Henry Sidgwick

First published Tue Oct 5, 2004; substantive revision Mon Oct 2, 2023

Henry Sidgwick was one of the most influential ethical philosophers of the Victorian era, and his work continues to exert a powerful influence on Anglo-American ethical and political theory, with an increasing global impact as well. His masterpiece, The Methods of Ethics was first published in 1874 (seventh edition: 1907) and in many ways marked the culmination of the classical utilitarian tradition—the tradition of Jeremy Bentham and James and John Stuart Mill—with its emphasis on “the greatest happiness of the greatest number” as the fundamental normative demand. Sidgwick’s treatment of that position was more comprehensive and scholarly than any previous one, and he set the agenda for most of the twentieth-century debates between utilitarians and their critics. Utilitarians and consequentialists from G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell to J. J. C. Smart and R. M. Hare down to Derek Parfit, Peter Singer, and Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek have acknowledged Sidgwick’s Methods as a vital source for their arguments. But in addition to authoritatively formulating utilitarianism and inspiring utilitarians and their sympathizers, the Methods has also served as a general model for how to do ethical theory, since it provides a series of systematic, historically informed comparisons between utilitarianism and its leading alternatives.

Even such influential critics of utilitarianism as William Frankena, Marcus Singer, and John Rawls looked to Sidgwick’s work for guidance. C. D. Broad, a later successor to Sidgwick’s Cambridge chair, famously went so far as to say

Sidgwick’s Methods of Ethics seems to me to be on the whole the best treatise on moral theory that has ever been written, and to be one of the English philosophical classics. (Broad 1930: 143)

In recent years, Broad’s assessment has been endorsed by an increasing number of prominent philosophers (Parfit 2011–2017; de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014, 2021; Crisp 2015; Phillips 2022). Engaging with Sidgwick’s work remains an excellent way to cultivate a serious philosophical interest in ethics, metaethics, and practical ethics, not to mention the history of these subjects. Moreover, he made important contributions to many other fields, including economics, political theory, classics, educational theory, and parapsychology. His significance as an intellectual and cultural figure has yet to be fully appreciated, but recent years have witnessed an impressive expansion of Sidgwick studies, and he has even been featured in popular novels (Cohen 2010; Entwistle 2014). What is still relatively rare is serious engagement with Sidgwick’s role in advancing liberal imperialism and the ideology of the British Empire (Schultz 2004; Bell 2016).

1. Life and Background

Sidgwick was born on May 31, 1838, in the small Yorkshire town of Skipton. The extended Sidgwick family was well-known in the area and quite prosperous, with their cotton-spinning mills representing the oldest manufacturing firms in the town (Dawson 1882; Schultz 2017). But Henry was the second surviving son of Mary Crofts and the Reverend William Sidgwick, the headmaster of the grammar school in Skipton, who died when Henry was only three. Henry’s older brother William went on to become an Oxford don, as did his younger brother Arthur. His sister Mary, known as Minnie, ended up marrying a second cousin, Edward White Benson, who in addition to being an early mentor of Henry’s (and Rugby master) went on to become the archbishop of Canterbury. The Sidgwick and Benson families would contribute much to English letters and science over the course of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, though their legacies have also been controversial on some counts (Askwith 1971; Bolt 2011; Goldhill 2016).

Henry was educated at Rugby and at Trinity College, Cambridge, where he took his degree in 1859. As an undergraduate, he excelled at both mathematics and, especially, classics, in due course becoming Craven Scholar, 33rd Wrangler, and Senior Classic, also winning the Chancellor’s Medal. He wound up staying at Cambridge his entire life, first, beginning in October of 1859, as a Fellow of Trinity and a lecturer in classics—a position that in the later sixties evolved into a lectureship in the moral sciences—then, from 1875, as praelector in moral and political philosophy, and finally, from 1883, as Knightbridge Professor of Moral Philosophy. He resigned his Fellowship in 1869 because he could no longer subscribe in good conscience to the Thirty-Nine Articles of the Church of England, as the position required. This act helped inspire the successful opposition to such requirements. In 1881 he was elected an honorary Fellow, and in 1885, he regained a full Fellowship, remarking on the changing times:

Last time I swore that I would drive away strange doctrine; this time I only pledged myself to restore any College property that might be in my possession when I ceased to be a Fellow. (Memoir: 400)

Sidgwick’s Cambridge career was rich in reformist activity (Rothblatt 1968; Harvie 1976; Todd 1999). As an undergraduate, he had been elected to the “Apostles”, the secret Cambridge discussion society that did much to shape the intellectual direction of modern Cambridge; Sidgwick’s allegiance to this group was a very significant feature of his life and work (Lubenow 1998). The 1860s, which he described as his years of “Storm and Stress” over his religious views and commitments, were also the years in which his identity as an academic liberal took shape, and he got caught up in a range of causes emphasizing better and broader educational opportunities, increased professionalism, and greater religious freedom. He evolved into an educational reformer committed to downplaying the influence of classics, introducing modern subjects, and opening up higher education to women. Much influenced by the writings of F. D. Maurice and J. S. Mill, he would become one of the leading proponents of higher education for women and play a guiding role in the foundation of Newnham College, Cambridge, one of the first colleges for women in England (McWilliams Tullberg 1975 [1998]; Sutherland 2006). He was also active in the cause of university reorganization generally, in due course serving on the General Board of Studies, the Special Board for Moral Sciences, and the Indian Civil Service Board, and he worked tirelessly to expand educational opportunities and professionalize educational efforts through such vehicles as correspondence courses, extension lectures, the Cambridge Working Men’s College, and the University Day Training College for teachers (initiated by Oscar Browning). Such educational reforms were, he held, also of political value in overcoming class conflict and social strife. But Sidgwick’s broader political commitments, which ranged from academic liberal to Liberal Unionist—he joined the breakaway faction of the Liberal Party opposing Gladstone’s policy of Home Rule for Ireland—to independent, were complex and shifting; he was not able to rise above the marked imperialistic and orientalist, racist tendencies of the late Victorian era (Schultz 2004; Bell 2007, 2016).

In 1876 Sidgwick married Eleanor Mildred Balfour, the sister of his former student, Arthur Balfour, the future prime minister. An accomplished and independent woman with serious scientific interests—she collaborated with her brother-in-law Lord Rayleigh on many scientific papers—Eleanor Sidgwick worked as an equal partner with her husband on many fronts, particularly higher education for women and parapsychology. She eventually took over as Principal of Newnham in 1892, and was for many decades a mainstay of the Society for Psychical Research, an organization that Henry had helped to found (in 1882) and several times headed, though his interest in the paranormal had been evident long before. The Sidgwicks hoped that their psychical research might ultimately support some core religious claims, particularly concerning the personal survival of physical death, which they deemed a vital support for morality. Their extensive and often quite methodologically sophisticated investigations were not as conclusive as they had hoped, but following Henry’s death from cancer on August 28, 1900, Eleanor did become persuaded that he had succeeded in communicating from “the other world”. The Sidgwicks’ work in this field continues to this day to be debated by academic parapsychologists (Gauld 1968; Braude 2003; McLuhan & Gauld 2020 [Other Internet Resources]).

Although Sidgwick published extensively in his lifetime, he is best known for his first major book, The Methods of Ethics, which first appeared in 1874 and went through five editions during his lifetime. His second most widely read book would be his Outlines of the History of Ethics for English Readers, which appeared in 1886 as an expanded version of the article on the subject that he had contributed to the famous ninth edition of the Encyclopedia Britannica. But he also published The Principles of Political Economy (1883), The Elements of Politics (1891), and Practical Ethics, A Collection of Addresses and Essays (1898), and after his death, Eleanor Sidgwick worked with various of his former colleagues to bring out Lectures on the Ethics of T. H. Green, H. Spencer, and J. Martineau (1902), Philosophy, Its Scope and Relations (1902), The Development of European Polity (1903), Miscellaneous Essays and Addresses (1904), Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant and Other Philosophical Lectures and Essays (1905), and Henry Sidgwick, A Memoir (1906), which Eleanor and Arthur Sidgwick assembled largely from his correspondence and journal. These posthumous works are typically quite polished and shed a great deal of light on the works that Sidgwick himself saw through publication (Schneewind 1977).

As Sidgwick’s publications attest, he was not only a pre-eminent moral philosopher, with sophisticated views on both going controversies in ethics and metaethics and the history of these subjects, but also an accomplished epistemologist, classicist, economist, political theorist, political historian, literary critic, parapsychologist, and educational theorist. If he was a founder of the Cambridge school of philosophy, he was also a founder of the Cambridge school of economics (along with his colleague and sometimes nemesis Alfred Marshall) and of the Cambridge school of political theory (along with such colleagues as Browning and Sir John Seeley). If such students as Moore and Russell owed him much, so too did such students and admirers as Balfour, J. N. Keynes, F. W. Maitland, F. Y. Edgeworth, James Ward, Frank Podmore, and E. E. Constance Jones. He had serious interests in many areas of philosophy and theology, and also wrote insightfully about poetry and literature, two of his great loves (at Newnham, he lectured on Shakespeare, along with such subjects as philosophy and economics). Indeed, Sidgwick was a force in the larger cultural developments of his age, active in such influential discussion societies as the Metaphysical Society and the Synthetic Society. His friends included George Eliot, T. H. Green, James Bryce, H. G. Dakyns, Roden Noel, and, of special importance, John Addington Symonds, the erudite cultural historian, poet, and man of letters who was a pioneer in the serious historical study (and promotion) of same sex love (Schultz 2004). Sidgwick’s versatile and many-sided intellect—not to mention his keen wit—are typically better displayed in his essays and letters than in his best-known academic books. He was in fact much loved for his gentle humor (or “Sidgwickedness”) and sympathetic conversation, and his philosophical students prized him for his candor. As Balfour put it:

Of all the men I have known he was the readiest to consider every controversy and every controversialist on their merits. He never claimed authority; he never sought to impose his views; he never argued for victory; he never evaded an issue. (Memoir: 311)

2. The Methods Of Ethics And Philosophy

2.1 Preliminaries

Sidgwick’s Methods was long in the making. His correspondence with his close friend H. G. Dakyns, a Clifton master who had been a private tutor for the Tennyson family, reveals how long and volatile the development of his ethical views was, particularly during the 1860s when he was working himself free of Anglican orthodoxy. As early as 1862, he wrote to Dakyns that he was “revolving a Theory of Ethics” and working on “a reconciliation between the moral sense and utilitarian theories” (Memoir: 75). He started telling people that he was “engaged on a Great Work”, which would indeed turn out to be the case. By 1867, much of the basic intellectual structure of the Methods was clearly in place; according to Marshall, at the faculty discussion group known as the “Grote Club”, Sidgwick

read a long & general sketch of the various systems of morality: I. Absolute right II. Make yourself noble III. Make yourself happy IV Increase the general happiness. In the course of it he committed himself to the statement that without appreciating the effect of our action on the happiness of ourselves or of others we could have no idea of right & wrong. (quoted in Schultz 2004: 142)

It was also in 1867 that Sidgwick sent a draft of his pamphlet on “The Ethics of Conformity and Subscription” to J. S. Mill, inviting comments. This work, part of his efforts with the Free Christian Union (an organization for promoting free and open religious inquiry), reflected his casuistical struggles over whether he had a right to keep his Fellowship, given his increasingly Theistic views. He had been increasingly drawn to Theism, which then, as now, stressed that “God’s will and purpose, and God’s assurance of an ultimate fulfilment, are behind all that is happening” (Polkinghorne 1998: 114), but without the orthodox commitments to belief in the Trinity, miracles, eternal punishment, etc.. As Sidgwick explained to his sister:

I have written a pamphlet … on the text “Let every man be fully persuaded in his own mind”. That is really the gist of the pamphlet—that if the preachers of religion wish to retain their hold over educated men they must show in their utterances on sacred occasions the same sincerity, exactness, unreserve, that men of science show in expounding the laws of nature. I do not think that much good is to be done by saying this, but I want to liberate my soul, and then ever after hold my peace. (Memoir: 226)

As he put it in the pamphlet, which appeared in 1870:

What theology has to learn from the predominant studies of the age is something very different from advice as to its method or estimates of its utility; it is the imperative necessity of accepting unreservedly the conditions of life under which these studies live and flourish. It is sometimes said that we live in an age that rejects authority. The statement, thus qualified, seems misleading; probably there never was a time when the number of beliefs held by each individual, undemonstrated and unverified by himself, was greater. But it is true that we only accept authority of a particular sort; the authority, namely, that is formed and maintained by the unconstrained agreement of individual thinkers, each of whom we believe to be seeking truth with single-mindedness and sincerity, and declaring what he has found with scrupulous veracity, and the greatest attainable exactness and precision. (Sidgwick 1870: 14–15)

This was a vision of inquiry and even culture that Sidgwick would promote throughout his life, though after this point he no longer openly directed his criticisms at the church. Mill had replied to his effort to address the question of subscription on “objective” and “utilitarian” grounds:

What ought to be the exceptions … to the general duty of truth? This large question has never yet been treated in a way at once rational and comprehensive, partly because people have been afraid to meddle with it, and partly because mankind have never yet generally admitted that the effect which actions tend to produce on human happiness is what constitutes them right or wrong. (Mill 1867)

Mill urged Sidgwick to turn his “thoughts to this more comprehensive subject”, and apparently when the latter did, he concluded that it would not be conducive to the general happiness to continue his open attacks on organized religion. The reasons for this larger conclusion are only partly evident from the Methods itself.

