Thermodynamic Asymmetry in Time

First published Thu Nov 15, 2001; substantive revision Tue Jun 8, 2021

The thermodynamic time asymmetry is one of the most salient and consequential features of the physical universe. Heat flows from hot to cold, never the reverse. The smell of coffee spreads throughout its available volume, never the reverse. Car engines convert fuel energy into work and thermal energy, never the reverse. And so on. The science of thermodynamics is able to capture these generalizations as consequences of its claim that systems spontaneously evolve to future equilibrium states but do not spontaneously evolve away from equilibrium states. This generalization covers an amazing amount of macroscopic physics and is rightly celebrated as one of the great laws of physics.

Despite its familiarity, however, the thermodynamic arrow of time raises many deep questions relevant to both philosophy and the foundations of physics. This entry concentrates on two of them. In contemporary parlance, they are each questions about grounding. (1) What grounds the thermodynamic asymmetry in time? In a world possibly governed at bottom by time-symmetric laws, how do the time-asymmetric laws of thermodynamics arise? (2) Does the thermodynamic time asymmetry ground any other temporal asymmetries? Does it account, for instance, for the fact that we know more about the past than the future? The discussion thus divides between thermodynamics being an explanandum or explanans. What grounds the thermodynamic asymmetry, and given the asymmetry, what does it ground?

1. Thermodynamic Time Asymmetry: A Brief Guide

First developed in Sadi Carnot’s Reflections on the Motive Power of Fire 1824, the science of classical thermodynamics is intimately associated with the industrial revolution. Most of the results responsible for the science originated from the practice of engineers trying to improve steam engines. Originating in France and England in the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries, the science quickly spread throughout Europe. By the mid-nineteenth century, Rudolf Clausius in Germany and William Thomson (later Lord Kelvin) in England had developed the theory in great detail. Once developed, its scope grew from steam engines and the like to arguably all macroscopic processes.

Thermodynamics is a “phenomenal” science. That means that its variables range over macroscopic parameters such as temperature, pressure and volume. These are properties that hold at equilibrium, i.e., when the values of the macroscopic variables remain approximately stable. Whether the microphysics underlying these variables are motive atoms in the void or an imponderable fluid is largely irrelevant to this science. The developers of the theory both prided themselves on this fact and at the same time worried about it. Clausius, for instance, was one of the first to speculate that heat consisted solely of the motion of particles (without an ether), for it made the equivalence of heat with mechanical work less surprising. However, as was common, he kept his “ontological” beliefs separate from his official statement of the principles of thermodynamics because he didn’t wish to (in his words) “taint” the latter with the speculative character of the former.[1]

A treatment of thermodynamics naturally begins with the statements it takes to be laws of nature. These laws are founded upon observations of relationships between particular macroscopic parameters and they are justified by the fact they are empirically adequate. No further justification of these laws is to be found—at this stage—from the details of microphysics. Rather, stable, counterfactual-supporting generalizations about macroscopic features are enshrined as law. The typical textbook treatment of thermodynamics describes some basic concepts, states the laws in a more or less rough way and then proceeds to derive the concepts of temperature and entropy and the various thermodynamic equations of state. It is worth remarking, however, that in the last fifty years the subject has been presented with a degree of mathematical rigor not previously achieved. Originating from the early axiomatization by Carathéodory in 1909, the development of “rational thermodynamics” has clarified the concepts and logic of classical thermodynamics to a degree not generally appreciated. There now exist many quite different, mathematically exact approaches to thermodynamics, each starting with different primitive kinds and/or observational regularities as axioms. (For a popular presentation of a recent axiomatization, see Lieb and Yngvason 2000.)

In the traditional approach classical thermodynamics has two laws, the First and Second Laws.[2] The First Law expresses the conservation of energy and is founded upon the impossibility of creating a machine that can create energy. The law uses the concept of the internal energy of a system, \(U\), which is a function of the system’s macroscopic variables, e.g., temperature, volume. For thermally isolated (adiabatic) systems—think of systems such as coffee in a thermos—the law states that this function, \(U\), is such that the work \(W\) delivered to a system’s surroundings is compensated by a loss of internal energy, i.e., \(dW = -dU\). When James Joule and others showed that mechanical work and heat were interconvertible, consistency with the principle of energy conservation demanded that heat, \(Q\), considered as a different form of energy, be taken into account. For non-isolated systems we extend the law as \(dQ = dU + dW\), where \(dQ\) is the differential of the amount of heat added to the system (in a reversible manner).

The conservation of energy tells us nothing about temporally asymmetric behavior. It doesn’t follow from the First Law that interacting systems quickly tend to approach equilibrium, and once achieved, never leave this state. It is perfectly consistent with the First Law that systems in equilibrium leave equilibrium. In particular, no limitations are placed on transforming energy from one form into another, so the Law permits the possibility of machines that remove heat from their environment and turn it into work (a so-called perpetual mobile of the second kind). To rule out such machines, and more generally, to capture the amazingly general temporally asymmetric behavior we find, another law is needed. Although Carnot was the first to state it, the formulations of Kelvin and Clausius are standard:

Kelvin’s Second Law: There is no thermodynamic process whose sole effect is to transform heat extracted from a source at uniform temperature completely into work.

Clausius’ Second Law: There is no thermodynamic process whose sole effect is to extract a quantity of heat from a colder reservoir and deliver it to a hotter reservoir.

Kelvin’s version is essentially the same as the version arrived at by both Carnot and Planck, whereas Clausius’ version differs from these in a few ways.[3]

Clausius’ version transparently rules out anti-thermodynamic behavior such as a hot iron bar extracting heat from a neighboring cold iron bar. The cool bar cannot give up a quantity of heat to the warmer bar (without something else happening). Kelvin’s statement is perhaps less obvious. It originates in an observation about steam engines, namely, that heat energy is a “poor” grade of energy. Consider a gas-filled cylinder with a frictionless piston holding the gas down at one end. If we put a flame under the cylinder, the gas will expand and the piston can perform work, e.g., it might move a ball. However, we can never convert the heat energy straight into work without some other effect occurring. In this case, the gas occupies a larger volume.

In 1854, Clausius introduced the notion of the “equivalence value” of a transformation, a concept that is the ancestor of the modern day concept of entropy. Later in 1865 Clausius coined the term “entropy” for a similar concept (the word derives from the Greek word for transformation). The entropy of a state \(A\), \(S(A)\) is defined as the integral \(S(A) = \int^{A}_{O} dQ/T\) over a reversible transformation, where \(O\) is some arbitrary fixed state. For \(A\) to have an entropy, the transformation from \(O\) to \(A\) must be quasi-static, i.e., a succession of equilibrium states. Continuity considerations then imply that the initial and final states \(O\) and \(A\) must also be equilibrium states. Put in the language of entropy, the Second Law states that in a transformation from equilibrium state \(A\) to equilibrium state \(B\), the inequality \(S(B) - S(A)\) is greater than or equal to the \(\int^{A}_{B} dQ/T\). Loosely put, for realistic systems, this implies that in the spontaneous evolution of a thermally closed system the entropy can never decrease and that it attains its maximum value at equilibrium. We are invited to think of the Second Law as driving the system to its new, higher entropy equilibrium state.

With the Second Law thermodynamics is able to characterize an extraordinary range of phenomena under one simple law. Remarkably, whether they are gases filling their available volumes, iron bars in contact coming to the same temperature, vinegar and oil separating, or milk mixing in your coffee, they all have an observable property in common: their entropy increases. Coupled with the First Law, the Second Law is remarkably powerful. It appears that all classical thermodynamical behavior can be derived from these two simple statements (O. Penrose 1970).

