First published Sat Feb 8, 1997; substantive revision Thu Jun 16, 2022

There is wide agreement that a term is vague to the extent that it has borderline cases. This makes the notion of a borderline case crucial in accounts of vagueness. This entry will concentrate on an historical characterization of borderline cases that most commentators still accept. Vagueness will then be contrasted with ambiguity and generality. This will clarify the nature of the philosophical challenge posed by vagueness. The entry will then discuss some rival theories of vagueness with an emphasis on many-valued logic, supervaluationism and contextualism. In the penultimate section this entry will discuss Kit Fine’s (2020) holistic challenge to the logical possibility of a borderline case. The entry concludes with the issue of whether all vagueness is linguistic.

1. Inquiry Resistance

If you cut one head off of a two-headed man, have you decapitated him? What is the maximum height of a short man? When does a fertilized egg develop into a person?

These questions are impossible to answer because they involve absolute borderline cases. In the vast majority of cases, the unknowability of a borderline statement is only relative to a given means of settling the issue (Sorensen 2001, chapter 1). For instance, a boy may count as a borderline case of ‘obese’ because people cannot tell whether he is obese just by looking at him. His curious mother could try to settle the matter by calculating her son’s body mass index. The formula is to divide his weight (in kilograms) by the square of his height (in meters). If the value exceeds 30, this test counts him as obese. The calculation will itself leave some borderline cases. The mother could then use a weight-for-height chart. These charts are not entirely decisive because they do not reflect the ratio of fat to muscle, whether the child has large bones, and so on. The boy will only count as an absolute borderline case of ‘obese’ if no possible method of inquiry could settle whether he is obese. When we reach this stage, we start to suspect that our uncertainty is due to the concept of obesity rather than to our limited means of testing for obesity.

Absolute borderline cases are first officially targeted by Charles Sanders Peirce’s entry for ‘vague’ in the 1902 Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology:

A proposition is vague when there are possible states of things concerning which it is intrinsically uncertain whether, had they been contemplated by the speaker, he would have regarded them as excluded or allowed by the proposition. By intrinsically uncertain we mean not uncertain in consequence of any ignorance of the interpreter, but because the speaker’s habits of language were indeterminate. (Peirce 1902, 748)

Peirce connects intrinsic uncertainty with the sorites paradox: “vagueness is an indeterminacy in the applications of an idea, as to how many grains of sand are required to make a heap, and the like” (1892, 167). In the case of relative borderline cases, the question is determinate but our means for answering it are incomplete. For absolute borderline cases, there is incompleteness in the question itself. When a term is applied to one of its absolute borderline cases the result is a statement that resists all attempts to settle whether it is true or false (Hu 2021). For instance, no amount of conceptual analysis or empirical inquiry can establish the minimum number of grains needed for a heap. Equally futile is inquiry into the qualitative vagueness illustrated by the decapitation riddle. An inventive speaker could give the appearance of settling the matter by stipulating that ‘decapitate’ means ‘remove a head’ (as opposed to ‘make headless’ or ‘remove the head’). But that semantic revision would change the topic to an issue that merely sounds the same as decapitation. The switch in meaning might not be detected if the inventive speaker was misperceived as merely applying antecedent knowledge of decapitation.

We should expect absolute borderline cases to arise for unfamiliar cases. Where there is no perceived need for a decision, criteria are left undeveloped. Since philosophical thought experiments often involve unfamiliar cases, there is apt to be intrinsic uncertainty. W. V. O. Quine was especially suspicious of the far-out hypotheticals popular in the literature on personal identity. He globalizes his doubts about determinate answers in his thesis of radical translation: for any language, there are indefinitely many, equally adequate rival translation manuals.

The indeterminacy of translation applies to one’s own language. Introspection will not settle whether ‘\(x\) is the same person as \(y\)’ means ‘\(x\) has the same body as \(y\)’ or ‘\(x\) has same memories as \(y\)’. You have never encountered a case in which these two possible rules of usage diverge. John Locke imagines a prince and cobbler who awake with each other’s memories. Is the prince now in the cobbler’s bed or is the prince in his royal bed with errant memories? Quine sees a deflating resemblance with the decapitation riddle. Either of the incompatible answers fits past usage. Yet Locke answers that the prince and cobbler have switched bodies. Materialists counter that the prince and cobbler have instead switched psychologies. Locke and his adversary should have instead shrugged their shoulders.

The Cambridge University philosophers Bertrand Russell (1923) and Frank Ramsey were heavily influenced by American pragmatism (Misak 2016). Their reading of Peirce made semantic indeterminacy grow into an international pre-occupation among analytic philosophers. Although vagueness seems holistic, Peirce’s definition is reductive. ‘Tall’ is vague by virtue of there being cases in which there is no fact of the matter. A man who is 1.8 meters in height is neither clearly tall nor clearly non-tall. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical investigation can settle whether a 1.8 meter man is tall. Borderline cases are inquiry resistant.

Inquiry resistance recurs. For in addition to the unclarity of the borderline case, there is normally unclarity as to where the unclarity begins. Twilight governs times that are borderline between day and night. But we are equally uncertain as to when twilight begins. This suggests there are borderline cases of borderline cases of ‘day’. Consequently, ‘borderline case’ has borderline cases. This higher-order vagueness seems to show that ‘vague’ is vague (Hu 2017). We are slow to recognize higher-order vagueness because we are under a norm to assert only what we know. When we discuss cases of twilight, we focus on definite cases of this borderline between day and night, not the marginal cases between definite day and definite twilight.

The vagueness of ‘vague’ would have two destructive consequences. First, Gottlob Frege could no longer coherently characterize vague predicates as incoherent. For this attribution of incoherence uses ‘vague’. Frege’s ideal of precision is itself vague because ‘precise’ is the complement of ‘vague’. Second, the vagueness of ‘vague’ dooms efforts to avoid a sharp line between true and false with a buffer zone that is neither true nor false. If the line is not drawn between the true and the false, then it will be between the true and the intermediate state. Any finite number of intermediates just delays the inevitable.

Several philosophers repudiate higher-order vagueness as an illusion (Wright 2021, chapter 5). They deny that there is an open-ended iteration of borderline status. They find it telling that speakers do not go around talking about borderline borderline cases and borderline borderline borderline cases and so forth (Raffman 2005, 23). Defenders of higher-order vagueness reply that ordinary speakers avoid iterating ‘borderline’ for the same reason they avoid iterating ‘million’ or ‘know’. The iterations are confusing but perfectly meaningful. ‘Borderline’ behaves just like a vague predicate. For instance, ‘borderline’ can be embedded in a sorites argument. Defenders of higher-order vagueness have also tried to clinch the case with particular-specimens such as borderline hermaphrodites (reasoning that these individuals are borderline borderline males) (Sorensen 2010).

Second thoughts about higher-order vagueness are difficult to sustain unless one also rethinks first-order vagueness. Perhaps Peirce overreacted to the threat of futile inquiry! Where does the tail of a snake begin? When posed as a rhetorical question, the speaker intimates that there is no definite answer. But the tail can be located by tracing down from the snake’s rib cage. A false attribution of indeterminacy will lead to the premature abandonment of inquiry. Is heat the absence of cold or cold the absence of heat? Many physicists ceased to inquire after Ernst Mach ridiculed the ancient riddle as indeterminate. Israel Scheffler (1979, 77–78) draws a moral from such hasty desertions. Never give up! In an internal criticism of his colleague Quine, Scheffler condemns any attribution of semantic indeterminacy as a defeatist relic of the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements. Appeals to meaning never conclude inquiry or preclude inquiry.

