18th Century German Aesthetics

First published Tue Jan 16, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jul 13, 2020

The philosophical discipline of aesthetics did not receive its name until 1735, when the twenty-one year old Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten introduced it in his Halle master’s thesis to mean epistêmê aisthetikê, or the science of what is sensed and imagined (Baumgarten, Meditationes §CXVI, pp. 86–7). But Baumgarten’s denomination of the field was an adult baptism: without a name, aesthetics had been part of philosophy since Plato attacked the educational value of poetry in the Republic and Aristotle briefly defended them in his fragmentary Poetics. In particular, Aristotle defended poetry from Plato’s charge that it is cognitively useless, trading in mere images of particulars rather than universal truths, by arguing that poetry delivers universal truths in a readily graspable form, unlike, for example, history, which deals merely with particular facts (Aristotle, Poetics, chapter 9, 1451a37–1451b10). And if experience of poetry can reveal important moral truths, then it can also be important to the development of morality, the other pole of Plato’s doubts. Some variant of this response to Plato was the core of aesthetics through much of subsequent philosophical history, and indeed continued to be central to aesthetics through much of the twentieth century. In the eighteenth century, however, two alternative responses to Plato were introduced. One may be regarded as taking up Aristotle’s idea in the Poetics that “katharsis,” purification or purgation, of the emotions of fear and pity, is a valuable part of our response to a tragedy; this led to an emphasis on the emotional impact of aesthetic experience that was downplayed in the cognitivist tradition. This line of thought was emphasized by Jean-Baptiste Du Bos in his Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting, and Music, published in France in 1719 and widely known throughout Europe even before it was translated into other languages. The other innovation was the idea that our response to beauty, whether in nature or in art, is a free play of our mental powers that is intrinsically pleasurable, and thus needs no epistemological or moral justification, although it may in fact have epistemological and moral benefits. This line of thought was introduced in Britain in Joseph Addison’s 1712 Spectator essays on “The Pleasures of the Imagination,” and developed by subsequent Scottish writers such as Francis Hutcheson, Henry Home (Lord Kames), and Alexander Gerard. It was only slowly received in Germany, hinted at by Moses Mendelssohn in the late 1750s, who also took up Du Bos’ emphasis on the emotional impact of aesthetic experience, but then made its first sustained appearance in the emphasis on the pleasure of the unhindered activity of our powers of representation in some of the entries in Johann Georg Sulzer’s Allgemeine Theorie der schönen Künste (1771–74), e.g., the entries on “beauty” and “taste” (Sulzer, Allgemeine Theorie, vol. II, pp. 371–85, at p. 371, and “Schön (Schöne Künste),” vol. IV, pp. 305–19, at p. 307). It became central to the aesthetic theories of Kant and Schiller in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) and the Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Mankind (1795). This article will chronicle the interaction between the traditional theory of aesthetic experience as a special form of the cognition of truth and the newer theories of aesthetic experience as a free play of cognitive (and sometimes other) mental powers and as a vicarious experience of emotions in eighteenth-century Germany.

1. Leibniz and Wolff: Perfection and Truth

The traditional idea that art is a special vehicle for the expression of important truths is the basis for the work of the philosopher who established the framework for German thought for much of the 18th century, namely, Christian Wolff (1679–1754). Wolff never devoted a whole work to aesthetics, but many of the ideas that would influence subsequent aesthetic theory are contained in his Rational Thoughts on God, the World, and the Soul of Man, his “German Metaphysics,” first published in 1719.

Originally appointed to teach mathematics at the Pietist-dominated university of Halle, Wolff was inspired by both the mathematical and philosophical genius of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716), but published a vast systematic statement of a philosophy that was constructed partly although by no means wholly on Leibnizian lines in a way that Leibniz himself never did. Wolff’s collected works (over thirty volumes in German and forty in Latin) include German versions of his logic, metaphysics, ethics, political philosophy, and teleology as well as a four-volume encyclopedia of mathematical subjects. In addition, there are expanded Latin versions of the logic, the components of metaphysics including ontology, rational cosmology, empirical psychology, rational psychology, and natural psychology, as well as another four-volume mathematical compendium, seven volumes on ethics, and no fewer than twelve volumes on political philosophy and economics. In all of this vast output, the only thing that might look like a work specifically in aesthetics is a treatise on architecture included in his encyclopedia of mathematics. That very placement indicates that Wolff regarded the discussion of architecture as part of the theory of science; and in the Preliminary Discourse on Philosophy in General that prefaces his Latin restatement of his system, Wolff states more generally that a “philosophy of the arts” is possible, but as part of “technics or technology,” “the science of the arts and of the works of art” (Wolff, Preliminary Discourse, §71, p. 38). Here Wolff uses the term “art” (ars) in the ancient sense of techne, which means any form of craft requiring both aptitude and training, rather than in the specifically modern sense of “fine art.” In his German works, Wolff uses the word Kunst in the same broad way. Even with regard to something closer to the fine arts, however, he says that “There could also be a philosophy of the liberal arts, if they were reduced to the form of a science….one might talk about rhetorical philosophy, poetical philosophy, etc.” (ibid., §72, p. 39). Wolff certainly does not have the idea of the fine arts as a domain of human production and response that differs in some essential way from all other forms of human production and response, thus he does not have the idea of aesthetics as a discipline that will focus on what distinguishes the fine arts and our response to them from everything else. Nevertheless, in the course of his works he introduces some ideas about both the fine arts and our response to them that will be seminal for the next half-century of German thought.

1.1 Leibniz

The two key ideas that Wolff takes from Leibniz are, first, the characterization of sensory perception as a clear but confused rather than distinct perception of things that could, at least in principle, be known both clearly and distinctly by the intellect; and, second, the characterization of pleasure as the sensory, and thus clear but confused, perception of the perfection of things. Leibniz’s conception of sensory perception was presented in a 1684 paper entitled “Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas.” Here Leibniz stated that “Knowledge is clear…when it makes it possible for me to recognize the thing represented,” but that it is “confused when I cannot enumerate one by one the marks which are sufficient to distinguish the thing from others, even though the thing may in truth have such marks and constituents into which its concept can be resolved.” Conversely, knowledge is both clear and distinct when one can not only clearly distinguish its object from other objects but can also enumerate the “marks” or properties of the object on which that distinction is based. Leibniz then says that sensory perception is clear but indistinct or confused knowledge, and illustrates his general thesis about sense perception with a remark about the perception and judgment of art: “Likewise we sometimes see painters and other artists correctly judge what has been done well or badly; yet they are often unable to give a reason for their judgment but tell the inquirer that the work which displeases them lacks ‘something, I know not what’” (Leibniz, “Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas,” p. 291). This illustration would be decisive for Wolff and all of those whom he in turn influenced.

The second idea that Wolff took over from Leibniz is the idea that pleasure is itself the sensory perception of the perfection existing in an object. For Leibniz and all his followers, all of the properties of actually existing objects can be regarded as perfections, since they held that the actual world is the one selected to exist by God from among all possible worlds precisely because it is the most perfect; thus each object and all of its properties must in some way contribute to the maximal perfection of the actual world. But they also used the concept of perfection in a more ordinary way, in which some actual objects have specific perfections that others do not, and it is this sense of perfection that Leibniz employed when he stated that

Pleasure is the feeling of a perfection or an excellence, whether in ourselves or in something else. For the perfection of other beings is also agreeable, such as understanding, courage, and especially beauty in another human being, or in an animal or even in a lifeless creation, a painting or a work of craftsmanship, as well.

Leibniz also holds that the perfection that we perceive in other objects is communicated to ourselves, although he does not say that our pleasure in the perception of perfection is actually directed at the self-perfection that is thereby caused. But there is certainly a nascent view here that the perception of beauty in art, although not only in art, is both intrinsically pleasurable and also instrumentally valuable because it leads to self-improvement.

1.2 Wolff

This is the background from which Wolff’s own hints toward aesthetics emerged. Wolff introduces the central concepts and principles of his ontology in the second chapter of his German metaphysics, which deals with “The first grounds of our cognition and all things in general” (German Metaphysics, p. 66). After expounding the formal principles that are the basis of all truth, the principles of non-contradiction and sufficient reason, Wolff introduces the concept that is the substantive basis of his ontology, namely the concept of perfection. He defines perfection as the “harmony” or “concordance” (Zusammenstimmung) of a manifold or multiplicity of objects or parts of objects—or as he says in Latin, perfectio est consensus in varietate (Wolff, Ontologia, §503, p. 390)—and illustrates this abstract definition with the example of a work of technology:

E.g., one judges the perfection of a clock from its correctly displaying the hours and their parts. It is however composed of many parts, and these and their composition are aimed at the hands displaying correctly the hours and their parts. Thus in a clock one finds manifold things, that are all in concordance with one another. (Wolff, German Metaphysics, §152, p. 152)

Here Wolff defines perfection in both formal and substantive terms: formally, simply as the order or harmony of the parts in a whole; but substantively, as the suitability of that order or harmony of parts for achieving the aim that is intended for the whole, such as accurately telling time in the case of a clock.

When we turn to Wolff’s conceptions of the perfections of the particular forms of art that he mentions, we see that he always has in mind both formal and substantive perfections for any particular art. Wolff also identifies order in things with truth. He says that

Since everything has its sufficient ground why it is, there must also always be a sufficient ground for why in simple things the alterations succeed one another just so and not otherwise, and why in composite things their parts are juxtaposed just thus and not otherwise, and also their alterations succeed one another just so and not otherwise.

He contrasts this order with the disorder that reigns in dreams, and then says that

Accordingly truth is nothing other than order in the alternations of things while the dream is disorder in the alteration of things. (German Metaphysics, §142, pp. 146–8)

In a 1729 lecture on “The enjoyment that one can derive from the cognition of truth,” Wolff does not in the first instance treat truth as a semantic correspondence between a linguistic representation and the object represented, or an epistemic relation between a mental representation and an external reality, but as an objective property consisting in coherence within things themselves, which is precisely what perfection consists in as well. But there is nevertheless a strongly cognitivist cast to Wolff’s aesthetics.

Wolff next defines clarity and distinctness and indistinctness in cognition. Thoughts are clear “when we know well what we think, and can distinguish that from other things”; they are obscure if we cannot even distinguish the objects of our thoughts from other objects (German Metaphysics, §§198–9, p. 188). Clear thoughts are also distinct if we not only know what objects we are thinking of but if “our thoughts are also clear with respect to their parts or the manifold that is to be found in them” (German Metaphysics, §207, p. 194), and are otherwise indistinct or confused. Wolff then defines sensations (Empfindungen) as those thoughts “which have their ground in the alterations of the members of our body and which are occasioned by corporeal things outside us,” and the “capacity for having sensations as the senses” (German Metaphysics, §220, p. 202). He then adopts Leibniz’s view that sensations or sensory perceptions are typically clear but indistinct or confused (German Metaphyics, §214, p. 198). Unlike Leibniz, the systematic Wolff observes that sensations come in differing degrees of clarity (German Metaphysics, §224, p. 206), but they are nevertheless all indistinct to some degree. This means that at least in principle a purely intellectual or conceptual representation is always a better source of knowledge of its object than is a sensory representation of it.

This in turn means that an aesthetic perception of a perfection is always a less than optimal cognition of that perfection, for having described sense perception or sensory cognition as clear but indistinct or confused, Wolff next defines pleasure as the sensory or “intuitive” cognition of perfection. In his German metaphysics, he writes that “Insofar as we intuit perfection, pleasure arises in us, thus pleasure is nothing other than an intuition of perfection, as Descartes already remarked” (German Metaphysics, §404, p. 344). Wolff’s successors will struggle to avoid the limitations on the cognitive significance of aesthetic response that follow from his definition of pleasure as a kind of sense perception and the limits he places on the cognitive significance of sense perception.

While Wolff’s basic account of pleasure is problematic, he does provide a straightforward account of beauty. Wolff defines beauty as the perfection of an object insofar it can be perceived by us with and through the feeling of pleasure: “Beauty consists in the perfection of a thing, insofar as it is suitable for producing pleasure in us” (Psychologia Empirica, §544, p. 420). This definition enunciates a clear position on the ontological status of beauty, which will often be vexed in the eighteenth century. Beauty is an objective property, founded in the perfection of things, but it is also a relational rather than intrinsic property, for it is attributed to perfection only insofar as there are subjects like us who can perceive it sensorily. Given perceivers like us, beauty is coextensive with or emergent from perfection, but in a universe without such perceivers perfection would not be equivalent to beauty.

Thus far we have considered only Wolff’s most abstract definition of perfection and therefore of beauty, namely that it is the coherence of a manifold insofar as we can perceive that through the sensation of pleasure. When he mentions or discusses specific arts, Wolff invokes more specific conceptions of perfection and thus of the beauties of those arts. In the case of the visual arts of painting and sculpture, Wolff locates their perfection in imitation or veridical representation, while other arts find their perfections in the fulfillment of intended uses. He uses the examples of painting and architecture in the German metaphysics to illustrate his claim that pleasure arises from the intuition of perfection. Thus,

the perfection of a painting consists in its similarity. For since a painting is nothing other than a representation of a given object on a tablet or flat surface, everything in it is harmonious if nothing can be discerned in it that one does not also perceive in the thing itself,


if a connoisseur of architecture contemplates a building that has been constructed in accordance with the rules of architecture, he thereby cognizes its perfection. (German Metaphysics, §404, p. 344)

Wolff frequently reiterates that the perfection of painting or sculpture consists in accurate representation without further amplification (“On the enjoyment that can be derived from the cognition of truth,” §7, p. 257, and Psychologia Empirica, §512, pp. 389–90, and §544, pp. 420–1); he is simply using what he takes to be a non-controversial fact about painting to confirm his connection of pleasure with the intuition of perfection. In his extended discussion of architecture, however, he reveals a more subtle conception of the perfections and thus the “rules” of architecture. In order for us to perceive it as beautiful, a building must display both the formal perfection of coherence as well as the substantive perfection of being suitable, indeed comfortable for its intended use.

Wolff begins his treatise on the Foundations of Architecture with the claim that “architecture is a science for constructing a building so that it is in complete correspondence with the intentions of the architect” (Wolff, Principles of Architecture, §1, p. 305). This locates the harmony or agreement in which perfection always consists in the relation between the intentions of the architect and the building that results from his plans and supervision. However, as he proceeds Wolff makes it clear that the intention of an architect is always to produce a structure that is both formally beautiful as well as useful and comfortable, so the perfection that subsists in the relation between intention and outcome in fact consists in the perfection of both form and utility in the building itself. On the one hand “A building is space that is enclosed by art in order that certain functions can proceed there securely and unhindered” (Architecture, §4, p. 306), and “A building is comfortable if all necessary functions can proceed within it without hindrance and vexation” (Architecture, §7, p. 307). These definitions form the basis for a requirement of perfection in the utility of a building. On the other hand, however, “Beauty is perfection or the necessary appearance thereof, insofar as the former or the latter is perceived, and causes a pleasure in us” (Architecture, §8, p. 307), and “A building must be constructed beautifully and decoratively” (Architecture, §18, p. 309). This is the basis for the requirement of formal rather than utilitarian perfection in a building. Throughout the remainder of the treatise, both conceptions of perfection are at work. Wolff does not explicitly extend this complex analysis of perfection to other arts, although it is not difficult to imagine how that extension might go: in painting we might respond to formal features of composition as well as to the accuracy of depiction, in sculpture we might respond to the intrinsic beauty of the marble or bronze as well as to the accuracy of depiction, and so on.

Finally, we must ask about the moral and religious implications of Wolff’s contributions to aesthetics. As we have seen, Wolff equates perfection, which is the object of pleasure in all contexts including those subsequently labeled aesthetic, with an objective sense of truth. However, and in this regard most unlike the German aestheticians of the next several generations who are so strongly influenced by him in other regards, he has nothing to say about the arts that are typically paradigmatic for those who ground their aesthetics on the notion of truth rather than that of play, namely literature, especially poetry and drama. Thus he does not consider the paradox of tragedy, formulated by Du Bos and then discussed by virtually every other eighteenth-century writer on literature, nor does he emphasize the moral benefits of uplifting literature, as so many others do. Indeed, he has nothing explicit to say about the moral benefits of aesthetic experience, nor does he directly consider the religious significance of such experience in any of his discussions of it. Nevertheless, it is clear that aesthetic experience does have religious significance for Wolff, because his philosophy culminates in a religious teleology. For Wolff, the most perfect and therefore most orderly of all possible worlds exists for a reason, namely to mirror the perfection of God, and sentient and cognizant beings such as ourselves exist for a reason, namely to recognize and admire the perfection of God that is mirrored in the perfection of things in the world and of the world as a whole. The perfection that is added to the natural world through human artistry is also part of the perfection of the world that emanates from and mirrors the perfection of God. Thus, in admiring the perfection of art we are performing part of our larger function in the world, namely admiring the perfection of God. Wolff states the premise of his teleology quite clearly in a work devoted entirely to that subject, the Rational Thoughts on the Aims of Natural Things, or “German teleology.” There he declares that

The chief aim of the world is this, that we should cognize the perfection of God from it. Now if God would attain this aim, he also had to arrange the world in such a way that a rational being could extract from the contemplation of it grounds that would allow him to infer with certainty the properties of God and what can be known about him. (Rational Thoughts on the Aims of Natural Things, §8, p. 6)

Several sections later, he uses the metaphor of the mirror to describe the relation between God, the world, and we who look at the mirror:

Now if the world is to be a mirror of the wisdom of God, then we must encounter divine aims in it and perceive the means by which he attains these aims…. And accordingly the connection of things in the world with one another makes it into a mirror of [God’s] wisdom…. (ibid., §14, pp. 18–19; see also German Metaphysics, §1045, p. 802)

Wolff writes as a spokesman for the Enlightenment, and he is emphatic that God reveals his wisdom and power not by intervening in the course of the world by means of miracles, but rather by designing everything in the world as if it were all smoothly-running machines that can achieve his goals without further intervention (see German Metaphysics, §1037, p. 796). This might seem to leave no room at all for the human creation of art, which all eighteenth-century writers will conceive of as a production of genius that is the complete opposite of anything mechanical. But for Wolff our ability to produce works of art is another manifestation of the perfection of the world—of which we are a part—and in turn of God. Wolff draws no distinction between the works of human art that are the subject of the “science of art” and the works of nature, nor for that matter any distinction between the works of human art that are the subject of the “science of art” and those human creations that are the subjects of the “doctrine of morals and statecraft”: they are all forms of perfection which, in a teleological natural theology, all ultimately mirror the perfection of God. And no doubt Wolff hardly thought it necessary to spell out the moral benefits of such a recognition.

2. Gottsched and His Critics: Truth and Imagination

In Wolff’s description of the experience of beauty as the “sensitive cognition of perfection,” cognition is naturally understood as knowledge of truth, so in the first instance Wolff’s formula meant that the experience of beauty is knowledge of truth by means of the senses. Yet Wolff’s conception of perfection was broad enough to include successful adaptation to an intended purpose, and thus in his analysis of our experience of architecture he emphasized our sense of the utility of structures as well as a sensory response to the kind of abstract form that could be considered an object of cognition. But it was the idea that aesthetic experience is a sensory apprehension of truth that dominated in Wolff’s most general statements. After 1720, Wolff’s philosophy enjoyed an influence in most parts of Germany similar to that which the philosophy of Locke exercised in most quarters in Britain by then and in France beginning a decade or two later. So the history of German aesthetics after Wolff is a history of the attempt to find room for a fuller account of aesthetic experience within a framework that privileges the idea of cognition, and only gradually was room found for the idea that the free play of our mental powers, including not only imagination but at least for some authors also emotion, could be equally important. The first round of this struggle was a debate extending from the late 1720s until the 1740s between the Leipzig literary figure Johann Christoph Gottsched and the Zürich critics Johann Jacob Bodmer and Johann Jacob Breitinger, in which the issue was really just how much room there could be for the freedom of imagination within a theory of poetry based on the idea that poetry is a truthful imitation of nature. This might be understood as an early form of debate over how much room there is for the free play of imagination in aesthetic experience.

From a distance of almost three hundred years, the differences between the “critical poetics” (critische Dichtkunst) of Johann Christoph Gottsched and his critics may seem small, because to us they are all so clearly working within the paradigm established by Wolff. Yet in the 1730s and 1740s their debate was intense, not just because Gottsched was a self-important controversialist who clearly enjoyed being on center stage, but also because their debate about the proper scope and power of the imagination was both theoretically interesting and reflected a tectonic shift in German taste. This shift is away from the French classicism represented by Racine and Corneille to the freer forms of Milton and Shakespeare, which in turn lead to the pan-European romanticism of the later eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries.

2.1 Gottsched

Johann Christoph Gottsched (1700–66) was born in Königsberg and studied philosophy there. He began teaching philosophy there in 1723, but fled the Prussian draft the next year and settled in the Saxon city of Leipzig, where Leibniz had earlier studied. Leipzig is only thirty kilometers away from Halle, the Prussian city where Wolff had been teaching for two decades; but Wolff had been driven from Halle in 1722 by the reaction to his argument that the “atheistic” Chinese could arrive at the same moral truths as Christian Europeans by the use of human reason alone. So Gottsched may never have met Wolff. Nevertheless, he had already been exposed to Wolffian philosophy in Königsberg, and his two-volume Erste Gründe der gesamten Weltweisheit (“First Principles of all Philosophy,” 1733–34), which includes an extensive review of natural science as well as logic, metaphysics, and ethics, became the most widely adopted textbook of Wolffian philosophy. However, although he eventually held the professorship in logic and metaphysics in Leipzig, Gottsched was also the professor of poetry, and by far the greatest part of his boundless energy was devoted to literature and philology. In the history of aesthetics, his reputation rests on his Versuch einer critischen Dichtkunst vor die Deutschen (“Essay toward a Critical Poetics for the Germans,” 1730, with further editions in 1737, 1742, and 1751).

The practical aim of the Critical Poetics was to elevate the tone of German popular theater and moderate the Baroque excesses of the upper-class theater by recommending the model of the classical French theater of Racine and Corneille. The theoretical basis of the work was the Wolffian principle that the theater and other forms of poetry (Gottsched had little to say about the emerging medium of the novel) should be used to convey important moral truths through images that would make them accessible and engaging for a wide audience. Gottsched stated his position a year before the Critical Poetics in a speech with the anti-Platonic title “Plays and especially tragedies are not to be banished from a well-ordered republic” where he defined a tragedy as

an instructive moral poem, in which an important action of preeminent persons is imitated and presented on the stage. (Gottsched, Schriften, p. 5)

He revealed the underlying premise of his argument when he observed that

The improvement of the human heart is not a work which can happen in an hour. It requires a thousand preparations, a thousand circumstances, much knowledge, conviction, experiences, examples and encouragement…. (Schriften, p. 9)

It would become a central theme of German Enlightenment aesthetics that even if people know the general truths of morality in some abstract way, the arts can make those truths concrete, alive, and effective for them in a way that nothing else can. The Critical Poetics opens with a brief history of poetry rather than with a statement of theoretical principles, but its first chapter concludes with a similar suggestion that the point of poetry is to make moral truths alive through their presentation in a form accessible to our senses: “The arousal of affects is…much livelier” in tragedy and comedy than anywhere else,

because the visible representation of persons is far more sensibly touching than the best description. The manner of writing is, especially in tragedy, noble and sublime, and it has rather a superfluity than a lack of instructive sayings. Even comedy teaches and instructs the observer, although it arouses laughter. (Schriften, p. 33)

The details of Gottsched’s view emerge in the succeeding chapters on “The character of a poet” and “On the good taste of a poet.”

In the first of these chapters, Gottsched defines a poet as one who produces imitations of nature:

A poet is a skilled imitator of all natural things; and this he has in common with painters, connoisseurs of music, etc. He is however distinguished from these by the manner of his imitation and the means through which he achieves it. The painter imitates nature with brush and colors; the musician through beat and harmony; the poet, however, through a discourse that is rhythmic or otherwise well arranged; or, which is much the same, through a harmonious and good-sounding text, which we call a poem. (Schriften, p. 39)

Gottsched goes on to argue that a poet must have a sharp wit or acumen, a “power of mind which readily perceives the similarity of things and thus can make a comparison among them,” but also that such a “natural gift” is “in itself still raw and imperfect if it is not awaked and cleansed of the incorrectness that clings to it” (Schriften, p. 44).

For the wit of a poet to lead to good results, it must therefore be accompanied with “art and learning,” “extensive scholarship,” and a strong “power of judgment,” including sound moral judgment, because his task is to make moral truths accessible to his audience through his imitations. All of these capacities require cultivation; once they have been cultivated, the artist can better fulfill his double task of imitation: through the imitation of worthy deeds in the medium of his art, he is to encourage his audience to the performance of similarly worthy deeds themselves.