The above sketch represents the conventional way of describing thermodynamics and its Second Law. Let me mention a few questions that it raises.

First, what is the precise location of the time-asymmetry? Almost all commentators claim that it lay in the Second Law. If Uffink (2001) and Brown and Uffink (2001) are correct, however, then this “static” Second Law does not encode any time asymmetry at all. It is, after all, simply a relation between a few variables at equilibrium. While that may be right, there is no question that thermodynamics, if not its Second Law, makes time-asymmetric claims. The spontaneous movement from non-equilibrium to equilibrium happens and is assumed throughout the field. The only question is whether it must be regarded as a separate assumption (perhaps demanding its own name) or can somehow be derived from existing principles. It’s also worth remarking that many other principles of thermodynamics are time-asymmetric, e.g., the classical heat equation.

Second, what is the scope of the Second Law? There are two issues here. First, does it apply to the universe as a whole, so that we can say the universe’s entropy is increasing, or does it only apply to select sub-systems of the universe? (See Uffink 2001 for an interesting historical discussion of this topic.) Many philosophers and physicists have balked at the idea that the universe itself has an entropy. As one might expect, those in the grip of an operationalist philosophy are especially prone to deny that the universe as a whole has an entropy. Second, what sub-systems of the universe does it govern? Are the principles of thermodynamics responsible for generalizations about black holes? The field of black hole thermodynamics assumes it is (see the section on black hole thermodynamics in the entry on singularities and black holes, for discussion and references), although not all are convinced (Dougherty & Callender forthcoming). What about the micro-realm?

Third, how are these laws framed in a relativistic universe? They were developed in the nineteenth century with a classical spacetime background in mind. How do we write the theory in a modern formulation? Surprisingly, the issue is as much conceptual as technical. The correct (special) relativistic transformation rules for thermodynamic quantities are controversial. Do Lorentz boosted gases appear hotter or colder in the new inertial frame? Albert Einstein himself answered the question about the gas differently throughout his life! With all the current activity of physicists being focused on the thermodynamics of black holes in general relativity and quantum gravity, it is amusing to note that special relativistic thermodynamics is still a field with many open questions, both physically and philosophically (see Earman 1981 and Liu 1994).

Fourth, another important question concerns the reduction of thermodynamic concepts such as entropy to their mechanical, or statistical mechanical, basis. As even a cursory glance at statistical mechanics reveals, there are many candidates for the statistical mechanical entropy, each the center of a different program in the foundations of the field. Surprisingly, there is no consensus as to which entropy is best suited to be the reduction basis of the thermodynamic entropy (see, for example, Sklar 1993; Callender 1999; Lavis 2005; Frigg 2008; Robertson forthcoming). Consequently, there is little agreement about what grounds the Second Law in statistical mechanics.

Despite the worthiness of all of these issues, this article focuses on two distinct problems associated with the direction of time.

2. The Problem of the Direction of Time I

The first “problem of the direction of time” is: what accounts for the time asymmetry of thermodynamics? Thermodynamics is not a fundamental physical science. Hence it must inherit its massive time asymmetry from the microworld. But where? In virtue of what, fundamentally, is thermodynamics time asymmetric? The puzzle is usually said to arise due to fundamental physics being time symmetric, or more precisely, time reversal invariant. (A theory is time reversal invariant, loosely speaking, if its laws don’t care about the direction of time.) No asymmetry in, no asymmetry out; therefore there is a puzzle over where the asymmetry enters. However, even if fundamental physics is time asymmetric one can and should still demand an answer to the question of what accounts for thermodynamics time asymmetry. The answer could be non-trivial because the time asymmetry of fundamental physics may have nothing to do with the time asymmetry of thermodynamics. This situation actually appears to be the case, as weak interactions between quarks and leptons can violate time symmetry yet these violations don’t appear to be responsible for thermodynamic behavior.

Historically the problem arose in a wonderful series of debates and arguments between the great physicist Ludwig Boltzmann and some of his contemporaries, notably, Johann Loschmidt, Ernst Zermelo and Edward Culverwell. Boltzmann was one of the founders and most influential developers of the field of statistical mechanics, as well as (later in life) a philosopher. While seeking a mechanical underpinning of the Second Law, he discovered a particularly ingenious explanation for why systems tend toward equilibrium.

Ignoring historical details (Brush 1976, Frigg & Werndl 2011, Sklar 1993, Uffink 2006), here is the core idea loosely reconstructed from Boltzmann’s later writings. Consider an isolated gas of \(N\) particles in a box, where \(N\) is large enough to make the system macroscopic \((N \approx 10^{23}+)\). For the sake of familiarity we will work with classical mechanics. We can characterize the gas by the coordinates and momenta \(x_{in}, p_{in}\) of each of its particles and represent the whole system by a point \(X = (q,p)\) in a \(6N\)-dimensional phase space known as \(\Gamma\), where \(q = (q_1 \ldots q_{3N})\) and \(p = (p_1 \ldots p_{3N})\). Boltzmann’s great insight was to see that the thermodynamic entropy arguably “reduced” to the volume in \(\Gamma\) picked out by the macroscopic parameters of the system. The key ingredient is partitioning \(\Gamma\) into compartments, such that all of the microstates \(X\) in a compartment are macroscopically (and thus thermodynamically) indistinguishable. To each macrostate \(M\), there corresponds a volume of \(\Gamma\), \(\lvert\Gamma_M\rvert\), whose size will depend on the macrostate in question. For combinatorial reasons, almost all of \(\Gamma\) corresponds to a state of thermal equilibrium. There are simply many more ways to be distributed with uniform temperature and pressure than ways to be distributed with nonuniform temperature and pressure. There is a vast numerical imbalance in \(\Gamma\) between the states in thermal equilibrium and the states in thermal nonequilibrium.

We now introduce Boltzmann’s famous formula (up to an additive constant) for what we might call the “Boltzmann entropy” \(S_B\): \[ S_B (M(X)) = k \log \lvert\Gamma_M\rvert \] where \(\lvert\Gamma_M\rvert\) is the volume in \(\Gamma\) associated with the macrostate \(M\), \(X\) is the microstate of the system, and \(k\) is Boltzmann’s constant. \(S_B\) provides a relative measure of the amount of \(\Gamma\) corresponding to each \(M\).

Given the mentioned asymmetry in \(\Gamma\), almost all microstates realizing non-equilibrium macrostates are such that their entropy value is overwhelmingly likely to increase with time. When the constraints are released on systems initially confined to small sections of \(\Gamma\), typical systems will evolve into larger compartments. Since the new equilibrium distribution occupies almost all of the newly available phase space, nearly all of the microstates originating in the smaller volume will tend toward equilibrium. Except for those incredibly rare microstates conspiring to stay in small compartments, microstates will evolve in such a way as to have \(S_B\) increase. Substantial questions can be raised about the details of this approach. What justifies, for instance, the standard probability measure on \(\Gamma\)? Nonetheless, the Boltzmannian explanation seems to offer a plausible and powerful framework for understanding why the entropy of systems tends to increase with time. (For further explanation and discussion see Bricmont 1995; Frigg 2008, 2009; Goldstein 2001; Hemmo & Shenker 2012; Klein 1973; Lavis 2005; Lebowitz 1993; Uffink 2006.)