No one pursues the many lines of inquiry Scheffler refuses to close. Yet some agree that the attribution of borderline status is never mandatory. Crispin Wright (2021) concludes there are no definite borderline cases. Diana Raffman (2014, 153) offers some empirical support for borderline status always being optional. A minority of fluent speakers will draw a sharp line between yellow and orange.

Mandatory status is defended by listing paradigm cases of ‘borderline’. Just as a language teacher tests for competence by having students distinguish clear positives from clear negatives, she also tests by their recognition of borderline cases. Any pupil who uses ‘-ish’ without recognizing borderline cases of ‘noonish’ has not yet mastered the suffix. ‘Noonish’ is not a synonym of ‘within ten minutes of noon’ or any other term with a precisely delimited interval.

2. Comparison with Ambiguity and Generality

‘Tall’ is relative. A 1.8 meter pygmy is tall for a pygmy but a 1.8 meter Masai is not tall for a Masai. Although relativization disambiguates, it does not eliminate borderline cases. There are shorter pygmies who are borderline tall for a pygmy and taller Masai who are borderline tall for a Masai. The direct bearers of vagueness are a word’s full disambiguations such as ‘tall for an eighteenth-century French man’. Words are only vague indirectly, by virtue of having a sense that is vague. In contrast, an ambiguous word bears its ambiguity directly—simply in virtue of having multiple meanings.

This contrast between vagueness and ambiguity is obscured by the fact that most words are both vague and ambiguous. ‘Child’ is ambiguous between ‘offspring’ and ‘immature offspring’. The latter reading of ‘child’ is vague because there are borderline cases of immature offspring. The contrast is further complicated by the fact that most words are also general. For instance, ‘child’ covers both boys and girls.

Ambiguity and vagueness also contrast with respect to the speaker’s discretion. If a word is ambiguous, the speaker can resolve the ambiguity without departing from literal usage. For instance, he can declare that he meant ‘child’ to express the concept of an immature offspring. If a word is vague, the speaker cannot resolve the borderline case. For instance, the speaker cannot make ‘child’ literally mean anyone under eighteen just by intending it. That concept is not, as it were, on the menu corresponding to ‘child’. He would be understood as taking a special liberty with the term to suit a special purpose. Acknowledging departure from ordinary usage would relieve him of the obligation to defend the sharp cut-off.

When the movie director Alfred Hitchcock mused ‘All actors are children’ he was taking liberties with clear negative cases of ‘child’ rather than its borderline cases. The aptness of his generalization is not judged by its literal truth-value (because it is obviously untrue). Likewise, we do not judge precisifications of borderline cases by their truth-values (because they are obviously not ascertainable as true or false). We instead judge precisifications by their simplicity, conservativeness, and fruitfulness. A precisification that draws the line across the borderline cases conserves more paradigm usage than one that draws the line across clear cases. But conservatism is just one desideratum among many. Sometimes the best balance is achieved at the cost of turning former positive cases into negative cases.

Once we shift from literal to figurative usage, we gain fictive control over our entire vocabulary—not just vague words. When a travel agent says ‘France is a hexagon’, we do not infer that she has committed the geometrical error of classifying France as a six-sided polygon. We instead interpret the travel agent as speaking figuratively, as meaning that France is shaped like a hexagon. Similarly, when the travel agent says ‘Reno is the biggest little city’, we do not interpret her as overlooking the vagueness of ‘little city’. Just as she uses the obvious falsehood of ‘France is a hexagon’ to signal a metaphor, she uses the obvious indeterminacy of ‘Reno is the biggest little city’ to signal hyperbole.

Given that speakers lack any literal discretion over vague terms, we ought not to chide them for indecisiveness. Where there is no decision to be made, there is no scope for vice. Speakers would have literal discretion if statements applying a predicate to its borderline cases were just permissible variations in linguistic usage. For the sake of comparison, consider discretion between alternative spellings. Professor Letterman uses ‘judgment’ instead of ‘judgement’ because he wants to promote the principle that a silent E signals a long vowel. He still has fond memories of Tom Lehrer’s 1971 children’s song “Silent E”:

Who can turn a can into a cane?
Who can turn a pan into a pane?
It’s not too hard to see,
It’s Silent E.

Who can turn a cub into a cube?
Who can turn a tub into a tube?
It’s elementary
For Silent E.

Professor Letterman disapproves of those who add the misleading E but concedes that ‘judgement’ is a permissible spelling; he does not penalize his students for misspelling when they make their hard-hearted choice of ‘judgement’. Indeed, Professor Letterman scolds students if they fail to stick with the same spelling throughout the composition. Choose but stick to your choice!

Professor Letterman’s assertion ‘The word for my favorite mental act is spelled j-u-d-g-m-e-n-t’ is robust with respect to the news that it is also spelled j-u-d-g-e-m-e-n-t. He would continue to assert it. He can conjoin the original assertion with information about the alternative: ‘The word for my favorite mental act is spelled j-u-d-g-m-e-n-t and is also spelled j-u-d-g-e-m-e-n-t’. In contrast, Professor Letterman’s assertion that ‘Martha is a woman’ is not robust with respect to the news that Martha is a borderline case of ‘woman’ (say, Letterman learns Martha is younger than she looks). The new information would lead Letterman to retract his assertion in favor of a hedged remark such as ‘Martha might be a woman and Martha might not be a woman’. Professor Letterman’s loss of confidence is hard to explain if the information about her borderline status were simply news of a different but permissible way of describing her. Discoveries of notational variants do not warrant changes in former beliefs.

News of borderline status has an evidential character. Loss of clarity brings loss of warrant. If you do not lower your confidence, you are open to the charge of dogmatism. To concede that your ferry is a borderline case of ‘seaworthy’ is to concede that you do not know that your ship is seaworthy. That is why debates can be dissolved by showing that the dispute is over an absolute borderline case. The debaters should both become agnostic. After all, they do not have a license to form beliefs beyond their evidence. If your ferry is borderline seaworthy, you are not free to believe it is seaworthy.

According to W. K. Clifford, belief beyond the evidence is always morally forbidden, not just irrational. William James countered that belief beyond the evidence is permissible when there is a forced, momentous, live option. Can I survive the destruction of my body, simply by virtue of a strong psychological resemblance with a future person? The answer affects my prospects for immortality. James says that my belief that this is borderline survival does not forbid me from believing that it is survival. Whether I exercise this prerogative depends on my temperament. Since momentous borderline cases are so prevalent in speculative matters, much philosophical disagreement is a matter of personality differences.

The Clifford drop into agnosticism is especially quick for those who believe that evidence supports a unique judgment. A detective who thinks the evidence shows Gray is a murderer cannot concede that the evidence equally permits the judgment that Gray is not a murderer. If the detective concedes that Gray’s act is borderline murder, then he cannot shed the hedge and believe the act is murder.

In the case of relative borderline cases, the hedge can be shed by the discovery of a novel species of evidence. Murder inquiries were sometimes inconclusive because the suspect had an identical twin. After detectives learned that identical twins have distinct fingerprints, some of these borderline cases became decidable. Presently, there are some borderline cases arising from the extreme similarity in DNA between identical twins. Soon, geneticists will be able to reliably discern the slight differences between twin DNA that arise from mutations.