Thus far, Gottsched has not made special use of Wolffian terms. His ensuing discussion of the “good taste of a poet” is more explicitly Wolffian. Gottsched begins by characterizing taste in its literal sense—the taste of food or drink—as a form of representation “that for all of its clarity has nothing distinct in it.” He then states that in its “metaphorical” sense taste is always associated with the “liberal arts and other sensible things,” such as “poetry, oratory, music, painting, and architecture, likewise in dress, gardens, household furnishings, etc.,” not with subjects “where it is a matter of reason alone” and “where it is possible to make the strictest demonstrations from distinctly cognized fundamental truths,” such as “arithmetic and geometry or other sciences” (Schriften, pp. 60–1). Thus “metaphorical as well as ordinary taste has to do only with clear but not entirely distinct concepts of things, and distinguishes from one another the sort of things that one judges in accordance with mere sensation.” However, although it follows from the fact that judgments of taste are made on the basis of “clear but not entirely distinct concepts” that “people who judge merely on the basis of taste” can arrive at opposite conclusions, Gottsched holds that such opposed judgments cannot both be true, and that there must be a true fact of the matter to which one but not the other of them corresponds. In other words, although judgments of taste are made on the basis of clear but indistinct concepts, which is to say sensory perceptions and feelings rather than clear and distinct concepts, they nevertheless

have their ground in the unalterable nature of things themselves; in the concordance of the manifold; in order and harmony. These laws, which are investigated, discovered, and confirmed through lengthy experience and much reflection, are unbreakable and firm, even if someone who judges in accordance with his taste sometimes gives preference to those works which more or less violate them. (Schriften, pp. 62–3)

In Gottsched’s view, judgments of taste, even if they are not made on the basis of explicit knowledge of objective rules about the perfection of things, track those objective rules when they are in fact correct. Experts in the relevant art can make those rules explicit. The “touchstone” for judgments of taste

is thus found in the rules for perfection that are suitable for every particular kind of beautiful things, whether buildings, paintings, music, etc., and which can be distinctly conceived and demonstrated by genuine masters thereof. (Schriften, pp. 64–5)

Thus judgments of taste are not to be attributed to “wit, nor to imagination, nor to memory,” nor to any “sixth sense,” but to “understanding,” although not to “reason” (Schriften, pp. 63–4)), since these judgments track the rules that the experts know but are not explicitly derived from those rules.

And what are the rules in accordance with which judgments of taste are tacitly made? The most general rule is simply that art should imitate nature, so that in order to be beautiful art must imitate what is beautiful in nature. Poets in particular must give truthful but lively descriptions of “natural things,” and in the case of poetry destined for the theater they must give their characters “such words, gestures, and actions” as are “appropriate to their circumstances” (Schriften, p. 81). Gottsched does not interpret this rule to mean that poets can describe only the actual actions and feelings of actual people; of course poetry can present fables as well as history. But for Gottsched a fable is

an occurrence that is possible in certain circumstances although it has not actually taken place, in which a useful moral truth lies hidden. Philosophically one could say that it is a piece of another possible world (Schriften, p. 86)

Insofar as it does not recount an actual event a fable is “probable” rather than “true.” But for Gottsched probability depends upon the consistency of the fictional event with the actual laws of nature, in particular the laws of human nature, even though the circumstances of the fictional world differ in some regard from those of the actual world. In this regard even the fable must still be an imitation of nature with all its perfections. Of course Gottsched’s rider that the fable must contain a hidden moral truth means that it must also be consistent with the real rules of moral perfection, and indeed that the point of poetic indulgence in fable or fiction is precisely to make a moral truth alive and forceful to us by showing that it holds even in a possible world that differs from the actual world in certain of its facts but not in its principles.

2.2 Bodmer and Breitinger

Gottsched’s work became the subject of a “war of the poets” with the Swiss writers Johann Jacob Bodmer and Johann Jacob Breitinger. Bodmer (1698–1783) taught Swiss history in Zürich for forty years, advocated the works of Dante and Shakespeare, and translated Milton’s Paradise Lost into German prose. Breitinger (1701–76) taught Greek, Hebrew, logic, and rhetoric, and edited the works of the German Baroque poet Martin Opitz. Together, they edited Die Discourse der Mahlern (“The Discourse of the Painters”), Switzerland’s first “moral weekly” based on the model of The Spectator, from 1721–23. These essays did not concern painting at all or even general issues about the arts very much—the name merely reflects their use of the names of famous painters as pseudonymous signatures for their articles—although one of Bodmer’s articles on Opitz celebrated the imagination as the key to poetic success: “A writer such as our Opitz who has enriched and filled the imagination with images of things can write poetry that is lively and natural” and by “the strength of his imagination bring back all the ideas that he had when he was really in love, empathetic, depressed, or enraged” (Die Discourse der Mahlern, Erster Theil, XIX Discourse, cited from Dichtungstheorien der Aufklärung, p. 13).

The emphasis on the imagination seems to have been the central issue in Bodmer and Breitinger’s dispute with Gottsched, which came to a head in Breitinger’s own Critische Dichtkunst, published in 1740 with a forward by Bodmer. Because they shared with Gottsched the general assumption that art is based on the imitation of nature and has the goal of making important moral truths come alive for us, it is hard to see exactly what divided the two sides in this dispute, but the key seems to lie in their conception of poetic fables. As we saw, Gottsched believed that a poetic fable describes events in a possible rather than in the actual world, but he insists that the laws of nature and human nature must remain constant: thus a poetic fable can depict a hero who never existed, and make some moral truth alive to us through its depiction of this possible rather than actual hero, but everything about this hero and his world should still be natural. Bodmer and Breitinger, however, as advocates of Shakespeare and Milton, believed that important moral truths could be made alive to us through works of the poetic imagination that depart more drastically from actual nature and history. They held that novelty is an especially powerful source of aesthetic pleasure and thus an especially powerful means of making moral truths come alive, and for this reason they concluded that “since the most ancient times” the fable has been the means “for bringing the most useful but at the same time best known moral truths home to us in a pleasing way” (Breitinger, Critische Dichtkunst, cited from Dichtungstheorien der Aufklärung, p. 42). Their idea is that the more imaginative inventions of the poets—the Satan of Milton or the Caliban of Shakespeare rather than the more human heroes of Racine and Corneille admired by Gottsched—make moral truths appear more alive precisely by their attention-grabbing departure from the familiar creatures of the real world. Thus Bodmer and Breitinger thought that the moralistic aim of poetry that they accepted in common with Gottsched could be better achieved by a freer use of the imagination in poetry than Gottsched was prepared to allow. They agreed in their philosophical analysis of the ends of art but disagreed in their empirical assessment of its most effective means.

By their advocacy of Milton and Shakespeare, the most imaginative poets of the preceding century, Bodmer and Breitinger prepared the way for subsequent artistic movements that emphasized the freedom of the imagination, even while they continued to work within the conceptual framework of Wolffian perfectionism. The same is true for two professional philosophers of the time who also worked within the Wolffian framework but took at least one step towards an aesthetic theory that could subsequently give the play of the mental powers equal importance with the sensible representation of truth by treating the aesthetic qualities of representations as parallel to rather than identical with their purely cognitive qualities. So let us now turn to the innovations of Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten and his disciple and ally, Georg Friedrich Meier. Meier actually responded directly to Gottsched in a number of polemics, but since his views were based largely—although not entirely—on Baumgarten’s, it will be better to treat them together than to treat Meier now.

3. Baumgarten and Meier: Aesthetics as the Analogue of Rational Cognition

Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten (1714–1762), as previously mentioned, introduced the term “aesthetics” in his 1735 thesis Meditationes philosophicae de nonnullis ad poema pertinentibus (“Philosophical meditations pertaining to some matters concerning poetry”). Baumgarten’s new name for the discipline did not, however, signify a complete break with earlier philosophical views, that is, with the perfectionist aesthetics of Leibniz and Wolff. By introducing the concept of “analogue of reason” Baumgarten did however make one key departure from the Wolffian model that would eventually open the way for much more radical reconceptions of aesthetic experience in Germany; Baumgarten would also introduce an emphasis on the emotional impact of art that is lacking in Wolff. But Baumgarten nevertheless remained more a Moses who glimpsed the new theory from the shores of Wolffianism than a Joshua who conquered the new aesthetic territory.

3.1 Baumgarten

Baumgarten was the son of a Pietist minister from Berlin, but was orphaned by the time he was eight. He followed his older brother Jacob Sigismund (who would become a prominent theologian and historian of religion) to Halle when he was thirteen. The Baumgartens thus arrived in Halle just after Wolff had been expelled and the study of his philosophy banned, although the ban was less strictly enforced at the famous Pietist orphanage and school in Halle (the Franckesche Stift) where they went first than at the university. The younger Baumgarten started at the university at sixteen (in 1730), and studied theology, philology, poetry, rhetoric, and philosophy, especially Leibniz, whose philosophy unlike that of Wolff had not been banned. He began teaching there himself in 1735, upon the acceptance of his thesis on poetry, and published his Metaphysics in 1739. In 1740, the same year as he published his Ethics, he was called to a professorship—or more precisely, ordered to accept it—at another Prussian university, in Frankfurt an der Oder. Georg Friedrich Meier (1718–1777), who had been studying with Baumgarten, took over his classes and was himself appointed professor at Halle in 1746.

Having published the textbooks for his metaphysics and ethics classes (which Kant would still use decades later), Baumgarten then returned to aesthetics, and began working on a major treatise in 1742. The first volume of his Aesthetica appeared in 1750. It was written in Latin, like Baumgarten’s other works, and was the first work ever to use the name of the new discipline as a title. The next year, however, Baumgarten’s health began to decline, and a second volume of the Aesthetica came out only in 1758, under pressure from the publisher. The two volumes cover just under a third of Baumgarten’s original plan, although they may have included the most original part of the plan. Meanwhile, Meier had been publishing profusely in Halle since the early 1740s, with works in or relevant to aesthetics including a Theoretical Doctrine of the Emotions in 1744, a twenty-five part Evaluation of Gottsched’s Poetics collected in book form in 1747, a three-volume Foundations of the Beautiful Sciences from 1748–1750, and a condensation of the latter, the Extract from the Foundations of the Beautiful Arts and Sciences in 1757. (Meier also published massive textbooks in logic, metaphysics, and ethics, as well as a memoir of Baumgarten and a German translation of Baumgarten’s Latin Metaphysics). Although Meier thus published his main treatise in aesthetics before Baumgarten did, he claimed it was based on Baumgarten’s lectures, and always presented himself as a disciple of Baumgarten.

Baumgarten’s Meditations on Poetry conclude with his famous introduction of the term “aesthetics”: “The Greek philosophers and the Church fathers have always carefully distinguished between the aistheta and the noeta,” that is, between objects of sense and objects of thought, and while the latter, that is, “what can be cognized through the higher faculty” of mind, are “the object of logic, the aistheta are the subject of the episteme aisthetike or AESTHETICS,” the science of perception (Meditationes, §CXVI, p. 86). But this work says nothing about in what way the new discipline might be a general science of perception, and analyzes only the nature of poetry and our experience of it. We will first see what is novel in Baumgarten’s theory of poetry, and then turn to his larger work to see what it suggests about the general character of the new discipline. Baumgarten begins the work with a series of definitions, defining “discourse” as a “series of words that bring to mind [intelligimus] connected representations,” “sensible representations” as ones “received through the lower part of the cognitive faculty,” “sensible discourse” as a “discourse of sensible representations,” and finally a “poem” as a “perfect sensible discourse.” The parts of sensible discourse are “(1) sensible representations, (2) their interconnections, and (3) the words, or the articulate sounds which are represented by the letters and which symbolize the words,” and sensible discourse is “directed toward the apprehension of sensible discourse” (Meditationes, §§I–IX, pp. 6–10). The key thoughts in this series of definitions is that poetry is aimed not just at conveying truth, but at conveying it by means of “sensible representations,” or imagery drawn from the senses, and that the “perfection” of a poem may lie in both its medium, that is, the words its uses, and the imagery it arouses, and indeed in the relationship between these two dimensions. Thus Baumgarten introduces the idea that the sensible imagery a work of art arouses is not just a medium, more or less perfect, for conveying truth, but a locus of perfection in its own right. This is a view that was barely hinted at by Wolff, and not at all in his discussion of imitation as the perfection of mimetic arts, but only in his discussion of mixed arts like architecture, where he took into account the appearance as well as the function of structural elements.

As he continues Baumgarten remains within the Wolffian framework by defining sensible representations as clear rather than obscure—thus he rejects poetry that aims at obscurity for its own sake (Meditationes, §XIII, p. 14)—but confused rather than distinct, and thus as conveying more representations packed together rather than fewer that are neatly separated. Or as he puts it, poems aim for extensive rather than intensive clarity, conveying more rather than less information but without separating the images from each other, as would be aimed for in scientific or “logical” discourse (Meditationes, §§XVI–XVII, p. 16). And since individuals are more fully determined, or more fully characterized, than any abstraction, “particular representations are in the highest degree poetic” (Meditationes, §XIX, p. 18): poetry achieves its goal of arousing a density of images by portraying individuals in particular circumstances rather than by trafficking in generalities and abstractions. Thus Baumgarten turns what is a vice in scientific knowledge—connoting too many ideas without clearly distinguishing among them—into the paradigm virtue of poetry.

What is particularly striking is that he then uses what we might call this quantitative conception of the aim of poetry, that it arouse more and denser rather than fewer and more clearly separated images, as the basis for an argument that poetry should be emotionally affecting. First he argues that poetry aims to arouse our affects or engage our emotions simply because they are sensible:

Since affects are more notable degrees of pain and pleasure, their sensible representations are given in representing something to oneself confusedly as good or bad, and thus they determine poetic representations, and to arouse affects is poetic. (Meditationes, §XXV, p. 24)

But then he goes on to give an explicitly quantitative argument for this conclusion:

The same can be demonstrated by this reasoning also: we represent more in those things which we represent as good and bad for us than if we do not so represent them; therefore representations of things which are confusedly exhibited as good or bad for us are extensively clearer than if they were not so displayed, hence they are more poetic. Now such representations are motions of the affects, hence to arouse affects is poetic. (Meditationes, §XXVI, pp. 24–6)

Baumgarten thus innovates within the formal structure of Wolffian philosophy in order to accommodate a non-cognitivist aspect of the aims of art. Indeed, his emphasis on the poetic arousal of emotion has recently been argued to be a subtle Pietist response to Wolffian intellectualism. This aspect of Baumgarten’s early poetics clearly impressed his student Meier, who devoted one of his earliest books to a Theoretical Doctrine of the Emotions, or “Gemüthsbewegungen,” literally, “movements of the mind.” Meier states that

Aesthetics is in general the science of sensible cognition. This science concerns itself with everything that can be assigned in more detail to sensible cognition and to its presentation. Now since the passions have a strong influence on sensible cognition and its presentation, aesthetics for its part can rightly demand a theory of the emotions. (Meier, Theoretische Lehre der Gemüthsbewegungen, §7, p. 7)

However, since Baumgarten himself does not give as much emphasis to the emotional aspect of the experience of art in his Aesthetica as his earlier Meditations might lead us to expect, perhaps because it remained incomplete, we will return to Meier’s development of this theme only after we have considered Baumgarten’s mature work.

Before we can turn to the Aesthetica, however, we must look at some of the key definitions Baumgarten lays down in the chapter on “Empirical Psychology” in his Metaphysics. Baumgarten begins by defining the “inferior” or “lower faculty of cognition” as that which works with sensible representations, which are in turn “indistinct, that is, obscure or confused” (Metaphysik, §§382–3, pp. 115–16). Sensible representations can be developed in either of two ways, however: either with increasing clarity of their component “marks,” in which case they acquire “greater clarity” (claritas intensive maior), or with increasing “multitude of marks,” in which case they acquire “liveliness” (vividitas, claritas extensive maior, cogitationum nitor) (Nitor means brightness or splendor). The former development of cognition leads to proofs, while what makes a perception lively is a “painterly” form of clarity (eine malende), thus one that consists in richness of imagery rather than analytical clarity (Metaphysik, §393, p. 119). It is this liveliness rather than probative clarity which is the basis of aesthetic experience.

Baumgarten then defines judgment as the representation of the perfection or imperfection of things. Judgment is initially divided into “practical” judgment, the object of which is “things foreseen,” and “theoretical judgment,” which concerns everything else (Metaphysik, §451, p. 139). Theoretical judgment is in turn divided into that which is distinct and that which is rather sensible, and the “ability to judge sensibly is taste in the broad,” that is, aesthetic sense. So taste is the ability to judge perfections and imperfections sensibly rather than intellectually. Perfections and imperfections, it should be noted, are defined entirely formally as the “agreement or disagreement” of the “manifold of a thing” (Metaphysik, §452, p. 139). Next, Baumgarten divides the sensible representation or judgment of perfections and imperfections into the “intuitive” and the “symbolic,” that is, those which consist in sensible properties directly and those which consist in sensible properties taken as symbols of something else, and then adds that the sensible cognition of a perfection is pleasing and that of its imperfection displeasing. If I have sensible cognition neither of an object’s perfection nor its imperfection, then it is indifferent to me (Metaphysik, §478, p. 150). Finally, Baumgarten states that beauty is perfection perceived by means of the senses rather than by the pure intellect (Metaphysik, §488, pp. 154–5).

Thus far, then, Baumgarten has remained within the conceptual framework of Wolff. One key addition to Wolff that he makes in the Metaphysics, however, is the concept of the analogon rationis, the “analogue of reason.” He writes:

I cognize the interconnection of some things distinctly, and of others indistinctly, consequently I have the faculty for both. Consequently I have an understanding, for insight into the connections of things, that is, reason (ratio); and a faculty for indistinct insight into the connections of things, which consists of the following: 1) the sensible faculty for insight into the concordances among things, thus sensible wit; 2) the sensible faculty for cognizing the differences among things, thus sensible acumen; 3) sensible memory; 4) the faculty of invention; 5) the faculty of sensible judgment and taste together with the judgment of the senses; 6) the expectation of similar cases; and 7) the faculty of sensible designation. All of these lower faculties of cognition, in so far as they represent the connections among things, and in this respect are similar to reason, comprise that which is similar to reason (analogon rationis), or the sum of all the cognitive faculties that represent the connections among things indistinctly. (Metaphysik, §468, p. 146)

Baumgarten’s departure from Wolff here may be subtle, but his idea is that the use of a broad range of our mental capacities for dealing with sensory representations and imagery is not an inferior and provisional substitute for reason and its logical and scientific analysis, but something parallel to reason. Moreover, this complex of human mental powers is productive of pleasure, through the sensible representation of perfection, in its own right. Baumgarten has not yet introduced the idea that aesthetic pleasure comes from the free play of our mental powers, but he has relaxed the grip of the assumption that aesthetic response is a straightforward case of cognition.

The potential of this idea finally begins to emerge in the Aesthetica. Taking up where the Meditations had left off, Baumgarten begins the “Prolegomena” of this work with his famous definition of aesthetics:

Aesthetics (the theory of the liberal arts, the logic of the lower capacities of cognition [gnoseologia inferior], the art of thinking beautifully, the art of the analogon rationis) is the science of sensible cognition. (Aesthetica, §1)

Baumgarten’s list of synonyms may be confusing, for it includes both traditional and novel designations of his subject matter. He explains in the preface to the second edition of the Metaphysics that he

adds synonymous designations from other authors in parentheses alongside [his own] defining expressions so that the latter might more easily be understood. (Vorreden zur Metaphysik, p. 43)

Yet it is clear that he means his own new science to be broader in scope than some of the more traditional definitions he brackets: he intends to provide a general science of sensible cognition rather than just a theory of the fine arts or our taste for them. Although Baumgarten makes some broad claims for the new science, this is not where the novelty of the Aesthetica lies, for at least in the extant part of the work Baumgarten never actually develops this theme. Instead, the innovation comes at the beginning of the first chapter of the work, when Baumgarten writes that

The aim of aesthetics is the perfection of sensible cognition as such, that is, beauty, while its imperfection as such, that is, ugliness, is to be avoided. (Aesthetica, §14)

Baumgarten’s departure from Wolff’s formula that beauty is the sensitive cognition of perfection may easily be overlooked, but in his transformation of that into his own formula that beauty is the perfection of sensitive cognition he is saying that beauty lies not—or as his subsequent practice suggests, not just—in the representation of some objective perfection in a form accessible to our senses, but rather—or also—in the exploitation of the specific possibilities of sensible representation for their own sake. In other words, there is potential for beauty in the form of a work as well as in its content because its form can be pleasing to our complex capacity for sensible representation—the analogon rationis—just as its content can be pleasing to our theoretical or practical reason itself. The satisfaction of those mental powers summed up in the analogon rationis is a source of pleasure in its own right.

What does this mean in practice? Baumgarten’s recognition of the perfection of sensible cognition as well as the perfection of what is represented as a distinct source of pleasure in beauty leads him to recognize not just one but in fact three different potential sources of beauty in a work of art: “the harmony of the thoughts insofar as we abstract from their order and their signs,” or means of expression; “the harmony of the order in which we meditate upon the beautifully thought content,” and “the harmony of the signs” or means of expression “among themselves and with the content and the order of the content” (Aesthetica, §§18–20). Here Baumgarten is importing the traditional rhetorical concepts of inventio, dispositio and elocutio into his system, and conceiving of the latter two, the harmony of the thoughts and the harmony of the expression with the thoughts, as the dimensions in which the potentials for pleasure within our distinctively sensible manner of representing and thinking are realized. He thus recognizes those aspects of works of art, which were touched upon only in passing by Wolff and Gottsched, as sources of pleasure internal to works of art that are equally significant with the pleasure that arises from the content of works, considered as representations of perfections outside of the works themselves. The three main sections of Baumgarten’s planned project, the “heuristic,” “methodology,” and “semiotics” were intended to cover these three sources of pleasure in works of art. (see Aesthetica, §13).

As it happened, Baumgarten did not live to complete even the first of these three parts. Further, the material he did complete suggests that he may have been more successful in making conceptual space for the appreciation of the particularly sensible aspects of art than in substantively changing how art is actually experienced. What Baumgarten does is to take a list of the categories of the perfections of the content of logical or scientific cognition and construct a parallel list by adding the adjective “sensible” to them to arrive at a list of sensible or aesthetic perfections (and Meier makes a similar addition to lists of the perfections of the organization and expression of scientific knowledge). Nevertheless, some of Baumgarten’s categories of aesthetic qualities are important. The list of the perfections of every kind of cognition that Baumgarten gives in the first chapter of the Aesthetica is “wealth, magnitude, truth, clarity, and liveliness” (ubertas, magnitudo, veritas, claritas, certitudo et vita cognitionis), and thus beauty consists in the aesthetic versions of these perfections (Aesthetica, §§22–25).

However, in his classroom lectures on the Aesthetica, Baumgarten particularly emphasized the moral magnitude of the subject matter of works of art as a major source of our pleasure in them, and there mentions that works of art will therefore be touching, that is to say, emotionally moving. Baumgarten stressed that the moral content of a work of art is only one source of beauty, and that a work of art can be beautiful without any moral grandeur. “[A]esthetic dignity,” he claimed, “belongs to aesthetic magnitude as a part to the whole,” but if a work of art represents moral agents then it cannot be maximally beautiful without representing moral dignity, and it certainly cannot be beautiful if it conveys an attitude contrary to morality. What is important here, finally, is the moral standing of what is contained in the work of art, not the actual morality of the artist himself.

3.2 Meier

Baumgarten did not extensively develop his comment that art must be touching, but this became central to Meier’s aesthetics. In his early work on the emotions, Meier emphasized that aesthetics should deal with the passions because they have a “strong influence on sensible cognition.” His position is not just that the passions have influence on sensible cognition, but that they are themselves a great source of sensible pleasure, and that it is therefore part of the aim of art to arouse them. Meier analyzes the passions, in spite of their name (the German term Leidenschaft, like the Latin passio, etymologically means something that happens to someone rather than something that one does, an actio), as a form of mental activity: they are “efforts or strivings of the soul” that result in a desire or an aversion, more precisely particularly strong and firm desires or aversions (Meier, Gemüthsbewegungen, §27, p. 30). This might lead one to expect that desires and aversions can be sources of great pleasure or displeasure, depending upon whether they are realized or not, but Meier goes on to argue that “all emotions, the disagreeable ones not excluded, produce a gratification,” because they are active states or perfections of the soul, and “whenever the soul feels a perfection in itself, it is sensitive of a gratification.” And because they are so strong, the passions, whether desires or aversions, are those among our mental states that make us most aware of our own mental activity, and therefore are actually the strongest source of pleasure for us:

in the passions almost the entire lower power of cognition and desire is engaged, that is, almost the entire lower part of our soul. Thus in the emotions the soul is sensitive of the strength of its powers, that is, of its perfection. It must therefore necessarily be gratified with its own strength. It must be joyous when it feels as much as it can. (Gemüthsbewegungen, §89, p. 124)

In another essay Meier identifies this feeling of joy at the activity of our own soul with the category of the “life of cognition,” and thus makes it a central source of our pleasure in art.

Living cognition becomes alive through the sensible representations. The lower powers of the soul, the desires and aversions, constitute the life of a cognition. Everything that leaves our powers in peace when we cognize it is a dead cognition. (Meier, “Daß das Wesen der Dichtkunst in unserer Natur gegründet ist” (“That the essence of poetry is grounded in our nature”), in Meier, Frühe Schriften, Part 3, pp. 160–4, at p. 162)

Art aims for the opposite. Indeed, Meier continues that it is by arousing our passions that art achieves its goal of a clear but confused, that is, manifold but densely packed, cognition. For Meier, moving our emotions is not just some small part of the beauty of art, as Baumgarten seems to suggest. Instead, the arousal of our emotions, even ones that considered by themselves should be disagreeable, is the strongest source of the pleasure at which art aims because it is the most intense form of mental activity.

