Notes to Thermodynamic Asymmetry in Time

1. For a nice discussion of this point within the debate about scientific realism, see Psillos 1994.

2. More laws were added (or recognized) in the twentieth century. The Zeroth Law is the claim that the equilibrium with relation is transitive. This claim is connected to setting up the state space of the theory and the derivation that temperature is constant at equilibrium. Arguably this law was already included in classical thermodynamics but only recognized as essential and important later. Interestingly, this law follows from Kelvin and Carathéodory’s formulations but not from Clausius’ (see Pippard 1964: 95). The so-called Third Law is essentially Nernst’s Theorem, which states that the entropy of every system at absolute zero can always be taken equal to zero. The Third Law thus allows one to calculate the absolute value of the entropy; however, this is not necessary for classical thermodynamics to work successfully.

3. A third version, inequivalent to both of the above, is Carathéodory’s law. It states that in the neighborhood of any equilibrium state of a system there are states that are inaccessible by an adiabatic process. This considerably more abstract version of the second law forbids a more general type of process than the other formulations, but it does so at the cost of making the law less intuitive, since its relationship to the familiar types of thermodynamic processes is often quite convoluted.

4. That is, a case can be made that both the ‘super-weak’ and ‘milli-weak’ fields previously postulated to account for CP-violations are quite analogous in method to the postulation of the time-ordering field. See Sachs 1987: 236, and references therein.

5. The confusion surrounding interventionism is especially bad in quantum mechanics. Coupled with one of the primary sources of confusion, the measurement problem, and various mistaken views conflating information and entropy, one encounters many misguided ideas. The mysterious loss of information essential to the observation process, for instance, is frequently said to be the source of quantum mechanical collapses and also the direction of time. Partovi and Hossein (1989) have a project along these lines that exploits much such confusion. The point of his project is to show that interactions with the environment bring about wave function reduction that in turn causes entropy increase. Since environmental noise is often interpreted as environmental decoherence in QM, the decoherence approach to quantum measurement is also said to explain time’s arrow (Joos and Zeh 1985). But since decoherence respects the unitarity and reversibility of the Schroedinger evolution, it is hard to see how it could make itself immune to a Loschmidt reversal, and so, this approach would still need to posit special initial conditions.

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Craig Callender <>

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