Sidgwick did always explicitly claim, however, that his struggles with the ethics of subscription shaped the views set forth in the Methods. These struggles had led him “back to philosophy” from his more theological and philological investigations—for which he had learned German and Hebrew and struggled with biblical hermeneutics. He found the problem of whether he ought to resign his Fellowship very

difficult, and I may say that it was while struggling with the difficulty thence arising that I went through a good deal of the thought that was ultimately systematised in The Methods of Ethics. (Memoir: 38)

One of the ways in which this is evident has been highlighted in the work of J. B. Schneewind, whose Sidgwick’s Ethics and Victorian Moral Philosophy (1977) was the most comprehensive and sophisticated commentary on Sidgwick’s ethics produced in the twentieth century. As part of an extensive account of the historical context of the Methods, underscoring how Sidgwick’s work was shaped by both the utilitarian tradition and its intuitionist and religious opposition (represented in part by the “Cambridge Moralists” William Whewell, Julius Hare, F. D. Maurice, and John Grote), Schneewind argued that

it is a mistake to view the book as primarily a defence of utilitarianism. It is true, of course, that a way of supporting utilitarianism is worked out in detail in the Methods, and that there are places in it where Sidgwick seems to be saying quite plainly that utilitarianism is the best available ethical theory. From his other writings we know also that he thinks of himself as committed to utilitarianism, and that he assumes it in analysing specific moral and political issues. Yet it does not follow that the Methods itself should be taken simply as an argument for that position. We must try to understand it in a way that makes sense of its author’s own explicit account of it. (Schneewind 1977: 192)

That account, as both Schneewind and Rawls have stressed, repeatedly affirms that the aim of the book is less practice than knowledge,

to expound as clearly and as fully as my limits will allow the different methods of Ethics that I find implicit in our common moral reasoning; to point out their mutual relations; and where they seem to conflict, to define the issue as much as possible.

That is, echoing his views on theological inquiry, he confesses that:

I have thought that the predominance in the minds of moralists of a desire to edify has impeded the real progress of ethical science: and that this would be benefited by an application to it of the same disinterested curiosity to which we chiefly owe the great discoveries of physics. It is in this spirit that I have endeavoured to compose the present work: and with this view I have desired to concentrate the reader’s attention, from first to last, not on the practical results to which our methods lead, but on the methods themselves. I have wished to put aside temporarily the urgent need which we all feel of finding and adopting the true method of determining what we ought to do; and to consider simply what conclusions will be rationally reached if we start with certain ethical premises, and with what degree of certainty and precision. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: vi])

The model for such an approach is not Bentham or even J. S. Mill, but Aristotle, whose Ethics gave us

the Common Sense Morality of Greece, reduced to consistency by careful comparison: given not as something external to him but as what “we”—he and others—think, ascertained by reflection.

This was really, in effect, “the Socratic induction, elicited by interrogation” (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: xix]).

As Marcus Singer and others have observed (M. Singer 1974; Phillips 2022), Sidgwick’s notion of a “method” of ethics is not the same as that of an ethical principle, ethical theory, or ethical decision-procedure. A “method” is a way of “obtaining reasoned convictions as to what ought to be done” and thus it might reflect a commitment to one or more ethical principles as the ultimate ground of one’s determination of what one has most reason to do, here and now, while allowing that one might ordinarily be reasoning from such principles either directly or indirectly. Thus, one might, on theological grounds, hold that the moral order of the universe is utilitarian, with God willing the greatest happiness of the greatest number, while also holding that the appropriate guide for practical reason is enlightened self-interest, since utilitarian calculations are God’s business and God has ordered the cosmos to insure that enlightened self-interest conduces to the greatest happiness. In this case, one’s “method of ethics” would be rational egoism, but the ultimate philosophical justification for this method would appeal to utilitarian principles. Still, despite this emphasis on the reasoning process between principles and practical conclusions—another reflection of his struggles with subscription—Sidgwick obviously had quite a bit to say in the Methods about the defense of the ultimate principles of practical reason (Crisp 2014, 2015; de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014; Phillips 2022).

Many have felt that, in setting up the systematic comparison between the main methods of ethics, Sidgwick was not nearly as neutral and impartial as he thought, and in various ways slanted the discussion against a wide range of alternatives, including Aristotelian and other forms of perfectionism, Whewellian rationalism, Idealism, and more (Donagan 1977, 1992; Irwin 1992, 2007, 2011; Hurka 2014a, 2014b). He simply dismisses the traditional philosophical concern with the “moral faculty”, explaining that he is going to leave that matter to psychologists. For Sidgwick, in any given situation, there is something that it is right or that one ought to do, and this is the proper sphere of ethics. The basic concept of morality is this unique, highly general notion of “ought” or “right” that is irreducible to naturalistic terms, sui generis, though moral approbation is

inseparably bound up with the conviction, implicit or explicit, that the conduct approved is “really” right—that is, that it cannot without error, be disapproved by any other mind. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 27])

On this count, at least, his student G. E. Moore was willing to declare the Methods untainted by the “naturalistic fallacy”—that is, the confusion of the “is” of attribution and the “is” of identity that supposedly infected much previous ethical theory, including that of Bentham and the Mills. And indeed, it is plain that Sidgwick parted company from classical utilitarianism in many ways, rejecting the empiricism, psychological egoism, and associationism (supposedly) characteristic of the earlier tradition. F.H. Hayward, who wrote one of the first books on Sidgwick’s ethics, famously complained that E. E. Constance Jones had missed just how original Sidgwick was:

Sidgwick’s identification of “Right” with “Reasonable” and “Objective”; his view of Rightness as an “ultimate and unanalysable notion” (however connected subsequently with Hedonism); and his admission that Reason is, in a sense, a motive to the will, are due to the more or less “unconscious” influence of Kant. Miss Jones appears to think that these are the common-places of every ethical system, and that real divergences only arise when we make the next step in advance. I should rather regard this Rationalistic terminology as somewhat foreign to Hedonism. I do not think that Miss Jones will find, in Sidgwick’s Hedonistic predecessors, any such emphasis on Reason (however interpreted). (Hayward 1901b: 361)

Sidgwick himself allowed that Kant was one of his “masters”, and he was also quite familiar with the works of Hegel. Schneewind’s reading (1977) has stressed this influence, along with the influence of Joseph Butler, whose works persuaded Sidgwick of the falsity of psychological egoism and of the reality of other than self-interested actions (Frankena 1992). Indeed, the comparison between Sidgwick and Kant has proved to be a fertile and ongoing source of academic work on Sidgwick, and one of increasing significance (Parfit 2011–2017; Paytas 2018; Paytas & Henning [eds] 2020; Phillips 2022)

However, despite the considerable influence Kant and Kantianism—and the Cambridge Moralists—exercised on Sidgwick, the Methods also deviated from some stock features of such views, among other things rejecting the issue of free will as largely irrelevant to ethical theory and failing to appreciate the Kantian arguments about expressing one’s autonomy and the incompatibility of the categorical imperative and rational egoism. As Schneewind allows, Sidgwick’s

basic aim is similar to Kant’s, but, as his many points of disagreement with Kant suggest, the Kantian aspect of his thinking needs to be defined with some care. He detaches the issue of how reason can be practical from the most distinctive aspects of Kantianism. He rejects the methodological apparatus of the “critical philosophy”, the Kantian distinction of noumenal and phenomenal standpoints, and the association of the issue with the problem of free will. He treats the question of the possibility of rationally motivated action as answerable largely in terms of commonplace facts; he does not attribute any special synthesizing powers to reason beyond those assumed in ordinary logic; and he does not take morality to provide us with support for religious beliefs.. In refusing to base morality on pure reason alone, moreover, he moves decisively away from Kant, as is shown by his very un-Kantian hedonistic and teleological conclusions.. These points make it clear that the Kantian strain in Sidgwick’s thought is most marked in his central idea about the rationality of first principles. (Schneewind 1977: 419–20)

Naturally, a Sidgwickian position on the venerable free will issue is bound to be controversial, and recent work on the Sidgwick/Kant comparison has brought out just how divided commentators continue to be on this matter (Crisp 2015; Skelton 2016; Paytas 2018, Paytas & Henning [eds] 2020; Phillips 2022). Moreover, there has also been significant controversy over just how internalist Sidgwick’s account of moral motivation actually was. On balance, he held that the dictates or imperatives of reason were “accompanied by a certain impulse to do the acts recognized as right”, while admitting that other impulses may conflict (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 34]). Brink (1988, 1992) has urged that some of Sidgwick’s chief arguments make better sense if he is construed, in externalist fashion, as allowing the possibility that one may have good reasons not to be moral. But Sidgwick’s moderate, qualified internalism seems plain and plausible enough to most commentators (Schultz 2004; de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014; and Crisp 2015).

There has been perhaps even more controversy surrounding Sidgwick’s account of the “good”. The Methods is at least fairly clear in arguing that the difference between “right” and “good” in part concerns the way in which judgments of ultimate good do not necessarily involve definite precepts to act or even the assumption that the good in question is attainable or the best attainable good under the circumstances. Rightness and goodness thus “represent differentiations of the demands of our own rationality as it applies to our sentient and our active powers” (Schneewind 1977: 493). But Sidgwick offers an intricate account of ultimate good that has struck some as highly naturalistic. In A Theory of Justice, Rawls famously explained that Sidgwick

characterizes a person’s future good on the whole as what he would now desire and seek if the consequences of all the various courses of conduct open to him were, at the present point of time, accurately foreseen by him and adequately realized in imagination. An individual’s good is the hypothetical composition of impulsive forces that results from deliberative reflection meeting certain conditions. (Rawls 1971 [1999: 366])

Some have followed the Rawlsian line in casting Sidgwick as a defender of a naturalistic “full-information” account of the “good” (for example, Sobel 1994; Rosati 1995), but the balance of scholarly opinion has it that Sidgwick’s account adumbrates an “objective” view that allows that some desires, however informed, may be rejected as irrational or unreasonable (see especially Phillips 2022: 74–76; Schneewind 1977; de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014; and Parfit 1984, 2011a,b). Crisp (2007, 2015) and Shaver (1997) provide helpful reviews of the debates; although the former offers perhaps the best possible defense of the interpretation of Sidgwick’s view as a naturalistic full-information account (with an experience requirement), it also admits that the objective list reading is a more charitable one.

Some commentators have made much of the difference between Sidgwick and Moore on the notion of ultimate good, urging that whereas Sidgwick prioritizes an unanalysable notion of “right”, Moore prioritizes an unanalysable notion of “good”, while adding a suspect ontological claim about “goodness” involving a non-natural property (Moore 1903; Shaver 2000). However, Hurka (2003) has offered some forceful arguments against most such accounts:

After defining the good as what we ought to desire, he [Sidgwick] added that “since irrational desires cannot always be dismissed at once by voluntary effort”, the definition cannot use “ought” in “the strictly ethical sense”, but only in “the wider sense in which it merely connotes an ideal or standard”. But this raises the question of what this “wider sense” is, and in particular whether it is at all distinct from Moore’s “good”. If the claim that we “ought” to have a desire is only the claim that the desire is “an ideal”, how does it differ from the claim that the desire is good? When “ought” is stripped of its connection with choice, its distinctive meaning seems to slip away. (Hurka 2003: 603–4)

Moreover, as Hurka has developed the point, the

initial reviewers of Principia did not see it as altering Sidgwick’s ontology but emphasized its continuity with Sidgwick, while Moore himself said little about his non-natural property and even tried to limit his metaphysical claims, saying that though goodness is an object and therefore “is somehow”, it does not “exist”, and in particular does not exist in a “supersensible reality”. (Hurka 2014a: 90)

At any rate, for his part (and unlike Moore), Sidgwick goes on to argue that, despite the serious problems with the views of previous utilitarians (for example, the Millian account of the “higher” pleasures), the best going account of ultimate goodness is a hedonistic one, and that this is an informative, non-tautological claim, though also a more controversial one than many of the others that he defends. That was putting it mildly, and commentators past and present have struggled to try to determine whether Sidgwick regarded the hedonistic account of good as grounded on another cognitive intuition, but one of a lower degree of certainty than the others he endorses (Phillips 2022: 86–89). As Skelton aptly observes,

Sidgwick is a hedonist: pain is the only non-instrumental evil; pleasure is the only non-instrumental good. His argument for hedonism in ME [Methods of Ethics] Book III, chapter xiv is a mess. (Skelton 2022)

For one thing, as Irwin and Richardson have cogently argued, Sidgwick’s hedonistic commitments, and his criticisms of such views as T. H. Green’s, often reflected the (problematic) conviction that practical reason simply must be fully clear and determinate in its conclusions (Irwin 1992: 288–90; Richardson 1994). For Sidgwick, without some such metric as the hedonistic one, it was hopelessly unclear how to weigh one virtue against another. But whether or not that is actually the case, he advanced other arguments as well, such as whether one can really recommend making people more virtuous at the expense of their hedonistic happiness. What if the virtuous life were conjoined to extreme pain, with no compensating good to anyone? At many points, as Shaver observes,

Sidgwick works out what it is reasonable to desire, and so attaches moral to natural properties, by the ordinary gamut of philosopher’s strategies—appeals to logical coherence, plausibility, and judgment after reflection. (Shaver 1997: 270)

But many problems remain, since Sidgwick’s arguments about the fundamental nature of pleasure and pain are far from perspicuous. According to Rawls,

Sidgwick denies that pleasure is a measurable quality of feeling independent of its relation from volition. This is the view of some writers, he says, but one he cannot accept. He defines pleasure “as a feeling which, when experienced by intelligent beings, is at least apprehended as desirable or—in cases of comparison—preferable”. It would seem that the view he here rejects is the one he relies upon later as the final criterion to introduce coherence among ends. (Rawls 1971 [1999: 488])

And Sumner, in an important treatment related to what is called the “heterogeneity” of pleasures problem, has also urged that Sidgwick and Mill, by contrast with Bentham,

seemed to recognize that the mental states we call pleasures are a mixed bag as far as their phenomenal properties are concerned. On their view what pleasures have in common is not something internal to them—their peculiar feeling tone, or whatever—but something about us—the fact that we like them, enjoy them, value them, find them satisfying, seek them, wish to prolong them, and so on. (Sumner 1996: 86)

Accepting the heterogeneity of pleasures objection to the feeling tone account, along with a “resonance constraint” to the effect that what is good for someone must somehow resonate with what they care about, and the view that “what is ultimately good is pleasure, understood as desirable consciousness”, de Lazari-Radek and Singer urge that Sidgwick takes a position that is “intermediate between internalism and externalism” (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014: 254). In their vigorous defense of Sidgwickian hedonism against all rival accounts of ultimate good, including the desire satisfaction view that Singer had previously adopted, they explain that

the hedonist will not say that it is good for a person to be in a conscious state that she does not take to be desirable, and to this extent hedonism satisfies the resonance constraint and is internalist. On the other hand, hedonism does insist that what is good or bad for you is your states of consciousness, and nothing else, irrespective of whether what you desire is to have certain states of consciousness. (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014: 253)

Thus, satisfying a desire for posthumous fame, which if satisfied would not resonate with any of conscious states one could possibly have, would not be good for the person in question. Shaver (2016) has also offered a subtle account and defense of Sidgwick’s notion of pleasure as feeling apprehended, perhaps wrongly, as desirable qua feeling, rather than as feeling manifesting a special tone of pleasantness. However, as Skelton warns, with accounts like these, the wording is a very delicate matter:

At one point, Sidgwick says that if we accept his definition of pleasure, it is a tautology that pleasure is good ... But this would follow for him only if pleasure is defined as desirable feeling, since, for Sidgwick, desirable means good. But this would not be true if, for him, pleasure is defined as feelings apprehended to be desirable. It is not a tautology to say feelings apprehended to be desirable are in fact desirable. (Skelton 2022: 9)

And whether or how this apprehension is something only “experienced by intelligent beings” also calls for critical attention, since that stipulation would seem to implausibly narrow the scope of sentience.