News of an alternative sense is like news of an alternative spelling; there is no evidential impact (except for meta-linguistic beliefs about the nature of words). Your assertion that ‘All bachelors are men’ is robust with respect to the news that ‘bachelor’ has an alternative sense in which it means a male seal. Assertions are not robust with respect to news of hidden generality. If a South African girl says ‘No elephant can be domesticated’ but learns there is another species of elephant indigenous to Asia, she will lose some confidence; maybe Asian elephants can be domesticated. News of hidden generality has evidential impact. When it comes to robustness, vagueness resembles generality more than vagueness resembles ambiguity.

Mathematical terms such as ‘prime number’ show that a term can be general without being vague. A term can also be vague without being general. Borderline cases of analytically empty predicates illustrate this possibility.

Generality is obviously useful. Often, lessons about a particular \(F\) can be projected to other \(F\)s in virtue of their common \(F\)-ness. When a girl learns that her cat has a nictitating membrane that protects its eyes, she rightly expects that her neighbor’s cat also has a nictitating membrane. Generality saves labor. When the girl says that she wants a toy rather than clothes, she narrows the range of acceptable gifts without going through the trouble of specifying a particular gift. The girl also balances values: a gift should be intrinsically desired and yet also be a surprise. If uncertain about which channel is the weather channel, she can hedge by describing the channel as ‘forty-something’. There is an inverse relationship between the contentfulness of a proposition and its probability: the more specific a claim, the less likely it is to be true. By gauging generality, we can make sensible trade-offs between truth and detail.

‘Vague’ has a sense that is synonymous with abnormal generality. This precipitates many equivocal explanations of vagueness. For instance, many commentators say that vagueness exists because broad categories ease the task of classification. If I can describe your sweater as red, then I do not need to ascertain whether it is scarlet. This freedom to use wide intervals obviously helps us to learn, teach, communicate, and remember. But so what? The problem is to explain the existence of borderline cases. Are they present because vagueness serves a function? Or are borderline cases side-effects of ordinary conversation—like the echoes indoor listeners learn to ignore?

Every natural language is both vague and ambiguous. However, both features seem eliminable. Indeed, both are eliminated in miniature languages such as checkers notation, computer programming languages, and mathematical descriptions. Moreover, it seems that both vagueness and ambiguity ought to be minimized. ‘Vague’ and ‘ambiguous’ are pejorative terms. And they deserve their bad reputations. Think of all the automotive misery that has been prefaced by

Driver: Do I turn left?
Passenger: Right.

English can be lethal. Philosophers have long motivated appeals for an ideal language by pointing out how ambiguity creates the menace of equivocation:

No child should work.
Every person is a child of someone.
Therefore, no one should work.

Happily, we know how to criticize and correct all equivocations. Indeed, every natural language is self-disambiguating in the sense that each has all the resources needed to uniquely specify any reading one desires.

3. The Philosophical Challenge Posed by Vagueness

Vagueness, in contrast, precipitates a profound problem: the sorites paradox. For instance,

  • Base step: A one-day-old human being is a child.
  • Induction step: If an \(n\)-day-old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is \(n + 1\) days old.
  • Conclusion: Therefore, a 36,500-day-old human being is a child.

The conclusion is false because a 100-year-old man is clearly a non-child. Since the base step of the argument is also plainly true and the argument is valid by mathematical induction, we seem to have no choice but to reject the second premise.

George Boolos (1991) observes that we have an autonomous case against the induction step. In addition to implying plausible conditionals such as “If a 1-day-old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is 2 days old”, the induction step also implies ludicrous conditionals such as “If a 1-day-old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when 36,500 days old”.

Boolos is puzzled why we overlook these clear counterexamples. One explanation is that we tend to treat the induction step as a generic generalization such as “People have ten toes” (Sorensen 2012) rather than a generalization with a quantifier such as ‘all’ or ‘most’. Whereas the universal generalization “All people have ten toes” is refuted by a single person with eleven toes, the generic generalization tolerates exceptions.

This hypothesis is plausible for newcomers to the sorites paradox. But it is less plausible for those being tutored by Professor Boolos. He guides logic students to the correct, universal reading of the induction step. When students drift to a generic reading, Boolos reminds them that the induction step is a generalization that tolerates no exceptions.

Guided by Boolos’ firm hand, logic students drive a second stake into the heart of the induction step (the entailment of preposterous conditionals). Yet the paradox seems far from dead. The hitch is that death for the induction step is life for its negation. The negation of the second premise classically implies a sharp threshold for childhood. For the falsehood of the induction step implies the existential generalization that there is a number \(n\) such that an \(n\)-day-old human being is a child but is no longer a child one day later.

Epistemicists accept this astonishing consequence. They stand by classical logic and conclude that vagueness is a form of ignorance. For any day in the borderline region of ‘child’, there is a small probability that it is the day one stopped being a child. Normally, the probability is negligible. But if we round down to zero, we fall into into inconsistency.

This diagnosis is reminiscent of Carl Hempel’s solution to the Raven Paradox. At first blush, we deny that a white handkerchief could confer any degree of confirmation on ‘All ravens are black’. But this is incompatible with us regarding a white handkerchief as providing some confirmation of ‘All non-black things are non-ravens’. Since this contrapositive is logically equivalent to ‘All ravens are black’, whatever confirms one hypothesis confirms the other. Hempel advises us to regain consistency by conceding that a white handkerchief slightly confirms ‘All ravens are black’. Similarly, Hempel might advise us to slightly raise the probability of a borderline child being a child upon learning that she is a day younger than previously believed.

Hempel’s only reservation about indoor ornithology is inefficiency. Given how the actual world is arranged, more news about ‘All ravens are black’ can be gained outdoors. We do not bother to look indoors because the return on inquiry is too low. Bottom-up Bayesians envisage extraordinary scenarios in which the return on inquiry could be high. However, even their ample imagination fails to yield a possible world in which a single day has a more discernible opportunity to make a difference to whether someone is a child. All pressure to shift credence is exerted top down from probability theory.

Timothy Williamson (1994) traces our ignorance of the threshold for childhood to “margin for error” principles. If one knows that an \(n\)-day-old human being is a child, then that human being must also be a child when \(n + 1\) days old. Otherwise, one is right by luck. Given that there is a threshold, we would be ignorant of its location. Under a use theory of meaning, the threshold depends on many speakers. Williamson characterizes this threshold as sharing the unpredictability of long-term weather forecasts. According to the meteorologist Edward Lorenz, a tornado in Kansas could be precipitated by the flapping of a butterfly’s wings in Tokyo.

The use theory of meaning does not apply to asocial languages. For instance, psycholinguists postulate a language of thought that is not used for communication. This innate language is vague.

Natural languages lexicalize only a small share of our concepts. The primary bearers of vagueness are concepts rather than words (Bacon 2018). Aphasia does not end vague thinking. Insofar as we attribute thinking to non-linguistic animals, we attribute vague thinking. Peirce’s emphasis on a community of inquirers encourages a sociology of language. Ludwig Wittgenstein’s attack on the possibility of a private language was intended to remove any rival to a community-based approach to language. Yet asocial vagueness remains viable. This motivates some epistemicists to explain our ignorance more metaphysically, say, as an effect of there being no truth-maker to control the truth-value of a borderline statement (Sorensen 2001, chapter 11).