Trouble looms over this explanation of time asymmetry (see Brown, Myrvold, & Uffink 2009). Before Boltzmann explained entropy increase as described above, he proposed a now notorious “proof” known as the “\(H\)-theorem” to the effect that entropy must always increase. Loschmidt 1876/1877 and Zermelo 1896 launched objections to the \(H\)-theorem. If we take as premises classical mechanical dynamics, they pointed out, it’s impossible to get any function of the classical state to monotonically increase. Loschmidt focused on the time reversal invariance of the classical dynamics and Zermelo on its recurrence property (roughly, that a bounded system, left to itself, will eventually return arbitrarily close to its initial state, for any given initial state). They were right: time reversal means that for every entropy-increasing solution to the classical equations there is a mirror entropy-decreasing solution; and recurrence means that every solution will at some point have its entropy decrease if we wait long enough. Some time asymmetric ingredient that had not been properly announced had been smuggled into the theorem.

The reader can find this story in many textbooks and in many references cited above. An objection in their spirit (specifically, Loschmidt’s) can also be advanced against Boltzmann’s later view sketched above. Loosely put, because the classical equations of motion are time reversal invariant, nothing in the original explanation necessarily referred to the direction of time (see Hurley 1986). Although we just stated the Boltzmannian account of entropy increase in terms of entropy increasing into the future, the explanation can be turned around and made for the past temporal direction as well. Given a gas in a box that is in a nonequilibrium state, the vast majority of microstates that are antecedents of the dynamical evolution leading to the present macrostate correspond to a macrostate with higher entropy than the present one. Therefore, not only is it highly likely that typical microstates corresponding to a nonequilibrium state will evolve to higher entropy states, but it is also highly likely that they evolved from higher entropy states.

Concisely put, the problem is that given a nonequilibrium state at time \(t_2\), it is overwhelmingly likely that

the nonequilibrium state at \(t_2\) will evolve to one closer to equilibrium at \(t_3\)

but that due to the reversibility of the dynamics it is also overwhelmingly likely that

the nonequilibrium state at \(t_2\) has evolved from one closer to equilibrium at \(t_1\)

where \(t_1 \lt t_2 \lt t_3\). However, transitions described by (2) do not seem to occur; or phrased more carefully, not both (1) and (2) occur. However we choose to use the terms “earlier” and “later”, clearly entropy doesn’t increase in both temporal directions. For ease of exposition let us dub (2) the culprit.

The traditional problem is not merely that nomologically possible (anti-thermodynamic) behavior does not occur when it could. That is not straightforwardly a problem: all sorts of nomologically allowed processes do not occur. Rather, the problem is that statistical mechanics seems to make a prediction that is falsified, and that is a problem according to anyone’s theory of confirmation.

Many solutions to this problem have been proposed. Generally speaking, there are two ways to solve the problem: eliminate transitions of type (2) either with special boundary conditions or with laws of nature. The former method works if we assume that earlier states of the universe are of comparatively low-entropy and that (relatively) later states are not also low-entropy states. There are no high-to-low-entropy processes simply because earlier entropy was very low. Alternatively, the latter method works if we can somehow restrict the domain of physically possible worlds to those admitting only low-to-high transitions. The laws of nature are the straightjacket on what we deem physically possible. Since we need to eliminate transitions of type (2) while keeping those of type (1) (or vice versa), a necessary condition of the laws doing this job is that they be time reversal noninvariant. Our choice of strategy boils down to either assuming temporally asymmetric boundary conditions or of adding (or changing to or restricting to) time reversal noninvariant laws of nature that make entropy increase likely. Many approaches to this problem have thought to avoid this dilemma, but a little analysis of any proposed “third way” arguably proves this to be false.

Motivations for restrictions of type (2) transitions originate in both philosophy and in particular physical theories. The rest of this section describes some of the wide range of views found on the issue.

2.1 Past Hypothesis

Without proclaiming the laws of nature time asymmetric, there is no way to eliminate as impossible transitions (2) in favor of (1). Nevertheless, appealing to temporally asymmetric boundary conditions allows us to describe a world wherein (1) but not (2) occur. A cosmological hypothesis claiming that in the very distant past entropy was much lower will work. Boltzmann, as well as many of this century’s greatest scientists, e.g., Einstein, Richard Feynman, and Erwin Schroedinger, saw that this hypothesis is necessary given our (mostly) time asymmetric laws. (Boltzmann, however, explained this low-entropy condition by treating the observable universe as a natural statistical fluctuation away from equilibrium in a vastly larger universe.) Earlier states do not have higher entropy than present states because we make the cosmological posit that the universe began in an extremely tiny section of its available phase space. Albert (2000) calls this the “Past Hypothesis” and argues that it solves both this problem of the direction of time and also the one to be discussed below. Note that classical mechanics is also compatible with a “Future Hypothesis”: the claim that entropy is very low in the distant future. The restriction to “distant” is needed, for if the near future were of low-entropy, we would not expect the thermodynamic behavior that we see—see Cocke 1967, Price 1996, and Schulman 1997 for discussion of two-time boundary conditions.

The Past Hypothesis offers an elegant solution to the problem of the direction of time. However, there are some concerns.

First, some find it incredible that (e.g.) gases everywhere for all time should expand through their available volumes due to special initial conditions. The common cause of these events is viewed as itself monstrously unlikely. Expressing this feeling, R. Penrose (1989) estimates that the probability, given the standard measure on phase space, of the universe starting in the requisite state is astronomically small. In response, one may hold that the Past Hypothesis is lawlike. If so, then the probability for this state, if such exists, is one! Even if one doesn’t go down this path, one may have other problems with claiming that the initial condition of the universe needs further explanation. See Callender 2004a,b for such a view and Price 1996, 2004 for the contrary position.

Second, another persistent line of criticism might be labeled the “subsystem” worry. It’s consistent with the Past Hypothesis, after all, that none of the subsystems on Earth ever display thermodynamically asymmetric behavior. How exactly does the global entropy increase of the universe imply local entropy increase among the subsystems (which, after all, is what causes us to posit the Second Law in the first place)? See Winsberg 2004 for this objection and Callender 2011a, Frisch 2010, and North 2011 for discussion.

Third, what exactly does the Past Hypothesis say in the context of our best and most recent physics? While not denying that temporally asymmetric boundary conditions are needed to solve the problem, Earman (2006) is very critical of the Past Hypothesis, concluding that it isn’t even coherent enough to be false. The main problem Earman sees is that we cannot state the Past Hypothesis in the language of general relativity. Callender (2010, 2011b) and Wallace (2010) discuss the related question of stating the Past Hypothesis when self-gravitation is included. One may also consider the question in the context of quantum theory (see Wallace 2013).

2.2 Electromagnetism

If we place an isolated concentrated homogeneous gas in the middle of a large empty volume, we would expect the particles to spread out in an expanding sphere about the center of the gas, much as waves of radiation spread out from concentrated charge sources. It is therefore tempting to think that there is a relationship between the thermodynamic and electromagnetic arrows of time. In a debate in 1909, Albert Einstein and Walther Ritz apparently disagreed about the nature of this relationship, although the exact points of dispute remain a bit unclear. The common story told is that Ritz took the position that the asymmetry of radiation had to be judged lawlike and that the thermodynamic asymmetry could be derived from this law. Einstein’s position is instead that “irreversibility is exclusively based on reasons of probability” (Ritz and Einstein 1909, English translation from Zeh 1989: 13). It is unclear whether Einstein meant probability plus the right boundary conditions, or simply probability alone. In any case, Ritz is said to believe that the radiation arrow causes the thermodynamic one, whereas Einstein is said to hold something closer to the opposite position. The real story is far more complicated, as Ritz had a particle-based ontology in mind as well as many additional considerations (see Frisch and Pietsch 2016 for subtleties of the actual historical debate).