But in contrast to the above accounts, Crisp, who defends an internalist, feeling tone account of pleasure, argues persuasively that Sidgwick’s writings did not express his better inclinations on the subject

Sidgwick is at heart an internalist about pleasure who was mislead by the heterogeneity argument into offering an externalist view which is open to serious objections. (Crisp 2007: 134; 2015 70)

For Crisp,

the heterogeneity objection moves in an unjustified way from the obviously true claim that the kinds of experience that are enjoyed are very various to the claim that the feeling of enjoyment is not some phenomenologically internal property common to all such experiences. On the face of it, it might appear that there is such a property: We can ask of any enjoyable experience whether it felt enjoyable, or whether it was more or less enjoyable than some other experience, and it is quite plausible to suggest that answers to these questions do not involve our attending to any attitude or other state external to the enjoyment or lack of it in question. (Crisp 2015: 67)

Enjoyment is a determinable, like color vision, with particular enjoyments being determinates, like seeing particular colors. Crisp concludes that some such account of enjoyment, or pleasure, would have better served Sidgwick, as Sidgwick himself half realized.

Clearly, recent years have witnessed some remarkable rehabilitations of Sidgwick’s ethical hedonism, particularly in the works of Crisp (2007, 2015), Feldman (2004, 2010), and de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2014, 2016). And clearly, the forms of hedonism being defended usually reconfigure or qualify the Sidgwickian approach in important ways, in part out of necessity, because of the obscurity of Sidgwick’s position on the fundamental issues. These rehabilitations of Sidgwickian hedonism have also involved, for some, a recognition of the importance of the hedonimetrics of F. Y. Edgeworth, the brilliant economist who was a slightly junior contemporary of Sidgwick’s and one of his most enthusiastic philosophical disciples, though one whose work has until recently been largely ignored in philosophical commentary on Sidgwick (Edgeworth 1877, 1881 [2003]). Edgeworth’s approach has been revived in economics by such figures as Kahneman (2011), and the convergence of economic and philosophical, and neurobiological, interests on this point suggests that hedonism remains a live option in ethics, though in key respects Sidgwick’s account, obscure as it is, remains superior to these more recent developments, which rely on a rather too crude claim about pleasurable consciousness as a state that a subject wishes to prolong. Indeed, despite philosophical hedonism being a core commitment of classical utilitarianism past and present, no account of it, whether Sidgwick’s or anyone else’s, is problem free and uncertainty abounds. For example, de Lazari-Radek and Singer, while initially impressed by the heterogenity objection, are now no longer sure that it is decisive:

As Crisp notes, in our book we approve of this “heterogeneity objection”, and cite the work of the neuroscientists Kent Berridge and Morten Kringelbach in support of the view that pleasure is not a sensation, but rather is a kind of “hedonic gloss” that our hedonic brain systems paint on certain sensations. Crisp thinks that it is better to interpret Berridge and Kringelbach as saying that pleasure is not merely a sensation, but allowing that the hedonic gloss may itself be a sensation, or a single type of feeling. We are now willing to concede that Crisp may be right on this If so, the heterogeneity objection can be met, to the extent that we can say that the hedonic systems of the brain put the same kind of hedonic gloss on various different sensations. (Singer & de Lazari-Radek 2016: 205–6)

But as de Lazari-Radek and Singer admit, this might not prove to be much of a victory:

The question is, however, whether this does not simply transfer the problem of saying what pleasure is to the problem of saying what the hedonic gloss is. How is it to be distinguished from other feelings? If we answer this question by saying that it is just a particular kind of feeling, in the way that sweetness is a particular kind of taste, then anyone who thinks that pleasure is intrinsically good needs to explain why just this kind of feeling has intrinsic value. If some people do not desire this kind of feeling, even qua feeling, then hedonistic theories of the good will fail to satisfy what, following Peter Railton, we have called “the resonance requirement”—we will be telling such people that pleasure is good for them, but this will not resonate with anything they desire or value. Obviously, the same problem recurs if we describe the hedonic gloss in terms of certain brain states. If, on the other hand, we say that the hedonic gloss is to be distinguished from other feelings by the fact that we do desire it, qua feeling, we are back to where we started, with pleasure being whatever mental state we desire, qua mental state. These problems remain in need of more work. (Singer & de Lazari-Radek 2016: 206)

Without getting into the problematic conflation here of “desired” and “desirable”, or “apprehended as desirable”, it should be plain enough that the controversies Sidgwick sparked are ongoing. To make matters worse, Nozick’s venerable “Experience Machine” objection to hedonism—to the effect that for hedonism a virtual, or Matrix like programmed world is as good as the real one—has received new life with the growth of concerns over developments with AI and the metaverse, which seem to exert a disturbing pressure on people, especially young people, to assume that their good or well-being just is what goes on in their heads, however undesirable that may be (Mulgan 2020: 26–28).

2.2 Reconstruction and Reconciliation

For better or worse, Sidgwick uses the language of hedonism to label two out of the three methods with which he will be chiefly concerned—namely, egoistic hedonism (or rational egoism) and universal hedonism (or utilitarianism). The third method is variously called dogmatic or intuitional morality, which is somewhat ambiguously construed as either the (mostly negative) precepts of common-sense morality or the somewhat more refined version of these set out in the theories of such moral theorists as Whewell, T. R. Birks, or Henry Calderwood (Whewell 1864; Birks 1874; Calderwood 1876; Donagan 1977, 1992). The main point of such views is that conformity to such moral duties as truth-telling, promise-keeping, temperance etc. is held to be “the practically ultimate end of moral actions” and these duties are “unconditionally prescribed” and discernible with “really clear and finally valid intuition”, though it is the job of the moral theorist to set them out with proper precision and “to arrange the results as systematically as possible, and by proper definitions and explanations to remove vagueness and prevent conflict”. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 101]). Indeed, the plain person is apt to be rather confused about the differences between the methods of ethics, arbitrarily deploying one or another without recognizing any inconsistency.

The three methods of ethics—egoism, intuitional morality, and utilitarianism—respectively form the subject matter of books two through four of the Methods, which brackets them with an opening book reviewing the whole work and a concluding chapter on “The Mutual Relations of the Three Methods”. Each of these books represents in itself a classic treatment of the view at issue, though it is the chapter on utilitarianism that has perhaps most often been treated as such. This architectonic can, however, make it somewhat difficult to follow the thread of Sidgwick’s thought, particularly on the more philosophical points having to do with intuitionism. Indeed, intuitionism figures in both the second method of ethics, and, in a more philosophical form, in the treatment of all the methods of ethics, particularly when it comes to the discussion of fundamental principles. As Sidgwick explains, although some might think that conscience delivers immediate judgments on particular acts—a view he variously calls aesthetic, perceptional or ultra intuitionism—“reflective persons, in proportion to their reflectiveness, come to rely rather on abstract universal intuitions relating to classes of cases conceived under general notions”. Hence, dogmatic intuitional morality, which in the Methods is rather awkwardly taken to cover both more deontological views and non-hedonistic teleological ones, on the ground that the latter tend to construe virtue in the same fashion as the simply the done thing, whatever the consequences. But the process of reflection should not stop there: there is another, more sophisticated phase of intuitionism. Without

being disposed to deny that conduct commonly judged to be right is so, we may yet require some deeper explanation why it is so.

Thus, philosophical intuitionism,

while accepting the morality of common sense as in the main sound, still attempts to find for it a philosophic basis which it does not itself offer: to get one or more principles more absolutely and undeniably true and evident, from which the current rules might be deduced, either just as they are commonly received or with slight modifications and rectifications. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 102])

The ascent to this philosophical intuitionism is especially evident in the treatment of common-sense or intuitional morality. As Sidgwick explained in reply to Calderwood’s critical review of the Methods, which asked why he had not simply confined himself “to the consideration of Intuitionism in its most philosophical form”, that tactic

would have led me at once to Utilitarianism: because I hold that the only moral intuitions which sound philosophy can accept as ultimately valid are those which at the same time provide the only possible philosophical basis of the Utilitarian creed. I thus necessarily regard Prof. Calderwood’s Intuitionism as a phase in the development of the Intuitional method, which comes naturally between the crude thought of Butler’s “plain man” and the Rational Utilitarianism to which I ultimately endeavor to lead my reader.

That is, allowing that the morality of common sense is his as well, he must as a philosopher nonetheless

ask myself whether I see clearly and distinctly the self-evidence of any particular maxims of duty, as I see that of the formal principles “that what is right for me must be right for all persons in precisely similar circumstances” and “that I ought to prefer the greater good of another to my own lesser good”: I have no doubt whatever that I do not. I am conscious of a strong impression, an opinion on which I habitually act without hesitation, that I ought to speak truth, to perform promises, to requite benefits, & c., and also of powerful moral sentiments prompting me to the observance of these rules; but on reflection I can now clearly distinguish such opinions and sentiments from the apparently immediate and certain cognition that I have of the formal principles above mentioned. But I could not always have made this distinction; and I believe that the majority of moral persons do not make it: most “plain men” would probably say, at any rate on the first consideration of the matter, that they saw the obligations of Veracity and Good Faith as clearly and immediately as they saw those of Equity and Rational Benevolence. How then am I to argue with such persons? It will not settle the matter to tell them that they have observed their own mental processes wrongly, and that more careful introspection will show them the non-intuitive character of what they took for intuitions; especially as in many cases I do not believe that the error is one of misobservation. Still less am I inclined to dispute the “primitiveness” or “spontaneousness” or “originality” of these apparent intuitions. On the contrary, I hold that here, as in other departments of thought, the primitive spontaneous processes of the mind are mixed with error, which is only to be removed gradually by comprehensive reflection upon the results of these processes. Through such a course of reflection I have endeavored to lead my readers in chaps. 2–10 of Book III of my treatise: in the hope that after they have gone through it they may find their original apprehension of the self-evidence of moral maxims importantly modified. (Sidgwick 1876: 564)

And as he explained in another important commentary on the Methods, “The Establishment of Ethical First Principles”, he accepts Aristotle’s distinction between logical priority and priority in the knowledge of a particular person, such that we

are thus enabled to see that a proposition may be self-evident, i.e., may be properly cognisable without being viewed in connexion with any other propositions; though in order that its truth may be apparent to some particular mind, there is still required some rational process connecting it with propositions previously accepted by that mind.

This latter can be done in two ways: by showing how “some limited and qualified statement” supposed to be self-evident is only part of a “simpler and wider proposition”, on which the limitations turn out to be arbitrary, and by establishing some general criteria “for distinguishing true first principles” that are then used to

construct a strictly logical deduction by which, applying their general criteria to the special case of ethics, we establish the true first principles of this latter subject. (Sidgwick 1879: 106–7)

Truth being one, both tactics should ultimately converge on the same conclusions.

Whether Sidgwick succeeded in avoiding mere “hostile criticism from the outside” in his analysis of common-sense morality is open to debate; certainly, the critical reflection can seem quite remorseless, with the utilitarian repeatedly demonstrating to the dogmatic intuitionist

that the principles of Truth, Justice, etc. have only a dependent and subordinate validity: arguing either that the principle is really only affirmed by Common-Sense as a general rule admitting of exceptions and qualifications, as in the case of Truth, and that we require some further principle for systematising these exceptions and qualifications; or that the fundamental notion is vague and needs further determination, as in the case of Justice; and further, that the different rules are liable to conflict with each other, and that we require some higher principle to decide the issue thus raised; and again, that the rules are differently formulated by different persons, and that these differences admit of no Intuitional solution, while they show the vagueness and ambiguity of the common moral notions to which the Intuitionist appeals. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 421])

Time and again, common sense collapses into utilitarian thinking, or is shown to presuppose it, or is at least revealed as requiring something very like it. This effort to criticize and assimilate common-sense moral rules went far beyond the efforts of J. S. Mill and has served as a template for the utilitarian or consequentialist work of Smart (1973), Brandt (1979), Hare (1981), Parfit (1984, 2011–2017), Hardin (1988), Gibbard (1982, 1990), de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2014, 2016, 2021), and Woodard (2019). Like so many in the utilitarian tradition, Sidgwick ended up recognizing the moral standing of non-human animals, puzzling over questions of suicide, defending a notion of intention covering all foreseen consequences, rejecting purely retributive accounts of punishment, embracing a cosmopolitan (rather than nationalistic) outlook, and thinking—though not public insisting—that orthodox religion and its morality were often dogmatic and superstitious. More originally, he initiated the (modern) philosophical discussion of the problem of future generations and optimal population growth, arguing that

strictly conceived, the point up to which, on Utilitarian principles, population ought to be encouraged to increase, is not that at which average happiness is the greatest possible … but that at which the product formed by multiplying the number of persons living into the amount of average happiness reaches its maximum. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 415–16])

Sidgwick was not always consistent in his treatment of this issue of average versus total utility, but even so, had he done nothing more than formulate this issue, his philosophical fame would have been secured. The flourishing fields of population ethics and justice for future generations, which received an enormous boost from Parfit, especially his Reasons and Persons (1984), reflect the seminal Sidgwickian influence at many, many points, though as with hedonism, the controversies have often deepened rather than dissipated (McMahan, Campbell, Goodrich, & Ramakrishnan [eds] 2022).