Meier thus departed from the strictly cognitivist aesthetics of Wolff and connected what he had learned from Baumgarten with the passionate aesthetics of the French Abbé Du Bos. With his connection of the pleasure in experiencing emotions to the pleasure of experiencing mental activity as such he brought Wolffian aesthetics a step closer to contemporary British aesthetics. Meier thereby prepared the way for the tremendous influence that British aesthetics would have in Germany by the end of the 1750s. But while Meier stressed the activity of the mind and Baumgarten argued that aesthetic experience is based in an analogue of reason, not reason itself, neither was quite ready to introduce the idea of the free play of our mental powers as the fundamental source of our pleasure in aesthetic experience. Baumgarten mentions play once, but only to recommend that children be allowed to play in order to develop their cognitive powers, not as the fundamental source of mature aesthetic pleasure (Poppe, §55, p. 102). Baumgarten also at least once characterizes the mental state of aesthetic experience as a form of harmony: he says that the “aestheticodogmatic” thinker (by which he means a thinker aiming to express a true doctrine aesthetically )

should in his striving for truth put that before the eyes of his audience the truth of which he has known with certitude and which can be represented in its aesthetic truth on the basis of the harmony between the upper and lower faculties of cognition. ( Aesthetica, §573; Schweizer, pp. 254–5)

But the occurrence of this comment in the context of Baumgarten’s discussion of aesthetic truth (or of how truths can be presented in ways agreeable to the senses) makes clear that with this reference to “harmony” between the lower and upper faculties of cognition he is not quite introducing the idea of a free play between them. That idea would be decisively introduced into German aesthetics only with Kant’s unique synthesis of the preceding German tradition with the British tradition. Before that was to happen, however, the ideas, emphasized more by Meier although already suggested by Baumgarten, that art aims at arousing our emotions and at the pleasurable activity of the mind, and at the former as an instance of the latter, would be further developed by an intervening generation of German thinkers. Let us now turn to some of those.

4. Mendelssohn, Winckelmann, and Lessing: Mixed Emotions

4.1 Mendelssohn

In a review of Meier’s 1757 Extract from the Foundations of all fine Arts and Sciences, Moses Mendelssohn (1729–86) rejected what he took to be the excessively abstract and a priori method of Baumgarten and Meier, writing that:

Just as little as the philosopher can discover the appearances of nature, without examples from experience, merely through a priori inferences, so little can he establish appearances in the beautiful world, if one can thus express oneself, without diligent observations. The securest path of all, just as in the theory of nature, is this: One must assume certain experiences, explain their ground through an hypothesis, then test this hypothesis against experiences from a quite different species, and only assume those hypotheses to be general principles which have thus held their ground; one must finally seek to explain these principles in the theory of nature through the nature of bodies and motion, but in aesthetics through the nature of the lower powers of our soul. (Review of Meier, pp. 197–8)

Yet the reference to the “lower powers of the soul” in the final line of the quotation suggests that Mendelssohn will continue to work within the general paradigm of Wolffian philosophy himself. He certainly does, but what he aims to do is to show that the perfections that can be realized in aesthetic experience are both more positive and more complicated than those recognized by Baumgarten. Mendelssohn’s method allows him to recognize that all of our aesthetic experiences draw on a range of mental and even physical resources, and that because of this many aesthetic experiences can be understood only as “mixed” rather than simple feelings. Mendelssohn’s analysis of the complexity of aesthetic experience places more emphasis on the powers of mind and body involved in such experience than on the objective perfections that art may represent or nature contain. His account further prepares the ground for the full-blown theory of aesthetic experience as based in a play of our powers that will subsequently be achieved by Kant and Schiller. But in his emphasis on the role of the body as well as the mind in aesthetic experience, Mendelssohn goes beyond his successors.

Mendelssohn followed his rabbi from Dessau to Berlin at the age of fourteen. At twenty-one, he became a tutor in the home of a Jewish silk manufacturer, at twenty-five his accountant, subsequently his manager, and finally a partner in the business, in which he would work full-time for the rest of his life. But by twenty-five Mendelssohn had also mastered not only literary German but Greek, Latin, French, and English as well as a vast range of literature and philosophy in all those languages. He had also become friends with the critic and playwright Gotthold Ephraim Lessing and the writer and publisher Friedrich Nicolai, and begun an active publishing career. In 1755, before he turned twenty-six, Mendelssohn published Philosophical Dialogues on the model of Shaftesbury, the epistolary On Sentiments, and, with Lessing, Pope, a Metaphysician! The next year he published Thoughts on Probability and a translation of Rousseau’s second discourse On the Origins of Inequality. From 1756 to 1759 he collaborated with Lessing and Nicolai on the Library of Fine Sciences and Liberal Arts, for which he wrote two dozen reviews of new works in aesthetics and literature, and from 1759 to 1765 he contributed nearly one hundred reviews to Nicolai’s Letters concerning the newest Literature, discussing works not only in aesthetics and literature but also metaphysics, mathematics, natural science, and politics (Gesammelte Schriften, vol. 5.1 (1991), pp. 5–676). In 1761 he published the first edition of his Philosophical Writings, mostly on aesthetics, and in 1763 he took first place in a Prussian Academy of Sciences essay competition for an essay on Evidence in Metaphysical Sciences, beating out the entry by Kant. But as a Jew, he was denied entrance to the Academy by the “enlightened” Frederick the Great, even though he had the strong support of its members. In 1767, Mendelssohn published Phaedo: or on the Immortality of the Soul, loosely based on Plato’s dialogue of the same name, an immensely popular work. In the 1770s, after the onset of a “nervous debility” that he would henceforth claim prevented him from serious philosophical work, Mendelssohn began a translation of the Pentatuech and Psalms into modern German (but printed in Hebrew characters) that he hoped would preserve the Jewish religion while simultaneously facilitating the assimilation of Jews into German culture and society. His masterpiece Jerusalem, or on Religious Power and Judaism, in which he argued for the civil rights of the Jews by arguing that the state had no right to recognize any religion at all and therefore must allow all religions freedom from interference, was published in 1783. In 1785, he returned to philosophy one last time with Morning Lessons, a magisterial summary of his own version of Wolffianism. By this time, however, he was caught up in a strenuous controversy with the fideist philosopher Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi over whether his lifelong friend Lessing had been a Spinozist. In the midst of this controversy he died of in January, 1786, at the age of fifty-six.

Mendelssohn worked within the framework of Wolffian metaphysics and psychology, and thus he accepted the definition of sensible perception as clear but confused cognition. He accepted Wolff’s explanation that pleasure arises in the sensible perception of perfection, but also Baumgarten’s transformation of that formula into the explanation of beauty as the perfection of sensible cognition: in Mendelssohn’s terms, “the essence of the fine arts and sciences consists in an artful, sensibly perfect representation or in a sensible perfection represented by art” (“On the Main Principles of the Fine Arts and Sciences” (1757), Philosophical Writings, pp. 172–3). But Mendelssohn vigorously rejected any interpretation of the Wolffian premise according to which the confusion of sensible perception itself could be the source of our pleasure in it. For Mendelssohn, any “pure gratification of the soul must be grounded in the positive powers of our soul and not in its incapacity, not in the limitation of those original powers” (On Sentiments, Fourth Letter; Philosophical Writings, p. 19). Further, “neither fully distinct nor fully obscure concepts are compatible with the feeling of beauty”: beauty requires that an object offer enough “extensive clarity,” that is, richness and variety, to stimulate us, but enough unity so that we can easily take it in as a whole (On Sentiments, Third Letter, Philosophical Writings, pp. 14–15). Mendelssohn’s explicit thesis is that while the parts of an object must be distinct enough to allow one to have a sense of their variety but dense enough to allow one to grasp them together with equilibrium and proportion, it is the latter that is the source of our pleasure. It might seem a stretch to read him as also suggesting that it is the play of the mind back and forth between its perception of the parts and its grasp of the whole that is pleasant. But he will argue that the exercise of various of our powers, indeed as we are about to see bodily as well as mental powers, is itself a perfection that we enjoy, so this might at least point toward the idea that the source of pleasure in beauty is the free play of the those powers.

While rejecting any interpretation of obscurity or confusion as itself the source of our pleasure in beauty (On Sentiments, note h; Philosophical Writings, p. 79), Mendelssohn also rejects the idea of the Abbé Du Bos (and of Meier’s theory of the emotions) that the mere arousal of feelings as such is the aim of art (On Sentiments, Conclusion; Philosophical Writings, p. 71), as well as the idea of Charles Batteux that “the imitation of nature is the general means by which the fine arts please us, and [that] it is possible to derive all particular rules of the fine arts and sciences from this single principle” (“On the Main Principles of the Fine Arts and Sciences”, Philosophical Writings, p. 170). Yet Mendelssohn no more rejects the idea that works of art do arouse our emotions and that they are, at least in many cases, imitations of nature than he rejects the idea that the perception of perfection and the perfection of perception is central to our experience of beauty and other aesthetic properties. So how does he fit all of these ideas together into his own distinctive theory?

Mendelssohn never presented his aesthetic theory in a full-length treatise. His most systematic presentation, the 1757 essay “On the Main Principles of the Fine Arts and Sciences,” discusses only three out of the four axes of potential perfection that he finds in the complete aesthetic experience. We therefore need to supplement what we can glean from this essay with suggestions from On Sentiments and the Rhapsody, or addition to the Letters on Sentiments that he added to his 1761 collection. The four axes that Mendelssohn identifies are the perfection in the object of the aesthetic experience, typically the perfection of what is depicted by a work of art but not always, since some arts, such as music and architecture, and all of nature are not mimetic at all; the perfection of our own perceptual capacities in the experience of an object, the “perfection of sensible cognition” that he adopted from Baumgarten; the perfection of our bodily condition that can be produced through the effect of our mental condition on our body, a dimension lacking from all previous accounts in the German rationalist tradition but perhaps inspired by Mendelssohn’s acquaintance with Edmund Burke’s account of the physiology of our feelings of the beautiful and the sublime (itself perhaps building upon the common property of David Hartley’s 1749 Observations on Man); and finally, the perfection of the artistry that has gone into the production of an object, whether human artistry in the case of a work of art or divine artistry in the case of the beauties of nature. Perfection along any of these axes is a potential source of pleasure in the experience of an object, and the effect of these sources of pleasure can be additive, each increasing our pleasure in the same object. But these multiple dimensions to our pleasure in objects also create the possibility of the “mixed emotions” that we experience in the artistic representation of unpleasant or tragic objects, because in those cases our pleasure in the mental activity stimulated by the work of art, the pleasant effect of that on the body, and our admiration of the artistry that has gone into the object can outweigh any pain associated with the depicted content of the work.

Mendelssohn’s characterization of the intrinsic perfection of objects in nature and thus of the objects depicted in representational art follows in the path already marked out by Wolff: the perfection of an object lies in the order, symmetry, and rational coherence of its parts, and its beauty lies in that perfection insofar as it can be grasped in sensible cognition. Thus in On Sentiments Mendelssohn writes that we

call the structure of the world beautiful in the proper sense of the term when the imagination orders its chief parts in as splendid a symmetry as that of the order that reason and perception teach us that they possess outside us. (On Sentiments, Third Letter; Philosophical Writings, p. 15)

In the case of natural objects, this order is comprised by both the internal organization of an object to suit its overall goal and the part that the particular object plays in nature as a whole. In the “Main Principles,” Mendelssohn goes beyond this formalistic characterization of perfection and offers a more concrete list of the kinds of things that count as perfections in objects, whether objects in nature enjoyed in their own right or objects in nature enjoyed through the artistic depiction of them, which provide “the first level of satisfaction and dissatisfaction which alternately accompany all our representations.” Here he says that

Everything capable of being represented to the senses as a perfection could also present an object of beauty. Belonging here are all the perfections of external forms, that is, the lines, surfaces, and bodies and their movements and changes; the harmony of the multiple sounds and colors; the order in the parts of a whole, their similarity, variety, and harmony; their transposition and transformation into other forms; all the capabilities of our soul, all the skills of our body. Even the perfections of our external state (under which honor, comfort, and riches are to be understood) cannot be excepted from this if they are fit to be represented in a way that is apparent to the senses. (“Main Principles”: Philosophical Writings, p. 172)

When Mendelssohn refers to the capabilities of our soul and the skills of our body here, he is referring to them as objects for depiction or description in a work of art, thus as part of the content of works of art. This is how he fits into his model the representation of human intentions, actions, and responses to them, which are the subject matter of most mimetic art.

The next axis of perfection that Mendelssohn considers is the state of our mind in response to perfection or imperfection in a real or represented object. His clearest treatment of this may come in the Rhapsody, which begins by taking up the question of how we can be “powerfully attracted to the representation” of something unpleasant. Mendelssohn answers this question this by saying that

Each individual representation stands in a twofold relation. It is related, at once, to the matter before it as its object (of which it is a picture or copy) and then to the soul or the thinking subject (of which it constitutes a determination). As a determination of the soul, many a representation can have something pleasant about it although, as a picture of the object, it is accompanied by disapproval and a feeling of repugnance. (Rhapsody; Philosophical Writings, p. 132)

Several points about this passage need comment. First, while by “representation” (Vorstellung) here Mendelssohn means a mental state that represents something other than itself and not an external object such as a painting or a poem that depicts or describes something, a mental representation can of course indirectly represent an external object that is not directly present to it but is indirectly presented to it by an external representation such as a painting or a poem which is its direct external object, and that is indeed how artistic representation typically works. Second, while Mendelssohn here refers to a mental representation as a “determination” (Bestimmung) or property of the mind, his further discussion suggests that he is actually thinking of representation as a kind of mental activity, an activity involving our capacities for both knowing and desiring, and that we enjoy representation because we enjoy mental activity. Thus he continues that while “elements of perfection” in a thing are “satisfying and comfortable to us” while “elements of imperfection…are perceived with dissatisfaction,”

In relation to the thinking subject, the soul, on the other hand, perceiving and cognizing the features as well as testifying to enjoying them or not constitutes something actual [Sachliches] that is posited in the soul, an affirmative determination of the soul. Hence every representation, at least in relation to the subject, as an affirmative predicate of the thinking entity, must have something about it that we like. For even the picture of the deficiency of the object, just like the expression of discontent with it, are not deficiencies on the part of the thinking entity, but rather affirmative and actual determinations of it….considered as a representation, a picture within us that engages the soul’s capacities of knowing and desiring, the representation of what is evil is itself an element of the soul’s perfection and brings with it something quite pleasant that we by no means would prefer not to feel than to feel. (Rhapsody; Philosophical Writings, pp. 133–4)

It is striking how Mendelssohn writes here in gerundives and infinitives rather than in substantives in order to convey a sense of mental activity: recognizing and approving or even disapproving are actions of the mind in knowing and desiring. We enjoy that mental activity, even when it is stimulated by the representation of something of which we disapprove, and we enjoy the representation even of something evil as long as our pleasure in the activity of representing is not overwhelmed by disapproval of the object of the representation.

The contrast between perfection or imperfection in the content of a representation and the enjoyable activity of the mind in representing that content is the heart of Mendelssohn’s theory, so we can interrupt our catalogue of all four of the axes of perfection that he recognizes for some comments on this contrast. The first thing to be noticed is that Mendelssohn here emphasizes the engagement of our powers of both knowing and desiring in aesthetic experience, not merely the power of knowing. This gives him room to add an emphasis on our enjoyment of the arousal of our emotions to Baumgarten’s emphasis on our enjoyment of the perfection of sensible cognition. Now, as we saw, Baumgarten in fact made room for this dimension of aesthetic experience in his early Meditations on Poetry, even though he did not take it up again in the Aesthetica, and Meier emphasized it in several of his works. But Mendelssohn adds a crucial point here, leading to a fundamental revision in the significance of artistic imitation: in order for us to enjoy the mixed emotions in a pleasing representation of something that is objectively displeasing, our sense of the difference between the represented content and our act of representing it cannot be allowed to collapse, and the rôle of artistic imitation is precisely to create enough distance between our representation and its object to allow us to enjoy the representation rather than to collapse that space by creating the illusion that we are in the actual presence of the depicted object. Mendelssohn writes,

If the objects gets too close to us, if we regard it as a part of us or even as ourselves, the pleasant character of the representation completely disappears, and the relation to the subject immediately becomes an unpleasant relation to us since here subject and object collapse, as it were, into one another. (Rhapsody; Philosophical Writings, p. 134)

He then says that a

means of rendering the most terrifying events pleasant to gentle minds is the imitation by art, on the stage, on the canvas, and in marble, since an inner consciousness that we have an imitation and nothing genuine before our eyes moderates the strength of the objective disgust and, as it were, elevates the subjective side of the representation. (Rhapsody; Philosophical Writings, p. 138)

Thus, contrary to Wolff, Mendelssohn does not suppose that what we enjoy in imitation is accuracy of representation taken to the point of illusion, but rather the room for the experience of our own mental activity that the knowledge that the depicted object is only being imitated allows.

In fact, Mendelssohn’s analysis of our mixed emotions in the experience of tragedy is even more subtle than this, for a further aspect of it is that our knowledge that we are experiencing represented rather than real people allows us to enjoy sympathy with the perfections of the noble characters who are depicted rather than pity at their weaknesses or at the fate that overcomes them. But rather than pursuing this, I want to make to make one further point about Mendelssohn’s general account of our enjoyment of the engagement of our powers of knowing and desiring. This explanation of a fundamental source of aesthetic pleasure as arising from the engagement of those two powers might seem to conflict with Mendelssohn’s influential ascription of aesthetic pleasure to a third faculty, the “faculty of approval,” distinguished from both the “faculty of cognition” and the “faculty of desire.” Mendelssohn introduces this third faculty in the Morning Lessons, a quarter-century after his early writings on aesthetics. There he says that

One usually divides the faculties of the soul into the faculty of cognition and the faculty of desire, and assigns the sentiment of pleasure and displeasure to the faculty of desire. But it seems to me that between knowing and desiring lies the approving, the assent, the satisfaction of the soul, which is actually quite remote from desire. We contemplate the beauty of nature and of art, without the least arousal of desire, with gratification and satisfaction. It seems to be a particular mark of beauty that we contemplate it with quiet satisfaction; that it pleases, even if we do not possess it, and that is remote from the urge to possess it. (Morgenstunden, Lesson VII, p. 70)

Mendelssohn’s introduction of a faculty of approval in 1785 may have been influential for Kant’s elevation of judgment to a faculty on a par with understanding and reason, signaled in his letter of December 25, 1787, to Karl Leonhard Reinhold, a decisive step in the genesis of the third critique. But as far as Mendelssohn is concerned, his explanation of the faculty of approval shows that his basic theory has not changed. By introducing this faculty, he wants to emphasize that the experience of beauty or other aesthetic qualities is not actual knowledge, nor does it lead to specific desires and actions (except perhaps the desire to be able to continue contemplating an object already found to have been beautiful). But what satisfies the faculty of approval is still the activity of the other mental powers. Thus Mendelssohn writes, first with reference to the power of cognition but then with reference to desire as well, that

We can consider the cognition of the soul in different respects; either in so far as it is true or false, which I call the material aspect in cognition; or in so far as arouses pleasure or displeasure, has as its consequence the approval or disapproval of the soul, and this can be called the formal aspect in cognition.

And he explains the latter aspect precisely in terms of mental activity:

Every concept, in so far as it is merely thinkable, has something that pleases the soul, that occupies its activity, and is thus cognized by it with satisfaction and approval….where the soul finds more satisfaction in one concept than in another, more agreeable occupation, then can it prefer the former to the latter. In this comparison and in the preference that we give to an object consists the essence of the beautiful and the ugly, the good and the evil, the perfect and the imperfect. What we cognize as the best in this comparison works on our faculty of desire and stimulates it, where it finds no resistance, to activity. This is the side on which the faculty of approval touches demand or desire. (Morgenstunden, Lesson VII, pp. 72–3)

Ordinarily, the faculty of cognition aims at truth, and the faculty of desire aims at action. The faculty of approval, however, aims just for the pleasing activity of the other two faculties without their usual results. The faculty of approval should be distinguished from the faculties of cognition and desire, since it does not aim at the same results they do. But it is itself satisfied by creations that set those faculties into an “agreeable play.” This is not a breach with Mendelssohn’s earlier doctrine, but an explanation of it. Mendelssohn’s explicit introduction of the concept of play here, finally, may be just as influential for the development of Kant’s aesthetics as is his insistence that the faculty of approval does not lead to actual knowledge or actual desire.

In the Morning Lessons Mendelssohn does not emphasize that the free play of the mind has a pleasing effect on the body, but he does in his earlier writings, so let us now return to this third item in Mendelssohn’s catalogue of the axes of perfection in aesthetic experience. This is the effect of the activity of the mind in aesthetic experience on the state of the body, a point that Mendelssohn emphasizes in On Sentiments and the Rhapsody although not in the essay on the “Main Principles.” Mendelssohn says that if

each sensible rapture, each improved condition of the state of our body, fills the soul with the sensible representation of a perfection, then every sensible representation must also, in turn, bring with it some well-being of the body…And in this way a pleasant emotion [Affekt] arises.

He distinguishes between a “sensible rapture” (sinnliche Wollust) and an emotion because the former begins in a part of a body, that is, with an actual external perception, while the latter “arises in the brain itself,” but in either case the feeling of the pleasure “arrange[s] the fibers of the brain into an appropriate tone, employing them without fatiguing them,” and then “The brain communicates this harmonious tension to nerves of the other parts of the body and the body becomes comfortable” (On Sentiments, Twelfth Letter; Philosophical Writings, p. 53). In other words, although as a rationalist metaphysician Mendelssohn maintains the formal distinction between the mind and the body (the mind is simple and indivisible, while body is essentially divisible), as a psychologist and aesthetician he nevertheless sees them as in the most intimate interaction, with the perception of harmony by the body infusing the mind with a pleasant sense of harmony that then further stimulates the harmonious condition of the body.

Finally, the “Main Principles” introduce a fourth source of perfection and therefore pleasure in the aesthetic experience, namely our appreciation of the artistry that is manifested in the production of a beautiful object. In explaining this source of pleasure, Mendelssohn also makes another revision to the traditional theory that it is resemblance alone that is the source of our pleasure in imitation, because resemblance is easily produced by means far less complex and admirable than all of the faculties that go into artistry—a point that Plato had already made when he had Socrates argue that if it is mere imitation that the painter were after, he could just go around with a mirror (Plato, Republic, Book X, 596d–e):

All works of art are visible imprints of the artist’s abilities which, so to speak, put his entire soul on display and make it known to us. This perfection of spirit arouses an uncommonly greater pleasure than mere similarity, because it is more worthy and far more complex than similarity. It is all the more worthy the more that the perfection of rational beings is elevated above the perfection of lifeless things, and also more complex because many abilities of the soul and often diverse skills of the external limbs as well are required for a beautiful imitation. We find more to admire in a rose by Huysum than in the image that every river can reflect of this queen of the flowers; and the most enchanting landscape in a camera obscura does not charm us as much as it can through the brush of a great landscape painter. (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, p. 174)

Mendelssohn explicitly recognizes the physical skills as well as the mental powers of the artist as among the perfections that we indirectly admire in admiring the work of art; this is another example of his recognition of the close connection between mind and body in spite of their metaphysical distinction. He also stresses the superiority of artistic representation over the mere imitation of nature by observing that the artist can create “ideal beauty” by gathering

together in a single viewpoint what nature has diffusely strewn among various objects, forming for himself a whole from this and taking the trouble to represent it just as nature would have represented it if the beauty of this limited object had been its sole purpose. (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, p. 176)

However, although human artistry may concentrate beauty more than nature does, that hardly means that artistic beauty is in all regards superior to natural beauty. Mendelssohn concludes the paragraph just cited by saying that “the most perfect, ideal beauty…is to be encountered nowhere in nature other than in the whole and is perhaps never fully to be attained in the works of art.” The beauty of nature as a whole exceeds the beauty of any work of art, and accordingly our admiration for the skill and genius of any human artist must be exceeded by our admiration for and pleasure in the artistry that lies behind nature as a whole.

Mendelssohn concludes the essay on the “Main Principles of the Fine Arts and Sciences” with a brief but pregnant division of the arts. The basis of his division is a distinction between “natural” and “arbitrary” signs, which has precedents in Du Bos, in Leibniz and Wolff, and beyond all of them in St. Augustine. Signs are natural “if the combination of the subject matter signified is grounded in the very properties of what is designated,” as smoke is a natural product of fire or “The passions are, by their very nature, connected with certain movements in our limbs as well as with certain sounds and gestures” (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, p. 177). Signs are arbitrary that “by their very nature have nothing in common with the designated subject matter, but have nevertheless been arbitrarily assumed as signs for it,” such as the “articulated sounds of all languages, the letters, the hieroglyphic signs of the ancients, and some allegorical images” (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, pp. 177–8). The arbitrary signs could also be called conventional. Mendelssohn’s chief distinction is then between those arts that convey their content by artificial signs, namely poetry and rhetoric, and those arts that employ natural signs, which convey both reference to content and the expression of feeling through natural signs and do “not presuppose anything arbitrary in order to be understood,” namely painting, sculpture, music, dance, and even architecture insofar as it conveys any meaning and expression. In fact, Mendelssohn distinguishes between the fine arts and the beautiful sciences, or between beaux arts and belles lettres, on this basis: the fine arts employ natural signs, and the beautiful sciences or belles lettres employ arbitrary or conventional signs (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, pp. 178–9). Among the belles lettres, poetry and rhetoric are distinguished by the fact that “The main, ultimate purpose of poetry is to please by means of a sensibly perfect discourse, while that of rhetoric is to persuade by means of a sensibly perfect discourse.” Mendelssohn does not explain why the fact that poetry and rhetoric employ artificial rather than natural signs entitles them to be called sciences rather than arts; perhaps what he has in mind is that since the meanings of arbitrary signs can be codified, there is more room for precision in the interpretation of poetry and rhetoric than there is in the various fine arts (with the exception of their allegorical or iconographical aspects, which as Mendelssohn has suggested are more like arbitrary than natural signs). In the case of rhetoric, moreover, there was a long tradition going back to antiquity of formulating rules for how persuasion can be achieved, and perhaps this made it seem like more of a science than an art to Mendelssohn.