If this common tale is correct—and there is reason to think it isn’t the full story—then it seems that Einstein must be closer to being correct than Ritz. Ritz’ position appears implausible if only because it implies gases composed of neutral particles will not tend to spread out. That aside, Einstein’s position is attractive if we concentrate on the wave asymmetry mentioned above. Using Popper 1956’s famous mechanical wave example as an analogy, throwing a rock into a pond so that waves on the surface spread out into the future requires every bit the conspiracy that is needed for waves to converge on a point in order to eject a rock from the bottom. However, here it does seem clear that one process is favored thermodynamically and the other disfavored once we have a thermodynamic arrow in hand. Given a solution to the thermodynamic arrow, impulses directed toward the center of a pond such as to eject a rock are unlikely, whereas a rock triggering spherical waves diverging from the point of impact are likely. Here the radiation arrow seems plausibly connected to and perhaps even derivable from the thermodynamic arrow. The main interesting difference is that Popper’s time-reversed pond seems approximately attainable whereas anti-thermodynamic processes seem more absolutely forbidden (or at least dramatically harder to engine, requiring a so-called Maxwell Demon).

If the wave asymmetry were the only electromagnetic arrow, then the above sketch would plausibly capture the core connection between the thermodynamic and electromagnetic arrows of time. We would have reason to think that whatever causes the thermodynamic arrow also is responsible for the electromagnetic arrow. That may ultimately be correct. However, it’s too early to conclude that, for electromagnetism is chock full of arrows of time besides the wave asymmetry.

Maxwell’s equations are well-known to include both “advanced” and “retarded” solutions. The retarded solution \[ \phi_{\text{ret}}(r,t) = \int dr' \rho\frac{(r', t- \frac{\lvert r'-r\rvert}{c})}{\lvert r'-r\rvert} \] gives the field amplitude \(\phi_{\text{ret}}\) at \(r,t\) by finding the source density \(r\) at \(r'\) at earlier times. The advanced solution \[ \phi_{\text{adv}}(r,t) = \int dr' \rho\frac{(r', t+ \frac{\lvert r'-r\rvert}{c})}{\lvert r'-r\rvert} \] gives the field amplitude in terms of the source density at \(r'\) at later times. Physicists routinely discard the advanced solutions for reasons of “causality”. It is not so clear thermodynamic considerations are behind this rejection of solutions, an asymmetry made all the harder to see given the freedom electromagnetism has to rewrite retarded fields in terms of advanced fields and outgoing sourceless radiation (and vice versa). Electromagnetism is also said to allow emissions and not absorptions. Accelerating charges are also damped and not anti-damped by the field. With so many arrows besides the wave asymmetry—emission/absorption, in/out, retarded/advanced, damped/anti-damped—it’s premature to say that the thermodynamic arrow is the one arrow to rule them all. Most agree that the wave asymmetry is ultimately “thermodynamic” but after that matters are contested.

For further discussion of these controversial points, see the articles/chapters by Allori 2015; Arntzenius 1994; Atkinson 2006; Earman 2011; Frisch 2000, 2006; Frisch and Pietsch 2016; North 2003; Price 1996, 2006; Rohrlich 2006; and Zeh 1989.

2.3 Cosmology

Cosmology presents us with a number of apparently temporally asymmetric mechanisms. The most obvious one is the inexorable expansion of the universe. The spatial scale factor \(a(t)\), which we might conceive roughly as the radius of the universe (it gives the distance between co-moving observers), is increasing. The universe seems to be uniformly expanding relative to our local frame. Since this temporal asymmetry occupies a rather unique status it is natural to wonder whether it might be the “master” arrow.

The cosmologist Thomas Gold 1962 proposed just this. Believing that entropy values covary with the size of the universe, Gold asserts that at the maximum radius the thermodynamic arrow will “flip” due to the re-contraction. However, as Richard Tolman 1934 has shown in some detail, a universe filled with non-relativistic particles will not suffer entropy increase due to expansion, nor will an expanding universe uniformly filled with blackbody radiation increase its entropy either. Interestingly, Tolman demonstrated that more realistic universes containing both matter and radiation will change their entropy contents. Coupled with expansion, various processes will contribute to entropy increase, e.g., energy will flow from the “hot” radiation to the “cool” matter. So long as the relaxation time of these processes is larger than the expansion time scale, they should generate entropy. We thus have a purely cosmological method of entropy generation.

Others (e.g., Davies 1994) have thought inflation provides a kind of entropy-increasing behavior—again, given the sort of matter content we have in our universe. The inflationary model is an alternative of sorts to the standard big bang model, although by now it is so well entrenched in the cosmology community that it really deserves the tag “standard”. In this scenario, the universe is very early in a quantum state called a “false vacuum”, a state with a very high energy density and negative pressure. Gravity acts like Einstein’s cosmological constant, so that it is repulsive rather than attractive. Under this force the universe enters a period of exponential inflation, with geometry resembling de Sitter space. When this period ends any initial inhomogeneities will have been smoothed to insignificance. At this point ordinary stellar evolution begins. Loosely associating gravitational homogeneity with low-entropy and inhomogeneity with higher entropy, inflation is arguably a source of a low entropy “initial” condition.

There are other proposed sources of cosmological entropy generation, but these should suffice to give the reader a flavor of the idea. We shall not be concerned with evaluating these scenarios in any detail. Rather, our concern is about how these proposals explain time’s arrow. In particular, how do they square with our earlier claim that the issue boils down to either assuming temporally asymmetric boundary conditions or of adding time reversal non-invariant laws of nature?

The answer is not always clear, owing in part to the fact that the separation between laws of nature and boundary conditions is especially slippery in the science of cosmology. Advocates of the cosmological explanation of time’s arrow typically see themselves as explaining the origin of the needed low-entropy cosmological condition. Some explicitly state that special initial conditions are needed for the thermodynamic arrow, but differ with the conventional “statistical” school in deducing the origin of these initial conditions. Earlier low-entropy conditions are not viewed as the boundary conditions of the spacetime. They came about, according to the cosmological schools, about a second or more after the big bang. But when the universe is the size of a small particle, a second or more is enough time for some kind of cosmological mechanism to bring about our low-entropy “initial” condition. What cosmologists (primarily) differ about is the precise nature of this mechanism. Once the mechanism creates the “initial” low-entropy we have the same sort of explanation of the thermodynamic asymmetry as discussed in the previous section. Because the proposed mechanisms are supposed to make the special initial conditions inevitable or at least highly probable, this maneuver seems like the alleged “third way” mentioned above.

The central question about this type of explanation, as far as we’re concerned, is this: Is the existence of the low “initial” state a consequence of the laws of nature alone or the laws plus boundary conditions? In other words, first, does the proposed mechanism produce low-entropy states given any initial condition, and second, is it a consequence of the laws alone or a consequence of the laws plus initial conditions? We want to know whether our question has merely been shifted back a step, whether the explanation is a disguised appeal to special initial conditions. Though we cannot here answer the question in general, we can say that the two mechanisms mentioned are not lawlike in nature. Expansion fails on two counts. There are boundary conditions in expanding universes that do not lead to an entropy gradient, i.e., conditions without the right matter-radiation content, and there are boundary conditions that do not lead to expansion in which entropy nonetheless increases, e.g., matter-filled Friedmann models that do not expand. Inflation fails at least on the second count. Despite advertising, arbitrary initial conditions will not give rise to an inflationary period. Furthermore, it’s not clear that inflationary periods will give rise to thermodynamic asymmetries (Price 1996: ch. 2). The cosmological scenarios do not seem to make the thermodynamic asymmetries a result of nomic necessity. The cosmological hypotheses may be true, and in some sense, they may even explain the low-entropy initial state. But they do not appear to provide an explanation of the thermodynamic asymmetry that makes it nomologically necessary or even likely.