Sidgwick made other original contributions as well. Although it can seem strained and anachronistic to apply the classification of “act” or “rule” utilitarianism to him, the scholarly consensus does for the most part classify him as an act utilitarian (Gray 1984; Williams 1995; Hooker 2000a,b; de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014, 2021; Crisp 2015). But he does not fit the stock stereotype of that position. Among other things, it is quite clear that he defended a very “indirect” form of utilitarianism, going so far as to defend the possibility of utilitarianism entailing a self-effacing, even esoteric morality:

Thus, on Utilitarian principles, it may be right to do and privately recommend, under certain circumstances, what it would not be right to advocate openly; it may be right to teach openly to one set of persons what it would be wrong to teach to others; it may be conceivably right to do, if it can be done with comparative secrecy, what it would be wrong to do in the face of the world; and even, if perfect secrecy can be reasonably expected, what it would be wrong to recommend by private advice or example. These conclusions are all of a paradoxical character: there is no doubt that the moral consciousness of a plain man broadly repudiates the general notion of an esoteric morality, differing from the one popularly taught; and it would be commonly agreed that an action which would be bad if done openly is not rendered good by secrecy. We may observe, however, that there are strong utilitarian reasons for maintaining generally this latter common opinion…. Thus the Utilitarian conclusion, carefully stated, would seem to be this; that the opinion that secrecy may render an action right which would not otherwise be so should itself be kept comparatively secret; and similarly it seems expedient that the doctrine that esoteric morality is expedient should itself be kept esoteric. … a Utilitarian may reasonably desire, on Utilitarian principles, that some of his conclusions should be rejected by mankind generally; or even that the vulgar should keep aloof from his system as a whole, in so far as the inevitable indefiniteness and complexity of its calculations render it likely to lead to bad results in their hands. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 489–90])

Such provocative remarks, which flatly contradict any Kantian insistence on the necessary publicity of fundamental moral principles, may reflect a consistent interpretation of the different “levels” of moral thinking, critical versus everyday, but they have generated much criticism, with Williams insinuating that Sidgwick was a “Government House” utilitarian whose views comported well with colonialism (Williams 1995). Yet even on the count of esoteric morality, Sidgwick’s views have attracted some forceful recent defenders (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2010, 2014, 2016) who strike at the very heart of the Kantian and neo-Kantian publicity requirement. Their argument owes much to Parfit’s demonstration that an ethical theory could be self-effacing without being self-defeating, incoherent or untrue (Parfit 1984).

As noted, however, for all his originality, Sidgwick has often been charged with slanting his discussion against a wide range of alternatives (Donagan 1977, 1992; Irwin 1992, 2007, 2011; Hurka 2014b). And at times it is very far from clear whose views he is criticizing. Thus, his account of “aesthetic intuitionism” would seem to be trained on a certain form of Aristotelianism stressing the contextual and particularist nature of practical wisdom (McDowell 1979; Irwin 1992), but, in a curiously neglected work on the history of ethics that was in some ways a successor to Sidgwick’s own Outlines (and contained an extended treatment of Sidgwick’s views), Reginald A. P. Rogers identified aesthetic intuitionism with the moral sense theory of Shaftesbury (Rogers 1911). Furthermore, of special concern to recent intuitionists has been the effort to combine Sidgwick’s views with those of Ross on prima facie intuitions, acknowledging that Sidgwick’s account of intuitional morality did not address such an option (Hurka 2014a, 2014b; Crisp 2015). Hurka has developed this critique forcefully, expanding on his claim that Sidgwick’s framing of ethical theory was slanted from the start: Sidgwick

took it to be a serious objection to a pluralist deontology that it cannot always judge acts determinately because it cannot weigh duties precisely, but no objection to hedonistic theories that they cannot compare pleasures precisely. He tested deotontological principles rigorously with his four conditions but barely applied those conditions to his own principles. And though one of his main objections to deontological principles turned on the difference between their other-things-equal and all-things-considered forms, his defence of his axioms equivocated on the same point and involved the same ambiguity. In arguing against deontology and for consequentialism he applied, and not just once, a double standard. (Hurka 2014b: 151–2)

For others, however, it is clear enough that Sidgwick’s hedonistic utilitarianism does not require any Rossian apparatus for recognizing apparent conflicts of duties. De Lazari-Radek and Singer, in response to Crisp’s defense of Rossian prima facie intuitions, argue that

Ross starts by assuming that, as he puts it, “the main moral convictions of the plain man” are “not opinions which it is for philosophy to prove or disprove, but knowledge from the start”. As we have already indicated both in our book and in this response, we are skeptical about the validity of most of our moral intuitions. (Singer & de Lazari-Radek 2016)

As Crisp allows, Sidgwick would probably not have deemed the Rossian gambit to the point for purposes of dealing with the problems that most troubled him.

More generally, it must be said that Sidgwick, under the influence of Hegel and other historically-minded philosophers, did not claim that he was impartially addressing all historically important methods of ethics, but only those that in his estimate had become the live options as humanity had progressed (Schultz 2013; Phillips 2022). He may have been somewhat misguided in identifying those, but that is not the same as being blind to the content of the alternatives.

At any rate, fair or not, Sidgwick’s reconciliation of intuitional morality and utilitarianism obviously deploys a sophisticated form of intuitionist epistemology, one allowing for the fallibilism of its conclusions. He formulates four criteria or conditions

the complete fulfillment of which would establish a significant proposition, apparently self-evident, in the highest degree of certainty attainable: and which must be approximately realised by the premises of our reasoning in any inquiry, if that reasoning is to lead us cogently to trustworthy conclusions. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 338])

The first, often called simply the “Cartesian Criterion”, demands that the “terms of the proposition must be clear and precise”, and the second requires that the “self-evidence of the proposition must be ascertained by careful reflection”, which is especially important in ethics because

any strong sentiment, however purely subjective, is apt to transform itself into the semblance of an intuition; and it requires careful contemplation to detect the illusion. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 339])

Third, the “propositions accepted as self-evident must be mutually consistent”, since it “is obvious that any collision between two intuitions is a proof that there is error in one or the other, or in both”. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 341]). And fourth, since

it is implied in the very notion of Truth that it is essentially the same for all minds, the denial by another of a proposition that I have affirmed has a tendency to impair my confidence in its validity.

This last adds an important social dimension to Sidgwick’s epistemology:

the absence of such disagreement must remain an indispensable negative condition of the certainty of our beliefs,


if I find any of my judgements, intuitive or inferential, in direct conflict with a judgment of some other minds, there must be error somewhere: and if I have no more reason to suspect error in the other mind than in my own, reflective comparison between the two judgments necessarily reduces me temporarily to a state of neutrality. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 341–42])

In other, more purely epistemological works, Sidgwick collapsed the first two conditions into one, such that his philosophical intuitionism involved the three-pronged demand for clarity and ability to withstand critical reflection, consistency or coherence, and consensus of experts. He was also apt to explain that these conditions only afforded the best means for reducing the risk of error, rather than establishing indubitable truth. On this count, such posthumous works as Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant (1905) and Philosophy, Its Scope and Relations (1902) provide important supplements to the Methods. Marcus G. Singer (2000) provides an excellent edited collection of those of Sidgwick’s essays and reviews most relevant to the Methods. Unfortunately, much otherwise excellent work on Sidgwick’s intuitionism has been compromised by a failure to recognize the significance of these other works.

3. Epistemology and Chaos

Perhaps no region of Sidgwick’s work has been the subject of greater interpretive controversy than his epistemology. The early work of Schneewind (1963), Rawls (1971, and Schultz ([ed.] 1992) played up the dialectical side of Sidgwick’s approach and the ways in which he anticipated the Rawlsian account of the method of reflective equilibrium. Reactions to any such interpretation, which supposedly accorded a too generous role to “received opinion” in Sidgwick’s methodology, came from Peter Singer (1974) and many others influenced by Hare’s critique of Rawls (see also Sverdlik 1985, and especially, Skelton 2007, 2008, 2010a,b). Rawls himself shifted his ground somewhat in later work, playing up Sidgwick’s “rational intuitionism” (Rawls 1993, 2007). But other accounts, notably Brink (1994), Shaver (1999, 2011, 2014) and Phillips (2022), have recognized that Sidgwick’s approach contains both dialectical and more purely intuitionist elements, debating whether these can be combined in a consistent or coherent way. Recent work on Sidgwick has also benefited from the renaissance in and rehabilitation of intuitionism, evident in such works as Audi (1997), Parfit (2011–2017), and Stratton-Lake ([ed.] 2002); the latter contains an important contribution by Crisp that effectively distances Sidgwick’s views from cruder versions of intuitionism, though Deigh (2010) has argued forcefully that Sidgwick was too committed to an axiomatic approach that was undermined by developments in analytical philosophy, a point in some ways reminiscent of Donagan’s (1977) critique of Sidgwick’s intuitionism. Schultz (2013, 2014a) surveys the development of some of these debates, and emphasizes the role of consensus in Sidgwick’s epistemology, a factor also figuring in the Sidgwickian methodology developed by Parfit (2011–2017). But this is a very lively area of research in which the history of English moral philosophy from Whewell to Ross is still being actively rewritten in dramatic fashion (Hurka [ed.] 2011; 2014a). Yet it does appear that in the last decade, the scholarly emphasis has been disproportionately on Sidgwick and his successors, notably Ross, rather than Sidgwick and his predecessors, notably Whewell, who remains a comparatively neglected figure (Snyder 2001 [2019], 2006).

Sidgwick’s epistemology is linked to other significant controversies as well, such as those concerning the degree to which he can really be classified as a utilitarian, in any unqualified fashion. For Sidgwick argues, over the course of the Methods, that common-sense or intuitional morality keeps giving way to more abstract formal principles as the better candidates for genuinely self-evident truths. Although there is some controversy over just how many such principles he advances, at the least he defends a universalizability principle (one must be able to will one’s maxim to be a universal law) and a principle of rational prudence (or temporal neutrality, such that one should be ceteris paribus equally concerned with all parts of one’s life), in addition to the utilitarian principle of rational benevolence. Controversially, he holds that the universalizability principle is merely formal and lacks content, being consistent with both egoism and utilitarianism, and that temporal neutrality translates into a form of prudence. And in fact, even utilitarianism is actually derived from two more fundamental principles, and involves the “relation of the integrant parts to the whole and to each other” in order to obtain

the self-evident principle that the good of any one individual is of no more importance, from the point of view (if I may say so) of the Universe, than the good of any other; unless, that is, there are special grounds for believing the more good is likely to be realised in the one case than in the other. And it is evident to me that as a rational being I am bound to aim at good generally,—so far as it is attainable by my efforts,—not at a particular part of it.

And from

these two rational intuitions we may deduce, as a necessary inference, the maxim of Benevolence in an abstract form: viz. that each one is morally bound to regard the good of any other individual as much as his own, except in so far as he judges it to be less, when impartially viewed, or less certainly knowable or attainable by him. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 382])

Thus, in his more careful statements of the candidates for self-evident truths, Sidgwick refrains from formulations directly invoking “the greatest happiness of the greatest number” or hedonistic considerations. Some of the most sophisticated commentary on the Methods, such as Schneewind (1977), Shaver (1999, 2014), Nakano-Okuno (2011), Parfit (2011–2017), Phillips (2011, 2022), de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2014, 2016), Hurka (2014a), and Crisp (2015), has highlighted the gap between these “axioms” and the substantive ethical theories derived or developed from them. Sidgwick himself appreciated the irony of his position, the way in which the hard-headed, reformist utilitarian emphasis on clarity and conclusiveness had dissipated in his work: there are indeed

certain absolute practical principles, the truth of which, when they are explicitly stated, is manifest; but they are of too abstract a nature, and too universal in their scope, to enable us to ascertain by immediate application of them what we ought to do in any particular case; particular duties have still to be determined by some other method. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 379])

Common-sense rules have their place, but are not even clear enough to serve as the “middle axioms” of the utilitarian theory. As he put it to Dakyns:

Ethics is losing its interest for me rather, as the insolubility of its fundamental problem is impressed on me. I think the contribution to the formal clearness & coherence of our ethical thought which I have to offer is just worth giving: for a few speculatively-minded persons—very few. And as for all practical questions of interest, I feel as if I had now to begin at the beginning and learn the ABC. (Memoir: 277)

Worse still, all was not happy even in the ethereal region of the axioms. The “insolubility” of the “fundamental problem” of ethics—the key problem that had troubled Sidgwick in the 1860s—was indeed on display in Sidgwick’s treatise, in that he did not find the unified account of practical reason that he sought even at the more abstract level. As he had put it in an earlier letter to his friend Dakyns:

You know I want intuitions for Morality; at least one (of Love) is required to supplement the utilitarian morality, and I do not see why, if we are to have one, we may not have others. I have worked away vigorously at the selfish morality, but I cannot persuade myself, except by trusting intuition, that Christian self-sacrifice is really a happier life than classical insouciance. (Memoir: 90)

The problem of self-sacrifice and the claims of rational egoism were not, on Sidgwick’s view, amenable to the same form of reconciliation with utilitarianism that intuitional morality was. In fact, the first edition of the Methods concludes that rational egoism and utilitarianism end up in a stand-off, that there is a “dualism of the practical reason”, and that as a result, there is a “fundamental contradiction in our apparent intuitions of what is Reasonable in conduct” such that

the “Cosmos” of Duty is thus really reduced to a Chaos, and the prolonged effort of the human intellect to frame a perfect ideal of rational conduct is seen to have been foredoomed to inevitable failure. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 473])

Later editions of the work sounded a somewhat less bleak concluding note, but did not differ in substance. The main possible solutions to the problem that Sidgwick considered are two, a weakening of epistemological standards, or a Theistic postulate about the coherent moral government of the universe. On the first, he suggests that if

we find that in our supposed knowledge of the world of nature propositions are commonly taken to be universally true, which seem to rest on no other ground than that we have a strong disposition to accept them, and that they are indispensable to the systematic coherence of our beliefs,—it will be more difficult to reject a similarly supported assumption in ethics, without opening the door to universal scepticism. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 509])

On the second, he explains that if

we may assume the existence of such a Being, as God, by the consensus of theologians, is conceived to be, it seems that Utilitarians may legitimately infer the existence of Divine sanctions to the code of social duty as constructed on a Utilitarian basis; and such sanctions would, of course, suffice to make it always every one’s interest to promote universal happiness to the best of his knowledge. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 506])