Be this as it may, the main point of Mendelssohn’s distinction is that because its signs are arbitrary and can therefore be associated with any conceivable content, “the poet can express everything of which our soul can have a clear concept,” while the arts that employ natural signs are limited to the expression of those ideas and emotions the natural signs for which can be replicated in their specific media; each of these arts “must content itself with that portion of natural signs that it can express by means of the senses,” or more precisely by means of its particular way of engaging the senses. For example, “Music, the expression of which takes place by means of inarticulate sounds,” although it can express both the general ideas of harmony and all of the particular “inclinations and passions of the human soul which tend to make themselves known by means of sounds,” cannot possibly indicate particular concepts of objects such as “the concept of a rose, a poplar tree, and so on, just as it is impossible for painting to represent a musical chord to us” (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, pp. 178–9). A similar point would be made a century later by the music critic Eduard Hanslick.

Mendelssohn next assumes that only hearing and sight can convey natural signs, and then observes that

the natural signs that affect the sense of sight can be represented either successively or alongside one another, that is to say, they can express beauty either through movement or through forms. (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, p. 179)

The art of dance employs movements that naturally express human feelings and emotions, while the arts of painting and sculpture must “express beauties that are alongside one another” through line, color, and shape. This leads Mendelssohn to the point that although works of music, dance, and for that matter poetry themselves take place through a succession of moments and can thereby convey a succession of movements, painting and sculpture can represent only a single moment in the history of their objects. The painter and sculptor must therefore

choose the instant that is most favorable to their purpose. They must assemble the entire action into a single perspective and divide it up with a great deal of understanding. In this instant everything must be rich in thoughts and so full of meaning that every accompanying concept makes its own contribution to the required meaning. When we view such a painting [or sculpture] with due attention, our senses are all at once inspired, all the abilities of our soul suddenly enlivened, and the imagination can from the present infer the past and reliably anticipate the future. (“Main Principles”; Philosophical Writings, pp. 180–1)

Mendelssohn’s thesis that the visual arts must convey all of their content through their representation of an object at a single moment while other arts can represent movements and actions in, as we would say, real time, would be used as a premise in a famous controversy between his friend Lessing and the renowned historian of ancient art Johann Joachim Winckelmann, to which we will turn in a moment. But before doing so, we must complete our survey of Mendelssohn’s aesthetics with a comment on his discussion of the sublime.

Mendelssohn was instrumental in introducing the topic of the sublime into German aesthetics, publishing a lengthy review of Burke’s book on the beautiful and the sublime in 1758, just a year after it appeared in England (reprinted in Mendelssohn, Gesammelte Schriften, volume 4, pp. 216–36), as well as an essay “On the Sublime and Naïve in the Fine Sciences” in the same year. In the latter essay, Mendelssohn makes a number of points that will become central to the subsequent German discussion of the sublime, especially in Kant. His premise, not surprisingly, is that “The sentiment produced by the sublime is a composite one” (“On the Sublime and the Naïve in the Fine Sciences”; Philosophical Writings, p. 195). For one thing, it may be produced by the perception or thought of an “immensity of extended magnitude” or of an “immensity of strength or unextended magnitude” (“The Sublime and Naïve”; Philosophical Writings, p. 194)—by the sight, image, or thought of something vastly big or of something vastly powerful.

This distinction anticipates Kant’s subsequent distinction between the “mathematical” and the “dynamical” sublime, and while it was not uncommon in British discussions of the sublime, Mendelssohn may have been Kant’s source for it. Mendelssohn then says that either immensity of size or immensity of strength first “captures our attention” and “arouses a sweet shudder that rushes through every fiber of our being…giving wings to the imagination to press further and further without stopping.” “All these sentiments blend together in the soul,” becoming “a single phenomenon which we call awe” (loc. cit.). But the feeling of awe at immensity does not yet complete the complex experience of the sublime; for that, there must also be an element of admiration at a perfection—for remember that Mendelssohn’s project is still to ground all aesthetic experience on the underlying principle of pleasure in perfection. So the immensity which inspires us with awe must also be interpreted as a manifestation of perfection. Mendelssohn then invokes the same distinction he employed in his discussion of artistry. The immensity which fills us with awe may be either a product of divine artistry, in which case

the properties of the Supreme Being which we recognize in his works inspire the most ecstatic awe and admiration because they surpass everything that we can conceive as enormous, perfect, or sublime,

or it can be due to human artistry. In that case we may not find the represented object so extraordinary but feel with pleasure how “the artist possesses the skill of elevating its properties and showing them in an uncommon light,” or alternatively we may be awed by both the represented object and the divine artistry that lies behind it and by the “great wit, genius, imagination, and capacities of the soul” of the human artist who produces the image of the work of divine artistry.

What especially pleases us in the case of art, considered as art, is the reference to the spiritual gifts of the artist which make themselves visibly known. If they bear the characteristics of an uncommon genius…then they inspire awe on our part. (“The Sublime and Naïve”; Philosophical Writings, pp. 196–7)

We may now turn to the famous controversy between Lessing and Winckelmann, built upon Mendelssohn’s distinction between the arts of form and the arts of movement.

4.2 Winckelmann

Johann Joachim Winckelmann (1717–1768), the son of a cobbler from Prussia, studied at Halle and Jena, and became a school teacher. But at thirty-one he got a position as a librarian for a nobleman in Dresden, and gained access to the court of the Elector of Saxony, home of one of the great art collections of Europe, and also a Catholic court that ultimately gave him access to Rome. He established his reputation in 1755 with an essay “On the Imitation of Greek Works in Painting and Sculpture.” He moved to Rome later that year, in the service of the Papal Nuncio to the Saxon court, and in 1758 entered the service of Cardinal Allessandro Albani, the nephew of Pope Clement XI and owner of a great collection of antiquities. In 1764 Winckelmann published The History of Ancient Art to great acclaim. He was working on a revision of it when he was murdered in Trieste in June of 1768, while returning to Rome from Vienna, where the Empress Maria Theresa had awarded him a collection of gold and silver medallions.

Winckelmann spent his two years in Halle (1738–40) while Baumgarten was still teaching there and Meier was also a student. But his writing offers no evidence that he knew their works. His History of Ancient Art does cite Du Bos, Batteux, and the essays of Hume, however, and he had clearly absorbed some of the most general ideas of eighteenth-century aesthetics. A 1763 essay “On the Capacity for the Sentiment for the Beautiful in Art, and on Instruction in it” suggests several of the premises assumed throughout his work on ancient art history. He shares with Wolff and Batteux the assumption that art derives its beauty from the imitation of nature, and derives the most beauty from the imitation of beauty in nature. Thus he writes that

Art, as an imitator of nature, should always seek out what is natural for the form of beauty, and should avoid, as much as is possible, all that is violent, because even the beauty in life can become displeasing through forced gestures. (“On the Capacity for the Sentiment for the Beautiful in Art,” Essays on the Philosophy and History of Art, volume I, p. xlvi)

However, Winckelmann believes that natural beauty itself lies not merely in the superficial appearance of bodies but, at least in the case of human beauty, is an expression of the thought and character of persons:

Above all things, one is to be attentive to the particular, characteristic thoughts in works of art, which sometimes stand like expensive pearls in a string of inferior ones, and can get lost among them. Our contemplation should begin with the effects of the understanding as the most worthy part of beauty, and from there should descend to the execution

a point that he illustrates with examples from the paintings of Poussin, Corregio, and Domenichino rather than from ancient art (“The Sentiment for the Beautiful,” p. xlv). Winckelmann clearly belongs to the tradition that finds beauty in the truthful representation of the objective perfections of body and mind, rather than in the stimulation of the play of the mental powers of the audience for beauty.

Winckelmann’s premises underlie his history of ancient art, the main claims of which are already evident in his 1755 essay “On the Imitation of the Painting and Sculpture of the Greeks.” This essay begins with the claim that “There is but one way for the moderns to become great, and perhaps unequalled; I mean, by imitating the ancients” (Reflections on the Painting and Sculpture of the Greeks, p. 2; in Essays on the Philosophy and History of Art, volume I). His topic is thus in the first instance the imitation of ancient art, not imitation in ancient art. Winckelmann then attributes the excellent of ancient, that is to say Greek, art to three factors: first, nature in ancient Greece was particularly favorable to the development of beautiful bodies; second, the “natural” way of life in Greece was particularly favorable to the observation of beautiful bodies and thus to their imitation in art; and finally, Greek thought and character were particularly noble, and thus the external beauty of Greek bodies was an expression of the beauty of the Greek mind as the “most worthy part of beauty.” The first of these claims is in the tradition of the emphasis of the influence of climate on human character and society initiated by Du Bos and continued by many eighteenth-century thinkers, including Montesquieu in The Spirit of the Laws (1748).

Winckelmann’s second point is that the Greek climate and way of life were conducive to the development of art. He makes the general claim that freedom is conducive to the development of art:

Art claims liberty: in vain would nature produce her noblest offsprings, in a country where rigid laws would choke her progressive growth, as in Egypt, that pretended parent of sciences and arts: but in Greece, where, from their earliest youth, the happy inhabitants were devoted to mirth and pleasure, where narrow-spirited formality never restrained the liberty of manners, the artist enjoyed nature without a veil.

Winckelmann then makes the specific point that freedom from excessive clothing among the Greeks, particularly in their gymnastic and athletic exercises, gave their artists unparalleled opportunity to observe and to learn to represent the beauty of their bodies:

The Gymnasies, where, sheltered by public modesty, the youths exercised themselves naked, were the schools of art…. Here beautiful nakedness appeared with such a liveliness of expression, such truth and variety of situations, such a noble air of the body, as it would be ridiculous to look for in any hired model of our academies. (“Imitation,” pp. 9–10)

Winckelmann’s reference to expression and nobility here points the way to his last claim, that above all the bodily beauty of the Greeks is an expression of their mental and moral beauty:

The last and most eminent characteristic of the Greek works is a noble simplicity and sedate grandeur in Gesture and Expression. As the bottom of the sea lies peaceful beneath a foaming surface, a great soul lies sedate beneath the strife of passions in Greek figures. (“Imitation,” p. 30)

Winckelmann illustrates the last claim with a discussion of the famous statue of the Trojan priest Laocoön and his sons being strangled by the serpents Neptune sent to stifle his warnings against accepting the “gift” of the Trojan horse. The version of this statue that was unearthed near Naples in 1506 and quickly acquired by Pope Julius II for the Vatican, where it has been displayed ever since, is now thought to be a Roman copy of a Pergamese bronze from the second century BCE, and may or may not be the same one described by Pliny (Natural History, XXXV). Winckelmann took it to be a classical Greek work. He also must have known it only from illustration when he first wrote about it in “On the Imitation of the Painting and Sculpture of the Greeks,” since he moved to Rome only after that essay was published. Be that as it may, Winckelmann writes:

’Tis in the face of Laocoön this soul shines with full lustre, not confined however to the face, amidst the most violent sufferings. Pangs piercing every muscle, every labouring nerve; pangs which we almost feel ourselves, while we consider—not the face, nor the most expressive parts—only the belly contracted by excruciating pains: these however, I say, exert not themselves with violence, either in the face or gesture. He pierces not heaven, like the Laocoön of Virgil; his mouth is rather opened to discharge an anxious overloaded groan, as Sadolet says; the struggling body and the supporting mind exert themselves with equal strength, nay balance all the frame.

Laocoön suffers, but suffers like the Philoctetes of Sophocles: we weeping feel his pains, but wish for the hero’s strength to support his misery.

The Expression of so great a soul is beyond the force of mere nature. It was in his own mind the artist was to search for the strength of spirit with which he marked his marble. Greece enjoyed artists and philosophers in the same persons; and the wisdom of more than one Metrodorus directed art, and inspired its figures with more than common souls.

The last paragraph of this is somewhat contorted: since Laocoön was not himself a classical Greek, but a pre-classical Trojan, Winckelmann does not quite attribute the “noble simplicity and quiet grandeur” that shines through his face even in the midst of his suffering to him and to nature as it might have been at work in Troy, but rather to the classical Greek artist whom he supposes did make the statue. But his basic point remains: since in his view the statue itself was Greek, the noble simplicity and quiet grandeur of the Greek soul inevitably manifests itself and elevates these figures caught in a moment of supreme suffering to the highest level of beauty.

Winckelmann’s History of Ancient Art, published nine years after the essay on imitation, reaffirms his general commitment to contemporary aesthetics as well as his particular emphasis on a certain kind of mental condition as the ultimate source of physical beauty. It nevertheless gives a slightly different and perhaps more plausible account of the Laocoön statue, which by then he had seen first-hand. To general statements on beauty as unity and simplicity (History, p. 196) and the beauty of youthfulness (p. 197) Winckelmann adds a passage on the expression of inward attitude that is reminiscent of his description of the “noble simplicity and quiet grandeur” of the Greeks in the earlier essay:

Expression is an imitation of the active and suffering states of our minds and our bodies and of passions as well as deeds…Stillness is the state most proper to beauty, as it is to the sea, and experience shows that the most beautiful beings are of a still and well-mannered nature. (History, p. 204)

But, as noted, in the History Winckelmann gives a slightly different account of the Laocoön, in which he suggests that the beauty of the central figure of the work lies not so much in the nobility of character that is expressed in spite of Laocoön’s agony, but rather in a kind of harmony between his agony and his nobility:

Laocoön is a being in the greatest pain, fashioned in the likeness of a man seeking to gather the conscious strength of his mind and spirit against it…. Beneath the brow, the battle between pain and resistance, as if concentrated in this one place, is composed with great wisdom…Thus, where the greatest pain is expressed, the greatest beauty is also to be found. (History, pp. 313–14)

4.3 Lessing

This description of the Laocoön has been of great interest to recent interpreters, but it was Winckelmann’s earlier account that inspired the criticism of Lessing, whose Laocoön: An Essay on the Limits of Painting and Poetry, although not published until 1766, was clearly begun and largely written before the appearance of Winckelmann’s History in 1764. Lessing’s work was thus a response to the earlier essay (only in chapter 26, almost at the end of the book, does Lessing say that Winckelmann’s History “has appeared, and I shall not venture another step until I have read it”). Lessing’s book, although part of the larger eighteenth-century debate about the comparative merits of literature and the visual arts that builds upon the division of the arts by his friend Mendelssohn, first argues against Winckelmann that the beauty of the Laocoön statue comes not from the special nobility of the Greek soul but from the particular demands of its visual rather than literary medium.

Lessing published his Laocoön at the midpoint of his varied literary and intellectual career. Lessing, like Mendelssohn born in 1729, was the oldest of thirteen children of a Saxon pastor, and at twelve he entered the monastic school at Meissen; at seventeen he went to Leipzig to study theology, then changed to medicine, and then to the university at Wittenberg. But at twenty, he left the university and went to Berlin to make a career as a writer. There he quickly met among others Voltaire, at that time employed by Frederick the Great, as well as Mendelssohn. In 1755, Lessing had his great success with the bourgeois tragedy Miss Sara Sampson, which initiated a new direction in the German theater. In 1758, he started collaborating with Mendelssohn and Friedrich Nicolai on the Letters concerning the newest literature. From 1760 to 1765 Lessing worked as secretary to the governor of Silesia in Breslau, during which time he wrote Laocoön as well as the comedy Minna von Barnhelm. He returned to Berlin again in 1765, but, disappointed in his hopes for the position of Royal Librarian, went to Hamburg in 1767 as director of the National Theater. The program notes he wrote in that capacity became his Hamburg Dramaturgy, his most extended critical work. In 1770 Lessing finally found a secure post as librarian for the great collection of the Dukes of Brunswick in Wolffenbüttel, where he remained until his death in 1781. There he wrote the tragedy Emilia Galotti and his famous plea for religious tolerance in the form of Nathan the Wise, a play inspired by Mendelssohn. In addition to various theological polemics, he also published his Education of the Human Race the year before his death.

The thesis of Laocoön, as already suggested, is that the character of the famous statue is due not to the nobility of the Greek mind but to the imperatives of its visual medium. Lessing begins his work by quoting the passage from Winckelmann’s essay “On the Imitation of the Painting and Sculpture of the Greeks” quoted above (Laocoön, chapter 1, p. 7). He then argues that the Greek, like anyone else, “felt and feared, and he expressed his pain and grief,” and that this was not thought to be incompatible with nobility of soul; he appeals to examples from Homer’s Iliad to prove this point. So he concludes that

if, according to the ancient Greek, crying aloud when in physical pain is compatible with nobility of soul, then the desire to express such nobility could not have prevented the artist from representing the scream in his marble, There must be another reason why he differs on this point from his rival the poet. (Laocoön, chapter 1, pp. 9–11)

The reason, Lessing claims, is

that among the ancients beauty was the supreme law of the visual arts. Once this has been established, it necessarily follows that whatever else these arts may include must give way completely if not compatible with beauty, and, if compatible, must at least be subordinate to it.

In the case of the story of Laocoön, since

The demands of beauty could not be reconciled with [his] pain in all its disfiguring violence, so it had to be reduced. The scream had to be softened to a sigh, not because screaming betrays an ignoble soul, but because it distorts the features in a disgusting manner. (Laocoön, chapter 1, pp. 15, 17)

Indeed, in a later discussion of the demands of religion on visual art, Lessing adds that

I should prefer that only those be called works of art in which the artist had occasion to show himself as such and in which beauty was his first and ultimate aim. None of the others, which betray too obvious traces of religious conventions, deserves this name because in their case the artist did not create for art’s sake [weil die Kunst hier nicht um ihren selbst willen gearbeitet, literally “because here art did not work for its own sake”], but his art was merely a handmaid of religion, which stressed meaning more than beauty in the material subjects it allotted to art for execution. (Laocoön, chapter 1, pp. 15, 17)

The phrase “art for art’s sake” is often thought to be a nineteenth-century invention, but here Lessing clearly anticipates it, meaning that at least in the visual arts all other considerations must be subordinated to the creation of beauty.

Lessing does not appeal to any philosophical theory to back up this insistence. But his next step is to buttress his argument by borrowing Mendelssohn’s idea that since the visual arts present objects in a single moment, they must choose that moment carefully, and in particular they must choose a moment that gives “free rein” to the imagination. Even if it were to be conceded that “Truth and expression are art’s first law,” which Lessing is not actually willing to concede, this would still hold. Thus paintings and sculptures must not represent the moment of the culmination of an action, which leaves nothing further to the imagination, but a moment of anticipation which leaves the imagination free to play with further possibilities (Laocoön, chapter 3, p. 19). The artist of the Laocoön did not represent his subject at the moment of his greatest pain and full scream because that would have foreclosed the free play of the imagination of the audience for the work. Here Lessing at least tacitly invokes the new theory that the play of our mental powers rather than the representation of some form of truth is the fundamental aim of art, or at least visual art.

Lessing continues his argument by turning to the other half of Mendelssohn’s theory, the claim that poetry is an art that can represent a succession of events over time rather than one moment in time. “Accordingly, bodies with their visible properties are the true subjects of painting,” while, since actions take place over time, “actions are the true subjects of poetry.” Thus, “painting too can imitate actions, but only by suggestion through bodies,” and again “can use only a single moment of an action in its coexisting compositions and must therefore choose the one that is most suggestive.” Conversely, in order to represent a body poetry can only describe an action in which the body is made, used, or otherwise involved (Laocoön, chapter 16, pp. 78–9). This leads Lessing to a memorable analysis of some examples from Homer: “If Homer wants to show us Juno’s chariot, he shows Hebe putting it together piece by piece”; when he “wants to show us how Agamemnon was dressed, he has the king put on his garments, one by one,” and, most famously, when he wants to show us Achilles’s shield, he does not describe it “as finished and complete, but as a shield that is being made” (Laocoön, chapter 16, p. 80; chapter 18, p. 95).

So far, Lessing has merely rejected Winckelmann’s analysis of the Laocoön statue on the basis of his own insistence that beauty is the primary aim of visual art as well as on Mendelssohn’s distinction between arts that can represent one moment and arts that can represent a succession of moments. But he broadens his target when he says, in a passing discussion of the fact that both Homer and Milton were blind, that “if the range of my physical sight must be the measure of my inner vision, I should value the loss of the former in order to gain freedom from the limitations on the latter” (Laocoön, chapter 14, p. 74). Here his implication is that sight actually constrains the imagination, while non-visual media—in other words, poetry—free the imagination for a wider play with both ideas and emotions. This point could also be thought to depend on one of Mendelssohn’s ideas, namely his contrast between natural and arbitrary or conventional signs. Lessing touches upon this in passing, arguing that although “the symbols of speech are arbitrary,” the poet actually wants to overcome our awareness of that fact:

He wants rather to make the ideas he awakens in us so vivid that at the moment we believe that we feel the real impressions which the objects of these ideas would produce in us. In this moment of illusion we should cease to be conscious of the means which the poet uses for this purpose, that is, his words. (Laocoön, chapter 17, p. 85)

But while emphasizing that the poet aims to create a vivid response in us, in particular a vivid emotional response, Lessing fails to mention Mendelssohn’s point that we also need to retain some awareness of the artificiality rather than reality of the artistic depiction of persons and actions in order to maintain the distance necessary to allow us to enjoy the emotions evoked by art rather than being overwhelmed by them into actual suffering. He does not need to mention this, perhaps, in the case of the visual arts, since he holds that the visual artist leaves the audience some freedom of imagination by not depicting the moment of the greatest suffering of his subject, and this freedom may afford the necessary distance, but he might have done well to mention it in the case of poetry.

Lessing thus touches upon the new idea that aesthetic response is based on the free play of our mental powers stimulated by an object, in his case always by a work of art, and he exploits several of Mendelssohn’s theoretical tools. He should nevertheless be seen as a practicing critic using theoretical developments for his own purposes rather than as a theorist in his own right. However, his criticism immediately triggered more philosophical aesthetics in response. In the next section, we shall see how Johann Gottfried Herder reasserted yet refined an aesthetics of truth beginning with a response to Lessing, while Johann Georg Sulzer attempted to combine an aesthetics of truth with an aesthetics of play. Sulzer’s combination of the aesthetics of truth and play would in turn prepare the way for Kant, while Herder’s final work, more than twenty years after he completed his main work in aesthetics, would be a critique of Kant’s aesthetics. This section will also include a discussion of the aesthetic theory of Marcus Herz, who was first a student of Kant and then a friend of Mendelssohn, but who developed an aesthetic theory that is in interesting ways independent of both.

5. Herder, Sulzer and Herz: Energy, Activity and Truth

5.1 Herder

Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803) is most often remembered for his philosophy of history, expounded with relative brevity in his 1774 work This Too a Philosophy of History for the Education of Humanity and at great length in his Ideas for the Philosophy of History of Humanity, published from 1784 to 1791. He is typically read as having advocated cultural relativism and historicism against the universalist pretensions of the Enlightenment—manifested in aesthetics in the search for a universally valid “standard of taste”—and thus as having been a forerunner of Romanticism. Our focus here will be on Herder’s work in aesthetics, which fully occupied him for the first fifteen years of his career, as well as at the very end of his career, when he wrote a vigorous polemic against the aesthetic theory of Kant. In this section we will consider Herder’s early work in aesthetics, while discussion of his later work will be reserved for section 9.

Herder came from East Prussia, and from 1762 to 1764 was a student in Königsberg, where he studied with Kant. He later turned away from Kant, whom he saw as having himself turned away from an empirical approach to philosophy to one that is excessively abstract and a priori. From 1762 to 1769, he taught school in Riga, and then left for a tour of France and Western Germany, during which he met the young Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, shortly to become famous for The Sorrows of Young Werther. Indeed, after Herder served as preacher in the small court of Bückeburg from 1771 to 1776, Goethe had him appointed as the General Superintendent of Lutheran clergy in the Duchy of Weimar, where Goethe himself was the chief minister. This position, which Herder occupied for the rest of his life, gave him ample time to write and put him into contact with the many other leading figures of late eighteenth-century German literary and intellectual life whom Goethe brought to Weimar.

Herder’s first major work in aesthetics, Fragments on Recent German Literature, appeared in 1767, when he was only twenty-three. The first three volumes of his next work, the Groves of Criticism (Kritische Waelder) were published in 1769. The first volume of the Groves is a spirited but friendly critique of Lessing’s Laocoön, the next two a detailed polemic against the now forgotten Halle rhetorician Christian Klotz (whom Lessing also attacked in a 1769 essay on “How the Ancients Depicted Death”). The fourth volume, a polemic against the now equally forgotten Friedrich Justus Riedel, who had published a hodgepodge Theory of the Fine Arts and Sciences: Extracts from various Authors in 1767, remained unpublished during Herder’s lifetime. Herder did, however, restate its most important ideas in Sculpture: Some Observations on Shape and Form from Pygmalion’s Creative Dream, begun in 1770 although itself not completed and published until 1778. Herder’s work on Sculpture was interrupted by several of what are now his best-known works, the Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772) and This Too a Philosophy of History for the Education of Humanity (1774). After finishing Sculpture, Herder published a collection of folk poetry from around the world, Popular Songs (1778–79), a work on the Old Testament, On the Spirit of Hebrew Poetry (1782–83), the large work on philosophy of history already mentioned, an influential defense of Spinoza under the name of God: Some Conversations (1787), a work on political philosophy, the Letters for the Advancement of Humanity (1793–97), and finally his critiques of Kant’s theoretical philosophy and aesthetics, A Metacritique on the Critique of Pure Reason (1799) and the Kalligone or “Birth of Beauty” (1800). In these works Kant’s harsh criticisms of his quondam student’s Ideas for a Philosophy of History of Humanity were repaid with interest.