Debate over Williamson’s margin for error principle draws us deep into epistemology and modality (Yli-Vakkuri 2016). Preferring to explore the shallows, some commentators survey attitudes weaker than knowledge. According to Nicholas Smith (2008, 182) we cannot even guess that the threshold for baldness is the 400th hair. Hartry Field (2010, 203) denies that a rational man can fear that he has just passed the threshold into being old. Hope, speculation, and wonder do not require evidence but they do require understanding. So it is revealing that these attitudes have trouble getting a purchase on the threshold of oldness (or any other vague predicate). A simple explanation is that bare linguistic competence gives us knowledge that there are no such thresholds. This accounts for the comical air of the epistemicist. Just as there is no conceptual room to worry that there is a natural number between sixty and sixty one, there is no conceptual room to worry that one has passed the threshold of oldness between one’s sixtieth and sixty-first birthday.

An old epistemicist might reply: My piecemeal confidence that a given number is not the threshold for oldness does not agglomerate into collective confidence that there is no such number. If I wager against each number being the threshold, then I must have placed a losing bet somewhere. For if I won each bet then there was no opportunity for me to make the transition to oldness. My bookie could have made a “Dutch book” against me. He would have been entitled to payment without having to identify which bet I lost. Since probabilities may be extracted from hypothetical betting behavior, I must actually assign some small (normally negligible) probability to hypotheses identifying particular thresholds. So must you.

Stephen Schiffer (2003, 204) denies that classical probability calculations apply in vague contexts. Suppose Donald is borderline old and borderline bald. According to Schiffer we should be just as confident in the conjunction ‘Donald is old and bald’ as in either conjunct. Adding conjuncts does not reduce confidence because we have a “vague partial belief” rather than the standard belief assumed by mathematicians developing probability theory. Schiffer offers a calculus for this vagueness-related propositional attitude. He crafts the rules for vague partial belief to provide a psychological solution to the sorites paradox.

The project is complicated by the fact that vague partial beliefs interact with precise beliefs (MacFarlane 2010). Consider a statement that has a mixture of vague and precise conjuncts: ‘Donald is old and bald and has an even number of hairs’. Adding the extra precise conjunct should diminish confidence. Schiffer also needs to accommodate the fact that some speakers are undecided about whether the nature of the uncertainty involves vagueness. Even an idealized speaker may be unsure because there is vagueness about the borders between vagueness-related uncertainty and other sorts of uncertainty.

Attitudes toward determinacy vary over time. Bernard Williams (2010, 162) says Thucydides (460–400 BC) invented historical time. Thucydides insists that any two events occurred simultaneously or one occurred before the other. Thucydides does not countenance a vague “olden days”—a period in which events fail to be chronologically ordered. Every event is situated on a single timeline. There can be ignorance of when an event took place but there is always a fact of the matter. With similar focus, Archimedes (287–212 BC) insists that every quantity corresponds to a specific number. No quantity, however large, is innumerable. In “The Sand Reckoner” Archimedes devises a special notation to express the total number of grains of sand. The reductionism of Enlightenment thinkers led them to further analysis of shades of gray into black and white dots of precision.

In a holistic reaction, the Romantics portray the new boundaries as no more real than the grid lines of a microscope. The specimen under the slide lacks boundaries. Understanding does not require boundaries. Organizing items along a spectrum is a natural form of classification. We comprehend this analog grouping more readily and smoothly than we grasp the digital groupings instilled by Descartes’ algebraic representation of space. If our metaphysics of classification is constricted by a logic designed for mathematics, the sorites paradox will make us see disorder where there is really order of a more fluid sort. Spontaneous arrangements will bring what order is permitted by the subject matter. Romantic biologists take to the field and refuse to pen species within the axes of the Cartesian coordinate system. Confronted with novel phenomena such as evolution, magnetism and electricity, Romantic scientists bypassed boundaries.

A geologist views a pair of aerial photographs cross-eyed. His brain recognizes the two images as representations of the same landscape. The flat images fuse into a unifying stereoscopic perspective. The Romantics portray vague language as perceptively de-focussed. Vagueness is not the cloudy vision of an old man with cataracts.

The epistemicist fits into the Thucydidean tradition of replacing indeterminacy with determinacy. Crispin Wright (2021, 393) compares the epistemicist’s postulation of hidden boundaries to the mathematical realist’s postulation of a hidden Platonic realm. Both the epistemicist and the mathematical realist add metaphysical infrastructure to ensure truth will transcend our means of proof. This infrastructure validates proofs of generalizations that are not constructed from examples. The impossibility of finding a witness for an existential generalization, such as ‘There is a youngest old man’, is compatible with there being a non-constructive proof.

Despite rearguard defenses by the Romantics, Newtonian physics appeared to show that empirical reality fits classical logic. The hard sciences illustrated the crystalline growth of determinacy. But in a shocking reversal, quantum mechanics suggests the possibility of reversing from determinacy to indeterminacy. What had been formerly regarded as determinate, the position and velocity of an object, was regarded as indeterminate by Werner Heisenberg. Quantum logicians, such as Hilary Putnam (1976), abandoned the distributive laws of propositional logic.

Putnam (1983) went on propose a solution that seems to apply L. E. J. Brouwer’s intuitionism to the sorites paradox. (In response to a rebuttal, Putnam [1985] surprisingly denied that intuitionistic semantics was part of the proposal.) Brouwer had achieved fame with his fixed point theorem. But reflection on Kant’s philosophy of mathematics led Brouwer to retract his lovely proof. Any non-constructive proof had to be replaced! Brouwer’s recall of established theorems yielded more specific proofs that had higher explanatory power. Theorems that could not be retrofitted became objects of agnosticism. This was sad news for Brouwer’s fixed point theorem. But Putnam welcomes the recall of the epistemicist’s theorem that there is a smallest natural number. The classical logician relies on double negation to deduce a hidden boundary from the negation of the generalization “If \(n\) is small, then \(n + 1\) is small”. Since the intuitionist does not accept this classical rule, his refusal to acquiesce to the induction step does not saddle him with hidden thresholds. Like the epistemicist, the intuitionist treats vagueness as a cognitive problem that does not require rejecting the law of bivalence. Unlike the epistemicist, the intuitionist must not claim to know the law of bivalence. To sustain this agnosticism about bivalence, the intuitionist must parry the sorites monger’s reformulations (Wright 2021, chapter 14). For instance, the intuitionist’s least number principle threatens to re-ignite the sorites.

Many commentators concede to the epistemicist that it is logically possible for vague predicates to have thresholds. They just think it would be a miracle:

It is logically possible that the words on this page will come to life and sort my socks. But I know enough about words to dismiss this as a serious possibility. So I am right to boggle at the possibility that our rough and ready terms such as ‘red’ could so sensitively classify objects.

Epistemicists counter that this bafflement rests on an over-estimate of stipulation’s role in meaning. Epistemicists say much meaning is acquired passively by default rather than actively by decision. If some boundaries are more eligible for reference than others, then the environment does the work. If nothing steps in to make a proposition true, then it is false. Or so opines Timothy Williamson.

Most doubt whether precise analytical tools fit vague arguments. The scientific Romantic H. G. Wells was amongst the first to suggest that we must moderate the application of logic:

Every species is vague, every term goes cloudy at its edges, and so in my way of thinking, relentless logic is only another name for stupidity—for a sort of intellectual pigheadedness. If you push a philosophical or metaphysical enquiry through a series of valid syllogisms—never committing any generally recognised fallacy—you nevertheless leave behind you at each step a certain rubbing and marginal loss of objective truth and you get deflections that are difficult to trace at each phase in the process. Every species waggles about in its definition, every tool is a little loose in its handle, every scale has its individual error. (1908, 18)

Many more believe that the problem is with logic itself rather than the manner in which it is applied. They favor solving the sorites paradox by replacing standard logic with an earthier deviant logic.