Sidgwick often departed from the pristine language of the axioms when describing this conflict. In another important essay on his own work, he explained that along with

(a) a fundamental moral conviction that I ought to sacrifice my own happiness, if by so doing I can increase the happiness of others to a greater extent than I diminish my own, I find also (b) a conviction—which it would be paradoxical to call “moral”, but which is none the less fundamental—that it would be irrational to sacrifice any portion of my own happiness unless the sacrifice is to be somehow at some time compensated by an equivalent addition to my own happiness. (Sidgwick 1889: 483)

He urges that each of these convictions has as much clarity and certainty “as the process of introspective can give” and each also finds wide assent “in the common sense of mankind”. Moreover, his account of rational egoism does not rely on a narrow or low-minded account of self-interest. Besides

admitting the actual importance of sympathetic pleasures to the majority of mankind, I should go further and maintain that, on empirical grounds alone, enlightened self-interest would direct most men to foster and develop their sympathetic susceptibilities to a greater extent than is now commonly attained. The effectiveness of Butler’s famous argument against the vulgar antithesis between Self-love and Benevolence is undeniable: and it seems scarcely extravagant to say that, amid all the profuse waste of the means of happiness which men commit, there is no imprudence more flagrant than that of Selfishness in the ordinary sense of the term,—the excessive concentration of attention on the individual’s own happiness which renders it impossible for him to feel any strong interest in the pleasures and pains of others. (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 501])

Still, he found it impossible to deny that even very high-minded versions of egoism posed a problem, prescribing actions conflicting with the general good in such cases as heroic sacrifice of self in battle, etc. This view, he suggested, could be found in Butler’s claim that “Reasonable Self-love and Conscience are the two chief or superior principles in the nature of man”, each generating an obligation, though Frankena (1992), Darwall (2000) and Crisp (2019) have raised questions about the historical accuracy of this attribution. But in any event, the basic point is that if

the Egoist strictly confines himself to stating his conviction that he ought to take his own happiness or pleasure as his ultimate end, there seems no opening for an argument to lead him to Utilitarianism (as a first principle). But if he offers either as a reason for this conviction, or as another form of stating it, the proposition that his happiness or pleasure is objectively “desirable” or “a good”, he gives the requisite opening. For the Utilitarian can then point out that his happiness cannot be more objectively desirable or more a good than the happiness of any one else; the mere fact … that he is he can have nothing to do with its objective desirability or goodness. (Sidgwick 1873: 259–60)

But the egoist need not make that move—it is just as rational simply to take one’s own point of view as it is to take the point of view of the universe—of the utilitarian superperson.

Sidgwick’s dualism has a long history of stimulating controversy, even leading some commentators to urge that he is better termed a “dualist” or “dual-source theorist” than a utilitarian (Crisp 2002, 2014, 2015). Moore (1903) famously dismissed the problem on the grounds that the notion of one’s “own good” was nonsense, but Mackie (1976) sharply countered that Moore was begging the question. Broad (1930) claimed that Sidgwick’s account was confused, since his proposed solutions did not touch the problem of the inconsistent fundamental principles, though this has been effectively addressed by Coady (1994), Schneewind (1977) and many others. Brink (1988) has argued that it is absurd to claim that two self-evident principles are inconsistent, but Shaver (1999) has replied that Sidgwick is for the most part consistent in calling the principles at issue only “apparently” self-evident, though Shaver also suggests that Sidgwick did not present a compelling case for the egoistic side of the conflict. Skorupski (2000) has forcefully argued that there is no dualism of the “pure” practical reason, which is agent neutral, but there are many such conflicts in the larger field of less than pure practical reason, not merely a conflict with egoistic reasons. Parfit, too, argued that Sidgwick’s two standpoints approach failed to capture how egoistic reasons can be weaker than omnipersonal ones (Parfit 2011a,b), though Smith (2009) has defended Sidgwick’s construction of the problem. And Baier (1995) argued that Sidgwick’s account suffers from various ambiguities because he does not clearly distinguish “requiring” reasons from “permissive” ones, which would avoid the contradiction. Indeed, more generally, it is telling that many of Sidgwick’s most notable admirers, such as Larmore (1996) and Parfit (2011–2017), do not carry all the baggage of his epistemological intuitionism but prefer instead to translate his arguments into the idiom of objective normative “reasons”. Indeed, Parfit called his deeply Sidgwickian view a form of non-naturalistic, non-metaphysical moral rationalism. And in his major works on the Methods, Phillips (2011, 2022) reconstructs Sidgwick’s arguments in a similar, Parfitian way, while retaining more of Sidgwick’s terminology. He also, in Phillips (2022: 210–31), provides an excellent overview of the various positions on the Sidgwickian dualism. Thus, in one vocabulary or another, these controversies are likely to continue as long as there is such a thing as ethical philosophy.

The issue is worth illustrating in more detail, given the importance of recent work in this area. Thus, unlike Sidgwick, but like Crisp (2006b, 2015) and Phillips (2011, 2022), Parfit did not regard practical reason as teetering on chaos or think it a cosmic calamity if we could not demonstrate that we always have most objective reason to do what would be impartially best, or that impartial and egoistic reasons can be harmonized, though he did think it would be a cosmic calamity if there were no objective normative reasons (Edmonds 2023). When it came to Sidgwick’s dualism, he was content to sort out the complex of objective reasons that we might have, without going so far as to worry about the absurdity of a universe in which Own Good and Other Good might be left in conflict, and he even pronounced Sidgwick’s “somber claims” on this score “overstatements”, and the result of an unhelpful “two standpoints” framework of self and other that misses how we can compare the strength of different reasons. Parfit urged that Sidgwick’s more plausible, revised claim is simply:

When one of our two possible acts would make things go in some way that would be impartially better, but the other act would make things go better either for ourselves or for those to whom we have close ties, we often have sufficient reasons to act in either of these two ways. (Parfit 2011a: 137)

Thus, Sidgwick drew the conflict too narrowly, between impartial and egoistic reasons; he failed to consider the full range of less than fully impartial reasons and how they may or may not be comparatively stronger than impartial ones. He also failed to consider the relevance of a Reductionist view of personal identity in undermining egoism. Indeed, Parfit went even further in elaborating the complex of objective reasons, allowing not only that we might have personal and partial, but not self-interested reasons that could outweigh impartial reasons, but also that, if we are not act consequentialists, we might find conflicts between impartial reasons and moral reasons, such as deontological ones (Parfit 2017). As Crisp (2006b, 2015) has argued, and as Parfit clearly admitted, Sidgwick himself took a less elaborate view. But for all his revisionism, Parfit did reflect Sidgwick’s views at a great many points, not least in taking very seriously the consensus of experts criterion, which pushed him to develop his “Triple Theory”, a consequentializing convergence of rule consequentialism, Kantian universalizability, and Scanlonian contractualism. Although the Triple Theory is at some distance from Sidgwick’s form of utilitarianism, Parfit denied that he had dismissed the viability of act consequentialism (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2020).

In fact, the works of de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2012, 2014, 2016) have opened up some ingenious new lines of argument in this area, arguments that, they claim, are more thoroughly Sidgwickian. As noted, Sidgwick had argued that apparently self-evident claims had to be clear and precise, able to withstand critical reflection, consistent with one another, and able to win a consensus of experts, though in other writings he collapsed the first two into just one condition. De Lazari-Radek and Singer seem less concerned to reject any element of Sidgwick’s account than to add to it, such that the significance of evolutionary “debunking” arguments is recognized, and this leads them to reject Sidgwick’s Dualism:

We might have become reasoning beings because that enabled us to solve a variety of problems that would otherwise have hampered our survival, but once we are capable of reasoning, we may be unable to avoid recognizing and discovering some truths that do not aid our survival. That can be said about some complicated truths of mathematics or physics. It can also, as Parfit has suggested, be the case with some of our normative epistemic beliefs; for instance, the belief that when some argument is valid and has true premises, so that this argument’s conclusion must be true, these facts give us a decisive reason to believe this conclusion. Parfit argues that this normative claim about what we have decisive reason to believe is not itself evolutionarily advantageous, since to gain that advantage, it would have been sufficient to have the non-normative beliefs that the argument is valid, and has true premises, and that the conclusion must be true. Hence this and other normative epistemic beliefs are not open to a debunking argument. This may also hold for some of our moral beliefs. One such moral truth could be Sidgwick’s axiom of universal benevolence: “each one is morally bound to regard the good of any other individual as much as his own, except in so far as he judges it to be less, when impartially viewed, or less certainly knowable or attainable by him”. (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014: 182–83)

Thus, if, with Sharon Street (2006), one holds that in many cases

it is more scientifically plausible to explain human evaluative attitudes as having evolved because they help us to survive and to have surviving offspring, than because they are true, (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014: 180)

one can debunk many of the beliefs competing with the Axiom of Universal Benevolence, such as those purportedly justifying partial or personal reasons for action. If Benevolence is not debunked, and if it can in fact be accounted for straightforwardly as a result of reason coming as a unity or package, such that either

we have a capacity to reason that includes the capacity to do advanced physics and mathematics and to grasp objective moral truths, or we have a much more limited capacity to reason that lacks not only these abilities, but others that confer an overriding evolutionary advantage. If reason is a unity of this kind, having the package would have been more conducive to survival and reproductions than not having it. (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014: 183)

Of course, as Parfit commented, one might concede that this argument has some force, but think other objections to egoism, say from a Reductionist view of personal identity, or Present-Aim account of rationality, also matter (Parfit 2017: 339–40).

That Singer, in particular, should in this way have developed defenses, not only of Sidgwickian hedonism, esotericism, and totalism (in population ethics), but also of Sidgwickian metaethical cognitivism (against his former commitment to Hare’s prescriptivism), and used these to advance a form of utilitarianism that, he holds, is more consistently utilitarian than Sidgwick’s own position and in that way in line with Sidgwick’s deeper tendencies, is illustrative of the increasingly important role that Sidgwick’s work is playing in cutting edge ethical theory. Whether the principle of Universal Benevolence really has the ability to withstand evolutionary debunking arguments, and whether such arguments can really be made compelling in the first place, are open questions, as is the question of whether Sidgwick himself would not have found such gambits too narrow and unable to address his deeper worries about the religious significance of the dualism of practical reason (Schultz 2014b, 2017; Gray 2015). But even so, these recent developments amount to something of a Sidgwickian counter-revolution to the Rawlsian Kantian revolution, an effort at both the meta and substantive ethical levels to provide an effective cognitive intuitionist and consequentialist alternative to Kantian constructivist and proceduralist accounts of moral reasons.

Although Sidgwick denied that it was his special purpose, in the Methods, to call attention to the dualism of practical reason, this problem clearly loomed very large for him and affected many other aspects of his life and work, including his views on the history of ethics: he thought egoism the dominant view of the classical Greek philosophers, the difference between ancients and moderns having largely to do with the modern preoccupation with “ought” rather than “good” and the emergence of the dualism in Butler (Frankena 1992; Irwin 1992, 1994, 2011; Crisp 2015). Again, arguably, he never did full justice to non-hedonistic, teleological forms of perfectionism (Hurka 2001, [ed.] 2011, 2014a; Crisp 2015) or to fully deontological, Kantian views (Schneewind 1977; Korsgaard 2009). However, as the remarks above underscore, the range of his arguments is richer and more fertile than many of his critics have recognized. Indeed, in his own day, he advanced effective criticisms of the evolutionism of Herbert Spencer, the idealism of Green and Bradley, and most of the other currents of philosophical opinion that he encountered. Weinstein (2000) argues effectively that on key points Spencer and Sidgwick had much in common; Brink (2003) indicates just how intelligent and penetrating the exchanges between Sidgwick and Green were, though he concludes that Green scored an effective point in charging that Sidgwick’s hedonism was implausible, even if coherent, a point that the recent hedonists are of course not willing to concede (de Lazari-Radek & Singer 2014, 2016).

In the end, however, at least on the topic of classifying Sidgwick’s Methods as a work of classical utilitarianism, it remains difficult to dissent from Schneewind’s summary of its heterodoxy: the Methods

centers on an examination of the accepted moral opinions and modes of thought of common sense. It involves a rejection of empiricism and dismisses the issue of determinism as irrelevant. It emphasizes an attempt to reconcile positions seen by utilitarians as deeply opposed to each other. It finds ethical egoism as reasonable as utilitarianism; and it concludes with arguments to show that, because of this, no full reconciliation of the various rational methods for reaching moral decisions is possible and therefore that the realm of practical reason is probably incoherent. (Schneewind 1974 [1992: 94])

This helps explain why the work continues to inspire both utilitarians and their critics.

4. Religion and Parapsychology

In an intriguing piece of retrospection written in 1887, Sidgwick explained:

Some fifteen years ago, when I was writing my book on Ethics, I was inclined to hold with Kant that we must postulate the continued existence of the soul, in order to effect that harmony of Duty with Happiness which seemed to me indispensable to rational moral life. At any rate I thought I might provisionally postulate it, while setting out on the serious search for empirical evidence. If I decide that this search is a failure, shall I finally and decisively make this postulate? Can I consistently with my whole view of truth and the method of its attainment? And if I answer “no” to each of these questions, have I any ethical system at all? (quoted in Memoir: 467)

Whether Sidgwick’s memory was entirely accurate is uncertain. In a letter actually composed in 1870, he confessed to his friend Roden Noel:

I have never based my belief in immortality on our consciousness of the oneness of Self. I have always considered Kant’s “Paralogisms” conclusive as against that.

What I really base it on (apart from the evidence supplied by Spiritualism, and apart from religious grounds) is on Ethics, as Kant, supported by Common Sense. But I do not state the argument quite as you answer it, but thus

In the face of the conflict between Virtue & Happiness, my own voluntary life, and that of every other man constituted like me, i.e., I believe, of every normal man, is reduced to hopeless anarchy.

Two authorities roughly speaking Butler’s “self-love” and “Conscience” claim to rule, and neither will yield to the other.

The only way of avoiding this intolerable anarchy is by the Postulate of Immortality. But you may say—“you cannot believe it because you want to”

I reply; I find

  1. in me an inherited predisposition to this faith.
  2. In human history the belief is that of the best part of mankind: it has nearly, though not quite, the authority of a belief of Common Sense. (quoted in Schultz 2004: 441).