Lessing, as we saw, had argued that visual art presents an object as it is at a single moment and thus can only intimate an action, while poetry describes a succession of states comprising an action and thus can represent an object only by describing the act of producing it; he also argued that beauty is the first law of the visual arts and thus that a work of art must not only depict an object at a pregnant moment in an action or event but must also depict it at a beautiful moment. In his critique in the first of his Groves of Criticism, Herder argues that Lessing’s division of the arts was too schematic and incomplete, offering three particular points of criticism against Lessing. He first claims that Lessing fails to explain why beauty must be the first law of the visual arts. He further insists that there is an essential difference within the so-called visual arts that Lessing fails to capture, namely that painting is concerned strictly with with the sense of sight whereas the aesthetics of sculpture in fact derive primarily from the sense of touch. Herder’s third critical thesis is that Lessing’s emphasis on time and succession in poetry better fits the art of music, which Lessing ignored, while the essence of poetry lies not in such an accidental feature of the kind of signs that it uses but in the way in which it captures and communicates the energy of real life, something no other art does equally well. Herder’s contrast between painting and sculpture becomes central in the argument of the fourth of the Groves of Criticism and in the essay on Sculpture, so let us consider the other two themes first and then return to that one.

Herder’s first charge is that Lessing fails to explain why beauty must be the first law of the visual arts. In Herder’s view, visual art must aim at beauty because only in that way can it overcome the essential conflict between its own spatial, static character and the incessantly changing, transitory character of everything in nature.

In nature everything is transitory, the passion of the soul and the sensation of the body: the activity of the soul and the motion of the body: every state of changeable finite nature. Now if art has only one instant in which everything is to be contained: then every alterable state of nature is unnaturally immortalized through it, and thus with this principle all imitation of nature through art cease. (“First Grove,” p. 133)

Furthermore, all ordinary sensuous pleasures are also momentary: “All sensible joys are only for the first glance” (“First Grove,” p. 134). The only way for an essentially static art to overcome the transitory nature of both what it depicts and of ordinary pleasures is by picking a beautiful moment which is as it were exempt from the actual transitoriness of an object’s history in real nature and our pleasure in which also does not fade like other pleasures do (“First Grove,” p. 137). In other words, our pleasure in beauty in a sense lifts us out of the ordinary passage of time. However, Herder quickly adds that not any kind of beauty can do this: bodily beauty is too closely connected with time, so a truly beautiful work must somehow instead intimate the beauty of soul rather than body: “Corporeal beauty is not satisfying: through our eye there looks a soul, and through the beauty that is represented to us a soul thus also peers” (“First Grove,” pp. 137–8).

However, this opening sally against Lessing is misleading in two regards, first for its suggestion that the task for aesthetics is to give a better explanation of beauty than Lessing did and second for its suggestion that aesthetics must be grounded on a metaphysical distinction between mind and body. The latter suggestion is misleading because Herder does more than almost anyone else in eighteenth-century Germany to minimize any separation between mind and body. This is a result of his emphasis on the connection between thought and speech, bodily sensation and expression, and the natural and man-made environment of the linguistic community. The former suggestion is also misleading because, while Herder will go on to argue that painting in particular strives after beauty, he also links beauty to mere appearance Indeed, he connects beauty with illusion. Herder also argues that both sculpture, which he emphatically distinguishes from painting, and poetry ultimately aim much more at truth than at beauty. Herder’s path to this conclusion is not direct, however, and just what sense or senses of truth he has in mind is difficult to pin down, so we will have to look at his classification of the arts in some detail to see how to construe his theory.

In fact, Herder suggests two different classifications of the arts, and a central challenge in the interpretation of his aesthetics is to see how they are connected. In the first of the Groves of Criticism, Herder argues that Lessing’s distinction between the visual arts as the representation of objects in space at a single moment in time and poetry as the representation of a succession of events in time confuses poetry with music. Lessing thereby misses what is essential to poetry altogether, namely that it communicates to us the real force of objects, including but not limited to actions, and thus most deeply engages our own force in response. The first part of this argument is that the contrast between the coexistence of the properties of an object in space and the succession of events in time properly grounds the contrast between painting and music, not between painting and poetry, and that both painting and music depend upon natural signs of coexistence and succession (“First Grove,” p. 193). Both painting—which Herder is thus far, like Lessing, using as a generic term for the visual arts comprising both painting proper and sculpture—and music use natural signs, that is, signs that communicate the thought of their objects to us by means of resemblance between their own fundamental properties and the fundamental properties of their objects. Painting and music are thus best suited to represent objects in space and successions of events in time, respectively. Poetry, however, uses primarily artificial rather than natural signs, and is thus, unlike music, not restricted to the depiction of events as Lessing thought it was (“First Grove,” pp. 193–4). Herder turns Lessing’s distinction between natural and artificial signs against him, arguing that precisely because poetry uses artificial rather than natural signs its content is in no fundamental way constrained by the natural properties of its signs themselves. Thus, in the proper hands poetry can effectively represent anything, and in this way it certainly has a wider sphere of truth accessible to it than painting or music do.

But this is only the first step of Herder’s argument. The second step argues that just as Lessing’s division of the arts into painting and poetry is incomplete, the distinction between space and time on which the former division is based is also incomplete. This is because Lessing’s distinction leaves out the essential category of force (Kraft), and precisely this last category is essential to the effect of poetry (“First Grove,” p. 194). Herder is not particularly clear about the difference between the energy (Energie) that is displayed in music and the force that is at work in poetry, but his idea seems to be that energy is the outward manifestation, in change or motion, of underlying forces. Poetry, precisely because it employs artificial rather than natural signs, can therefore bring us closer to the reality that underlies the superficial features of objects captured by artificial signs. Thus poetry may reach not only wider but also deeper than these other arts.

In continuing his discussion of poetry in the first Grove, Herder initially emphasizes the broader reach of poetry: precisely because in taking in poetry we do not focus on the physical or acoustical properties of the signs themselves, but on their meanings, poetry can represent anything. In poetry,

it is not the sign itself but the sense [Sinn] of the sign that must be felt; the soul must not feel the vehicle of the force, the words, but the force itself, the sense…But thereby it also brings every object as it were visibly before the soul. (“First Grove,” p. 195)

Herder then develops his view by invoking Baumgarten’s characterization of poetry as “the sensibly perfect in discourse.” What he now argues is that poetry actually gets its force by exploiting both the depiction of objects as in painting and their energy as represented by music. Once painting and music have been properly distinguished from each other and poetry from both, it becomes clear that poetry, because it uses artificial rather than natural signs, can present both objects and actions to us. It is in this sense that poetry can present more truth to us than either painting or music alone.

What remains unclear, however, is just what Herder means by “force” here. He only hints at what he might mean a few pages later when he says that “the essence of poetry” is “the force, which adheres to the inner in words, the magical force, which works on my soul through fantasy and recollection” (“First Grove,” p. 197). The force unique to poetry seems to be precisely its power to make us feel as if the objects and events it describes are real and thereby to engage our own emotions and passions more fully than the other arts can. But he may make clearer what he has in mind in his praise for the poetry of primitive peoples in a famous 1773 essay on what were later to be revealed to be the fraudulent poems of the fictional Scottish bard “Ossian.” This essay was included in a collection On German Style and Art that also included Herder’s equally famous essay on Shakespeare (to which we will return below) and a seminal essay by Goethe that revived interest in Gothic architecture. Here Herder declaims:

Know then, that the more barbarous a people is—that is, the more alive, the more freely acting (for that is what the word means)—the more barbarous, that is, the more alive, the more free, the closer to the senses, the more lyrically dynamic its songs will be, if songs it has. The more remote a people is from an artificial, scientific manner of thinking, speaking, and writing, the less its songs are made for paper and print, the less its verses are written for the dead letter. The purpose, the nature, the miraculous power of these songs as the delight, the driving-force, the traditional chant and everlasting joy of the people—all this depends on the lyrical, living, dance-like quality of the song, on the living presence of the images, and the coherence and, as it were compulsion of the content, the feelings; on the symmetry of the words and syllables, and sometimes even of the letters, on the flow of the melody, and on a hundred other things which belong to the living world, to the gnomic song of the nation, and vanish with it. (“Ossian,” pp. 155–6)

Leave aside the fact that the poems of the supposed Ossian were concocted in eighteenth-century Edinburgh by James MacPherson, and were thus very much made for paper and print. Leave aside as well Herder’s supposition that the most dynamic poetry can only be composed by a “barbarous people,” Mycenaen Greeks or Scottish highlanders. The point remains that he connects the “living presence of the images” achieved by the most effective poetry with a corresponding feeling of freedom and of being alive. Paradoxically, poetry’s use of artificial rather than natural signs, which allows it to achieve the effects of painting and music combined, also allows it to engage our deepest emotions more thoroughly than those other arts, including ultimately the joyous feeling of being alive itself, even though the other arts use natural signs and might therefore have been thought to be more effective.

We may now turn to Herder’s second main criticism of Lessing, hinted at in the first of the Groves of Criticism but more fully developed in the unpublished fourth Grove and the essay on Sculpture. The fourth Grove is cast as a critique of Riedel’s Theory of the Fine Sciences and Arts, as earlier noted, but also continues the debate with Lessing. Herder begins with several methodological objections to Riedel. First, although he otherwise admires Baumgarten, Herder criticizes Riedel’s acceptance of Baumgarten’s characterization of aesthetics as both a theory of beauty and “the art of thinking beautifully,” that is, a prescription of concrete rules and methods for artists to follow in order to produce beautiful or otherwise successful works (“Fourth Grove,” p. 267). Herder is clear that there are no such rules, thus that aesthetics must confine itself to understanding the work of artists and our experience of their work without telling them how to do that work. Second, Herder objects to a tripartite classification of the methods of aesthetics, as such a theory, that Riedel proposes. According to Riedel, aesthetic theories can be divided into those employing the methods of Aristotle, Baumgarten, or Kames: the Aristotelian method aims to reach general principles from the analysis of particular masterpieces of art, the method of Kames tries to reach the same goal from the analysis of our sensations in response to aesthetic objects, and what Riedel characterizes as the “miserable dry” method of Baumgarten simply begins from definitions (“Fourth Grove,” p. 262). In Herder’s view, these distinctions are artificial and the characterization of Baumgarten’s method in particular is unfair. Although the charge that Baumgarten simply began with definitions may seem a fair critique of his early Meditations on Poetry, Herder must have felt that in his larger and more mature Aesthetica Baumgarten did support his definitions by his extensive examples. In any case, Herder’s own method is certainly to reach general conclusions only from close examination of examples of art and of our response to them. This is why he engages Lessing in such detail, for example, and why some of his most important claims in aesthetics are contained in the essays on Ossian and Shakespeare. Further, Herder’s approach ends rather than begins with definitions.

The main thrust of the fourth Grove, building upon Herder’s insistence that aesthetics must employ the methods of both Aristotle and Kames in order to reach Baumgartian conclusions, is that recognition of the distinctions among our senses will explain the variety of both forms of art and forms of aesthetic response. The premise of Herder’s argument is that aesthetic response is not the disinterested reaction of a special internal sense to purely formal properties of objects, but is really the heightened response of various of our senses to their appropriate objects. Aesthetic responses naturally emerge from our senses. Herder rejects the traditional distinction between mind and body, arguing that mind is essentially connected to the bodily organs of sense, as well as any suggestion that aesthetic pleasures are essentially distinct from the other sources of our happiness and unhappiness. In this connection, Herder scorns Riedel’s thesis that the beautiful is that “which can please without an interested aim and thus also please if we do not possess it” (“Fourth Grove,” p. 291n.), thereby prefiguring his later critique of Kant’s aesthetics. Instead, Herder argues that the phenomenon of distance that Riedel mistakenly characterizes as general quality of disinterestedness in all aesthetic response is a specific feature of the visual perception of beauty, indeed that beauty is properly speaking a property only of the visual. This in turn leads Herder to distinguish between sight as a sense for mere appearance and touch as the sense for reality, and thus to the essential distinction between painting and sculpture which, he charges, Lessing fails to make. Herder insists that visible beauty arises only from the most superficial features of objects, not from their full reality, and that only feeling—by which he here means the sense of touch—can put us into direct contact with reality, or with the deeper truth about physical reality. He expands upon this contrast in the essay on Sculpture:

The term Schönheit [beauty] derives from the words Schauen [to behold] and Schein [appearance]. Beauty can most easily be understood and appreciated in terms of Schauen, that is, through schöner Schein [beautiful appearance]. Nothing is faster, more dazzlingly brilliant than the light of the sun and our eyes carried upon its wing. A world of external things ranged alongside one another is revealed in an instant. Since this world does not disappear as do sounds, but endures and invites contemplation, is it any wonder that our doctrine of psychology chooses to borrow many of its terms from this sense? For psychology, to know is to see, and its greatest pleasure is beauty…. If we succeeded in “deriving” from this sense alone a true phenomenology of the beautiful and the true, we should already have achieved a great deal.

Nonetheless, we would not thereby have achieved everything and certainly not what is most fundamental, simple, and primary…. The living, embodied truth of the three-dimensional space of angles, of form and volume, is not something we can learn through sight. This is all the more true of the essence of sculpture, beautiful form and beautiful shape, for this is not a matter of color, or of the play of proportion and symmetry, or of light and shadow, but of physically present, tangible truth…. Consider the lover of art sunk deep in contemplation who circles restlessly around a sculpture. What would he not do to transform his sight into touch, to make his seeing into a form of touching that feels in the dark…. With his soul he seeks to grasp the image that arose from the arm and the soul of the artist. Now he has it! The illusion has worked; the sculpture lives and his soul feels that it lives. His soul speaks to it, not as if his soul sees, but as if it touches, as if it feels. (Sculpture, pp. 39–41)

Herder’s emphasis on the sense of touch and its centrality to the experience of sculpture builds upon his interpretation of the debate about the relation between sight and touch in which Locke, Berkeley, and Diderot had all argued that we do not correlate the deliverances of the two senses innately, but have to learn from experience that an object that looks a certain way also feels a certain way, or vice versa (see Sculpture, pp. 33–8). But he takes this thesis a step further by arguing that it is touch that reveals the true form of objects, while sight merely reveals or plays with their superficial appearance. Thus, although sight initially seemed to be the paradigmatic vehicle of knowledge, Herder ultimately concludes that “in painting there is merely beautiful deception” while in sculpture there is “primary truth” (“Fourth Grove,” p. 314). The passages from Sculpture also display what Herder thinks is the significance of the perception of the true form of objects through the tactile medium of sculpture: it communicates to us the feeling of life in the sculpture and in turn arouses our own feeling of being truly alive. In the case of sculpture, both the artist and the audience can fully feel the emotions and passions of life that made Pygmalion wish that his beautiful creation could come alive. This view of the power of art is what Herder finds missing in Riedel and perhaps even in Lessing himself.

In the fourth Grove, Herder also has interesting things to say about arts we have not mentioned, namely, dance, architecture, and horticulture, and an important passage about music, which he analyzes as the “imitation of human passions,” arousing “a series of inner feelings, true, although not distinct, not intuitive, only extremely obscure” (“Fourth Grove,” pp. 406–7). But we will have to leave these arts aside and conclude our discussion of Herder with a comment on his supposed historical and cultural relativism, which, as was earlier noted, has often been thought to be his central contribution to modern thought. Herder’s writings are certainly replete with observations connecting the different circumstances and mores of different cultures and times with differences in their arts and tastes. For example: “The Greek, the Gothic, the Moorish taste in architecture and sculpture, in mythology and in poetry, is it the same? And is [the difference] not to be explained from times, mores, and peoples?” (“Fourth Grove,” p. 286). And in his essay on Shakespeare, he attacks the rigid insistence on unity of time, place, and action in classical French theater by arguing that these ideals grew naturally out of the circumstances of both Greek theater and Greek life, but that it is absurd to make them into rigid rules in the very different circumstances of both modern theater and modern life (“Shakespeare,” pp. 162–3).

However, it would be a mistake to infer from such comments that Herder does not think that there are underlying commonalities in the arts and tastes of different times and places, or that people living in one time and culture cannot learn to appreciate deeply the art of another time and culture. On the contrary, the argument of the essay on Shakespeare is that the best art of different times and places—for example, the theater of Sophocles and that of Shakespeare—must differ superficially precisely because at the deepest level they are committed to the same principle—the truthful imitation of nature—but have different natures to imitate. Thus he writes that the unities of time, place, and action were not artificial for the Greeks at all, although it would be for moderns (“Shakespeare,” p. 163). Further, it is precisely because the Greek “view of the world, their customs, the state of the republics, the tradition of the heroic age, religion, even music, expression, and the degrees of illusion changed” (“Shakespeare,” p. 164), that the drama of Shakespeare was bound to be different than that of Sophocles. It was bound to be different because while all these things changed, Shakespeare was committed to the same underlying principle of truthfully representing his own world that his drama, unlike that of the misguided French classicists, had to look and sound different. If Shakespeare’s “world did not offer such simplicity of history, traditions, domestic, political, and religious conditions, then of course it will not display it” in his work either. Instead, he will create his “drama out of [his world’s] own history, the spirit of its age, customs, views, language, national attitudes, traditions, and pastimes” (“Shakespeare,” p. 167). But in doing so, Shakespeare was in fact doing the same thing as Sophocles:

For Shakespeare is Sophocles’s brother, precisely where he seems to be so dissimilar, and inwardly he is wholly like him. His whole dramatic illusion is attained by means of this authenticity, truth, and historical creativity. (“Shakespeare,” p. 172)

Precisely because the art of Sophocles and that of Shakespeare rest on the same underlying principle it is possible for people at any time to come to appreciate them both, although no doubt with the considerable effort it would take to appreciate fully their language, their customs, in short, their worlds.

5.2 Sulzer

Herder is thus no straightforward historicist or cultural relativist. Rather, his convictions that the best art reveals the truth about its world and that there are deep commonalities in human emotional responses to such truths allow him to defend the ideal of a standard of or paradigm for taste after all. It will be noted, however, that throughout Herder’s aesthetics the notion of play has hardly figured at all; it has been mentioned only in connection with the superficial art of painting rather than with the deeper arts of sculpture, poetry, and even music. For an attempt to combine an aesthetics of truth with an aesthetics of play that is in some ways shallower than Herder’s thought but in other ways an important innovation in German aesthetics, let us now take a look at the work of Johann Georg Sulzer (1720–1779). He was born a quarter-century before Herder but his encyclopedic General Theory of the Fine Arts, first published from 1771 to 1774, was contemporaneous with such central works of Herder as the essays on Ossian and Shakespeare. Sulzer advocates a conventional view of the relation between aesthetic experience and truth: the experience of art—although not solely of beautiful art—can make moral truths vivid and efficacious for us, even though we can know those truths independently of art, and indeed must know the most fundamental principles of morality independently of art. But he also emphasized that aesthetic experience is an intrinsically enjoyable and therefore valuable experience of the unhindered activity of the mind. His conception of the mind has Leibnizian origins, but his emphasis on the pleasure of its unhindered activity points the way toward Kant’s conception of aesthetic experience as the free play of the cognitive powers. While Sulzer was generally a more conventional thinker than Herder, he here introduces a theme that is almost entirely absent from Herder’s thought and prepares the way for Kant’s synthesis of two although not all three of the main approaches of eighteenth-century aesthetics.

Sulzer was born in Winthertur, Switzerland, in 1720. Destined for the clergy, at sixteen he was boarded with a pastor in Zürich and attended the gymnasium there. But at eighteen, he became more interested in the study of mathematics, botany, and philosophy, and came under the influence of Bodmer and Breitinger. Sulzer was ordained on the completion of his studies in 1739, and in 1740 became a tutor in a wealthy Zürich household. The next year he became a village vicar and was able to devote himself to natural history and archaeology. In 1744 he took up a teaching position in Magdeburg, Germany, and in 1747 he became professor of mathematics at a gymnasium in Berlin. Sulzer was elected to the Academy of Sciences in 1750. From that time on he regularly published essays on reason, consciousness, language, materialism, the immortality of the soul, and the nature and existence of God, as well as a lengthy “Investigation of the original of agreeable and disagreeable sentiments” (1751), which first stated central themes of his aesthetics. He also published shorter treatments of such topics as genius (1757), the utility of drama, a reply to Rousseau’s attack upon the theater (1760), and “Energy in works of fine art” (1765). In 1755 Sulzer published a translation of Hume’s first Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, and Hume’s theories of the imagination and the moral sentiments, although not his skepticism, would considerably influence the further development of Sulzer’s own philosophy. Although Sulzer himself remained at bottom a loyal Leibnizo-Wolffian, his introduction of Hume into German philosophical discourse prepared the way for Kant’s critique of that philosophy. In 1761, Sulzer began work on his General Theory of the Fine Arts, which was originally planned as a revision of Jacques Lacombe’s Dictionnaire portraitif des beaux-arts (1752) but became a vehicle for the statement of Sulzer’s own general views about aesthetics and the moral significance of art as well an outlet for his vast learning and energy. Sulzer finally published the General Theory in two volumes from 1771 to 1774; especially in the expanded posthumous editions by Friedrich von Blankenburg in 1786–87 and 1792–94 (Sulzer having died in 1779), this remains a valuable source for the aesthetics of the German Enlightenment and especially for its bibliography.

Sulzer’s earliest works in aesthetics concerned nature rather than art, but already demonstrated his lifelong concern for the moral significance of aesthetic experience. In his Conversations on the Beauties of Nature (Unterredungen über die Schönheiten der Natur, 1750), which was republished in 1770 together with his earlier Moral Thoughts on the Works of Nature (Versuch einiger moralischen Gedanken über die Werke der Natur, 1745), Sulzer analyzed the benefits of the enjoyment of natural beauty in a way that prefigured his subsequent complex analysis of the value of art. In the first conversation he argued that the contemplation of natural beauty has a calming and moderating influence on our passions. The remaining conversations argue that the contemplation of the order of nature proves to us that its existence cannot have been a matter of chance, and that its beauty gives us palpable evidence of the wisdom and benevolence of its creator. This analysis foreshadows Sulzer’s later position that the enjoyment of art is of immediate moral value because it directly contributes to our happiness, which is the ultimate object of morality, and is also of indirect moral value because it can enliven and thereby make more effective our knowledge of the general precepts of morality, and is indeed the best instrument for that end.

Sulzer’s mature aesthetics is firmly grounded in his generally Leibnizo-Wolffian metaphysics and psychology as well as in his Wolffian moral philosophy. The central tenets of his metaphysics and psychology are that the human mind is essentially representational, so that desire and will as well as cognition are forms of representation, and that the ultimate source of all of our pleasurable sentiments is the unhindered activity of our capacity for representation. Conversely, the fundamental source of disagreeable sentiments is the restriction of our representational activity. Sulzer’s morality is a Wolffian form of utilitarianism, according to which the goal of the moral life is happiness. Thus, whatever contributes to happiness is at least prima facie good. Aesthetic experience is a variety of free and unhindered activity of our representational capacity, and therefore produces pleasurable sentiments which are a primary constituent of happiness. In that way, aesthetic experience is of direct moral value. But works of art also enliven our abstract knowledge of moral precepts and make them effective on our action, so aesthetic experience is also of indirect moral value. Sulzer’s morality might seem egocentric, but he forestalls such an objection by an argument that normal human beings naturally desire for others what they desire for themselves, and naturally recognize the right of others to that for which they claim a right for themselves (“Psychological Considerations,” p. 287). Thus those who desire happiness for themselves naturally desire it for others as well, and those who desire happiness in the form of the pleasure of aesthetic experience for themselves will naturally desire it for others as well. However, Sulzer also recognizes that art can be put to perverse and immoral use as well as healthy and good use, thus while art can contribute to morality both directly and indirectly we must also have an independent grasp of and commitment to the fundamental principles of morality in order to make sure that aesthetic experience’s natural tendency to morally good outcomes is not perverted.

Working within the tradition of Wolff and Baumgarten, Sulzer bases his aesthetics on the premise that the experience of beauty is founded on the sensuous perception of perfection. Perfection consists in the rich variety of a manifold on the one hand and its unity on the other but also in a third element, namely the “complete agreement” of what a thing is “with what it ought to be, or of the real with the ideal” (“Vollkommenheit” (“Perfection”) in Allgemeine Theorie der schönen Künste, volume IV, pp. 688–9, at p. 688). He thus allows for no conception of perfection without a concept of purpose. Kant will subsequently reject the assumption that we must have a conception of the purpose of an object in order to make a (pure) judgment of beauty about it. But Sulzer himself already departs from the purely Wolffian conception that the experience of beauty consists simply in a clear but obscure recognition of the perfection of an object relative to a conception of its purpose because he holds that the experience of the beauty of an object is an awareness of its effect on our representational faculty rather than an awareness of the cause of that effect in the object. Thus the experience of beauty becomes the sensation or sentiment (Empfindung) caused by the perfection of the object, rather than a clear but indistinct cognition of that perfection. The real object of pleasure then becomes the activity of one’s own representational state, manifested in the form of sentiment, that is caused by the perfection of the beautiful object. This is Sulzer’s decisive modification of the Leibnizo-Wolffian approach to aesthetics, not to be found in Baumgarten nor in Herder. However, from this innovation Sulzer does not draw the conclusion that Kant subsequently will, namely, that there can be no general rules for beauty. On the contrary, in his view the causal relation between perfection in the object and the pleasurable sentiments of activity in the subject is precisely the sort of relation that gives rise to rules, although such rules will be fairly general rather than very specific.