There is a desperately wide range of opinions as to how the revision of logic should be executed. Every form of deviant logic has been applied in the hope of resolving the sorites paradox.

4. Many-valued Logic

An early favorite was many-valued logic. On this approach, borderline statements are assigned truth-values that lie between full truth and full falsehood. Some logicians favor three truth-values, others prefer four or five. The most popular approach is to use an infinite number of truth-values represented by the real numbers between 0 (for full falsehood) and 1 (for full truth). This infinite spectrum of truth-values might be of service for a continuous sorites argument involving ‘small real number’ (Weber and Colyvan 2010). Classical logic does not enforce a sharp boundary for infinite domains. But it still enforces unlimited sensitivity for vague predicates. If two quantities \(A\) and \(B\) are growing but \(A\) is given a headstart, then \(A\) will cease to equal a small real number before \(B\). Since this transitional difference holds regardless of the lead’s magnitude, “\(A\) equals a small real number” passes from true to false within an arbitrarily narrow interval. If the number of truth-values is instead as numerous as the real numbers, there is no longer any mismatch between the tiny size of the transition and the large difference in truth-value.

There is a new mismatch, however. The number of truth-values now dwarfs the number of truth-value bearers. Since a natural language can express any proposition, the number of propositions equals the number of sentences. The number of sentences is \(\aleph_0\) while (assuming the continuum hypothesis) the number of real numbers is at least \(\aleph_1\). Consequently, there are infinitely many truth-values without bearers.

This new mismatch seems more bearable than the old mismatch it is designed to avoid. Yet some find even a lower infinity of truth-values over-bearing. Instead of having just one artificially sharp line between the true and the false, the many-valued logician has infinitely many sharp lines such as that between statements with a truth of .323483925 and those with a higher truth-value. Mark Sainsbury grimaces, ‘… you do not improve a bad idea by iterating it’ (1996, 255).

A proponent of an infinite-valued logic might cheer up Sainsbury with an analogy. It is a bad idea to model a circle with a straight line. Using two lines is not much better, nor is there is much improvement using a three-sided polygon (a triangle). But as we add more straight lines to the polygon (square, pentagon, hexagon, and so on) we make progress—by iterating the bad idea of modeling a circle with straight lines.

Indeed, it would be tempting to triumphantly conclude “The circle has been modeled as an infinite-sided polygon”. But has the circle been revealed to be an infinite-sided polygon? Have curved lines been replaced by straight lines? Have curved lines (and hence circles) been proven to not exist? A model can succeed without being clear what has been achieved.

But it is premature to dwell on the analogy “Precision is to vagueness as straightness is to curvature”. The many-valued logician must first vindicate the comparison by providing details about how to calculate the truth-values of vague statements from the truth-values of their component statements.

Proponents of many-valued logic approach this obligation with great industry. Precise new rules are introduced to calculate the truth-values of compound statements that contain statements with intermediate truth-values. For instance, the revised rule for conjunctions assigns the conjunction the same truth-value as the conjunct with the lowest truth-value. These rules are designed to yield all standard theorems when all the truth-values are 1 and 0. In this sense, classical logic is a limiting case of many-valued logic. Classical logic is agreed to work fine in the area for which it was designed—mathematics.

Most theorems of standard logic break down when intermediate truth-values are involved. (An irregular minority, such as ‘If \(P\), then \(P\)’, survive.) Even the classical contradiction ‘Donald is bald and it is not the case that he is bald’ receives a truth-value of .5 when ‘Donald is bald’ has a truth-value of .5. Many-valued logicians note that the error they are imputing to classical logic is often so small that classical logic can still be fruitfully applied. But they insist that the sorites paradox illustrates how tiny errors accumulate into a big error.

Critics of the many-valued approach complain that it botches phenomena such as hedging. If I regard you as a borderline case of ‘tall man’, I cannot sincerely assert that you are tall and I cannot sincerely assert that you are of average height. But I can assert the hedged claim ‘Either you are tall or of average height’. The many-valued rule for disjunction is to assign the whole statement the truth-value of its highest disjunct. Normally, the added disjunct in a hedged claim is not more plausible than the other disjuncts. Thus it cannot increase the degree of truth. Disappointingly, the proponent of many-valued logic cannot trace the increase of assertibility to an increase in the degree of truth.

Epistemicists ascribe the increase in assertibility to the increasing probability of truth. Since the addition of disjuncts can raise probability indefinitely, the epistemicists correctly predict that we can hedge our way to full assertibility. However, epistemicists do not have a monopoly on this prediction.

5. Supervaluationism

According to supervaluationists, borderline statements lack a truth-value. This neatly explains why it is universally impossible to know the truth-value of a borderline statement. Supervaluationists offer details about the nature of absolute borderline cases. Simple sentences about borderline cases lack a truth-value. Compounds of these statements can have a truth-value if they come out true regardless of how the statement is admissibly precisified. For instance, ‘Either Mr. Stoop is tall or it is not the case that Mr. Stoop is tall’ is true because it comes out true under all ways of sharpening ‘tall’. Thus the method of supervaluations allows one to retain all the theorems of standard logic while admitting “truth-value gaps”.

One may wonder whether this striking result is a genuine convergence with standard logic. Is the supervaluationist characterizing vague statements as propositions? Or is he merely pointing out that certain non-propositions have a structure isomorphic to logical theorems? (Some electrical circuits are isomorphic to tautologies but this does not make the circuits tautologies.) Kit Fine (1975, 282), and especially David Lewis (1982), characterize vagueness as hyper-ambiguity. Instead of there being one vague concept, there are many precise concepts that closely resemble each other. ‘Child’ can mean a human being at most one day old or mean a human being at most two days old or mean a human being at most three days old …. Thus the logic of vagueness is a logic for equivocators. Lewis’ idea is that ambiguous statements are true when they come out true under all disambiguations. But logicians normally require that a statement be disambiguated before logic is applied. The mere fact that an ambiguous statement comes out true under all its disambiguations does not show that the statement itself is true. Sentences which are actually disambiguated may have truth-values. But the best that can be said of those that merely could be disambiguated is that they would have had a truth-value had they been disambiguated (Tye 1989).

Supervaluationism will converge with classical logic only if each word of the supervaluated sentence is uniformly interpreted. For instance, ‘Either a carbon copy of Teddy Roosevelt’s signature is an autograph or it is not the case that a carbon copy of Teddy Roosevelt’s signature is an autograph’ comes out true only if ‘autograph’ is interpreted the same way in both disjuncts. Vague sentences resist mixed interpretations. However, mixed interpretations are permissible for ambiguous sentences. As Lewis himself notes in a criticism of relevance logic, ‘Scrooge walked along the bank on his way to the bank’ can receive a mixed disambiguation. When exterminators offer ‘non-toxic ant poison’, we charitably switch relativizations within the noun phrase: the substance is safe for human beings but deadly for ants.

Even if one agrees that supervaluationism converges with classical logic about theoremhood, they clearly differ in other respects. Supervaluationism requires rejection of inference rules such as contraposition, conditional proof and reductio ad absurdum (Williamson 1994, 151–152). In the eyes of the supervaluationist, a demonstration that a statement is not true does not guarantee that the statement is false.