At any rate, he often expressed dissatisfaction with the Kantian solution, devoting endless hours to “the serious search for empirical evidence” of personal survival. He had long been sympathetic to this type of natural theology, devoting more effort to it than to exploring alternative epistemological arguments of relevance to the dualism. Indeed, Sidgwick joined the Cambridge “Ghost Society” as an undergraduate, and he had already devoted many years to informal psychical research before the formation of the Society for Psychical Research, in 1882, although his efforts expanded thanks to the larger formal organization (Gauld 1968; Oppenheim 1985; McLuhan & Gauld 2020 [Other Internet Resources]). He was president of the SPR from 1882–85 and again from 1888–93. The comparative sobriety of his leadership of this organization, which represented an unusual combination of eminent intellectuals, first-rate scientists, and spiritualistic lunatics, undoubtedly did a great deal to enhance its respectability and insure its longevity. Even many of the spiritualists, who were precommitted to belief in disembodied human spirits, seances, and so forth, allowed that Sidgwick was as fair-minded as any non-mystic could be.

Sidgwick’s parapsychology was clearly and admittedly an extension of his religious studies and as such relevant to the solution of the dualism of practical reason. He did not successfully spell out the precise chain of argument leading from evidence for survival to a unified conception of practical reason, but the general Theistic idea of a “friendly Universe” enjoying a utilitarian moral government was obviously behind his efforts. Again, although he was not sure that he could rationally defend it, he was strongly drawn to the Theistic view that there is a “Heart and Mind” behind phenomena—a “Sovereign Will that orders all things rightly” (Memoir: 604)—and that the universe is ethically meaningful, even if the storm and stress that he had suffered in the 1860s had permanently distanced him from Christian orthodoxy. Interestingly, his conversion to a more utilitarian mode of ethical theory had even predated his break with Anglican orthodoxy, which involved a long and painful struggle that had him studying Hebrew and German, engaging with the new biblical criticism of Strauss and Renan, and arguing with some of the most prominent theologians of his day, including Benson. He found, however, that historical and philological study of the Bible could not answer the deepest philosophical and ethical questions, which called for, among other things, free and open inquiry into the possibility of miracles and paranormal phenomena. Unfortunately, he found that orthodox religion was all too often unreceptive to such forms of inquiry, and that his doubts about such matters as the Virgin Birth were not adequately addressed by the theologians. In a revealing public letter to the Times, Sidgwick distinguished three different approaches to the Bible: “Simple Scripturalism”, which took it all as literally true, “Historical Scripturalism”, which took only its theological and moral statements has having that standing, and “Rationalism”, which held that, although the “most important part of religious truth … was discovered or revealed before the first century of Christianity was closed”, nonetheless

the process of development which the historical scripturalist traces between the earlier and later of them has continued since, and will continue, and that we cannot forecast its limits, and that even where the doctrine of the Bible, taken as a whole, is clear, an appeal lies always open to the common sense, common reason, and combined experience of the religious portion of mankind. (quoted in Schultz 2004: 83)

Sidgwick identified himself with the Rationalist camp, which was congenial to developing a thin Theistic account of religion emphasizing the moral government of the universe, personal survival of physical death, and the existence of a benevolent God. Indeed, he is confident “that the thought of civilised Europe is moving rapidly in its direction, and that it must inevitably spread and prevail”, though he also hopes “that it may spread with the least possible disruption and disorganization of existing institutions, the least possible disruption of old sympathies and associations”. He is also confident, as he makes plain in various works, that the day of theological censure and authoritarianism is passing.

Sidgwick’s psychical research never yielded the hard proof of survival that he sought, and although at the end of his life he concluded that it had been largely a waste of time, he allowed that there were some positive results from it and that, at least in the 1890s, some promising new lines of research had emerged. The investigation of personal survival turned out to be bound up with the investigation of many other purportedly paranormal phenomena: telepathy, telekinesis, hypnotism, automatic writing, trance mediumship, apparitions of the living as well as the dead, the claims of Theosophy, etc. After all, it was argued, a medium supposedly relaying information from the dead might instead be in telepathic communication with living sources of that information. Thus, in order to establish that communication from the “other world” had actually occurred, it was essential to be able to rule out the possibility of telepathy (Gauld 1968, 2007).

The “Sidgwick Group”, as it was called—that is, Henry and Eleanor Sidgwick, Arthur and Gerald Balfour, F. W. H. Myers, Lord Rayleigh, Edmund Gurney, Frank Podmore, and a few others—worked in close collaboration, and ended up establishing to their satisfaction the reality of telepathic communication among the living, the findings being presented in the series of massive (and quite sophisticated) studies Phantasms of the Dead, Phantasms of the Living, and the Census of Hallucinations. As Myers explained the work:

under our heading of “Phantasms of the living”, we propose, in fact, to deal with all classes of cases where there is reason to suppose that the mind of one human being has affected the mind of another, without speech uttered, or word written, or sign made;—has affected it, that is to say, by other means than through the recognised channels of sense.

To such transmissions of thoughts or feelings we have elsewhere given the name of telepathy; and the records of an experimental proof of the reality of telepathy will form a part of the present work. But … we have included among telepathic phenomena a vast class of cases which seem at first sight to involve something widely different from a mere transference of thought.

I refer to apparitions; excluding, indeed, the alleged apparitions of the dead, but including the apparitions of all persons who are still living, as we know life, though they may be on the very brink and border of physical dissolution. And these apparitions … are themselves extremely various in character; including not visual phenomena alone, but auditory, tactile, or even purely ideational and emotional impressions. All these we have included under the term phantasm; a word which, though etymologically a mere variant of phantom, has been less often used, and has not become so closely identified with visual impressions alone. (Myers [1886], 1975: vol. II, ix)

Psychical research, Myers goes on to suggest, can now claim “a certain amount of actual achievement”. Thus,

We hold that we have proved by direct experiment, and corroborated by the narratives contained in this book, the possibility of communications between two minds, inexplicable by any recognised physical laws, but capable (under certain rare spontaneous conditions) of taking place when the persons concerned are at an indefinite distance from each other. And we claim further that by investigations of the higher phenomena of mesmerism, and of the automatic action of the mind, we have confirmed and expanded this view in various directions, and attained a standing-point from which certain even stranger alleged phenomena begin to assume an intelligible aspect, and to suggest further discoveries to come.

Thus far the authors of this book, and also the main group of their fellow-workers, are substantially agreed. (Myers [1886], 1975: vol. II, xx)

This last line indicates, in particular, that Henry Sidgwick, whose name did not appear among the list of authors of these works, was in substantial agreement with their claims, which certainly appears to be the case. As Broad, a later sympathizer, summarized one of the main conclusions of the most comprehensive of the studies, the Census of Hallucinations:

About one visual hallucination in sixty-three occurs within a period of twenty-four hours round about the death of the person whose apparition has been “seen”. If such deal-coincidences were purely fortuitous concurrences of causally independent events the proportion would be about one in nineteen thousand.

Broad concluded that the Census was “a uniquely and meticulously careful contribution to an important branch of their subject”. (Broad 1938 [1952]: 144)

But these studies suggested that much of the supposed evidence for personal survival was merely evidence for telepathic communications from the living (albeit, perhaps dying), and Sidgwick consequently found much of this work distressing rather than encouraging. It was only in the 1890s, with the famous case of Leonora Piper, that he came to think that there was something resembling a “prima facie” case for survival. Piper was an American whose trance mediumship produced purported communications from particular deceased persons, and her claims withstood the combined scrutiny of the best researchers in both the American and British S.P.R.s, including William James, the Sidgwicks, Richard Hodgson, and Frank Podmore. As Braude (2003) indicates, the Piper case is still being debated to this day (see also Berger 1987). Evidence of this nature helped persuade Eleanor Sidgwick, in the years following Henry’s death, that his personality had survived physical death and succeeded in communicating with her. In an extremely curious, even bizarre, chapter of this history, Eleanor and her brothers, Arthur and Gerald, along with various close friends and colleagues, apparently developed a plot, supposedly with help from the “other side”, to bring about the birth of a “spirit child” who could become a new Messiah, ushering in a reign of global peace (Roy 2008; Gray 2011; Schultz 2017). What the actual, historical Henry might have made of such an effort at applied esoteric morality is a very intriguing question.

If much of Sidgwick’s psychical research today looks rather gullible, it must be allowed that his positive conclusions were always very cautious and guarded, and that his work in fact had an overwhelmingly negative, destructive effect, akin to that of recent debunkers of parapsychology. The Sidgwick Group exposed one fraud after another, including the fraudulent claims of Madame Blavatsky and the Theosophical movement, though Theosophists continue to dispute this. Indeed, Theosophy remains an influential “New Age” form of the esoteric spiritualism that Sidgwick found attractive (given its concern with the common mystical core of all religions) but impossible to defend (Oppenheim 1985). Insofar as parapsychology has ever enjoyed any standing as a rigorous field of scientific inquiry, this is thanks to the efforts of Sidgwick. Furthermore, the work of the Sidgwick Group helped pave the way for much of the developing research in depth psychology generally, calling attention to the efforts of Freud, Charcot, Richet and many others whose names are not primarily associated with parapsychology (Gauld 1968, 2007).

Thus, Sidgwick’s parapsychological investigations were of a-piece with his work on ethics and religion, and, especially in the late 1880s, similarly frustrating. As he explained to his close friend Symonds, he had

tried all methods in turn—all that I found pointed out by any of those who have gone before me; and all in turn have failed—revelational, rational, empirical methods—there is no proof in any of them. (Memoir: 472)

But Sidgwick was not eager to publicly proclaim the negative results of his investigations, any more than he was eager to publicly proclaim the skepticism about orthodox religion with with which they were entangled. In the 1860s, in his work with the Free Christian Union and religious investigations generally, he had been more open, freely identifying himself as a Rationalist and a skeptic. But in the aftermath of his resignation, he ceased to attack openly the religious beliefs and organizations that he deemed indefensible. As he later explained to an old friend:

In fact, the reason why I keep strict silence now for many years with regard to theology is that while I cannot myself discover adequate rational basis for the Christian hope of happy immortality, it seems to be that the general loss of such a hope, from the minds of average human beings as now constituted, would be an evil of which I cannot pretend to measure the extent. I am not prepared to say that the dissolution of the existing social order would follow, but I think the danger of such dissolution would be seriously increased, and that the evil would certainly be very great. (Memoir: 357)

Caught between the “Great Either-Or” of “Pessimism or Faith”, Sidgwick may have regarded his position as “an inevitable point in the process of thought”, but it was one he took “as a soldier takes a post of difficulty”, and he could not assume the responsibility of drawing others to it (Memoir: 354). He was not sure that the subject of ethics was sufficiently like science and unlike theology to render his academic position legitimate, even if he did not have to swear belief in the Thirty-Nine Articles. But he did allow himself the hope that

a considerable improvement in average human beings in this respect of sympathy is like to increase the mundane happiness for men generally, and to render the hope of future happiness less needed to sustain them in the trials of life. (Memoir: 358)

Hence, the importance of political and educational reform. It was “premature to despair”. Indeed, if Placido Bucolo, the force behind an impressive series of conferences on Sidgwick hosted by the University of Catania, is correct, Sidgwick’s non-despairing Theistic heart shone through his work and activities throughout his life (Bucolo, Crisp, & Schultz [eds] 2007, [eds] 2011). But there is still a great deal of research to do on this subject, on the politics and sociology of parapsychology (see Warner 2006), as well as the way in which Sidgwick distanced himself from Kantian arguments for religious belief. Such research will likely prove more fruitful if it resists the temptation to treat the Methods as a stand-alone work, with a narrow, textualist interpretive approach that Sidgwick himself would have rejected. Even Parfit failed to notice that Sidgwick had, in his psychical research, addressed the issue of the philosophical significance of a Reductionist view of personal identity, albeit in richer terms than the Humean ones alluded to in the Methods (Schultz 2004, 2018).

Still, perhaps the larger point of Sidgwick’s worries about the dualism and related issues is best captured by the gloss that, in the second edition of the Methods, he put on the dualism and its possible resolution by the appropriate Theistic premise:

For, if we find an ultimate and fundamental contradiction in our apparent intuitions of what is Reasonable in conduct, we seem forced to the conclusion that they were not really intuitions after all, and that the apparently intuitive operation of the Practical Reason is essentially illusory. Therefore it is, one may say, a matter of life and death to the Practical Reason that this premise should be somehow obtained…. it seems plain that in proportion as man has lived in the exercise of the Practical Reason—as he believed—and feels as an actual force the desire to do what is right and reasonable as such, his demand for this premise will be intense and imperious. Thus we are not surprised to find Socrates—the type for all ages of the man in whom this desire is predominant—declaring with simple conviction that “if the Rulers of the Universe do not prefer the just man to the unjust, it is better to die than to live”. And we must observe that in the feeling that prompts to such a declaration the desire to rationalize one’s own conduct is not the sole, nor perhaps always the most prominent, element. For however difficult it may practically be to do one’s duty when it comes into conflict with one’s happiness, it often does not seem very difficult, when we are considering the question in the abstract, to decide in favour of duty. When a man passionately refuses to believe that the “Wages of Virtue” can “be dust”, it is often less from any private reckoning about his own wages than from a disinterested aversion to a universe so fundamentally irrational that “Good for the Individual” is not ultimately identified with “Universal Good”. (Sidgwick 1877: 468–69)

It was, plausibly, this spectre of an unfriendly universe, of a perverse Cosmos and a fragmented self in which reason is schizophrenic or indeterminate, and the Wages of Virtue all too often dust, that most deeply disturbed Sidgwick, even if he sometimes articulated the issue in drier philosophical terms. And any successful but more limited defense of one side or another of the dualism may well have been, for him, only a very partial victory, a battle rather than the war. His deepest convictions were more Tennysonian—the allusions to “wages” being to Tennyson’s poem of that title, the last stanza of which reads:

The wages of sin is death: if the wages of Virtue be dust,
Would she have heart to endure for the life of the worm and the fly?
She desires no isles of the blest, no quiet seats of the just,
To rest in a golden grove, or to bask in a summer sky;
Give her the wages of going on, and not to die.