Another way to see the point is to consider the question of whether the thermodynamic arrow would “flip” if (say) the universe started to contract. Gold, as we said above, asserts that at the maximum radius the thermodynamic arrow must “flip” due to the re-contraction. Not positing a thermodynamic flip while maintaining that entropy values covary with the radius of the universe is clearly inconsistent—it is what Price (1996) calls the fallacy of a “temporal double standard”. Gold does not commit this fallacy, and so he claims that the entropy must decrease if ever the universe started to re-contract. However, as Albert writes,

there are plainly locations in the phase space of the world from which … the world’s radius will inexorably head up and the world’s entropy will inexorably head down. (2000: 90)

Since that is the case, it doesn’t follow from law that the thermodynamic arrow will flip during re-contraction; therefore, without changing the fundamental laws, the Gold mechanism cannot explain the thermodynamic arrow in the sense we want.

From these considerations we can understand the basic dilemma that runs throughout Price (1995, 1996): either we explain the earlier low-entropy condition Gold-style or it is inexplicable by time-symmetric physics. Because there is no net asymmetry in a Gold universe, we might paraphrase Price’s conclusion in a more disturbing manner as the claim that the (local) thermodynamic arrow is explicable just in case (globally) there isn’t one. However, notice that this remark leaves open the idea that the laws governing expansion or inflation are not time reversal invariant. (For more on Price’s basic dilemma, see Callender 1998 and Price 1995.)

Finally, it’s important to remember that this dilemma and the need for a Past Hypothesis are dependent upon a particular physical set-up. Can we explain the thermodynamic arrow without invoking a Past Hypothesis? Inspired by the idea of eternal spontaneous inflation, Carroll and Chen (2004, Other Internet Resources) describe a model in which new baby universes (or “pocket universes”) are repeatedly born from existing universes. Each birth increases the overall entropy of the multiverse although within each baby universe we have our familiar thermodynamic asymmetry. The crucial assumption in this model – one also found in the gravitational theory of Barbour, Koslowski, and Mercati (2014) – is that entropy is unbound. It can be arbitrarily high. With this assumption and in these models, one can do without a past Hypothesis. For discussion, see Goldstein, Tumulka, & Zanghi 2016 and Lazarovici and Reichert 2020.

2.4 Quantum Cosmology

Quantum cosmology, it is often said, is the theory of the universe’s initial conditions. Presumably this entails that its posits are to be regarded as lawlike. Because theories are typically understood as containing a set of laws, quantum cosmologists apparently assume that the distinction between laws and initial conditions is fluid. Particular initial conditions will be said to obtain as a matter of law. Hawking writes, for example,

we shall not have a complete model of the universe until we can say more about the boundary conditions than that they must be whatever would produce what we observe, (1987: 163).

Combining such aspirations with the observation that thermodynamics requires special boundary conditions leads quite naturally to the thought that “the second law becomes a selection principle for the boundary conditions of the universe [for quantum cosmology]” (Laflamme 1994: 358). In other words, if one is to have a theory of initial conditions, it would certainly be desirable to deduce initial conditions that will lead to the thermodynamic arrow. This is precisely what many quantum cosmologists have sought. (This should be contrasted with the arrows of time discussed in semiclassical quantum gravity, for example, the idea that quantum scattering processes in systems with black holes violate the CPT theorem.) Since quantum cosmology is currently very speculative, it might be premature to start worrying about what it says about time’s arrow. Nevertheless, there has been a substantial amount of debate on this issue (see Haliwell et al. 1994).

2.5 Causation

Penrose and Percival (1962) propose a general causal principle to handle our problem. The principle states that the effects of interactions happen after those interactions but not before. Similar to Reichenbach’s principle of the common cause, they suggest what they dub the Law of Conditional Independence, namely, that “If A and B are two disjoint 4-regions, and C is any 4-region which divides the union of the pasts of A and B into two parts, one containing A and the other containing B, then A and B are conditionally independent given c. That is, Pr(a&b/c) = Pr(a/c) × Pr(b/c), for all a,b.” (Penrose and Percival 1962, p. 611). Here c is an event that is a common cause that screens off the correlation between events in A and B.

In terms of statistical mechanics, this law would have the effect of making the phase space density associated with a system at a time determined by earlier events but not later events. This would more or less directly preclude the temporal "parity of reasoning" motivated transitions assumed in the problem of the direction of time, transition of type (2). To achieve this, the Law of Conditional Independence must be time asymmetric, which it is, and it must be a kind of fundamental principle that restricts the lawlike correlation otherwise allowed. After all, if we assume that the laws of nature are time reversal invariant, then there is no asymmetry between pre- and post-interaction correlations.

Price 1996 (chapter 5) and Sklar 1993 hold that this nomic restriction is unwarranted or unexplanatory. There is the sense that the causal asymmetry should come out of more basic physics, not be baked into this physics. Horwich 1987 is an example of someone trying to derive what he calls the fork asymmetry, which is similar to the Law of Conditional Independence, from more basic assumptions.

A recent contribution that has some affinities with the Penrose and Percival move can be found in Myrvold 2020.

2.6 Time Itself

Some philosophers have sought an answer to the problem of time’s arrow by claiming that time itself is directed. They do not mean time is asymmetric in the sense intended by advocates of the tensed theory of time. Their proposals are firmly rooted in the idea that time and space are properly represented on a four-dimensional manifold. The main idea is that the asymmetries in time indicate something about the nature of time itself. Christensen (1993) argues that this is the most economical response to our problem since it posits nothing besides time as the common cause of the asymmetries, and we already believe in time. A proposal similar to Christensen’s is Weingard’s “time-ordering field” (1977). Weingard’s speculative thesis is that spacetime is temporally oriented by a “time potential”, a timelike vector field that at every spacetime point directs a vector into its future light cone. In other words, supposing our spacetime is temporally orientable, Weingard wants to actually orient it. The main virtue of this is that it provides a time sense everywhere, even in spacetimes containing closed timelike curves (so long as they’re temporally orientable). As he shows, any explication of the “earlier than” relation in terms of some other physical relation will have trouble providing a consistent description of time direction in such spacetimes. Another virtue of the idea is that it is in principle capable of explaining all the temporal asymmetries. If coupled to the various asymmetries in time, it would be the “master arrow” responsible for the arrows of interest. As Sklar (1985) notes, Weingard’s proposal makes the past-future asymmetry very much like the up-down asymmetry. As the up-down asymmetry was reduced to the existence of a gravitational potential—and not an asymmetry of space itself—so the past-future asymmetry would reduce to the time potential—and not an asymmetry of time itself. Of course, if one thinks of the gravitational metric field as part of spacetime, there is a sense in which the reduction of the up-down asymmetry really was a reduction to a spacetime asymmetry. And if the metric field is conceived as part of spacetime—which is itself a huge source of contention in philosophy of physics—it is natural to think of Weingard’s time-ordering field as also part of spacetime. Thus his proposal shares a lot in common with Christensen’s suggestion.

