characteristics”, edited by Benjamin Rand, London/New York, 1900, 1–272.

Secondary Sources

Extensive bibliographies of works on Shaftesbury can be found at:

The following are works referenced in this entry:

  • Amir, Lydia, 2016, “Shaftesbury as Popperian: Critical Rationalism? Part 1,” Analiza I Egzystencja, 35: 5–21.
  • Annas, Julia, 2008, “Virtue Ethics and the Charge of Egoism,” in Morality and Self-Interest, Paul Bloomfield (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 205–221.
  • Arreguie, Jorge V. and Arnau, Pablo, 1994, “Shaftesbury: Father or Critic of Modern Aesthetics?” British Journal of Aesthetics, 34(4): 350–62.
  • xelsson, Karl, 2019, Political Aesthetics: Addison and Shaftesbury on Taste, Morals and Society, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
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Other Internet Resources

  • The Shaftesbury Project, hosted by Friedrich-Alexander-University (Erlangen) and funded with the help of the German Research Foundation.
  • Shaftesbury’s Characteristics, Liberty Fund edition, edited by Douglas Den Uyl.
  • Earl of Shaftesbury entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy (general account of Shaftesbury’s thought).
  • Deism, entry by Francis Aveling in the Catholic Encyclopedia (contains paragraphs and subsections on Shaftesbury’s relationship to Deism).

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Michael B. Gill <mgill@ed.ac.uk>

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