In holding that the real source of our pleasure in beautiful objects is our sensation of our own representational activity Sulzer is led to identify aesthetically valuable forms of sentiment that are not caused by beauty at all. In fact, he argues that the fine arts must arouse the full range of human sentiments, even sentiments of ugliness (although, unlike Lessing, he does not distinguish among the fine arts in this regard) (“Häßlich” (“Ugly”), Allgemeine Theorie, volume II, pp. 457–9). But even before he reaches that conclusion, his theory of beauty makes the nature and aims of art more complex than they might initially seem. Sulzer employs a trifold division of things that please us that is not dissimilar to Kant’s subsequent distinction between the agreeable, the good, and the beautiful. He distinguishes between things that please us “even if we do not have the least conception of the constitution” or means by which they do that, things that please us only if we have “a distinct representation of their constitution,” and things that please us because “the constitution of the objects charms our attention,” but where we “sense a satisfaction in them before we cognize them distinctly, before we know what they ought to be.” The last of these is what comprise the “class of the beautiful properly speaking,” while the former correspond to Kant’s classes of the agreeable and the good respectively (“Schön” (“Beautiful”), Allgemeine Theorie, volume IV, pp. 305–19, at p. 306). Then Sulzer makes a further distinction. Because of his inclusion of purposiveness in his conception of perfection, he argues that the perfect can please us “either because of its material, or because of its external form, or through its inner constitution, by means of which it is an instrument or means for the achievement of some final end” (ibid., p. 307). Correspondingly, there is a distinction between the pleasure that we may take in superficial beauty of the form and matter of an object, and the deeper pleasure that we take when an object also has “inner worth.” “A higher species of beauty arises from the close unification of the perfect, the beautiful, and the good. This arouses not merely satisfaction, but true inner pleasure, which often empowers the entire soul, and the enjoyment of which is happiness” (ibid., pp. 309–10). On Sulzer’s account, a beauty that appeals to the full range of our cognitive and emotional capacities through its purposiveness as well as its form is a “higher species” of beauty than one that appeals to our sense of form alone.

Sulzer’s conception of the two levels of beauty also leads him to an account of the “ideal of beauty” that may have been a source for Kant’s later discussion of that concept, which will in turn be criticized by Friedrich Schiller (see section 8). According to Sulzer,

that the human form [Gestalt] is the most beautiful of all visible objects does not need to be proved…The strongest, the most noble, and the most blessed sentiments of which the human mind is capable are effects of this beauty. (“Schönheit” (“Beauty”), Allgemeine Theorie, volume IV, pp. 319–27, at pp. 319–20)

The “external form of the inner character of a human being” (ibid., p. 322) is the ideal of beauty, when the beauty of that external form expresses the goodness of the internal character; correspondingly, the external expression of inner evil is the most hateful form of appearance. Like Herder, Sulzer recognizes that the variety of human tastes in both form and more substantial matters of morality means that different individuals and peoples will find both different external forms beautiful and different characters good, thus leading to differences in their ideals of beauty. But he is confident of the general principle that “every human being holds that to be most beautiful whose form announces to the eye of the judge the most perfect and best human being” (ibid., p. 320). This illustrates his general conception of the force of rules of taste: they express underlying commonalities in the etiology of human preferences without entailing complete agreement about particulars.

Sulzer also develops a complex theory of the value of fine art. Fine art aims to produce pleasure both by setting our cognitive powers into activity through the formal and material beauties of its products and by arousing our deepest feelings. Since the aim of morality is human happiness, art has immediate moral value just because it sets our mental powers into enjoyable activity. But its ability to arouse our emotions also gives art indirect moral value through its capacity to enliven and make effective our otherwise abstract and not always efficacious acknowledgement of the general precepts of morality. Thus, in such a statement as that “the essence” of art

consists in the fact that it impresses the objects of our representation with sensible force, its end is the lively affection [Rührung] of our minds, and in its application it aims at the elevation of the spirit and the heart, (“Künste; Schöne Künste” (“Arts; Fine Arts”) Allgemeine Theorie, volume III, pp. 72–95, at p. 75),

Sulzer clearly indicates that art has immediate value in its vivification of our sensory and cognitive powers as well as the value of its power to elevate our spirit and heart and thereby make morality efficacious for us. To be sure, he often emphasizes the latter aspect of the value of art more than the former; for example, he writes

The fine arts also use their charms in order to draw our attention to the good and to affect us with love for it. Only through this application does it become important to the human race and deserve the attention of the wise and the support of regents. (ibid., p. 76)

In a time and place where Calvinism and Pietism still questioned the value of the fine arts, it may have been necessary for him to emphasize the value of art for enlivening our moral precepts over his theory that morality itself aims at a kind of happiness in which the pleasures of the fine arts play a direct and major rôle. But the latter is as much a part of his thought as the former.

Sulzer’s more conventional view that the fine arts serve morality by enlivening our moral feelings explains his recognition of the value of the ugly as well as the beautiful in art: our sentiments of ugliness need to be aroused in order to strengthen our aversion to the evil just as our sentiments of beauty need to be aroused in order to strengthen our attraction to the good. But Sulzer also recognizes that the emotional power of art means that it can be made into a tool for evil as well as for good, especially in the political arena. For example, a leader

who does not have sufficiently secure power in his hands turns to the efforts of his artists in order to clothe his tyranny with agreeableness; and by this means the attention of that part of the populace which is merely passive is turned away from freedom and directed toward mere entertainment. (“Künste; Schöne Künste,” Allgemeine Theorie, volume III, p. 83)

For this reason, the moral potential of art must be governed by a firm recognition of the fundamental principles of morality itself (ibid., p. 78). Sulzer does not make the mistake of thinking that the experience of fine art, valuable as it can be for sound morality and politics, can substitute for a direct grasp of sound principles of morality and politics. Although his emphasis on the moral potential of the heightened sensitivity (Empfindlichkeit) that can be developed through aesthetic education may have been an important source for Schiller, he would not have gone as far as the latter does in his Letters on Aesthetic Education in suggesting that aesthetic education is both a necessary and sufficient condition for moral regeneration.

5.3 Herz

Sulzer was clearly significant for successors such as Kant and Schiller, both for his emphasis on the free activity of the mind in aesthetic experience and for his complex rather than simplistic position on the relation between art and morality. One other important aesthetician of the 1770s was also, like Herder, actually a student of Kant, but his theory would become an unstated target of Kant’s criticism rather than a source for him. This is Marcus Herz (1747–1803), Herder’s junior by three years. Remembered by philosophers primarily as the respondent at the defense of Kant’s inaugural dissertation On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible World in 1770 and as the recipient of Kant’s letters describing his progress on the Critique of Pure Reason in the following decade, Herz had a significant career of his own, as a physician and medical writer, as a lecturer on philosophy, and as the author not only of the earliest exposition of Kant’s philosophy, but also of an independent and important work in aesthetics.

Herz was born to a Jewish scribe and his wife in Berlin in 1747, and received a traditional talmudic education. At the age of fifteen he was sent to apprentice with a Jewish merchant in Königsberg, but at nineteen he matriculated at the university in Königsberg (two years after Herder had left) as a medical student—the only university course open to Jews in Prussia. Medical students were required to study modern languages, philosophy, and mathematics, and Herz became a loyal student of Kant’s, attending his lectures on logic, metaphysics, moral philosophy, natural law, physics, and physical geography. Kant’s selection of the Jewish student for the defense of his inaugural dissertation in 1770 was not accepted happily by some members of the faculty, but Kant supported Herz then and always remained loyal to him, even as the student’s views diverged from his own. Shortly after the defense of Kant’s dissertation, Herz left Königsberg without a degree but with an introduction from Kant to Moses Mendelssohn. He immediately became a member of Mendelssohn’s circle, and also resumed his medical studies in Berlin, and then from 1772 to 1774 in Halle, where he received his doctorate. He then returned to Berlin, where he was appointed to the Jewish hospital. He attended Mendelssohn in his final illness in 1786. Most of Herz’s publications arose from his medical and scientific practice, and included his Letters to Doctors in 1777 and 1784; Outline of All Medical Sciences in 1782, which was adopted as a textbook in Halle; a companion to his Berlin lectures on Experimental Physics; an Essay on Dizziness in 1786; and a controversial essay On Early Burial among the Jews in 1787, in which he argued against the current practice among Jews of burial on the day of death on medical grounds, holding that death could not always be conclusively determined within such a short period. In 1782, Herz also provided the German translation of Manasseh ben Israel’s Vindication of the Jews, to which Mendelssohn provided the preface that would in turn lead the way to his Jerusalem of the next year; Herz thus played a role in the genesis of that central text. In 1777 he began offering private lectures on philosophy in addition to his medical practice, which were well attended. Herz died on January 19, 1803, a year before his teacher Kant.

Herz’s two important philosophical works were his Considerations from Speculative Philosophy (Betrachtungen aus der spekulativen Weltweisheit) of 1771 and his Essay on Taste and the Causes of its Variety (Versuch über den Geschmack und die Ursachen seiner Verschiedenheit), first published in 1776 and then in an expanded edition in 1790—the same year as Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment. The contrast between the two works in aesthetics is interesting, because while some arguments in Kant’s work can be construed as subtle criticisms of some of Herz’s positions, Herz finished even the second edition of his book without any knowledge of Kant’s criticisms. In general, he remained closer to the Wolffian and Baumgartian theory of beauty and taste that had been transmitted to him through Mendelssohn than to the position of his erstwhile teacher Kant, but he also shared Sulzer’s emphasis on mental activity and Herder’s emphasis on the social dimension of art while introducing some novel positions of his own.

Herz’s Considerations from Speculative Philosophy, published at the age of twenty-four, does not purport to be more than a German paraphrase of Kant’s Latin dissertation, but it goes beyond Kant’s published work on a number of points in the treatment of space, time, and things in themselves. It also adds a Mendelssohnian argument about the simplicity of the soul, and, most surprisingly, includes a digression on aesthetic judgment that anticipates a central argument of his subsequent Essay on Taste. The central arguments of this digression, which comes in Herz’s exposition of Kant’s new theory of space and time as the forms of sensibility, are first, that beauty is an objective property especially connected to the form of an object, and not a mere sensation or sentiment (Empfindung) in the subject, and second, that there are general principles of beautiful form. However, form must always be realized in matter, and individuals differ more in their response to matter than to form, so these general principles are objective but not completely determinate, thus allowing for differences of taste even though beauty is objective. Kant would subsequently agree that individuals differ in their response to matter but not to form, but then restrict pure judgments of taste to form alone, thus attempting to guarantee unanimity of judgments of taste instead of accepting variation as Herz did. Kant’s analysis of pure judgments of taste might thus be seen as a criticism of Herz’s theory.

Five years after the Considerations, Herz developed this conception of beauty as objective but yielding only indeterminate rules for taste into the far more extensive Essay on Taste. Herz begins with what he considers to be a Baumgartian definition of beauty as the appearance of perfection in an object, where perfection in turn consists in the unity of a manifold. However, he adds that a work of art also has a Haltung, or expresses an attitude, and that its beauty also depends upon the harmony between the attitude expressed in the work and the goal or purpose of the work. We do not attribute purposes to natural objects, he argues, so in their case beauty lies in manifoldness and unity alone, but in human productions and therefore in art we always expect and respond to a purpose. Here Herz’s analysis anticipates Kant’s differentiation between natural and artistic beauty. He next argues that as natural beauty consists only in manifoldness and unity, we respond to it with the play of our imagination, which apprehends manifoldness, and reason, which recognizes unity. But as artistic beauty consists in the objective factors of manifoldness, unity, and attitude, the response to artistic beauty depends upon imagination, reason, and the further element of feeling, for response to the attitude of the work. In this analysis, Herz stresses that the perception of beauty is not passive, but rather active, because of the rôle of both imagination and reason. He also argues that our pleasure in beauty is ultimately due to the activity of our mental powers in its perception, activity being the greatest source of our pleasure. Here Herz clearly aligns himself with Sulzer. Herz then argues that human beings share their basic capacities of imagination, reason, and feeling, but that there are numerous factors that affect how these general faculties function concretely in different individuals and populations. This explains differences of taste without undermining the metaphysical objectivity of beauty: these differences include variations in freedom of thought, religion, morality, material wealth, climate and regime. Here Herz’s thought parallels the contemporary thought of Herder.

Some of Herz’s most interesting points and his greatest differences with Kant’s theory of taste emerge in the discussion of the influence of morality on taste. Herz argues that the enjoyment of beauty contributes to morality in two ways, directly and indirectly. The enjoyment of beauty contributes to morality directly because as a source of mental activity it is a source of happiness, and happiness is nothing less than the aim of morality. Here again Herz adopts the same positions as Sulzer. Herz takes a different position than Sulzer on the indirect moral benefits of art, however, arguing not that the experience of art enlivens moral sentiments that we already have from our more abstract recognition of general moral precepts, but rather that the cultivation of taste, which happens only in society, contributes to morality indirectly because it generates feelings of sociability that can then support our attempts to be moral. Although Kant will not mention Herz’s name in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, this seems to be the kind of vindication of aesthetic experience that Kant criticizes under the name of an “empirical interest in the beautiful,” holding that morality requires an a priori principle rather than mere feelings of sociability and can therefore be supported only by an “intellectual interest in the beautiful.”

Finally, in the appendix to the Essay Herz also argues against the position of Du Bos that critics have no better rules for arguing about the merits of works of art than cooks do for arguing about ragouts, a position adopted from Du Bos by Hume and subsequently endorsed by Kant. In spite of his recognition of the many factors that create variability in judgments of taste, Herz thus insisted to the end that we can have not just an a priori ideal of agreement in taste but rational means for arguing about judgments of taste, consisting in discussion of unity amidst variety on the one hand and the identification of factors leading to disagreement on the other hand. In this regard, Herz remained within the ambit of Wolff, Baumgarten, and Meier rather than approaching the view of his contemporary Herder. One might nevertheless have expected his emphasis on the rôle of individual mental activity in aesthetic experience, rather than Herder’s emphasis on truth as the basis of aesthetic experience, to have led to the more radical position on the possibility of determinate rules for art criticism.

6. Moritz: Art as that which is Perfect in itself

Karl Philipp Moritz (1756–1793) is the last of the pre-Kantian German aestheticians who will be considered here. Moritz was another of the many German intellectuals of the eighteenth century who rose to renown from unpromising beginnings. He was the son of an army musician who sought refuge from his own circumstances in Quietism, an extreme sect of Pietism, and inflicted its religiosity upon his son. After several years as an apprentice to a hatmaker, Moritz was able to attend grammar school. He spent a few years at the universities in Erfurt and Wittenberg, interspersed with attempts to become an actor and a stay at the seminary of the Moravian Brothers, another Pietist sect. At twenty-two, he became a schoolteacher in Berlin. In 1782 he made a trip to England and published a travelogue which won him some recognition, after which he returned to his school until 1786, when his publisher financed a trip to Italy in the hope of getting another popular travelogue out of him. In Italy Moritz became a friend of Goethe, who would write a much more famous account of his Italian journey, and learned enough about classical art to become professor of aesthetics at the Academy of Arts in Berlin in 1789, the position he held until his death just four years later. Moritz’s publications during his brief but intense literary career included, in addition to his Italian travelogue, eventually published in 1792–3, the novels Anton Reiser (1786–90), a barely fictionalized autobiography, and Andreas Hartknopf: An Allegory; philological works including an Essay on German Prosody in 1786 and Lectures on Style in 1793; textbooks on grammar and logic for children, a German Grammar for the Ladies, English and Italian grammars for Germans, and an eventually very successful account of Greek mythology aimed at both children and adults; a Theory of Ornament; and a journal of “empirical psychology” (erfahrende Seelenkunde) that he edited for ten years. But what concern us here are the essays in aesthetics that Moritz published between 1785 and 1791.

These essays commence with the ambitiously entitled “Attempt at a Unification of all the Fine Arts and Sciences under the Concept of that which is complete in itself,” dedicated to Moses Mendelssohn and published in 1785 in an issue of the Berlinische Monatsschrift that also contained an article (on astronomy) by Kant. In these essays Moritz argues that works of art please us because they have an “internal purposiveness” independent of any purpose external to them, a conception that might seem to anticipate Kant’s own account of beauty as “purposiveness without a purpose” and the nineteenth-century conception of “art for art’s sake.” It is certainly possible that Kant read Moritz’s essay, appearing as it did alongside one of his own, but Kant’s notion of “subjective” or “formal” purposiveness is more a repudiation of Moritz’s conception of “internal purposiveness” than a successor to it. Moritz’s view is also distinct from later conceptions of “art for art’s sake.” In fact, as the brief “Outlines of a Complete Theory of the Fine Arts” that he published in the journal of the Academy of Arts in 1789 makes clear, Moritz rejected the “subjectivist” view that our pleasure in artistic or natural beauty is due primarily to the way in which it freely engages our own mental powers on which the theory of Kant and later advocates of “art for art’s sake” is based in favor of an “objectivist” view:

The genuinely beautiful is not merely in us and in our manner of representation, but is to be found outside us in the objects themselves. (“Grundlinien zu einer vollständigen Theorie der schönen Künste,” in Werke, volume II, pp. 591–2, at p. 591)

What Moritz actually held is that the “internal purposiveness” of a work of art is an intimation of the perfection of the world as a whole, and that we enjoy it precisely as such an intimation. Thus Moritz attempted to stem the growth of the theory of aesthetic experience as free play by reverting to a theory of beauty as an intimation of the true order of the cosmos that has its roots in the views of Wolff and Shaftesbury.

Both the essay on art as “that which is complete in itself” and a longer pamphlet “On the formative Imitation of the Beautiful” (Über die bildende Nachahmung des Schönen) that Moritz published in 1788 start off with a contrast between the beautiful on the one side and the useful and the good on the other in a way that does anticipate the opening stratagem of Kant’s “Analytic of the Beautiful” in his Critique of the Power of Judgment in 1790. Moritz analyses the useful in particular as a means to a perfection that lies outside of the useful object itself, namely,

the convenience or comfortableness that accrues to myself or another through the use of it…i.e., I consider it merely as a means, for which I myself, in so far as my perfection is thereby promoted, am the end. The merely useful object is thus in itself nothing whole or complete.

Then he immediately assumes, as if this were the only alternative, that

In the contemplation of the beautiful I roll the end from myself back into the object itself: I consider it, as something that is complete not in me but rather in itself, that thus comprises a whole in itself, and that affords me pleasure on its own account. (“Über den Begriff des in sich selbst Vollendeten,” Werke, volume II, pp. 543–8, at p. 543)

Moritz continues that a beautiful object does not please us, like a clock or a knife, because it satisfies some need of our own, not even the need to be pleased, but, remarkably, that

the beautiful needs us, in order to be cognized. We could subsist very well without the contemplations of beautiful works of art, but these, as such, cannot well subsist without our contemplation.

He then goes on to say that when we see a play put on before an empty theater, we are displeased, not for the sake of the author or actors, but for the sake of the play itself, as work of art whose need to be contemplated is going unfulfilled (ibid., p. 544)!

In a passage that points more toward Arthur Schopenhauer than to Kant, Moritz next writes:

The sweet astonishment, the agreeable forgetting of ourself in the contemplation of a beautiful work of art, is also a proof that our gratification here is something subordinate, that we voluntarily allow ourself to be determined through the beautiful, to which we for a while concede a sort of sovereignty over all our own feelings. While the beautiful draws our consideration entirely to itself, it draws us for a while away from our self, it is the highest degree of pure and unselfish gratification that the beautiful affords us. In the moment we sacrifice our individual, limited existence to a sort of higher existence. The gratification in the beautiful must thereby ever more approach that of unselfish love if it is to be genuine…. The beautiful in the work of art is not for me pure and unmixed until I completely think away its special relation to me and consider it is as something that has been brought forth entirely for its own sake, so that it could be something complete in itself. (Ibid., p. 545)

As the popularity of Schopenhauer’s subsequent presentation of this view demonstrates, Moritz has surely here captured an aspect of the experience of artistic—or for that matter natural—beauty that many people have felt. But so far his conception of and argument for the idea of the beautiful as that which is perfect and complete in itself has been entirely negative; what is it in a beautiful object that can so please us and yet distract us completely from our ordinary concern with ourselves and our own pleasures?

The answer to this question can be found in Moritz’s longer essay On the formative Imitation of the Beautiful. Here, after a more extended contrast between the beautiful, the useful, and the good, Moritz adds to his previous account that a beautiful object is something that seems to us to be “a whole subsisting for itself” insofar as it “strikes our senses or can be grasped by our imagination,” and that “to that extent our instruments of sensation prescribe its measure to the beautiful” (Über die bildende Nachahmung des Schönen, Werke, volume II, pp. 551–78, at pp. 558–9). Here he aligns himself with the tradition of Wolff and Baumgarten by asserting that the perception of beauty is a perception of perfection by means of the senses or their extension through imagination. But he still owes us an explanation of what the internal and objective perfection of the beautiful object is. This comes next, when he states that it is actually the “interconnection of the whole of nature” insofar as we grasp it by means of the senses and imagination that we contemplate and admire in a beautiful work of art, or that it is intimated to us by such a work. “Every beautiful whole from the hand of the formative artist is thus a little impression of the highest beauty in the great whole of nature” (ibid., p. 560; see also “Grundlinien,” p. 592). The beautiful intimates the true order of the world-whole to us in a way that the use of our ordinary powers of thought, imagination, and sense on particular pieces of the world-whole cannot do. Only in the experience of the beautiful can we actually get a sense of the order of the world-whole.

From the premise that “The nature of the beautiful consists precisely in the fact that its inner essence lies outside of the limits of the power of thought, in its origination, in its own coming-to-be,” Moritz infers that “in the case of the beautiful, the power of thought can no longer ask, why is it beautiful?” (ibid., p. 564). The essence of beauty thus escapes ordinary conceptual thought. This is the basis for Moritz’s argument, in another essay entitled “The Signature of the Beautiful,” that the beautiful cannot be described, that is, that although words themselves may be beautiful, they cannot provide a description of beauty—even such a brilliant description as Winckelmann’s description of the Apollo Belvedere “rips apart the wholeness of this work of art,” and “is more damaging than useful to the contemplation of this sublime work of art” (“Die Signatur des Schönen,” Werke, volume II, pp. 579–88, at p. 588). And for this reason, the artistic genius cannot be fully conscious of what he does when he creates a beautiful work of art, for its beauty cannot be reduced to any concept that he can state (ibid., p. 585). Here Moritz arrives at results that are superficially similar to those Kant will arrive at a few years later—that aesthetic judgments cannot be grounded in determinate concept and that the process of creation by artistic genius cannot be guided and explained by determinate concepts. But he reaches these conclusions for very different reasons: Kant will draw these conclusions from his subjectivist account of the origin of aesthetic pleasure in a play of the cognitive powers that is free rather than determined by concepts, while Moritz draws these conclusions from his conception that a beautiful object always intimates the order of the world-whole that is beyond our grasp through any of the ordinary powers of mind. In other words, Moritz draws his conclusions from his version of an aesthetics of truth, while Kant will draw similar conclusions from an aesthetics based on the idea of the free play of mental powers.

In 1791, Moritz dedicated a review of the Essay on Taste by “our mutual friend” Herz to Salomon Maimon, another Jewish intellectual who had arisen to prominence in Berlin from beginnings even more unpromising than those of Mendelssohn and Herz. Here he manifests his own allegiance to Wolff and Baumgarten, arguing that his conception of beauty as the internal perfection of a work of art as it strikes the senses and imagination is essentially the same as their conception of beauty as “sensible perfection” (he draws no distinction between Wolff and Baumgarten) (“Über des Herrn Professor Herz Versuch über den Geschmack: An Herrn Salomon Maimon,” Werke, volume II, pp. 923–7, at p. 925). In this work he also tries to paper over any difference between himself and Kant, whose Critique of the Power of Judgment had also appeared the year before, by claiming that Kant’s concept of “purposiveness without purpose is nothing other than an ideal purpose,” and thus that Kant’s concept of beauty is essentially the same as Wolff’s and his own (ibid., p. 926). This is not true, because Moritz’s conception of the beauty of an individual work of art is that it is an intimation of the true and objective order of nature as a whole, while Kant’s notion of purposiveness without purpose is that of a subjective state of mind in which our mental powers of imagination and understanding are in a free harmony that does not by itself represent anything at all. At least in what Kant calls the “pure” judgment of taste, the experience of beauty is pleasurable without meaning anything or conveying any truth. As we will see, that is in fact only the starting-point of Kant’s aesthetics, although as he moves past his initial analysis of “pure” or “free” beauty he does add back into his view the beauties of truth that figured so prominently for so many of his German predecessors up through Herder and Moritz, as well as the beauty of utility that we saw to play a large rôle in the British tradition, for example in Hume. But we cannot appreciate the complexity of Kant’s aesthetics unless we have seen the separate approaches that he ultimately combines.

7. Kant: Playing with Truth

Immanuel Kant’s only significant work in aesthetics, the Critique of the Power of Judgment, came late in his life, at the end of the extraordinary decade in which he had published the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, revised 1787), the Prolegomena to any future Metaphysics (1783), the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), the Critique of Practical Reason (1788), and a host of important essays on history, science, and theology as well as philosophy. Although we take its existence for granted now, Kant’s third Critique could only have struck its original audience as a surprising and puzzling work. It was surprising, because the second critique had not announced a forthcoming third anymore than the first had announced that there would be a second; and it was puzzling, because the book not only gives an extended treatment to one topic, namely aesthetic experience and judgment, which Kant had previously denied could be the subject of a science (Critique of Pure Reason, A 21/B 35–6), but also links that topic with another, namely the teleological judgment of both organisms within nature and of nature as a whole, to which Kant had never before linked it. Clearly there must have been some revolution in Kant’s conception of the tasks of philosophy as well in his assessment of the prospects of both aesthetics and teleology. This change in view both made it imperative for him and enabled him to write this book, linking two subjects that were not only disparate but that had also previously been problematic for him, so soon after having completed his exhausting labors on the first two critiques.