This sort of proposal has been criticized by Sklar on methodological grounds. Sklar claims that scientists would not accept such an explanation (1985: 111–2). One might point out, however, that many scientists did believe in analogues of the time-ordering field as possible causes of the CP violations.[4] The time-ordering field, if it exists, would be an unseen (except through its effects) common cause of strikingly ubiquitous phenomena. Scientists routinely accept such explanations. To find a problem with the time-ordering field we need not invoke methodological scruples; instead we can simply ask whether it does the job asked of it. Is there a mechanism that will couple the time-ordering field to thermodynamic phenomena? Weingard says the time potential field needs to be suitably coupled (1977: 130) to the non-accidental asymmetric processes, but neither he nor Christensen elaborate on how this is to be accomplished. Until this is addressed satisfactorily, this speculative idea must be considered interesting yet embryonic. For more recent work in this vein, see Maudlin 2002.

2.7 Interventionism

When explaining time’s arrow many philosophers and physicists have focused their attention upon the unimpeachable fact that real systems are open systems that are subjected to interactions of various sorts. Thermodynamic systems cannot be truly isolated. To take the most obvious example, we can not shield a system from the influence of gravity. At best, we can move systems to locations feeling less and less gravitational force, but we can never completely decouple a system from the gravitational field. Not only do we ignore the weak gravitational force when doing classical thermodynamics, but we also ignore less exotic matters, such as the walls in the standard gas in a box scenario. We can do this because the time it takes for a gas to reach equilibrium with itself is vastly shorter than the time it takes the gas plus walls system to reach equilibrium. For this reason we typically discount the effects of the box walls on the gas.

In this approximation many have thought there lies a possible solution to the problem of the direction of time. Indeed, many have thought herein lies a solution that does not change the laws of classical mechanics and does not allow for the nomological possibility of anti-thermodynamic behavior. In other words, advocates of this view seem to believe it embodies a third way. Blatt 1959; Reichenbach 1956; Redhead and Ridderbos 1998, and to some extent, Horwich 1987 are a few works charmed by this idea.

The idea is to take advantage of what a random perturbation of the representative phase point would do to the evolution of a system. Given our Boltzmannian setup, there is a tremendous asymmetry in phase space between the volumes of points leading to equilibrium and of points leading away from equilibrium. If the representative point of a system were knocked about randomly, then due to this asymmetry, it would be very probable that the system at any given time be on a trajectory leading toward equilibrium. Thus, if it could be argued that the earlier treatment of the statistical mechanics of ideal systems ignored a random perturber in the environment of the system, then one would seem to have a solution to our problems. Even if the perturbation were weak it would still have the desired effect. The weak “random” previously ignored knocking of the environment is is claimed to be the cause of the approach to equilibrium. Prima facie, this answer to the problem escapes the appeal to special initial conditions and the appeal to new laws.

But only prima facie. A number of criticisms have been leveled against this maneuver. One that seems on the mark is the observation that if classical mechanics is to be a universal theory, then the environment must be governed by the laws of classical mechanics as well. The environment is not some mechanism outside the governance of physical law, after all, and when we treat it too, the “deus ex machina”—the random perturber—disappears. If we treat the gas-plus-the-container walls as a classical system, it is still governed by time-reversible laws that will cause the same problem as we met with the gas alone. At this point one sometimes sees the response that this combined system of gas plus walls has a neglected environment too, and so on, and so on, until we get to the entire universe. It is then questioned whether we have a right to expect laws to apply universally (Reichenbach 1956: 81ff). Or the point is made that we cannot write down the Hamiltonian for all the interactions a real system suffers, and so there will always be something “outside” what is governed by the time-reversible Hamiltonian. Both of these points rely, one suspects, on an underlying instrumentalism about the laws of nature. Our problem only arises if we assume or pretend that the world literally is the way the theory says; dropping this assumption naturally “solves” the problem. Rather than further address these responses, let us turn to the claim that this maneuver need not modify the laws of classical mechanics.

If one does not make the radical proclamation that physical law does not govern the environment, then it is easy to see that whatever law describes the perturber’s behavior, it cannot be the laws of classical mechanics \(if\) the environment is to do the job required of it. A time-reversal noninvariant law, in contrast to the time symmetric laws of classical mechanics, must govern the external perturber. Otherwise we can in principle subject the whole system, environment plus system of interest, to a Loschmidt reversal. The system’s velocities will reverse, as will the velocities of the millions of tiny perturbers. “Miraculously”, as if there were a conspiracy between the reversed system and the millions of “anti-perturbers”, the whole system will return to a time reverse of its original state. What is more, this reversal will be just as likely as the original process if the laws are time reversal invariant. A minimal criterion of adequacy, therefore, is that the random perturbers be time reversal noninvariant. But the laws of classical mechanics are time reversal invariant. Consequently, if this “solution” is to succeed, it must exercise new laws and modify or supplement classical mechanics. (Since the perturbations need to be genuinely random and not merely unpredictable, and since classical mechanics is deterministic, the same sort of argument could be run with indeterminism instead of irreversibility. See Price 2002 for a diagnosis of why people have made this mistake, and also for an argument objecting to interventionism for offering a “redundant” physical mechanism responsible for entropy increase.)[5]

2.8 Quantum Mechanics

To the best of our knowledge our world is fundamentally quantum mechanical, not classical mechanical. Does this change the situation? “Maybe” is perhaps the best answer. Not surprisingly, answers to the question are affected by one’s interpretation of quantum mechanics. Quantum mechanics suffers from the notorious measurement problem, a problem which demands one or another interpretation of the quantum formalism. These interpretations fall broadly into two types, depending on their view of the unitary evolution of the quantum state (e.g., evolution according to the Schroedinger equation): they either say that there is something more than the quantum state, or that the unitary evolution is not entirely correct. The former are called “no-collapse” interpretations while the latter are dubbed “collapse” interpretations. This is not the place to go into the details of these interpretations, but we can still sketch the outlines of the picture painted by quantum mechanics (for more see Albert 1992).

Modulo some philosophical concerns about the meaning of time reversal (Albert 2000; Earman 2002), the equation governing the unitary evolution of the quantum state is time reversal invariant. For interpretations that add something to quantum mechanics, this typically means that the resulting theory is time reversal invariant too (since it would be odd or even inconsistent to have one part of the theory invariant and the other part not). Since the resulting theory is time reversal invariant, it is possible to generate the problem of the direction of time just as we did with classical mechanics. While many details are altered in the change from classical to no-collapse quantum mechanics, the logical geography seems to remain the same.

Collapse interpretations are more interesting with respect to our topic. Collapses interrupt or outright replace the unitary evolution of the quantum state. To date, they have always done so in a time reversal noninvariant manner. The resulting theory, therefore, is not time reversal invariant. This fact offers a potential escape from our problem: the transitions of type (2) in our above statement of the problem may not be lawful. And this has led many thinkers throughout the century to believe that collapses somehow explain the thermodynamic time asymmetry.

Mostly these postulated methods fail to provide what we want. We think gases relax to equilibrium even when they’re not measured by Bohrian observers or Wignerian conscious beings. This complaint is, admittedly, not independent of more general complaints about the adequacy of these interpretations. But perhaps because of these controversial features they have not been pushed very far in explaining thermodynamics.

More satisfactory collapse theories exist, however. One, due to Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber, commonly known as GRW, can describe collapses in a closed system—no dubious appeal to observers outside the quantum system is required. Albert (1992, 2000) has extensively investigated the impact GRW would have on statistical mechanics and thermodynamics. GRW would ground a temporally asymmetric probabilistic tendency for systems to evolve toward equilibrium. Anti-thermodynamic behavior is not impossible according to this theory. Instead it is tremendously unlikely. The innovation of the theory lies in the fact that although entropy is overwhelmingly likely to increase toward the future, it is not also overwhelmingly likely to increase toward the past (because there are no dynamic backwards transition probabilities provided by the theory). So the theory does not suffer from a problem of the direction of time as stated above.