At the least, as Phillips (2022: 230–31) observes in connection with the debunking argument of de Lazari-Radek and Singer,

if they do succeed, Sidgwick would get one thing he would certainly have liked—an argument for the truth of utilitarianism—at the cost of losing another thing he also very much wanted, an argument for the existence of God.

But that might be better put: what concerned Sidgwick most deeply was how to defend a vision of a friendly moral order of the universe in which best for all and best for oneself were happily harmonized, with neither sacrificed for the sake of the other. Small wonder that he did not find what he was looking for.

5. Economics, Politics, Education

Sidgwick may have thought that the “deepest problems” of human life had to do with the religious and ethical problems that inspired his parapsychological research, but he nonetheless also devoted an enormous amount of time and energy to both the theoretical and practical sides of economics, politics, law, and ethics, which were after all relevant to the problem of the dualism. In this he was certainly in line with the tradition of Bentham and James and J. S. Mill, all of whom presented utilitarianism as a comprehensive doctrine that prioritized political, legal, and economic reform (Albee 1901; Skorupski 1993; Rawls 1993 [1996], 2007). If Sidgwick had his own take on these subjects, his perspective was still that of a theorist and reformer with broad “interdisciplinary” concerns, rather than that of an ethicist obsessed with personal ethics narrowly construed. His professional credentials as both an economist and political scientist were impeccable, although the professional organizations now associated with these disciplines were only beginning to take shape in his era. He was an active member of the section of the British Association concerned with political economy and economics, and his book on The Elements of Politics, first published in 1891, became a staple of political science at Cambridge and elsewhere. He is best thought of as one of the founding fathers of the “Cambridge School” of economics, one whose contributions should be classed with those of Alfred Marshall and A. C. Pigou (Backhouse 2006; Medema 2009; Cook 2009; Winch 2009; Cord [ed.] 2017).

But Sidgwick’s reputation as an economist has often suffered from an invidious comparison with Marshall, his Cambridge colleague and rival, who is classed among the greatest figures in the history of the discipline. Marshall was both a brilliant economic thinker and a relentless discipline builder, the man who basically established modern economics as an independent academic discipline at Cambridge. As “University politicians” he and Sidgwick were often at odds with each other, since Sidgwick on some points resisted his efforts, believing that economics should remain integrated with the study of politics. Almost immediately upon his appointment as professor in late 1884, Marshall, in a famous incident, confronted Sidgwick and ridiculed him for his “mania” for “over-regulation” and his “failure to attract men on a large scale”, the way Green had at Oxford. Marshall claimed that Sidgwick was hampering his efforts, despite his greater knowledge of economics. Sidgwick reflected on the charges, but concluded that missionary zeal was not for him:

feeling that the deepest truth I have to tell is by no means “good tidings”, I naturally shrink from exercising on others the personal influence which would make men [resemble] me, as much as men more optimistic and prophetic naturally aim at exercising such influences. Hence as a teacher I naturally desire to limit my teaching to those whose bent or deliberate choice it is to search after ultimate truth; if such come to me, I try to tell them all I know; if others come with vaguer aims, I wish if possible to train their faculties without guiding their judgements. I would not if I could, and I could not if I would, say anything which would make philosophy—my philosophy—popular. (Memoir: 394–96)

Sidgwick had known Marshall for a long time—since the 1860s—and had in fact helped his career. He had in effect tutored Marshall in philosophy, stimulated his interest in educational reform, fostered their mutual interest in political economy, and helped call attention to the importance of Marshall’s early work, privately circulating some of it. Initially, Marshall had joined in the cause of women’s higher education, but he later opposed it, despite his marriage to Newnham graduate Mary Paley. Thus, by the 1880s and 90s, relations between the two men were often quite strained (Groenewegen 1995).

Sidgwick had in fact long been a student of political economy. “Mill’s influence”, he explained, led him “as a matter of duty” to “study political economy thoroughly, and give no little thought to practical questions, social and political” (Memoir: 36). In the early 1860s, he was absorbed in the study of Mill’s classic work, the Principles of Political Economy, and much influenced by Mill’s Cambridge disciple, the blind political economist Henry Fawcett. From the late 1870s on, he regularly published works in this field, producing his own Principles of Political Economy in 1883, heading the political economy section of the British Association, contributing to Palgrave, and serving on various government Commissions concerned with economic questions (he developed considerable expertise devising intricate taxation schemes) His work as an academic and policy advisor put him in touch with (directly or indirectly) many of the leading economists of the day—not only such Cambridge colleagues as Fawcett, Marshall, J. N. Keynes, and Herbert Foxwell, but also such figures as Edgeworth, Leon Walras, N. Senior, J. E. Cairnes, and W. S. Jevons. He was even familiar with the work of Karl Marx, at a time when few trained economists even knew who Marx was. Moreover, he was long involved with both the practical and theoretical work of the Cambridge Charity Organization Society, developing a sophisticated, eclectic approach to the issue of poor relief.

But like Marshall and many economists down to the present, Sidgwick drew a careful distinction between the descriptive side (the science) of economic analysis and the normative or policy side (the art), which especially concerns the proper role of government intervention in the market system to improve wealth production or wealth distribution. He was also steeped in the great methodological debates over the historical or inductive versus the analytic or deductive approaches to the subject, and his balanced efforts to combine the two—and strengthen comparative studies as well—considerably distance his work from older Benthamite defenses of Laissez Faire. For Sidgwick, “economic man” is simply an abstraction that may be useful for explaining or predicting some aspects of the behavior of people under certain historical circumstances and in certain situations. Both the science and art of economic analysis need to recognize the limitations of the assumption that people always act out of self-interest and happily so. Indeed, as he rather heatedly put it in his “The Scope and Method of Economic Science”:

There is indeed a kind of political economy which flourishes in proud independence of facts; and undertakes to settle all practical problems of Governmental interference or private philanthropy by simple deduction from one or two general assumptions—of which the chief is the assumption of the universally beneficent and harmonious operation of self-interest well let alone. This kind of political economy is sometimes called “orthodox”, though it has the characteristic unusual in orthodox doctrines of being repudiated by the majority of accredited teachers of the subject. But whether orthodox or not, I must be allowed to disclaim all connection with it; the more completely this survival of the a priori politics of the eighteenth century can be banished to the remotest available planet, the better it will be, in my opinion, for the progress of economic science. (Sidgwick 1885: 2–3 [Miscellaneous: 171])

Sidgwick’s position certainly reflected the more sophisticated, more historical, and even more socialistic views of the later J. S. Mill, who had been influenced by both the Romantic movement and Macaulay’s withering criticisms of the apriorism of Benthamism—that is, of the supposedly Benthamite attempt to deduce the best form of law and government from the assumption of universal self-interest (Capaldi 2004; Pitts 2005). Sidgwick followed Mill in thinking that political economy needed to pay attention to the complexity and historical variety of human motivation and character, as well as the condition of the working class. Perhaps characteristically, however, Sidgwick appreciated the paradox involved in the successful application of the historical method:

[I]t may be worth while to point out to the more aggressive “historicists” that the more the historian establishes the independence of his own study, by bringing into clear view the great differences between the economic conditions with which we are familiar and those of earlier ages, the more, prima facie, he tends to establish the corresponding independence of the economic science which, pursued with a view to practice, is primarily concerned to understand the present. (Sidgwick 1883 [1901: 48])

This is not to applaud the increasing individualism and self-interested behavior of the modern world, which in fact rather worried Sidgwick. Again like Mill, he hoped that the future would bring a growth in human sympathy and moral motivation. He even hoped that individuals would come to be motivated to work by their concern to do their bit for the common good, to make their contribution to society; “ethical” socialism, though not necessarily governmental socialism, was for him a very attractive development. However, another side of this story concerns how those in the “waiting room of history”, as Chakrabarty (2000) called it, would be treated, not as different, but as inferior. As Mill put it, in The Principles of Political Economy:

To civilize a savage, he must be inspired with new wants and desires, even if not of a very elevated kind, provided that their gratification can be a motive to steady and regular bodily and mental exertion. If the negroes of Jamaica and Demerara, after their emancipation had contented themselves, as it was predicted they would do, with the necessaries of life, and abandoned all labour beyond the little which in a tropical climate, with a thin population and abundance of the richest land, is sufficient to support existence, they would have sunk into a condition more barbarous, though less unhappy, than their previous state of slavery. The motive which was most relied on for inducing them to work was their love of fine clothes and personal ornaments. No one will stand up for this taste as worthy of being cultivated, and in most societies its indulgence tends to impoverish rather than to enrich; but in the state of mind of the negroes it might have been the only incentive that could make them voluntarily undergo systematic labour, and so acquire or maintain habits of voluntary industry which may be converted to more valuable ends. In England, it is not the desire of wealth that needs to be taught, but the use of wealth, and appreciation of the objects of desire which wealth cannot purchase, or for attaining which it is not required. Every real improvement in the character of the English, whether it consist in giving them higher aspirations, or only a juster estimate of the value of their present objects of desire, must necessarily moderate the ardour of their devotion to the pursuit of wealth. (Mill 1871: 104–5)

Like Mill, and Bentham for that matter, Sidgwick was an enthusiastic supporter of Wakefield and colonization, which was deemed necessary to relieve pressures of population growth in England. Like them, he devoted considerable energy to theorizing the comparative demands of colonization, settler colonization, and dominion with respect to Britain’s “civilizing mission”. But at least with respect to his contributions to the supposed “science” of economics, there has long been considerable controversy over how successful Sidgwick was in going beyond Mill and appreciating the “marginalist revolution” going on around him. Deane argues that

the Principles owed more to the classical tradition of J. S. Mill than to what contemporaries were then calling the “new political economy” of Jevons and Marshall. (Deane 1987: 329)

And Howey, in an influential work, insists that economists

must add something to and take something away from hedonism, as ordinarily construed, before it becomes marginal utility economics. Jevons and Gossen could make the transformation; Sidgwick never could. (Howey 1960: 95)

On the other side, however, Sidgwick’s economic work has been praised by more than one Nobel Prize winner, including George Stigler. Stigler, after remarking on how the work of Cournot and Dupuit on monopoly and oligopoly “began to enter English economics, in particular though Edgeworth, Sidgwick, and Marshall”, confessed that he was

coming to admire Henry Sidgwick almost as much as the other two. His Principles … has two chapters (bk II, ch. IX and X) which are among the best in the history of microeconomics, dealing with the theories of human capital and noncompetitive behavior. (Stigler 1982: 41)

Elements of the Chicago School of Economics, particularly of law and economics, have been intriguingly traced back to Sidgwick by Steven Medema (2007), who has also helpfully brought out the impact of Sidgwick’s religious concerns on his economic approach (2008, 2009). Many of the contributions to Cord (2017) clarify and highlight the role Sidgwick played in the development of economics, at Cambridge and in general.

For his part, Sidgwick at least claimed that he was part of the new movement, describing himself as a disciple of Jevons:

as Jevons had admirably explained, the variations in the relative market values of different articles express and correspond to variations in the comparative estimates formed by people in general, not of the total utilities of the amounts purchased of such articles, but of their final utilities; the utilities, that is, of the last portions purchased. (Sidgwick 1883 [1901: 82])

But he did allow that the differences with the older, Millian school had been exaggerated, and he continued, despite his considerable mathematical expertise, to do economics in a qualitative mode. Even so, he showed considerable acumen in setting out and conceptually clarifying the fundamental concepts of economics (wealth, value, labor, money, efficiency, etc.), in bringing out the difficulties involved in cross-cultural and trans-historical comparisons of wealth, and in analyzing the various cases of market failure, from monopoly to collective action problems to negative externalities. Indeed, his accounts of market failure and the possible remedies—the “art” of political economy—have received somewhat more recognition. Even Marshall praised this side of Sidgwick’s work. It is widely admitted that Marshall’s hand-picked successor at Cambridge, A. C. Pigou, produced a form of welfare economics that largely recapitulated Sidgwick’s contributions (Backhouse 2006; Medema 2009; Cook 2009; Winch 2009).

The form of Sidgwick’s Principles of Political Economy, with its careful conceptual clarifications and distinction between normative and descriptive arguments, and its successive qualifications to individualistic, free market accounts of both, would prove to be characteristic, figuring in many of his essays and in such works as The Elements of Politics. As in the case of the Methods, the structure of these works has often made it difficult to see precisely where Sidgwick comes down on many issues. Typically, he begins with a robust statement of the “individualistic principle”, as, for example, in the Elements:

what one sane adult is legally compelled to render to others should be merely the negative service of non-interference, except so far as he has voluntarily undertaken to render positive services; provided that we include in the notion of non-interference the obligation of remedying or compensating for mischief intentionally or carelessly caused by his acts—or preventing mischief that would otherwise result from previous acts. This principle for determining the nature and limits of governmental interference is currently known as “Individualism” … the requirement that one sane adult, apart from contract or claim to reparation, shall contribute positively by money or services to the support of others I shall call “socialistic”. (Sidgwick 1891 [1919: 42])

Then, typically, he goes on to explain how any such principle reflects various psychological and sociological presuppositions—for example, that sane adults are the best judges of their own interests—and that these are only approximate generalizations and subject to crucial limitations. The psychological assumption that “every one can best take care of his own interest” and the sociological one that “the common welfare is best attained by each pursuing exclusively his own welfare and that of his family in a thoroughly alert and intelligent manner”—both essential to the case for Laissez Faire—end up being very heavily qualified and subject to so many exceptions that it is scarcely evident what Sidgwick means when he calls individualism “in the main sound”. The list of qualifications covers everything from education, defense, child care, poor relief, public works, collective bargaining, environmental protections, and more. He stresses two cases that, he urges, perspicuously point up the problems with the individualistic principle: “the humane treatment of lunatics, and the prevention of cruelty to the inferior animals”. Such restrictions do not aim at securing the freedom of the lunatics or the animals, but are a “one-sided restraint of the freedom of action of men with a view to the greatest happiness of the aggregate of sentient beings”. An unfortunate—but alas, all too revealing—note adds that the “protection of inferior races of men will be considered in a subsequent chapter” (Sidgwick 1891 [1919: 141–42]).