Kant does not immediately reveal a profound motivation for the new book in either the first draft of its Introduction, the so-called “first introduction” of 1789, or in the Preface or first section of the published Introduction as well as several of its subsequent sections. These are focused on the distinctions among the several faculties of the mind and the divisions of philosophy. As a result, the introductions make it seem as if Kant has been moved primarily by a pedantic desire for completeness to find a place in his system for two disciplines, aesthetics and teleology, that had been discussed by many of his German, British, and French predecessors, but that had apparently not played a large role in his own thought heretofore. It seems that the main task of the third Critique will be to introduce the conception of a new class of judgments or new use of the power of judgment, “reflecting” (reflektierend) judgment, which will subsume the aesthetic and teleological judgment and demonstrate both their affinities with and differences from the theoretical judgments analyzed and grounded in the first Critique and the moral judgments treated in the second Critique. However, Kant was driven to connect aesthetic and teleological judgment by a much more profound and powerful motivation than that of mere systematic housekeeping. This deeper motivation is first revealed in the second section of the published Introduction. Here Kant claims that there is a substantive and important problem that calls for a third critique, namely that

Although there is an incalculable gulf fixed between the domain of the concept of nature, as the sensible, and the domain of the concept of freedom, as the supersensible, so that from the former to the latter (thus by means of the theoretical use of reason) no transition is possible, just as if there were so many different worlds, the first of which can have no influence on the second: yet the latter should have an influence on the former, namely the concept of freedom should make the end that is imposed by its laws real in the sensible world, and nature must consequently also be able to be conceived in such a way that the lawfulness of its form is at least in agreement with the possibility of the ends that are to be realized in it in accordance with the laws of freedom. (CPJ, Introduction, section II, 5:174–5; see also section IX, 5:195–6)

The problem that has apparently not been solved by the earlier two critiques is that of showing that our choice to act in accordance with the moral law, as the fundamental principle of all laws of freedom, a choice that can be free only if it is conceived of as taking place in a “supersensible” or noumenal realm that is not governed by the deterministic laws of “sensible” or phenomenal nature, where every event is fully determined by chains of causality extending far back beyond any particular choice of any particular individual, must nevertheless be efficacious within that phenomenal world, able to transform the natural world into a “moral world” where people really do act in accordance with the moral law and the ends that are imposed upon us by that law really can be realized. And the reason for linking aesthetic and teleological judgment together in a third critique apparently must be that these two forms of human experience and judgment together somehow offer a solution to this problem.

But what problem about the efficacy of the laws of freedom in the realm of nature could remain to be solved after the first two critiques? The Critique of Pure Reason had argued that although we can disprove the possibility of any breach in the determinism of the natural world and cannot have theoretical knowledge of the freedom of our will in the noumenal world, nevertheless we can coherently conceive of the latter. And the Critique of Practical Reason had argued that we can confidently infer the reality of our noumenal freedom to choose to do whatever morality requires of us from our immediate awareness of our obligation under the moral law combined with the principle that if we ought to do something then we must be able to do it (see Critique of Practical Reason, §6, 5:30, and Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, 6:62, 66–7). The second Critique had also argued that since morality imposes an end upon us, namely that of realizing the highest good, the greatest happiness consistent with the greatest virtue, we must believe this to be possible, and thus must postulate “a supreme cause of nature having a causality in keeping with the moral disposition” (Critique of Practical Reason, Dialectic, 5:125; translation from Gregor, p. 240). If Kant has already established that on the basis of our awareness of our obligations under the moral law we can be confident that we have free will and that all of the laws of nature are at least consistent with our realization of the ends commanded by the moral law, what more needs to be done in order to throw a bridge between the theoretical cognition of nature and the laws of freedom?

As both the second critique and the preceding Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals make clear, Kant clearly recognizes that in order to act morally, we need to (i) understand the moral law and what it requires of us; (ii) believe that we are in fact free to choose to do what it requires of us rather than to do what all our other motives, which can be subsumed under the rubric of self-love, might suggest to us; (iii) believe that the objectives that morality imposes upon us can actually be achieved, and (iv) have an adequate motivation for our attempt to do what morality requires of us in lieu of the mere desirability of particular goals it might happen to license or even impose in particular circumstances. All of these together constitute the conditions of the possibility of morality. Kant also thinks that at one level all these conditions are satisfied by pure practical reason itself: (i) the very form of pure practical reason gives us the moral law; (ii) the first “fact” of pure practical reason, namely our consciousness of our obligation under this law, implies the reality of our freedom to be moral by means of the principle that we must be able to do what we know we ought to do; (iii) we can postulate by pure practical reason alone that the laws of nature are compatible with the demands of morality because both laws ultimately have a common author; and finally (iv) pure respect for the moral law itself can be a sufficient motivation for us to attempt to carry it out (and attempts to do so have “moral worth” only when that is our motivation). But Kant also recognizes that we are sensuous as well as rational creatures, and need sensuous as well as rational presentation and confirmation of the conditions of the possibility of morality. The task of the third Critique will then be to show how both aesthetic and teleological experience and judgment provide sensuous confirmation of what we do already know in an abstract way, but also need to feel or make palpable to ourselves, namely the efficacy of our free choice of the fundamental principle of morality in the natural world and the realizability of the objectives which that choice imposes upon us, summed up in the concept of the highest good. Specifically, Kant will argue that although in its purest form, the free play of our understanding and imagination that constitutes the experience of natural beauty does not presuppose any judgment of moral value, the very fact of the existence of natural beauty appears to confirm that the world is hospitable to our goals, especially our moral goals, while our experiences of natural sublimity and artistic beauty both involve the free play of our cognitive powers with morally significant ideas, and thus are distinctively aesthetic yet morally significant.

7.1 Kant’s Theory of Free Play

Following the canonical model introduced into eighteenth-century aesthetics by Burke and transmitted into Germany by Mendelssohn, Kant divides the first half of the Critique of the Power of Judgment, the “Critique of the Aesthetic Power of Judgment,” into two main parts, the “Analytic of the Beautiful” and the “Analytic of the Sublime.” But Kant actually analyzes three main forms of aesthetic experience—the experience of beauty, paradigmatically natural beauty; the experience of the sublime, again paradigmatically of sublimity in nature; and the experience of fine art—and each of these forms of aesthetic experience ultimately reveals distinctive connections to morality.

Starting from the claim that Francis Hutcheson had made in 1725 and Mendelssohn reintroduced in 1785, Kant begins his analysis of the judgment of taste, that is, our claim that a particular object is beautiful, from the premise that our pleasure in a beautiful object occurs independently of any interest in the existence of the object as physiologically agreeable (CPJ, §3, 5:205–7) or as good for some purpose expressed by a determinate concept of utility or morality (CPJ, §4, 5:207–9). But neither does a judgment of taste does not express a merely idiosyncratic association of pleasure with an object. Rather, to call an object beautiful is to speak with a “universal voice,” to assert that the pleasure one takes in the object is one that should be felt by anyone who responds to the object, at least under ideal or optimal circumstances, even though “there can also be no rule in accordance with which someone could be compelled to acknowledge something as beautiful” (CPJ, §8, 5:216). How can one’s pleasure in an object be independent of its subsumption under any determinate concept and its satisfaction of any determinate interest and yet be valid for all who properly respond to the object? Kant’s answer is that although our pleasure in a beautiful object is not a response to its subsumption under a determinate concept, it is an expression of the free play of the cognitive faculties of imagination and understanding that such an object induces, and those cognitive faculties must in fact work the same way in everyone. His underlying idea is that we experience a beautiful object as having the kind of unity that we ordinarily find in objects by subsuming them under a determinate concept, but independently of any such subsumption. Because finding such unity is our ultimate cognitive aim, we take pleasure in this discovery, especially since the unity we find must appear contingent, as it were unexpected, if it is not linked to any determinate concept (see CPJ, Introduction VI, 5:186–7). (This is not to say that we do not subsume an object we find beautiful under any determinate concepts at all; we must if we are even to identify the object of our pleasure and judgment of taste in any determinate way. Kant’s theory must rather be that when we find an object beautiful we experience it as having a degree of unity that cannot be explained by any of the determinate concepts under which we do subsume it). Kant thus appeals to the concept of free play, hinted at by Mendelssohn and developed further by Sulzer, to solve the problem of taste that was emphasized by British aestheticians such as Hutcheson and Hume, with whose works Kant was intimately familiar.

In this account, Kant makes two striking assumptions. First, he asserts that in “pure” judgments of taste our pleasure in beauty is a response only to the perceptible form of an object, not to any matter or content it may have—for example, in pictorial arts, “the drawing is what is essential,” while the “colors that illuminate the outline…can…enliven the object in itself for sensation, but cannot make it…beautiful” (CPJ, §14, 5:225). Second, he assumes that the cognitive faculties of all human beings work the same way, that is, respond to particular objects in the same way, even when they are in “free play” rather than at serious work. The second of these claims seems indefensible, but Kant never backs off from it. The first of these claims also seems unjustifiable, but this time Kant modifies his claim almost as soon as he makes it. While he continues to maintain that in pure judgments of taste our pleasure is in the unity of the form of the object alone, he quickly recognizes that there are a variety of impure forms of beauty where what we respond to with the free play of our imagination and understanding is harmony between an object’s perceptible form and its matter, its content, or even its purpose. Thus, just two sections after his assertion of formalism, Kant introduces the category of “adherent beauty,” which is the kind of harmony between an object’s form and its intended function that pleases us in a beautiful summer-house or racehorse; and he will subsequently assume that successful works of fine art normally have intellectual content and please us in virtue of the harmony among their content, form, and material.

However, Kant interposes his analysis of the experience of the sublime between his initial analysis of pure beauty and his later analysis of fine art. Again following a hint that we have already found in Mendelssohn, Kant recognizes two forms of the sublime: the “mathematical” and the “dynamical.” Our experience of both is a mixture of pain and pleasure, a moment of pain due to an initial sense of the limits of imagination followed by pleasure at the recognition that it is our own power of reason that reveals the limits of our imagination. The mathematical sublime involves the relationship between imagination and theoretical reason, which is the source of our idea of the infinite; our experience of this form of the sublime is triggered by the observation of natural vistas so vast that our effort to grasp them in a single image is bound to fail, but which then pleases us because this very effort of the imagination reminds us that we have a power of reason capable of formulating the idea of the infinite (CPJ, §26, 5:254–5).

Kant holds that in this experience we do not just infer that we have such a faculty, but actually experience “a feeling that we have pure self-sufficient reason” (CPJ, §27, 5:258). In the case of the dynamical sublime, what we experience is a harmony between our imagination and practical reason. This experience is induced by natural objects that seem not just vast, but overwhelmingly powerful and threatening—volcanoes, raging seas, and the like (CPJ, §28, 5:261. Kant’s examples were all commonplaces in the eighteenth century, going back to Joseph Addison’s illustrations of “grandeur” in Spectator 412, June 1712). Here we experience fear at the thought of our own physical injury or destruction followed by the satisfying feeling that we have

within ourselves a capacity for resistance of quite another kind, which gives us the courage to measure ourselves against the apparent all-powerfulness of nature,


our power (which is not part of nature) to regard those things about which we are concerned (goods, health and life) as trivial, and hence to regard its power (to which, to be sure, we are subjected in regard to these things) as not the sort of dominion over ourselves and our authority to which we would have to bow if it came down to our highest principles and their affirmation or abandonment. (CPJ, §28, 5:262)

Now we can turn to Kant’s analysis of fine art and our experience of it. For Kant, all art is intentional human production that requires skill or talent, yet fine or “beautiful” (schöne) art is produced with the intention of doing what anything beautiful does, namely, promoting the free play of the cognitive powers. That a work of fine art must be the product of intention and yet produce the free play of the mental powers seems like the paradox that “beautiful art, although it is certainly intentional, must nevertheless not seem intentional” (CPJ, §45, 5:306–7). Further, Kant also assumes that although our pleasure in beauty should be a response to the form of an object alone, fine art is paradigmatically mimetic, that is, has representational or semantic content (CPJ, §48, 5:311). This too seems like a paradox. Kant aims to resolve both of these apparent paradoxes through his theory that successful works of fine art are products of genius, a natural gift that gives the rule to art (CPJ, §46, 5:307). A work of genius must have “spirit,” which it gets through its content, typically—as Kant assumes without argument, although perhaps in his time, long before the invention of non-objective art, without any real need for argument—a rational idea, indeed an idea relevant specifically to morality. But in order to be beautiful, a work of art must still leave room for the freedom of the imagination, and therefore cannot present such ideas to us directly and didactically (indeed, such ideas cannot be directly and adequately presented in sensible form). Instead, a work of art succeeds when it presents an “aesthetic idea,” a representation of the imagination that “at least strive[s] toward something lying beyond the bounds of experience, and thus seek[s] to approximate a presentation of the concepts of reason.” A successful work of art also “stimulates so much thinking,” such a wealth of particular “attributes” or images and incidents, “that it can never be grasped in a determinate concept” (CPJ, §49, 5:314–15)—thereby stimulating a pleasurable feeling of free play among the imagination, understanding, and reason while at the same time satisfying the demand that a work of art have both a purpose and a content.

7.2 The Moral Significance of the Aesthetic

We can now see how Kant thinks that our aesthetic experiences and judgments can bridge the gulf between our abstract, intellectual understanding of the requirements and conditions of morality and a palpable, sensuous representation of those requirements and conditions. Kant suggests six links between the aesthetic and moral, which together make palpable the satisfaction of the four conditions of the possibility of morality that were noted in the introduction to the present section.

First, Kant evidently holds that objects of aesthetic experience can present morally significant ideas to us without sacrificing what is essential to them as objects of aesthetic response and judgment. This is obvious in the theory of aesthetic ideas, where Kant indeed assumes that works of art always have some morally relevant content. But this view takes other forms as well. In fact, Kant maintains that all forms of beauty, natural as well as artistic, can be regarded as expressions of aesthetic ideas: even natural objects can suggest moral ideas to us although such suggestion is not the product of any intentional human activity (CPJ, §51, 5:319). In “The Ideal of Beauty,” Kant also maintains that beauty in the human figure can be taken as “the visible expression of moral ideas, which inwardly govern human beings”; here he argues that only human beauty can be taken as a unique standard for beauty, because it is the only form of beauty that can express something absolutely and unconditionally valuable, namely the moral autonomy of which humans alone are capable. At the same time he holds there is no determinate way in which this unique value can be expressed in the human form, thus there is always something free in the outward expression in the human figure of the inner moral value of the human character (CPJ, §17, 5:235–6).

The second link is Kant’s claim that the aesthetic experience of the dynamical sublime is nothing other than a feeling of the power of our own practical reason to accept the pure principle of morality and to act in accordance with it in spite of all the threats or inducements to do otherwise that nature might place in our way. Because the experience of the dynamical sublime so centrally involves an intimation of our own capacity to be moral, Kant actually insists that “the sublime in nature is only improperly so called, and should properly be ascribed only to the manner of thinking, or rather its foundation in human nature” (CPJ, §30, 5:280). And while he does not want to claim that this experience is identical to explicit moral reasoning, but only a “disposition of the mind that is similar to the moral disposition” (CPJ, General Remark following §29, 5:268), he does in at least one place argue that the complex character of the experience of the sublime makes it the best representation in our experience of our moral situation itself (CPJ, General Remark following §29, 5:271).

However, Kant elsewhere argues, third, that there are crucial aspects of our moral condition that are symbolized by the beautiful rather than the sublime. He claims that the beautiful is the symbol of the morally good because there are significant parallels between our experience of beauty and the structure of morality. Indeed, he insists that it is only insofar as the beautiful is the symbol of the morally good that we have any right not merely to predict that under ideal circumstances others should agree with our appraisals of beauty but actually to demand that they do so (CPJ, §59, 5:353). Kant adduces “several aspects of this analogy,” the most important of which is that

The freedom of the imagination (thus of the sensibility of our faculty) is represented in the judging of the beautiful as in accord with the lawfulness of the understanding (in the moral judgment the freedom of the will is conceived as the agreement of the latter with itself in accordance with universal laws of reason). (CPJ, §59, 5:354)

Because the experience of beauty is an experience of the freedom of the imagination in its play with the understanding, it can be taken as a palpable symbol of the freedom of the will to determine itself by moral laws that is necessary for morality but not itself something that can be directly experienced. In other words, it is the very independence of aesthetic response from direct determination by concepts, including moral concepts, that makes the experience of beauty an experience of freedom that can in turn symbolize moral freedom. Presumably this can be reconciled with Kant’s earlier claim that the sublime is the most appropriate symbol of morality by observing that while the experience of beauty makes the freedom of the will palpable to us, it is only the mixed experience of the sublime that brings home to feeling that this freedom must often be exercised in the face of resistance offered by our own inclinations.

Kant’s fourth connection between the aesthetic and the ethical lies in his theory of the “intellectual interest” in the beautiful. Here Kant argues that although our basic pleasure in a beautiful object must be independent of any antecedent interest in its existence, we may add a further layer of pleasure to that basic experience if the existence of beautiful objects suggests some more generally pleasing fact about our situation in the world. Kant’s claim is that since it is of interest to practical reason that nature be hospitable to its objectives, we take pleasure in any evidence that nature is amenable to our objectives, even when those are not specifically moral; and the natural existence of beauty is such evidence, because the experience of beauty is itself an unexpected fulfillment of our most basic cognitive objective.

Kant’s fifth claim is that aesthetic experience is conducive to proper moral conduct itself. In his concluding comment on his analyses of both the beautiful and the sublime he states that “The beautiful prepares us to love something, even nature, without interest; the sublime, to esteem it, even contrary to our (sensible) interest” (CPJ, General Remark following §29, 5:267), where being able to love without any personal interest and to esteem even contrary to our own interest are necessary preconditions of proper moral conduct. Kant makes a similar point in his later Metaphysics of Morals (1797) when he argues that “a propensity to wanton destruction of what is beautiful in inanimate nature,” even though we do not owe any moral duties directly to anything other than ourselves and other human beings, nevertheless

weakens or uproots that feeling in [us] which, though not of itself moral, is still a disposition of sensibility that greatly promotes morality or at least prepares the way for it: the disposition, namely, to love something (e.g., beautiful crystal formations, the indescribable beauty of plants) even apart from any intention to use it. (Metaphysics of Morals, Doctrine of Virtue §17, 6:643; Gregor, p. 564)

Sixth and finally, in the brief “Appendix on the methodology of taste,” Kant suggests that the cultivation or realization of common standards of taste in a society can be conducive to the discovery of the more general “art of the reciprocal communication of the ideas of the most educated part” of a society “with the cruder, the coordination of the breadth and refinement of the former with the natural simplicity and originality of the latter” (CPJ, §60, 5:356), where this art is apparently necessary to the realization of the goal of “lawful sociability,” or the establishment of a stable polity on the basis of principles of justice rather than sheer force. Thus, aesthetic experience can be conducive to the development of sound politics as well as personal ethics, although the two are of course not unconnected, since Kant is a political moralist who believes that we have a moral duty to establish a just state, not merely a prudential interest in doing so.

These six links between aesthetics and morality satisfy the four conditions that need to be met in order to bridge the gulf between nature and freedom by making our abstract grasp of the contents and conditions of morality palpable to our sensuous nature. In particular, (i) the presentation of moral ideas in objects of natural and artistic beauty and especially in beautiful human form itself provides sensuous illustration of moral ideas, above all the foundational idea of the unconditional value of human freedom itself; (ii) the experiences of the dynamical sublime and of the beautiful in their different ways both confirm our abstract recognition of our own freedom always to choose to do as morality requires; (iii) the intellectual interest in the beautiful provides sensuous confirmation of nature’s amenability to our objectives, which is otherwise only a postulate of pure practical reason; and (iv) the claims that the experiences of the beautiful and the sublime and the sharing of these feelings among different strata of highly diversified societies are conducive to the realization of morality reveal ways in which our natural sensuous dispositions can be used as means to the realization of the goal set by our purely rational disposition to be moral.

8. Schiller’s Response to Kant’s Aesthetics: Grace, Dignity, and Aesthetic Education

In the history of ethics as well as aesthetics, mention of Kant is often quickly followed by mention of Friedrich Schiller (1759–1805), who criticized and developed Kant’s views in both areas. Perhaps best known to the general public as the author of the “Ode to Joy” (An die Freude) that provides the text for the fourth movement of Beethoven’s Ninth Symphony, as well as the source of materials for operas by Rossini and Verdi, in his lifetime Schiller was famous not only as a poet but also as a dramatist, historian, and (at least during the first half of the 1790s ) as an aesthetician and philosopher. As a student in the military college of the Duke of Württemberg he trained as a physician, and his earliest writings were on the mind-body relationship. But he achieved instant fame with his play The Robbers (Die Räuber) in 1782, and then had to flee Württemberg in order to continue writing plays. Between 1783 and 1787, he wrote Fiesko, Intrigue and Love (Kabale und Liebe), and Don Carlos. He met Goethe in 1787, and was professor of history in nearby Jena from 1789 to 1799. During this period he wrote histories of the Thirty Years’ War and the Dutch revolt against Spain. But he also devoted several years in the early 1790s to an intensive study of Kant, which then led to a series of essays including “On Grace and Dignity” (Über Anmut und Würde, 1793), Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Mankind (1795), and “On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry” (1795–6), as well as the unpublished “Kallias” letters on aesthetics (1793). After this period, Schiller returned to his original calling, writing the historical dramas Wallenstein (1798–9), Maria Stuart (1800), The Maiden of Orleans (Die Jungfrau von Orleans, 1801), The Bride of Messina (1803), and Wilhelm Tell (1804). Like so many of the others who have been discussed here (Baumgarten, Sulzer, Herz, Moritz) his life was cut short by lung disease, presumably tuberculosis, and he died at forty-five in 1805.

Schiller’s “Kallias” letters, written to his friend Gottfried Körner in January and February of 1793, were not historically influential, since they were not published for another half-century, but are fascinating reading today. In them Schiller argues that Kant’s “subjectivist” conception of free play in aesthetic response has to be complemented with an “objectivist” conception of beauty as the appearance of freedom or self-determination in the object: a beautiful form is one that appears to us to be determined not by any forces outside of it but only by itself. For that reason “A form is beautiful, one might say, if it demands no explanation, or if it explains itself without a concept” (“Kallias” letter of 18 February 1793, p. 155). Although Schiller does not mention his name, his theory could also be interpreted as an attempt to refine Moritz’s conception of beauty as that which is complete within itself. Had Kant known these letters, however, he could have replied that Schiller’s notions of appearing to be self- rather than other-determined and demanding no explanation are still subjective, that is, they characterize how we respond to beautiful objects rather than designating any properties that could be attributed to objects independently of our response to them.

Unlike the “Kallias” letters, Schiller’s essay “On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry” was immediately influential. Here Schiller describes the difference between “naïve” and “sentimental” art. The former is an expression of an immediate emotional response to nature, where nature is thought of as “the subsistence of things on their own, being there according to their own immutable laws” (a conception of nature that derives from the conception of beauty in the “Kallias” letters). The latter self-consciously expresses a sense of our own separation from nature and a feeling that the self-subsistent things in nature “are what we were” and “what we should become once more” (“Naïve and Sentimental Poetry,” pp. 180–1), or a longing for a wholeness with nature that we think humans once had but that we have lost. Schiller identifies naïve poetry with antiquity and sentimental poetry (and the sense of alienation from nature it expresses) with modernity. This essay can be seen as the source for the genre of philosophical histories of aesthetics that then flourished for several decades, beginning with Friedrich Schlegel’s “On the Study of Greek Poetry” of 1797, continuing with Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling’s lectures on The Philosophy of Art of 1802–3, and culminating in the lectures on “Philosophy of Art or Aesthetics” that Hegel gave in Berlin during the 1820s—lectures that decisively changed the sense of the name “aesthetics” itself from its original meaning of a general science of sensibility that included responses to nature as well as art to its modern meaning as the philosophy of art.

However, the two theoretical works by Schiller with which philosophers have most concerned themselves have been the 1793 essay “On Grace and Dignity” and the epistolary series On the Aesthetic Education of Man, first written as an actual series of letters to Schiller’s patron the Danish Duke of Augustenberg in 1793 and then rewritten for publication in 1795. These have typically been read as responses to Kant’s moral philosophy, inspired by Kant in their general concern for autonomy as the essence of morality but criticizing Kant for giving inadequate consideration to the rôle of sensibility in morality. “On Grace and Dignity” has been held to argue, in supposed opposition to Kant, for the necessity of developing feelings as part of what it takes to comply fully with the demands of morality, while Aesthetic Education has been read to argue that only the cultivation of aesthetic experience can transform individuals and their society as morality demands; the first of these can be considered a constitutive claim, and the second a causal claim. It will be argued here, on the contrary, that Kant actually makes greater claims for the significance and contribution of both moral sentiments and aesthetic responses to the individual achievement of morality than Schiller does. Specifically, while “On Grace and Dignity” argues that the moral determination of the will should be accompanied with certain moral sentiments on what are essentially aesthetic grounds, Kant argues that the virtuous determination of the will should be accompanied by certain moral sentiments on moral grounds. And while Aesthetic Education asserts that the development of taste is a necessary condition for the development of individual morality and social justice, which Kant never does, the variety of links that Kant recognizes between aesthetics and morality, described in section 7.2. above, show that the cultivation of taste can make a broader contribution to the realization of morality than Schiller realizes.