This does not mean, however, that it removes the need for something like the Past Hypothesis. GRW is capable of explaining why, given a present nonequilibrium state, later states should have higher entropy; and it can do this without also implying that earlier states have higher entropy too. But it does not explain how the universe ever got into a nonequilibrium state in the first place. As indicated before, some are not sure what would explain this fact, if anything, or whether it’s something we should even aspire to explain. The principal virtue GRW would bring to the situation, Albert thinks, is that it would solve or bypass various troubles involving the nature of probabilities in statistical mechanics.

The same type of benefit, plus arguably others, come from a recent proposal by Chen (forthcoming). Chen suggests that we adopt a position known as density matrix realism to help understand time’s arrow. Instead of regarding the wavefunction as the basic ontology of quantum theory, we take the quantum state to be represented by an impure density matrix. When we express the Past Hypothesis in terms of a density matrix, a number of virtues appear, including greater harmony between the probabilities of statistical mechanics and quantum mechanics. It may be that interpretations of quantum mechanics that are not like GRW can possess some of the same benefits that GRW brings.

More detailed discussion of the impact quantum mechanics has on our problem can be found in Albert 2000, North 2002, Price 2002 and Chen forthcoming. But if our superficial review is correct, we can say that quantum mechanics will not obviate our need for a Past Hypothesis though it may well solve at least one problem related to the direction of time.

2.9 Lawlike Initial Conditions?

Finally, let’s return to a point made in passing about the status of the Past Hypothesis. Without some new physics that eliminates or explains the Past Hypothesis, or some satisfactory “third way”, it seems we are left with a bald posit of special initial conditions. One can question whether there really is anything unsatisfactory about this (Sklar 1993; Callender 2004b). But perhaps we were wrong in the first place to think of the Past Hypothesis as a contingent boundary condition. The question “why these special initial conditions?” would be answered with “it’s physically impossible for them to be otherwise”, which is always a conversation stopper. Indeed, Feynman (1965: 116) speaks this way when explaining the statistical version of the second law.

Absent a particular understanding of laws of nature, there is perhaps not much to say about the issue. But given particular conceptions of lawhood, it is clear that various judgments about this issue follow naturally—as we will see momentarily. However, let’s acknowledge that this may be to get matters backwards. It might be said that we first ought to find out whether the boundary conditions are lawlike, and then devise a theory of law appropriate to the answer. To decide whether or not the boundary conditions are lawlike based merely on current philosophical theories of law is to prejudge the issue. Perhaps this objection is really evidence of the feeling that settling the issue based on one’s conception of lawhood seems a bit unsatisfying. It is hard to deny this. Even so, it is illuminating to have a brief look at the relationships between some conceptions of lawhood and the topic of special initial conditions. For discussion and references on laws of nature, please refer to the entry on that topic.

For instance, if one agrees with John Stuart Mill that from the laws one should be able to deduce everything and one considers the thermodynamic part of that “everything”, then the special initial condition will be needed for such a deduction. The modern heir of this conception of lawhood, the one associated with Frank Ramsey and David Lewis (see Loewer 1996), sees laws as the axioms of the simplest, most powerful, consistent deductive system possible. It is likely that the specification of a special initial condition would emerge as an axiom in such a system, for such a constraint may well make the laws much more powerful than they otherwise would be.

We should not expect the naïve regularity view of laws to follow suit, however. On this sort of account, roughly, if \(B\)s always follow \(A\)s, then it is a law of nature that \(A\) causes \(B\). To avoid finding laws everywhere, however, this account needs to assume that \(A\)s and \(B\)s are instantiated plenty of times. But the initial conditions occur only once.

For more robust realist conceptions of law, it’s difficult to predict whether the special initial conditions will emerge as lawlike. Necessitarian accounts like Pargetter’s (1984) maintain that it is a law that \(P\) in our world iff \(P\) obtains at every possible world joined to ours by a nomic accessibility relation. Without more specific information about the nature of the accessibility relations and the worlds to which we’re related, one can only guess whether all of the worlds relative to ours have the same special initial conditions. Nevertheless some realist theories offer apparently prohibitive criteria, so they are able to make negative judgments. For instance, “universalist” theories associated with David Armstrong say that laws are relations between universals. Yet a constraint on initial conditions isn’t in any natural way put in this form; hence it would seem the universalist theory would not consider this constraint lawlike.

Philosophical opinion is certainly divided. The problem is that a lawlike boundary condition lacks many of the features we ordinarily attribute to laws, e.g., multiple instances, governing temporal evolution, etc., yet different accounts of laws focus on different subsets of these features. When we turn to the issue at hand, what we find is the disagreement we expect.

3. The Problem of the Direction of Time II

Life is filled with temporal asymmetries. This directedness is one of the most general features of the world we inhabit. We can break this general tendency down into a few more specific temporal arrows.

  1. The epistemological arrow. Roughly put, we know more about the past than the future. I know that yesterday’s broken egg on the floor had a similar outline to Chile’s boundaries, but I have no idea what country tomorrow’s broken egg will look like. Albert (2000) provides a much better characterization, for no one really counts and compares known propositions between past and future. It’s better to say, as he does, that our way of knowing the past is different than our way of knowing the future. There also seem to be more traces of events in the future than in the past. When I say something embarrassing, information representing that event is encoded on sound and light waves that form a continually increasing spherical shell in my future light-cone. I am potentially further embarrassed throughout my whole future lightcone. Yet there is no indication of the unfortunate event in its backward lightcone.
  2. The mutability arrow. We feel the future is “open” or indeterminate in a way the past is not. The past is closed, fixed for all eternity. Related to this, no doubt, is the feeling that our actions are essentially tied to the future and not the past. The future is mutable whereas the past is not.
  3. The psychological arrow. We have very different attitudes toward the past than toward the future. We dread future but not past headaches and prison sentences. This controversial arrow is actually many different asymmetries. Another, much disputed, is that we seem to share a psychological sense of passage through time. Allegedly, we sense a moving “now”, the motion of the present as events are transformed from future to past.
  4. The explanation-causation-counterfactual arrow. This arrow is actually three, yet it seems plausible that there are connections among them. Causes typically occur before their effects. Related to the causal asymmetry in some fashion or other is the asymmetry of explanation. Usually good explanations appeal to events in the past of the event to be explained, not to events in the future. It may be that this is just a prejudice that we ought to dispense with, but it is an intuition that we frequently have. Finally, and no doubt this is again related to the other two arrows as well as the mutability arrow, we—at least naively—believe the future depends counterfactually on the present in a way that we do not believe the past depends counterfactually on the present.

The above list is not meant to be exhaustive or especially clean. Temporal asymmetries are everywhere. We age and die. Punchlines are at the ends of jokes. Propensities and dispositions and reproductive fitness are all future-directed. We prefer rags-to-riches stories to riches-to-rags stories. Obviously there are connections amongst many of these arrows. Some authors have explicitly or implicitly proposed various “dependency charts” that are supposed to explain which of the above arrows depend on which for their existence. Horwich (1987) argues for an explanatory relationship wherein the counterfactual arrow depends on the causal arrow, which depends on the arrow of explanation, which depends on the epistemological arrow. Lewis (1979), by contrast, thinks an alleged over-determination of traces grounds the asymmetry of counterfactuals and that this in turn grounds the rest. Suhler and Callender (2011) ground the psychological arrow on the causal and knowledge asymmetries. The chart one judges most appropriate will depend, to a large degree, upon one’s general philosophical stance on many large topics.