The supervaluationist is also under pressure to reject semantic principles which are intimately associated with the application of logical laws. According to Alfred Tarski’s Convention T, a statement ‘\(S\)’ is true if and only if \(S\). In other words, truth is disquotational. Supervaluationists say that being supertrue (being true under all precisifications) suffices for being true. But given Convention T, supertruth would then be disquotational. Since the supervaluationists accept the principle of excluded middle, the combination of Convention T and ‘P or ~P’ being supertrue would force them to say ‘\(P\)’ is supertrue or ‘\(\neg P\)’ is supertrue (even if ‘\(P\)’ applies a predicate to a borderline case). This would imply that either ‘\(P\)’ is true or ‘\(\neg P\)’ is true (Williamson 1994, 162–163). And that would be a fatal loss of truth-value gaps for supervaluationism.

There is a final concern about the “ontological honesty” of the supervaluationist’s existential quantifier. As part of his solution to the sorites paradox, the supervaluationist asserts, “There is a human being who, for some \(n\), was a child when \(n\) days old but not when \(n + 1\) days old.” For this statement comes out true under all admissible precisifications of ‘child’. However, when pressed the supervaluationist adds a codicil: “Oh, of course I do not mean that there really is a sharp threshold for childhood.”

After the clarification, some wonder how supervaluationists differs from drastic metaphysical skeptics. In his nihilist days, Peter Unger (1979) admitted that it is useful to talk as if there are children. But he insisted that strictly speaking, vague terms such as ‘child’ cannot apply to anything. Unger was free to use supervaluationism as a theory to explain our ordinary discourse about children. (Unger instead used other resources to explain how we fruitfully apply empty predicates.) But once the dust had cleared and the precise rubble came into focus, Unger had to conclude that there are no children.

Officially, the supervaluationist rejects the induction step of the sorites argument. Unofficially, he seems to instead reject the base step of the sorites argument.

Supervaluationists encourage the view that all vagueness is a matter of linguistic indecision: the reason why there are borderline cases is that we have not bothered to make up our minds. The method of supervaluation allows us to assign truth-values prior to any decisions. Expressivists think this is a mistake akin to assigning truth-values to normative claims (MacFarlane 2016). They model vagueness as practical uncertainty as to whether to treat a borderline \(F\) as an \(F\). The deliberator may accept the tautologies of classical logic as constraints governing competing plans for drawing lines. I can accept “Either Donald is bald or not” without accepting either disjunct. An existentially quantified sentence can be accepted even when no instance is. A shrug of the shoulders signals readiness to go either way, not ignorance as to which possible world one inhabits.

The expressivist is poised to explain how supervaluationism developed into the most respected theory of vagueness. Frege portrayed vagueness as negligent under-definition: One haphazardly introduces a necessary condition here, a sufficient condition there, but fails to supply a condition that is both necessary and sufficient. Supervaluationists counter that indecision can be both intentional and functional. Instead of committing ourselves prematurely, we fill in meanings as we go along in light of new information and interests.

Psychologists may deny that we could really commit ourselves to the complete precisifications envisaged by the supervaluationist (which encompass an entire language). Many of these comprehensive alternatives are too complex for memory. For instance, any precisification admitting a long band of random verdicts will be algorithmically complex and so not compressible in a rule. Realistic alternatives are only modestly more precise than ordinary usage.

Nevertheless, the supervaluationist’s conjecture about gradual precisification is popular for the highly stipulative enterprise of promulgating and enforcing laws (Endicott 2000). Judges frequently seem to exercise and control discretion by means of vague language. Uncertainties about the scope of discretion may arise from higher-order vagueness (Schauer 2016).

Discretion through gap-filling pleases those who regard adjudication as a creative process. It alarms those who think we should be judged by laws rather than men. The doctrine of discretion through indeterminacy has also been questioned on the grounds that the source of the discretion is the generality of the legal terms rather than their vagueness (Poscher 2012).

By David Lanius’s (2019) reckoning, the only function for vagueness in law is strategic. Drunk driving is discouraged by the vagueness of ‘drunk’ in the way it is discouraged by random testing of motorists. Scattershot enforcement becomes a welcome feature of the legal system rather than a bug in the legal programming. Motorists stay sober to avoid participation in a punishment lottery.

Judicial variance is just what one expects if the judges are making a forced choice on borderline cases. Judges cannot confess ignorance and so are compelled to assert beyond their evidence. Little wonder that what comes out of their mouth is affected by irrelevancies such as what went in their mouths for lunch. This susceptibility to bias by irrelevant factors (weather, order effects, anchoring) could be eliminated by methodical use of a lottery. The lottery could be weighted to the fact that borderline crimes vary in how close they come to being clear crimes.

Hrahn Asgeirsson (2020, chapter 3) admits that the descriptive question ‘Is this drunk driving?’ cannot be more reliably answered by a judge than anyone else when it is a borderline case. But he thinks the normative question, ‘Should this be counted as drunk driving?’ could be better answered by those with superior knowledge of legislative intent.

6. Subvaluationism

Whereas the supervaluationist analyzes borderline cases in terms of truth-value gaps the dialetheist analyzes them in terms of truth-value gluts. A glut is a proposition that is both true and false. The rule for assigning gluts is the mirror image of the rule for assigning gaps: A statement is true exactly if it comes out true on at least one precisification. The statement is false just if it comes out false on at least one precisification. So if the statement comes out true under one precisification and false under another precisification, the statement is both true and false.

To avoid triviality, the dialetheist must adopt a paraconsistent logic that stops two contradictory statements from jointly implying everything. The resulting “subvaluationism” is a dual of supervaluationism.

The spiritual father of subvaluationism is Georg Hegel. For Hegel, the basic kind of vagueness is conflict vagueness. The shopper in between the wings of a revolving doorway is both inside the building and outside the building. Degree vagueness is just a special case of the conflict inherent in becoming. Any process requires a gradual manifestation of a contradiction inherent in the original state. At some stage, a metamorphosizing caterpillar is not a butterfly (by virtue of what it was) and a butterfly (by virtue of what it will be). Hegelians believed this dialectical conception of vagueness solved the sorites and demonstrated the inadequacy of classical logic (Weber 2010). The Russian Marxist Georgi Plekhanov (1908 [1937]) proposed a logic of contradiction to succeed classical logic (Hyde 2008, 93–5). One of his students, Henry Mehlberg (1958) went on to substitute gaps for gluts. The first version of supervaluationism is thus a synthesis, reconciling the thesis of classical logic with the anti-thesis posed by the logic of contradiction.

From a formal point of view, there seems no more reason to prefer one departure from classical logic rather than the other (Cobreros and Tranchini 2019). Since Western philosophers abominate contradiction, parity with dialetheism would diminish the great popularity of supervaluationism.

A Machiavellian epistemicist will welcome this battle between the gaps and the gluts. He roots for the weaker side. Although he does not want the subvaluationist to win, the Machiavellian epistemicist does want the subvaluationist to achieve mutual annihilation with his supervaluationist doppelgänger. His political calculation is: Gaps + Gluts = Bivalence.

Pablo Cobreros (2011) has argued that subvaluationism provides a better treatment of higher-order vagueness than supervaluationism. But for the most part, the subvaluationists (and their frenemies) have merely claimed subvaluationism to be at least as attractive as supervaluationism (Hyde and Colyvan 2008). This modest ambition seems prudent. After all, truth-value gaps have far more independent support from the history of philosophy (at least Western philosophy). Prior to the explosive growth of vagueness research after 1975, ordinary language philosophers amassed a panoramic battery of analyses suggesting that gaps are involved in presupposition, reference failure, fiction, future contingent propositions, performatives, and so on and so on. Supervaluationism rigorously consolidated these appeals to ordinary language.