These qualifications and limitations then invariably involve a discussion of the case for socialism and/or communism, a subject that Sidgwick addressed at length in many works. His main objection to socialistic interference was the familiar one that too much of it would lead to splendidly equal destitution, as the old line has it, and that for people as presently constituted economic incentives were needed to spur them to produce. But again, a better, more communal world was possible, and he hoped that “human nature” would change, growing more sympathetic and more amenable to ethical socialism, leaving the door open to the possibility of legitimating much greater governmental interference with the market. Winch (2009) expertly brings out not only how far Sidgwick went in suggesting that government interference with markets should become “a normal element” of industrial policy, but also how his acceptable alternative to expropriating landlords as part of radical land nationalization was a program of reparative justice such that the poor “should be eligible for compensation by the rich”. (Winch 2009: 219).

At any rate, as noted above, whatever his anxieties about economic socialism, Sidgwick was openly enthusiastic about ethical socialism, the possibility of humanity growing more altruistic and compassionate, regarding their labor as their contribution to the common good. He was under no illusions whatsoever, not only about the market failing to reflect claims of desert or merit, but also about the limitations of that abstraction, “economic man”, since historical and cultural or national context could dramatically alter the possibilities for moving beyond economic individualism, though again, in some areas this emphasis on “national character” lent itself to the racist and imperialistic tendencies of the British empire (Schultz 2004). It is possible that Sidgwick’s drift toward racism may have been in significant part a result of his absorption in the work of Jevons, who held that a “man of lower race, a negro for instance, enjoys possession less, and loathes labour more; his exertions, therefore, soon stop” (Jevons 1871: 177). Such views on matters of race, which were more extreme than Mill’s, would increasingly reverberate through late nineteenth-century political economy (Macmillan 1890), finding expression in Sidgwick’s admirer Edgeworth, who would insist on how “Capacity for pleasure is a property of evolution, an essential attribute of civilisation”, with “civilisation” being determined in part by race. (Edgeworth 1881 [2003: 78]).

Clearly, in his political theoretical work, Sidgwick admittedly simply assumed the utilitarian criterion as the normative bottom line, rather than arguing for it against rational egoism. He also stressed, in many different works, that no one could confidently predict the direction of civilization. Although in his more historical works, notably The Development of European Polity, Sidgwick assembled evidence to suggest that a continued growth in federalism and large-scale state organizations was likely, it was a very carefully hedged conclusion and cast against a broad critique of the social sciences. Much as he admired the sweep and ambition of such pioneers of sociology as Spencer and Comte (whose emphasis on the “consensus of experts” was appropriated for his epistemological work), he regarded their “sciences” of the laws of human development as absurdly over-blown, yielding wildly different predictions about the future course of humanity. He sincerely hoped that a more cosmopolitan attitude would be the wave of the future, and that the growth of international law and cooperation would decrease the likelihood of war, but he could not convince himself that social science—with the partial exception of economics—was beyond its infancy when it came to predicting things to come (Sidgwick 1902a; see also the introduction to Bryce & Sidgwick [eds] 1919).

Thus, although D. G. Ritchie famously charged that with Sidgwick utilitarianism had grown “tame and sleek” and lost its reforming zeal, others, notably F. A. Hayek, held that he had in effect paved the way for the “New Liberalism” and even Fabian socialism that soon overtook British politics, legitimating a far greater degree of state intervention (Schultz 2004). Woodrow Wilson, the future president of the U. S., admired Sidgwick’s Elements, but found the more abstract, analytic side of his work oddly “colorless” and in need of historical content. These debates continue (Collini 2001; Kloppenberg 1992; H. S. Jones 2000; Bell 2007, 2016; Winch 2009; Miller 2020), though it would be difficult to conclude that anyone has got Sidgwick quite right. Sidgwick was at times tame and sleek, at times subversive and reformist, at times anxious, at times hopeful, and always more or less skeptical. At any rate, Sidgwick’s work in politics and political theory, like his work in economics, does reveal how far he was from Benthamism; he even criticized at length the Austinian theory of sovereignty—which analyzed law in terms of authoritative command and habitual obedience—so dear to the Benthamites, in a critique that received high praise from the legal historian (and Sidgwick student) F. W. Maitland.

But some sides of Sidgwick have not aged at all well, though they too need to be addressed. In an important article on “The Political Philosophy of Henry Sidgwick”, Miller goes so far as to argue that Sidgwick’s political philosophy has “fallen into oblivion while his ethics continues to be celebrated” because of

the weight he attached to common sentiments and beliefs in his application of the utility principle, illustrated by his treatment of topics such as secession and colonialism. Moreover his Elements of Politics is arranged in such a way that he never has to confront the basic question of what makes states legitimate. This means that neither political moralists, who want to see the utility principle applied in more radical fashion, nor political realists, for whom the problem of establishing political order is central, find much to commend in his political philosophy. (Miller 2020: 261)

There is certainly much that is right in Miller’s position. It must be allowed, at the least, that Sidgwick’s political writings did not achieve the inspiring tone of J. S. Mill, and that, for all of his indebtedness to On Liberty, Considerations on Representative Government etc., he tended to highlight the more elitist Millian concerns—concerns that often reflected his anxieties about the dualism of practical reason, rather than his hopes for a better world. Like the later Mill, Sidgwick harbored many suspicions about the wisdom of democracy and championed the need for a cultural “clerisy” or vanguard of educated opinion, often sounding a note not unlike that of Walter Lippmann in the twentieth century, stressing how an educated elite should benevolently shape public opinion. He much admired the work of his friend James Bryce, author of The American Commonwealth (1888), which pointed up both the vitality and the dangers of the U.S. political system. But he devoted comparatively little effort to proclaiming the benefits of freedom of conscience and speech (or grassroots democracy), was quite critical of Mill’s schemes for proportional representation, and worried at length about how

to correct the erroneous and short-sighted views of self-interest, representing it as divergent from duty, which certainly appear to be widely prevalent in the most advanced societies, at least among irreligious persons.

In fact, for the government to supply teachers of this view might even be

indirectly individualistic in its aim, since to diffuse the conviction that it is every one’s interest to do what is right would obviously be a valuable protection against mutual wrong,

though it would probably detract from the credibility of such teachers if they were salaried employees of the state (Sidgwick 1891 [1919: 213–14]).

The more sinister aspects of Sidgwick’s worries about what he termed the“lower classes” and the “lower races”, and the ways in which his work (including his parapsychology) intertwined with a variety of late Victorian imperialistic projects, including those of his colleague Sir John Seeley, his friend Charles Henry Pearson, and his brother-in-law Arthur Balfour, have been brought out primarily by Schultz (2004, 2007, 2017) and Bell (2007, 2016), though Miller also recognizes the importance of these matters. Plausibly, another reason why Sidgwick’s political work has been comparatively neglected is that there is so much deeply offensive, colonialist, imperialist, and racist content in it. As Bell puts it:

Sidgwick frequently wrote in a racialized idiom, and his work is studded with examples of crude (albeit standard) civilizational stereotyping…. This was a vision of liberal civilizational imperialism, remaking the manners as well as the map of the world, and drawing on a long-standing argument about the occupation of “unoccupied” territory leavened with late Victorian moralism about the duties of imperialists to indigenous populations. (Bell 2016: 262)

For Sidgwick, it was an open, urgent question whether the “lower races” were not inherently so, and he thought that intermarriage between races should be prohibited (as it often was) if there was forthcoming evidence that such marriages could result in the “debasement” of the “superior” race, though he hoped that would not prove to be the case. In addition to admiring his colleague Seeley’s work on the expansion of England, he allowed that the evidence marshalled by his friend Charles Henry Pearson, in his National Life and Character, evidence about the “threat” to the supremacy of the “white races” from the “black and yellow races”, was very impressive, if not quite decisive (Schultz 2004; 2017: 328–3). Like so many in his circles, Sidgwick occasionally used the “N word” to refer to Black, Indigenous, People of Color, and even while acknowledging the historical atrocities of settler colonialism, he insisted that

civilised nations … in performance of their legitimate business—for it is their legitimate business on utilitarian principles—of civilizing the world … have to commit acts which cannot but be regarded as aggressive by the savage nations whom it is their business to educate and absorb. (Sidgwick 1902a: 236–37)

He bought into the racist stereotyping of “national character” to be found in Millian ethology and the work of Bryce, and he supported the harsh repressive measures his brother-in-law Arthur Balfour used against the Irish, during his time as Irish Secretary, opposing Home Rule for Ireland. He extolled the satisfactions of the “spiritual expansion” of “civilized” nations, whatever the economics of the matter, and apparently despite the fact that when it came to metaethical foundations, these nations were not themselves very far along on the imperialist scale of “civilization”, being too tempted by a Machiavellian materialism and Jingoism making for conflict at home and abroad.

Thus, perhaps what Sidgwick’s political writings so effectively highlight is how his version of liberal imperialism is weaker on the liberal side than the Millian version, and how his views on quelling social strife and achieving peace through a more cosmopolitan, internationalist world order could reflect his racialized and racist version of the “civilizational mission” of Victorian imperialism, heightened by anxieties about the growth of democracy and the decline of religion. As with Mill, it is through the lens of the critique of the culture of imperialism that one can most sharply discern just why education was accorded such a crucial role here. Given the anti and postcolonial scholarship devoted to Bentham and James and John Stuart Mill, for example Inder Marwah’s Liberalism, Diversity and Domination: Kant, Mill and the Government of Difference (Marwah 2019; see also Pitts 2005), it is very surprising indeed how the comprehensive vision of utilitarianism that Sidgwick advanced could be ignored or censored in the way that it has been and mostly continues to be. Of course, as with Mill, Sidgwick was somewhat better on the home front and with certain reformist causes, at least insofar as these can be decolonized. Despite his disclaimers, he truly was committed to expanding and improving educational opportunities, the better to influence the direction of reform. His (highly Millian) feminism was focused on higher education for women and the foundation of Newnham College, and his many attempts to improve the curriculum of Cambridge University (by including Bentham, modern literature, physiology and other new subjects) were correlated with efforts to expand its audience and impact (McWilliams Tullberg 1975 [1998]; Sutherland 2006). And beyond formal educational institutions, Sidgwick was indefatigable in promoting and participating in discussion societies, ever aiming at the elusive “consensus of experts” that his epistemology called for. If, towards the end of his life, his participation in such vehicles as the “Ethical Societies” reflected his despair over the possibility of achieving such a consensus on the “deepest problems”, and instead involved an effort to set such problems aside in the hope of agreeing on the practical upshot of ethical questions (Sidgwick 1898), this was not his most characteristic attitude (Skelton 2011), though such participation did bring home to him how important it was to widen his dialogical efforts. His support for John Addington Symonds, one of the English followers of Walt Whitman and a pioneer of gay studies, is also suggestive of how important some of his reformist efforts could be (Schultz 2004).

As with other aspects of his politics, Sidgwick’s views on education and culture have not received nearly as much critical attention as his ethical work. But they merit careful analysis, given the way in which he fell in between Mill and Dewey as a prominent and politically charged consequentialist philosopher-educator. Calling for the inclusion of both older humanistic and modern scientific elements in any form of education worthy of the name, and for an open-minded fallibilistic attitude, he explained in “The Pursuit of Culture”:

since the most essential function of the mind is to think and know, a man of cultivated mind must be essentially concerned for knowledge: but it is not knowledge merely that gives culture. A man may be learned and yet lack culture: for he may be a pedant, and the characteristic of a pedant is that he has knowledge without culture. So again, a load of facts retained in the memory, a mass of reasonings got up merely for examination, these are not, they do not give culture. It is the love of knowledge, the ardour of scientific curiosity, driving us continually to absorb new facts and ideas, to make them our own and fit them into the living and growing system of our thought; and the trained faculty of doing this, the alert and supple intelligence exercised and continually developed in doing this,—it is in these that culture essentially lies. (1897 [Miscellaneous: 352]).

Perhaps Sidgwick would have admitted that there was always room for more doubt.


Primary Sources


  • Bryce, James and E. M. Sidgwick (eds), 1919, National and International Right and Wrong: Two Essays by Henry Sidgwick, London: George Allen and Unwin.
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  • 1870, “The Ethics of Conformity and Subscription”, London: Williams and Norgate. [Sidgwick 1870 available online]
  • 1873, “Utilitarianism”, Privately printed for the Metaphysical Society; reprinted in EM: ch. 1.
  • 1874 [1907], The Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan; this work was subsequently reprinted in the years 1877, 1884, 1890, 1893, 1901, 1907; all references to the 1907 (seventh) edition.
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  • 1883, The Principles of Political Economy, London: Macmillan; reprinted in the years 1887, 1901.
  • 1885, “The Scope and Method of Economic Science”, printed for the British Association, London: Macmillan; reprinted in Miscellaneous: 170–199 (essay 7). [Sidgwick 1885 available online]
  • 1886, Outlines of the History of Ethics for English Readers, London: Macmillan; reprinted in the years 1888, 1892, 1896, 1902.
  • 1889, “Some Fundamental Ethical Controversies”, Mind, 14(56): 473–87; reprinted in EM: ch. 6. doi:10.1093/mind/XIV.56.473
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  • 1897, “The Pursuit of Culture”, University of Wales Magazine, October. Collected in Practical Ethics: 205–234 (essay 8) and Miscellaneous: 352–360 (essay 15). Also collected in CW.
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  • 1898, Practical Ethics: A Collection of Addresses and Essays, London: Swan Sonnenschein; reprinted 1909. [Sidgwick 1898 available online]
  • 1902a, Lectures on the Ethics of T. H. Green, H. Spencer, and J. Martineau, E. E. Constance Jones (ed.), London: Macmillan.
  • 1902b, Philosophy, Its Scope and Relations: An Introductory Course of Lectures, James Ward (ed.), London: Macmillan.
  • 1903, The Development of European Polity, E. M. Sidgwick (ed.), London: Macmillan.
  • [Miscellaneous] 1904, Miscellaneous Essays and Addresses, E. M. Sidgwick and A. Sidgwick (eds), London: Macmillan. [Sidgwick Miscellaneous available online]
  • 1905, Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant and Other Philosophical Lectures and Essays, James Ward (ed.), London: Macmillan. [Sidgwick 1905 available online]
  • [Memoir] 1906, Henry Sidgwick, A Memoir, Arthur Sidgwick and Eleanor Mildred M. Sidgwick (eds), London: Macmillan.

Secondary Sources

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