Which dependency chart is the correct one is not our concern here. Rather, the second “problem of the direction of time” asks: do any (all?) of these arrows ultimately hold in virtue of the thermodynamic arrow of time (or what grounds it)?

Sklar (1985) provides useful examples to have in mind. Consider the up-down asymmetry. It plausibly reduces to the local gravitational gradient. Astronauts on the moon think down is the direction toward the center of the moon, not wherever it was when they left Earth. By contrast, there is (probably) merely a correlation between the left-right asymmetry (say, in snail shells) and parity violations in high-energy particle physics. The second problem asks whether any of the above temporal asymmetries are to the thermodynamic arrow as the up-down asymmetry is to the local gravitational gradient. Of course, we don’t expect anything quite so straightforward. Sklar describes an experiment where iron dust inserted in the ear sacs of fish cause the fish to swim upside down when a magnet is held over the tank, presumably altering their sense of up and down. But as Jos Uffink remarked to me, going inside a refrigerator doesn’t cause us to remember the future. The connections, if any, are bound to be subtle.

3.1 The Thermodynamic Reduction

Inspired by Boltzmann’s attempts in this regard, many philosophers have sought such reductions, either partial or total. Grünbaum (1973) and Smart (1967) develop entropic accounts of the knowledge asymmetry. Lewis (1979) suspects the asymmetry of traces is linked to the thermodynamic arrow but provides no specifics. Dowe (1992), like a few others, ties the direction of causation to the entropy gradient. And some have also tied the psychological arrow to this gradient (for a discussion see Kroes 1985). Perhaps the most ambitious attempts at grounding many arrows all at once can be found in Reichenbach 1956, Horwich 1987, and Albert 2000, 2015. Each of these books offers possible thermodynamic explanations for the causal and epistemic arrows, as well as many subsidiary arrows.

A straightforward reduction of these arrows to entropy is probably not in the cards (Earman 1974; Horwich 1987). Consider the epistemic arrow of time. The traditional entropic account claimed that because we know there are many more entropy-increasing rather than entropy-decreasing systems in the world (or our part of it), we can infer when we see a low-entropy system that it was preceded and caused by an interaction with something outside the system. To take the canonical example, imagine you are walking on the beach and come across a footprint in the sand. You can infer that earlier someone walked by (in contrast to it arising as a random fluctuation). In other words, you infer, due to its high order, that it was caused by something previously also of high (or higher) order, i.e, someone walking.

However, the entropic account faces some very severe challenges. First, do footprints on beaches have well-defined thermodynamic entropies? To describe the example we switched from low-entropy to high order, but the association between entropy and our ordinary concept of order is tenuous at best and usually completely misleading. (To appreciate this, just consider what happens to your salad dressing after it is left undisturbed. Order increases when the oil and vinegar separate, yet entropy has increased.) To describe the range of systems about which we have knowledge, the account needs something broader than the thermodynamic entropy. But what? Reichenbach is forced to move to a notion of quasi-entropy, losing the reduction in the process. Second, the entropic account doesn’t license the inference to a human being walking on the beach. All it tells you is that the grains of sand in the footprint interacted with its environment previously, which barely scratches the surface of our ability to tell detailed stories about what happened in the past. Third, even if we entertain a broader understanding of entropy, it still doesn’t always work. Consider Earman’s (1974) example of a bomb destroying a city. From the destruction we may infer that a bomb went off; yet the bombed city does not have lower entropy than its surroundings or even any type of intuitively higher order than its surroundings.

3.2 The Statistical Mechanical Reduction

Presumably for these reasons, contemporary theories abandon the attempt to ground the arrows of time on thermodynamic entropy. Instead, they turn to statistical mechanics, that which grounds the thermodynamic arrow. This more general basis is regarded as more fertile ground for the other arrows. In effect, the thermodynamic arrow is just regarded as another non-basic arrow like those four mention above. Horwich (1987) traces the arrows back to initial micro-chaos. Albert (2000, 2015) and Loewer (2012) instead trace them to a package dubbed the Mentaculus (after the Coen brothers’ film, A Serious Man, 2009). Let’s briefly consider how Albert and Loewer propose to derive the thermodynamic arrow, the epistemic arrow, and the causal arrow all from the Mentaculus.

In the Coen brothers’ film, the character Arthur Gopnik, a mathematician, spends his days on a couch filling a notebook with a probability map of the universe, the Mentaculus. It is an apt name for what statistical mechanics provides us according to Albert and Loewer. In effect, it provides us with a probability map for every macroscopic generalization because it provides probabilities over all the microstates realizing these macrostates. The package is composed of the following elements: the past hypothesis (that the entropy of initial macrostate \(M(0)\) is extremely low), a uniform probability distribution over the microstates that realize \(M(0)\), the present macrostate \(M(t)\), and the dynamical laws of the microlevel.

This package, they say, implies the thermodynamic arrow. We “derive” it from basic physics by making a case at time \(t\) that

\[ P(S \text{ increases } \mid M(t) \amp M(0) \amp \text{uniform-probability-over-}M(0)) = \text{high} \]

Boltzmann, Gibbs and many others make the case, although it’s worth bearing in mind that they do so rigorously only in ideal cases and much remains controversial (see above). Still, it strikes many as physically plausible. One could say a lot more, but let’s grant this. Then notice that the first problem of the direction of time is blocked by the Past Hypothesis. One conditionalizes on the uniform distribution given \(M(0)\) and \(M(t)\), not merely \(M(t)\). The constraint at one end of the universe makes the claim that earlier entropy was higher unlikely. If correct, we have an honest-to-goodness reduction of a special science law “the second law of thermodynamics” from the bottom.

But this package also implies more. Turn to the causal arrow. As a very rough first approximation, causation can be analyzed probabilistically. Cause \(C\) causes effect \(E\) just in case \(C\) is prior to \(E\) and the probability of \(E\) given \(C\) and background \(B\) is greater than the probability of \(E\) given \(B\) alone. Of course, there are major problems with this account (see the entry on Probabilistic Causation). Yet the core intuition appears to come from the package, as one gets the temporal priority of causes from the Past Hypothesis and the probabilities from statistical mechanics. Together, they are claimed to explain why we can manipulate causes to produce effects but not vice versa. Turn to the epistemic arrow. Reflect on the nature of records. When you weigh yourself on a scale, one produces a record of one’s weight. This record is based on an inference comparing the states of the scale at two different times. I’m (say) 180 lbs if the scale was in its functioning ready state at 0 lbs before I stepped on it. The idea, very loosely (see Albert 2000, 2015 and Loewer 2012 for the details) is that the Past Hypothesis effectively is the world’s Ready State. This highly constrained state is what causes there to be macroscopic traces of the past in the present but not macroscopic traces of the future in the present.

Naturally, this ambitious program met with vigorous criticism. The idea that statistical mechanics implies (probabilistically) the truth or falsity of virtually every counterfactual-supporting generalization in all of science and everyday life strikes many as going too far. See Callender and Cohen 2010, Earman 2006, Frisch 2010, Leeds 2003, North 2011, Westlake 2014, Winsberg 2004 and some essays in Wilson 2014.

Long ago Boltzmann (e.g., 1895) suggested that the temporal asymmetries discussed above are explained by the direction of increasing entropy. A lot of progress has been made developing this tantalizing thesis. Nevertheless, just as work on the first problem of the origins of the thermodynamic arrow remains active, so too does research on the second.


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