Dialetheists characterize intolerance for contradiction as a shallow phenomenon, restricted to a twentieth-century Western academic milieu (maybe even now being eclipsed by the rise of China). Experimental philosophers have challenged the old appeals to ordinary language with empirical results suggesting that glutty talk is as readily stimulated by borderline cases as gappy talk (Alxatib and Pelletier 2011, Ripley 2011).

7. Contextualism

Just as contextualism in epistemology runs orthogonal to the familiar divisions amongst epistemologists (foundationalism, reliabilism, coherentism, etc.), there are contextualists of every persuasion amongst vagueness theorists. They develop an analogy between the sorites paradox and indexical sophistries such as:

  • Base step: The horizon is more than 1 meter away.
  • Induction step: If the horizon is more than \(n\) meters away, then it is more than \(n + 1\) meters away.
  • Conclusion: The horizon is more than a billion meters away.

The horizon is where the earth meets the sky and is certainly less than a billion meters away. (The circumference of the earth is only forty million meters.) Yet when you travel toward the horizon to specify the \(n\) at which the induction step fails, your trip is as futile as the pursuit of the rainbow. You cannot reach the horizon because it shifts with your location.

All contextualists accuse the sorites monger of equivocating. In one sense, the meaning of ‘child’ is uniform; the context-invariant rule for using the term (its “character”) is constant. However, the set of things to which the term applies (its “content”) shifts with the context. In this respect, vague words resemble indexical terms such as: ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘today’, ‘tomorrow’. When a debtor tells his creditor on Monday ‘I will pay you back tomorrow’ and then repeats the sentence on Tuesday, there is a sense in which he has said the same thing (the character is the same) and a sense in which he has said something different (the content has shifted because ‘tomorrow’ now picks out Wednesday).

According to the contextualists, the rules governing the shifts prohibit us from interpreting any instance of the induction step as having a true antecedent and a false consequent. The very process of trying to refute the induction step changes the context so that the instance will not come out false. Indeed, contextualists typically emphasize that each instance is true. Assent is mandatory. Consequently, direct attacks on the induction step must fail. One is put in mind of Seneca’s admonition to his student Nero: “However many you put to death, you will never kill your successor.”

Hans Kamp (1981), the founder of contextualism, maintained that the extension of vague words orbits the speaker’s store of conversational commitments. He notes that the commitment pressures the speaker to adjust past judgments to current judgments. This backward smoothing undermines the search for a sharp transition. The diagnostic potential of this smoothing is first recognized by Diana Raffman (1994). Switching categories (e.g., from blue to green) between two neighboring, highly similar items in a sorites series, without installing a boundary, is enabled by a gestalt switch that occurs between the two judgments. Switching categories comes at a cost, however; so once the classifier has switched to a new category, she will stay in the new category as long as she can. In particular, if she now reverses direction and goes back down the series, she will continue to classify as green some items she previously classified as blue. This pattern of judgments, hysteresis, has the effect of smoothing out the category shift so that the seeming continuity of the series is preserved. Instead of merely inviting psychologists to verify her predictions about hysteresis effects in sorites series, Raffman (2014, 146–156) collaborates with two psychologists to run an experiment that confirms them.

Stewart Shapiro integrates Kamp’s ideas with Friedrich Waismann’s concept of open texture. Shapiro thinks speakers have discretion over borderline cases because they are judgment dependent. They come out true in virtue of the speaker judging them to be true. Given that the audience does not resist, borderline cases of ‘child’ can be correctly described as children. The audience recognizes that other competent speakers could describe the borderline case differently. As Waismann lyricizes, “Every description stretches, as it were, into a horizon of open possibilities: However far I go, I shall always carry this horizon with me” (1945, 124).

American pragmaticism colors Delia Graff Fara’s contextualism. Consider dandelion farms. Why would someone grow weeds? The answer is that ‘weed’ is relative to interests. Dandelions are unwanted by lawn caretakers but are desired by farmers for food and wine. Fara thinks this interest relativity extends to all vague words. For instance, ‘child’ means a degree of immaturity that is significant to the speaker. Since the interests of the speaker shift, there is an opportunity for a shift in the extension of ‘child’. Fara is reluctant to describe herself as a contextualist because the context only has an indirect effect on the extension via the changes it makes to the speaker’s interest.

How strictly are we to take the comparison between vague words and indexical terms? Scott Soames (2002, 445) answers that all vague words literally are indexical.

This straightforward response is open to the objection that the sorites monger could stabilize reference. When the sorites monger relativizes ‘horizon’ to the northeast corner of the Empire State Building’s observation deck, he seems to generate a genuine sorites paradox that exploits the vagueness of ‘horizon’ (not its indexicality).

All natural languages have stabilizing pronouns, ellipsis, and other anaphoric devices. For instance, in ‘Jack is tired now and Jill is too’, the ‘too’ forces a uniform reading of ‘tired’. Jason Stanley suggests that the sorites monger employ the premise:

If that1 is a child then that2 is too, and if that2 is too, then that3 is too, and if that3 is too, then that4 is too, … and then that\(_i\) is too.

Each ‘that\(_n\)’ refers to the \(n\)th element in a sequence of worsening examples of ‘child’. The meaning of ‘child’ is not shifting because the first occurrence of the term governs all the subsequent clauses (thanks to ‘too’). If vague terms were literally indexical, the sorites monger would have a strong reply. If vague terms only resemble indexicals, then the contextualist needs to develop the analogy in a way that circumvents Stanley’s counsel to the sorites monger.

The contextualist would also need to address a second technique for stabilizing the context. R. M. Sainsbury (2013) advises the sorites monger to present his premises in apparently random order. No pair of successive cases raises an alarm that similar cases are being treated differently. Unless the hearer has extraordinary memory, he will not feel pressured to adjust the context.

The contextualist must find enough shiftiness to block every sorites argument. Since vagueness seeps into every syntactic category, critics complain that contextualism exceeds the level of ambiguity countenanced by linguists and psycholinguists.

Another concern is that some sorites arguments involve predicates that do not give us an opportunity to equivocate. Consider a sorites with a base step that starts from a number too large for us to think about. Or consider an inductive predicate that is too complex for us to reason with. One example is obtained by iterating ‘mother of’ a thousand times (Sorensen 2001, 33). This predicate could be embedded in a mind-numbing sorites that would never generate context shifts.

Other unthinkable sorites arguments use predicates that can only be grasped by individuals in other possible worlds or by creatures with different types of minds than ours. More fancifully, there could be a vague predicate, such as Saul Kripke’s “killer yellow”, that instantly kills anyone who wields it. The basic problem is that contextualism is a psychologistic theory of the sorites. Since arguments can exist without being propounded, they float free of attempts to moor them to arguers.

8. Global Indeterminacy without Local Indeterminacy?

Contextualists base their holism about vagueness on top-down psychology. Holism can also be logical. We encountered this in the supervaluationist’s rejection of truth-functionality. Instead of calculating the truth-values of all compound statements bottom-up from the truth-values of their component statements, Kit Fine (1975) assigned truth-values top-down by counting a statement as true if it comes out true under all admissible precisifications of the entire language.

Fine’s (2020) new holism parachutes in from R. M. Sainsbury’s (1996) characterization of vagueness in terms of boundarylessness. A precise predicate such as ‘thirty-something’ organizes cases into pigeonholes. Positive cases commence at thirty and cease at thirty nine. But paradigms and foils of ‘thirty-ish’ operate as poles of a magnet. Candidates for ‘thirty-ish’ resemble iron filings. This force field prevents completion of a forced-march sorites argument (in which we are marched from a definite instance of a predicate to a definite non-instance). Judgment must be suspended somewhere in the series. But it does not follow that there is any specific case such that one must suspend judgment about it.

Borderline status has the mobility of a bubble in a level. The precisificationist’s mistake is to remove the bubble. Peirce’s mistake is to freeze the bubble into intrinsic uncertainty. This is the dual of the error Peirce attributes to René Descartes’ method of universal doubt. Doubting everything is impossible because doubt only gets leverage against a fulcrum of presuppositions. (Ludwig Wittgenstein’s analogy is with the hinges of a door that hold fast in order that the door of doubt can open and close.) These presuppositions are indubitable in the sense that they cannot be challenged within the inquiry. When the skeptic claims to doubt everything, he winds up doubting nothing. The skeptic’s sham doubts are belied by the absence of any interruption of his habits. A genuine doubt triggers inquiry. Inquiry requires presupposition. These background beliefs must be taken for granted. But the necessary existence of certainty does not entail any intrinsic certitudes. What must be presupposed for one inquiry need not be presupposed for another. By Fine’s reckoning, Peirce should have issued a parallel rejection of intrinsic uncertitudes. Within any inquiry, there must be some suspension of judgment. But it does not follow that any proposition must resist all inquiry.

Consider a literary historiographer who, weary of debate about the identity of the first book, demonstrates that ‘book’ is vague by assembling a slippery slope ranging from early non-books to paradigm books. According to Peirce, the demonstration succeeds only if the spectrum contains some intrinsically doubtful cases. They are what makes ‘book’ vague. Fine’s negative thesis is that this reductionist explanation relies on impossible explanans. A booklet can no more be an intrinsically borderline book than it can be intrinsically misshelved. Fine’s positive thesis is that slippery slopes suffice to demonstrate the vagueness of ‘book’. There are borderline books only in the way there are heavy books. In contrast to ‘mass’, ‘heavy’ requires relativization to a gravitational field. ‘Borderline’ requires relativization to a range of cases.

Many-valued logicians have long contended that local indeterminacy is incompatible with the law of excluded middle. Fine’s (1975) supervaluationism was designed to reconcile the two. But now Fine concedes the incompatibility. Unlike the many-valued logician, Fine blames all the inconsistency on local indeterminacy. Indeed, Fine continues to think the law of excluded middle is undeniable (which is not to say it must be affirmed). What Fine does deny is conjunctive excluded middle: (\(B \vee \neg B) \wedge (C \vee \neg C) \wedge (D \vee \neg D) \wedge \ldots .\) For this principle implies that there is a sharp cut-off in a forced-march sorites paradox.

Since conjunctive excluded middle is a theorem of classical logic, Fine proposes a compatibility semantics that bears a family resemblance to intuitionism. Fine reconstructs a pedigree by modifying Saul Kripke’s semantics for intuitionistic logic. Timothy Williamson (2020) objects that the resulting logic condemns even more innocent inferences than intuitionism. Others defend local indeterminacy by saying that there are paradigm cases of intrinsically uncertain propositions such as those opening section one. Paradigms such as the decapitation riddle concern qualitative vagueness rather than the quantitative vagueness that generates a forced-march sorites argument. Kit Fine is at work on a future book that may address the worry that his account is incomplete or disjunctive.

9. Is All Vagueness Linguistic?

Supervaluationists emphasize the distinction between words and objects. Objects themselves do not seem to be the sort of thing that can be general, ambiguous, or vague (Eklund 2011). From this perspective, Georg Hegel commits a category mistake when he characterizes clouds as vague. Although we sometimes speak of clouds being ambiguous or even being general to a region, this does not entitle us to infer that there is metaphysical ambiguity or metaphysical generality.

Supervaluationists are seconding a fallacy attribution dating back to Bertrand Russell’s seminal article “Vagueness” (1923). This consensus was re-affirmed by Michael Dummett (1975) and ritualistically re-avowed by subsequent commentators.

In 1978 Gareth Evans focused opposition to vague objects with a short proof modeled after Saul Kripke’s attack on contingent identity. If there is a vague object, then some statement of the form ‘\(a = b\)’ must be vague (where each of the flanking singular terms precisely designates that object). For the vagueness is allegedly due to the object rather than its representation. But any statement of form ‘\(a = a\)’ is definitely true. Consequently, \(a\) has the property of being definitely identical to \(a\). Since \(a = b\), then \(b\) must also have the property of being definitely identical to \(a\). Therefore ‘\(a = b\)’ must be definitely true!

Evans agrees that there are vague identity statements in which one of the flanking terms is vague (just as Kripke agrees that there are contingent identity statements when one of the flanking terms is a flaccid designator). But then the vagueness is due to language, not the world.

Despite Evans’ impressive assault, there was a renewal of interest in vague objects in the 1980s. As a precedent for this revival, Peter van Inwagen (1990, 283) recalls that in the 1960s, there was a consensus that all necessity is linguistic. Most philosophers now take the possibility of essential properties seriously.

Some of the reasons are technical. Problems with Kripke’s refutation of contingent identity have structural parallels that affect Evans’ proof. Evans also relies on inferences that deviant logicians challenge (Parsons 2000).

In the absence of a decisive reductio ad absurdum, many logicians feel their role to be the liberal one of articulating the logical space for vague objects. There should be ‘vague objects for those who want them’ (Cowles and White 1991). Logic should be ontologically neutral.

Since epistemicists try to solve the sorites with little more than a resolute application of classical logic, they are methodologically committed to a partisan role for logic. Instead of looking for loopholes, we should accept the consequence (Williamson 2015).

Some non-enemies of vague objects also have an ambition to consolidate various species of indeterminacy (Barnes and Williams 2011). Talk of indeterminacy is found in quantum mechanics, analyses of the open future, fictional incompleteness, and the continuum hypothesis. Perhaps vagueness is just one face of indeterminacy.

This panoramic vision contrasts with the continuing resolution of many to tether vagueness to the sorites paradox (Eklund 2011). They fear that the clarity achieved by semantic ascent will be muddied by metaphysics.

But maybe the mud is already on the mountain top. Trenton Merricks (2001) claims that standard characterizations of linguistic vagueness rely on metaphysical vagueness. If ‘Donald is bald’ lacks a truth-value because there is no fact to make the statement true, then the shortage appears to be ontological.

The view that vagueness is always linguistic has been attacked from other directions. Consider the vagueness of maps (Varzi 2001). The vagueness is pictorial rather than discursive. So one cannot conclude that vagueness is linguistic merely from the premise that vagueness is representational.

Or consider vague instrumental music such as Claude Debussy’s “The Clouds”. Music has syntax but too little semantics to qualify as language. There is a little diffuse reference through devices such as musical quotation, leitmotifs, and homages. These referential devices are not precise. Therefore, some music is vague (Sorensen 2010). The strength and significance of this argument depends on the relationship between music and language. Under the musilanguage hypothesis, language and music branched off from a common “musilanguage” with language specializing in semantics and music specializing in the expression of emotion. This scenario makes it plausible that purely instrumental music could have remnants of semantic meaning.

Mental imagery also seems vague. When rising suddenly after a prolonged crouch, I ‘see stars before my eyes’. I can tell there are more than ten of these hallucinated lights but I cannot tell how many. Is this indeterminacy in thought to be reduced to indeterminacy in language? Why not vice versa? Language is an outgrowth of human psychology. Thus it seems natural to view language as merely an accessible intermediate bearer of vagueness.


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