8.1 Kant and Schiller on Beauty, Grace, and Dignity

We may begin with a different point about “On Grace and Dignity,” however, namely that it is not primarily an essay in moral theory at all, but an essay in aesthetics, that is, an essay about the expression of moral qualities in the appearance of actual human beings. In this regard it is not a critique of Kantian moral theory but a critique of an aspect of Kantian aesthetics, namely Kant’s theory of the “ideal of beauty” in the “Analytic of the Beautiful” in the Critique of the Power of Judgment. Schiller’s use of the expression “ideal of beauty” very early in his essay signals that this is his primary target (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 253; Curran 126).

Kant introduces the concept of the “ideal of beauty” in the third moment of the “Analytic of the Beautiful,” which discusses the various relations that obtain between beauty and purposiveness. Kant begins the third moment by arguing that in its purest form the judgment of taste is a response to the mere appearance of the form of purposiveness in an object, as opposed to any actual purposiveness, in either of the senses of that concept, namely, actually serving some specific purpose or having been designed to serve some purpose. Correspondingly, Kant equates pure beauty with the mere form or appearance of purposiveness rather than with actual purposiveness. However, as we saw in section 7.1, Kant complicates his analysis by recognizing forms of beauty that are not pure but are connected with (although not reducible to) the recognition of actual purposiveness. The first of these forms is “adherent beauty,” a beauty of form that is consistent with or appropriate for the actual purpose of an object that clearly has a purpose that constrains its possible form in various ways, such as an arsenal or a race horse. Then Kant comes to the “ideal of beauty,” or “the highest model, the archetype of taste…in accordance with which [anyone] must judge everything that is an object of taste,” a representation of an individual object or particular type of object that is maximally beautiful (CPJ, §17, 5:232).

Kant signals that the search for an ideal of beauty is not something initiated by the logic of taste as such but by something external to taste, namely, the faculty of reason: the “archetype of taste…rests on reason’s indeterminate idea of a maximum.” Kant argues that

the beauty for which an idea [or ideal] is to be sought cannot be a vague beauty, but there must be a beauty fixed by a concept of objective purposiveness, consequently it must not belong to the object of an entirely pure judgment of taste, but rather to one of a partly intellectualized judgment of taste. (CPJ, §17, 5:232–3)

This means that the ideal of beauty is a species of adherent rather than free beauty. Kant then argues that there are two elements in such an ideal, namely a uniquely valuable purpose or end and a uniquely appropriate aesthetic expression of this purpose or end. “The human being alone is capable of an ideal of beauty,” Kant then argues, because “the humanity in his person, as intelligence, is alone among all the objects in the world capable of the ideal of perfection” (ibid., 5:233). That is, according to (practical) reason the human being is the only thing of unconditional value. But for this ideal to be an ideal of beauty, the unique moral value of humanity must find an outward expression which is somehow appropriate for it although it is not connected to it in accordance with any rule. This expression is found in the beauty of the “human figure,” which is associated “with the morally good in the idea of the highest purposiveness—goodness of soul, or purity, or strength, or repose, etc.”—not in accordance with any rule but simply by “great force of the imagination” (ibid., 5:235). Imagination is in fact doubly involved: first, because there is no way to derive what counts as beauty in the human figure from mere concepts or by any mechanical process (that could yield only “correctness in the presentation of the species”), so the ideal of maximum beauty can only be created by an act of the aesthetic imagination; and second, because there is no rule that says that moral value must be expressed in outward appearance or that outward appearance can be interpreted as an expression of moral value, but that association too must be created by the imagination.

Schiller’s first goal in “On Grace and Dignity” is to show that Kant’s account of the ideal of beauty is not sufficiently precise in its account of what aspects of human beauty can be taken as an expression of the moral condition of a human being. He also contends that Kant’s account does not offer an adequate explanation of why any features of the outward appearance should be taken as an expression of moral condition. More specifically, Schiller argues that there are two different moral conditions of human beings, grace and dignity, and these naturally find different external expressions in the appearance of human beings, and by implication in the artistic representation or mimesis of them. As a result, the ideal of beauty is more complicated than Kant recognizes. Moreover, there are good reasons why these moral conditions should find external expression, so the connection between moral condition and aesthetic result is much less arbitrary than Kant makes it seem.

On Schiller’s account, Kant’s first mistake is to locate the ideal of beauty vaguely in the human figure rather than specifically in the bodily accompaniments of intentional actions that are the products of the human will, which, according to Kant himself, is the primary locus of moral value. This also means that it is a mistake for Kant to suggest, if that is what he means, that the ideal of beauty can be found in a general type of human being rather than in particular human beings, for actions are always done by particular human beings. Kant is of course committed to the general thesis that beauty is always a property of a particular, but it might be argued that he has lost sight of that commitment when he locates the ideal of beauty in something as general as “the human figure” as the expression of human morality. Schiller argues that the “architectonic beauty of the human form,” that is, the fixed configuration of the features of a person’s appearance, “comes directly from nature and is formed by the rule of necessity” (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 255; Curran 127), and thus cannot plausibly be taken as an expression of the moral character or condition of a person, which is determined by the person’s will or free choice. Any aspect of beauty that can be interpreted as an expression of moral condition must thus be found in the voluntary actions of particular persons rather than in their fixed features. More specifically, grace, as a condition in which a person is not merely committed to doing what morality requires as a matter of principle but is also so committed to doing this that it has become part of his character and thus seems as much natural as voluntary, is revealed in the motions that accompany a person’s directly willed actions but are not themselves consciously willed (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 167; Curran 136). For example,

one can deduce from a person’s words how he would like to be viewed, but what he really is must be guessed from the gestures accompanying the speech, in other words, from the uncontained movements. (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 268; Curran 137)

It is in the unintentional accompaniments of intentional actions that we can discern people’s real commitment to what they are doing and the ease with which they make that commitment; the latter is grace, and thus the movements that express that are the expression of grace. Grace can be expressed in the “rigid and restful features” of an individual’s physiognomy only insofar as those features themselves “were originally nothing other than movements that through frequent repetition became habitual and left lasting traces” (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 264; Curran 134).

The next part of Schiller’s aesthetic argument against Kant is that dignity is a different moral condition than grace, and that it therefore naturally finds a different outward expression. While grace is the expression of a condition in which there is no tension between a person’s moral commitments and his desires, and where there is thus harmony between the explicitly willed aspects of his intentional motions and the instinctive aspects of them, dignity is the sensible expression of successfully willing to act in accordance with moral principles even at the cost of the suppression of conflicting desires and feelings, and is therefore manifest in quite different aspects of appearance than grace is. In a person expressing dignity rather than grace,

while his veins swell, his muscles become cramped and taut, his voice cracks, his chest is thrust out, and his lower body pressed in, his intentional movements are gentle, the facial features relaxed, and the eyes and brow serene….this contradiction of signs demonstrates the existence and influence of a power independent of suffering and above the impressions to which we see the sensuous succumb. And in this way, peace in suffering, in which dignity actually consists, becomes the representation of intelligence in human beings and the expression their moral freedom. (“On Grace and Dignity,”; NA 295–6; Curran 159–60)

As Schiller sums up, “Grace, then, lies in the freedom of intentional movements, dignity in the mastery of instinctive ones” (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 297; Curran 160). Grace expresses a tendency to act as morality requires that has become instinctive, while dignity expresses mastery grounded on moral principles over instincts that are not harmonious with morality. These are two different moral conditions, and thus find two different forms of visible expression.

Although Schiller’s illustration of both grace and dignity refer to our perceptions of actual human beings rather than to artistic representations of them, that is not an objection to reading his account as a critique of Kant’s conception of the ideal of beauty. In the “Analytic of the Beautiful” Kant himself is talking primarily about the beauty of nature rather than art, and in the section on the ideal of beauty he is clearly talking about a special feature of human beauty itself rather than of the artistic representation of human beauty. Any implications of either Kant’s account or of Schiller’s critique of it for the case of artistic representation would have to be inferred. But of course many of the features in which Schiller locates both grace and dignity could be represented in artistic depictions of human beings, and that is why it is not implausible to suggest that his account may be directed against Lessing as well as Kant. Schiller’s contrast between swelling veins, cramped muscles, and outhrust chest on the one hand and serenity of eye and brow on the other could be taken as a plausible description of the famous statue of Laocoön, and thus Schiller could be read as suggesting, in the spirit of Winckelmann, that the statue should be understood as an expression of dignity in the face of suffering rather than as a symbol for the differences between pictorial and verbal depiction. On Schiller’s account, however, the dignity of the unnamed Laocoön would be explained by the moral character of the individual, not by the circumstances of a whole people.

As earlier mentioned, “On Grace and Dignity” has traditionally been read as a critique of Kant’s moral theory rather than of his aesthetics, arguing for greater moral significance for feelings in line with our principled commitment to morality than Kant acknowledges. It looks as if Schiller holds that the ideal for moral conduct is that complete attunement between the determination of the will by moral principles and our natural and instinctive desires and inclinations that is expressed in grace. Further, it seems that this is only because he recognizes that such attunement will not always be possible for human beings that he admits that there is sometimes a need for that mastery over refractory feelings that expresses itself in dignity—but only as a fall-back or second-best state of character, rather than, as Kant seems to suppose, the norm for the human moral condition.

This is a misreading of the positions of both Schiller and Kant, however. For Schiller, that complete attunement of principle and feeling that expresses itself in grace is indeed an imperative, but an aesthetic demand rather than a strictly moral demand. Thus Schiller writes,

Human beings, as appearance, are also an object of the senses. Where the moral feeling finds satisfaction, the aesthetic feeling does not wish to be reduced, and the correspondence with an idea may not sacrifice any of the appearance. Thus, however rigorously reason demands an ethical expression, the eye demands beauty just as persistently….both these demands are made of the same object, although they come from different courts of judgment. (“On Grace and Dignity,” NA 277; Curran 144–5)

But as far as morality alone is concerned, the mastery of will over inclination that is expressed in dignity is all that is required. For Kant, however, morality itself demands a complete harmony between principle and inclination, because any tension between them is a sign that one’s commitment to the principle of morality is not yet complete, one’s good will or virtue not yet perfected. The self-mastery that is expressed in dignity may often be all that human beings can achieve under natural circumstances, and it certainly satisfies the demand for legality in our actions; but as Kant sees it morality requires that perfection of virtue or of the good will that he calls holiness (see Kant’s response to Schiller in a note added to the second edition of Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, 6:23–4n.). Thus Kant’s conception of morality actually demands a greater attunement of principles and feelings than does Schiller’s—although Schiller’s might be the more plausible account of morality, that is, one that better accommodates the reality of the human condition, precisely for that reason. Indeed, Kant may have been carried away by the polemic with Schiller, because elsewhere his position is not that human beings must aim at holiness, but only at virtue, not at the elimination of all inclinations contrary to morality but at the strength of will to overcome them.

8.2 Aesthetic Education and the Achievement of Morality

In Schiller’s other main philosophical work, the letters On the Aesthetic Education of Mankind, he certainly makes a much bolder claim than Kant would ever have countenanced, namely that “it is only through Beauty that man makes his way to Freedom” and thus to the achievement of morality and its external realization in political justice (Aesthetic Education, Second letter, p. 9). Here Schiller implies that the cultivation of taste through aesthetic education is a necessary as well as sufficient condition for the achievement of compliance with the ethical and political demands of morality, rather than, as Kant held, merely something that may contribute to moral development. But when we turn from Schiller’s rhetoric to the details of his argument, we will see that he actually grants aesthetic education a narrower rôle in the realization of morality than Kant does.

Schiller presents the problem to be solved by aesthetic education in several ways, but primarily as a political rather than a moral problem. In his Sixth Letter, he offers an influential diagnosis of alienation or fragmentation as the characteristic problem of modernity: “we see not merely individuals, but whole classes of people, developing but one part of their potentialities, while of the rest, as in stunted growths, only vestigial traces remain.” (Aesthetic Education, p. 33). Although this is a problem for human flourishing generally, and might therefore be considered a moral rather than specifically political problem, Schiller’s diagnosis of the source of this problem gives a prominent role to a specifically political cause. Schiller claims that the complex machinery of the state necessitates the separation of ranks and occupations, rather than claiming, as a Marxist diagnosis of alienation would, that a separation of ranks and occupations that has its source in the conditions of production necessitates the complex machinery of the state. In another famous passage, Schiller presents the problem as that of effecting the transition from a less just to a more just state without killing the patient in the operation:

The state should not only respect the objective and generic character in its individual subjects; it should also honor their subjective and specific character, and in extending the invisible realm of morals take care not to depopulate the sensible realm of appearance. (Aesthetic Education, Fourth Letter, p. 19)

The latter passage leads more directly to Schiller’s most general characterization of the problem: striking the right balance between the universal and the particular, that is, not realizing the ideal at the cost of individuals nor so focusing on individuals as they currently are that all concern for the ideal is lost. Schiller characterizes the tension with which he is concerned through a number of contrasts: person and condition, the atemporal and the temporal, noumenon and phenomena, form and matter, and so on (Eleventh Letter). He posits that we are driven in one direction by the “form drive” and in the other by the “sensuous drive” (Twelfth Letter). He then claims that we need to cultivate a new drive, the “play drive” (Fourteenth Letter), to bring these two drives, and thus person and condition, universal and particular, and so on, into proper balance with each other, “to preserve the life of sense against the encroachments of freedom; and second, to secure the personality against the forces of sensation” (Thirteenth Letter). Schiller’s claim is then that it is the experience of beauty which will induce this balance in us, and thus what we need is to be educated to experience beauty. In practice, since individuals tend to err in one direction or the other, that is, to be driven by principles at the cost of ignoring particulars or to be absorbed in particulars and thus inadequately attentive to principles, there will be two types of beauty, “energizing” beauty and “relaxing” or “melting” beauty, which will either strengthen an individual’s commitment to principle or relax the grip of principle on an individual, whichever is needed (Seventeenth Letter).

These claims are grandiose and abstract. In a crucial footnote to the Thirteenth Letter, however, Schiller comes down to earth, and reveals that what he expects from aesthetic education is something quite specific, although for that reason all the more plausible. What he worried about is “the pernicious effect, upon both thought and action, of an undue surrender to our sensual nature” on the one hand and “the nefarious influence exerted upon our knowledge and upon our conduct by a preponderance of rationality” on the other. In the realm of scientific inquiry, what we need to learn and what we can learn from aesthetic experience is not to “thrust ourselves out upon [nature], with all the impatient anticipations of our reason,” without having collected adequate data to support our theorizing. In the realm of conduct, thus of the moral generally and not just the realm of politics, what we need to learn is to be specifically attentive to the particular circumstances, needs, and feelings of others, and not just to impose our own views upon them. Schiller’s argument comes down to the claim that through the cultivation of our aesthetic sensibility we can learn to be attentive to detail and particularity as well as to principle and generality, and that being so attentive is a necessary condition for both theoretical and practical success. And it seems plausible to suppose that this claim is true, and therefore that aesthetic education may play a valuable rôle in the theoretical and practical development of human beings, in modern society as much as in any other. But this is a far cry from any claim that aesthetic education is sufficient for either theoretical or moral development, or even that it is necessary for such development, as the only way to cultivate the necessary combination of sensitivities. In the case of the natural sciences, surely both their general principles and their particular techniques of observation must be taught directly, and presumably a well-managed scientific education could also teach the student not to project the principles unchecked by the data. In the case of morals and politics, surely the general principles must be clearly fixed in the mind of those being initiated into the relevant community, as well as a proper empathy for the actual circumstances of others; but while perhaps the latter could be cultivated by aesthetic education, presumably it could also be cultivated directly by suitably edifying moral discourses, and certainly the general principles of morality will still have to be directly taught or elicited.

As we saw in section 7.2, Kant recognizes these limits on the significance of the cultivation of taste for moral development, but also described a wider variety of ways in which the former could be beneficial for the latter. The contribution to moral development that Schiller hopes to derive from aesthetic education is essentially cognitive: through the sensitivity to particularity that we acquire from aesthetic education we learn to recognize the circumstances, needs, and feelings of others and thereby to apply our principles to them appropriately. Kant, however, holds that aesthetic experience could give us sensible confirmation of the moral truths we already know through pure reason, but it also give us emotional support in our attempt to act as we know we should, although in no case does he argue that the support that morality can get from aesthetic experience is indispensable. Thus, although Schiller’s essay “On Grace and Dignity” appears to argue for a greater rôle for feelings in fulfillment of the demands of morality than Kant allows, it is only Kant who insists upon moral grounds for striving to realize grace and not just dignity. And while Schiller’s letters On Aesthetic Education insist that aesthetic education is a necessary condition for social justice, Kant has a broader conception of the contributions that aesthetic experience may make to moral and political development, although he certainly does not make the cultivation of taste a necessary (let alone sufficient) condition for the realization of morality.

9. Herder’s Critique of Kant: A Rapprochement between the Two Approaches?

In the five years after the publication of Schiller’s Letters on Aesthetic Education in 1795, both Romanticism and Absolute Idealism emerged, the former in works by Friedrich von Hardenburg (“Novalis”) and Friedrich Schlegel, the latter in works by Johann Gottlieb Fichte and Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling. But since both of these movements blossomed more fully in the early decades of the nineteenth century, they will not be included in this survey. Instead, it will conclude with a second look at the work of Johann Herder, in this case with his late critique of Kant’s aesthetic theory. Herder, who as we saw had done the bulk of his work in aesthetics long before the publications of Kant and Schiller, indeed even before the publication of Sulzer’s encyclopedia, reacted violently to the new aesthetics of play in his late work Kalligone (1800), i.e., “The Birth of Beauty.” This work, published only three years before Herder’s death and after his renown had been eclipsed by such new stars as Schelling and Fichte, has never received much attention, but beneath its bursts of ill-temper it contains interesting and important criticisms of Kant. The theme of Kalligone may be summed up with this statement from its table of contents: “Nothing harms immature taste more than if one makes everything into play” (Kalligone, p. 660). Herder’s critique came too late in his Kant’s life for him to respond to it. If he had been able to respond, he would have had no good reply to some of Herder’s criticisms; but if Herder had had more sympathy for Kant’s expository method in the third Critique, he might have realized that on some of the central substantive points of his criticism the distance between himself and Kant is not as great as it initially seems. In particular, Herder’s representation of Kant’s aesthetics as a pure theory of mental play mistakes Kant’s initial analysis of the simplest form of natural beauty for his whole theory of natural and artistic beauty. If Herder had recognized the importance for Kant of the more complicated cases of adherent and artistic beauty, he would have seen that there is considerable common ground between Kant’s aesthetics of free play and his own aesthetics of the sensory apprehension of truth.

Herder’s criticisms of Lessing and Riedel (section 5.1) prefigure several of his objections to Kant. He objects to Kant’s abstract method in aesthetics, to his failure to emphasize adequately the rôle of the senses and the differences among them both in his account of aesthetic experience and in his classification of the arts, to an inadequate recognition of the importance of truth (indeed truth in several senses ) in our experience of art, and to what he sees as Kant’s inadequate emphasis on the way in which aesthetic experience gives us a feeling of being alive. But what is missing from Herder’s early critical aesthetics is an objection to the aesthetics of play, for the simple reason that Kant had not yet made that prominent in German aesthetics. In turning now to Herder’s criticisms of Kant in Kalligone, we will have to add that objection to his list of charges.

Kalligone is a polemic against Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment, more precisely against its first half, the “Critique of the Aesthetic Power of Judgment,” loosely structured in parallel with Kant’s work, although with numerous digressions, sometimes even in dialogue form, and statements of Herder’s own positions. Like Herder’s polemic with Lessing in the Groves of Criticism, his response to Kant’s work is longer than its target, and not all of its themes can be discussed here. In ways anticipated in Herder’s earlier work, Kalligone attacks Kant’s methodology and his neglect of the concrete rôle of the senses in a discipline that is, as defined by Baumgarten, supposed to focus precisely on them. In an expression of the naturalism that pervades his work, Herder also attacks Kant’s appeals to the “supersensible” in his interpretation of aesthetic experiences, especially the experience of sublimity. But Herder’s most vehement objections are to Kant’s insistence upon the disinterestedness of aesthetic judgment and to his exclusion of a rôle for determinate concepts in the free play of the mental powers in aesthetic experience, which Herder sees as excluding any rôle for the knowledge of truth in aesthetic experience. We will focus here on Herder’s criticisms of the disinterestedness and non-conceptuality of aesthetic judgment.

Herder’s general theory of aesthetic experience is that it is an experience of well-being arising from a perception of the true order of nature, which he opposes to Kant’s theory of the disinterestedness of aesthetic experience and attachment. Before we turn to that central issue, however, we may note Herder’s objection that Kant’s aesthetics does not pay sufficient attention to the concrete rôle of the senses in aesthetic experience. The charge of insensitivity to the specificity of the senses, as we saw, was at the heart of Herder’s early aesthetics, beginning with his critique of Lessing, and it manifests itself in various ways in his critique of Kant. One point at which it is particularly clear is in his objection to Kant’s scheme for the classification of the fine arts, a scheme based on the differing capacities of different media for meaning, tone, and gesture that Herder claims “throws us back into the old chaos.” Kant’s basic division is between the verbal (redende) and the formative or visual (bildende) arts, and Herder says that Kant’s account of the

so-called verbal arts [is] built upon a word-play, which makes them…into play, and not in the technical sense of this word; and about the formative arts as well as about the arts that effect sentiments nothing is said that serves for the essence of each and the essence of all. (Kalligone, p. 939)

By contrast, Herder argues that any division of the arts, as well as any account of the way in which different arts need to be cultivated and contribute to our overall cultivation and development, must attend to the specificity of our senses. For Herder, any classification of the arts, and indeed any theory of aesthetic education and the contribution of aesthetic education to general education, must be based upon a firm grasp of the differences as well as the similarities among sight, hearing, touch, speech, and song (for that too is among the arts of the tongue). In his view Kant does not have that grasp. Nor does it seem too much of a stretch to think that Schiller’s theory of aesthetic education is deficient in this regard, too. Although Herder does not mention Schiller by name anywhere in Kalligone, he does begin the work by bemoaning the influence of Kant’s third Critique upon his followers, and Schiller might be supposed to be the foremost among these, albeit one with whom Herder had to maintain cordial relations in Weimar and perhaps spared for this reason.

We may now turn to the two main topics of Herder’s criticism, namely Kant’s theory of the disinterestedness of aesthetic judgment and of his doctrine of the purposeless play of imagination and understanding as the basis of such judgment. Herder had already expressed doubt about disinterestedness as a fundamental aesthetic category in his polemic with Riedel in the fourth Grove, where he had rejected Riedel’s definition of the beautiful as “that which can please without an interested aim [interessierte Absicht] and which also can please if we do not possess it” (“Fourth Grove,” p. 291). At that time, however, Herder’s objection seemed to be only that the concept of disinterestedness is not “original,” that is, that disinterestedness by itself cannot explain our pleasure in the beautiful and thus could at best be a consequence of some more fundamental explanation of beauty. In Kalligone, however, he argues much more broadly that our pleasure in beauty is not disinterested, but rather that it is intimately connected with our most fundamental interest, our interest in life itself. He does this by rejecting Kant’s rigid distinction between the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good, arguing that all of these notions are intimately connected and that they all reflect our fundamental interest in enjoying a harmonious, well-adapted life.

The first step in Herder’s argument is to reject Kant’s identification of agreeableness with sensory gratification narrowly understood. For Herder, the agreeable (angenehm) is what actually liberates and strengthens me and gives me a feeling of liberation and strength, of not merely being alive but of living freely and strongly. This feeling can come through the engagement of any or all of my senses:

whatever preserves, promotes, expands, in short is harmonious with the feeling of my existence, each of my senses gladly accepts that, appropriates that to itself, and finds it agreeable.

What gives us such feelings is moreover universally pleasing, because “well-being, welfare, health” (Wohlsein, Heil, Gesundheit) are the “ground and end of the existence of every living thing…We all desire well-being, and whatever promotes this well-being in any way is agreeable” (Kalligone, p. 668).

With the agreeable so broadly conceived, it is then easy for Herder to suggest that the beautiful cannot be rigidly separated from it, but must rather be more like a species of it, namely that which gives us such agreeable feelings of well-being through the “noble senses,” through figures, colors, tones, and the re-creation of all of these through the artificial signs of literary language. To be sure, there are specific contexts in which we might call something that is disagreeable good, or something that is beautiful disagreeable, but these are the exceptions, not the rule—a medicine that is good for one, for example, may nevertheless be disagreeable (Kalligone, pp. 672–3n.). But although the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good, which Kant construed as three fundamentally “different relations of representations to the feeling of pleasure and displeasure” (CPJ, §5, 5:209), do have to be distinguished in certain contexts, they nevertheless are all expressions of our pleasure in a free and healthy life. Given this assumption, it is then not hard for Herder to argue that so far from being disinterested, our pleasure in beauty is necessarily of the greatest interest to us. But while he argues that the beautiful necessarily interests us, Herder also insists that the beautiful does not appeal to self-interest or self-love: the pleasure and interest in the genuinely beautiful as well as the agreeable and good is universal, not personal or idiosyncratic.

It could well be argued that this is all that Shaftesbury originally meant when he introduced the concept of disinterestedness into modern moral and aesthetic discourse. For him, the opposite of disinterested is mercenary, that which one wants or does just for a personal reward (Shaftesbury, Sensus Communis, Part II, Section III, in Characteristicks, vol. I, p. 55). And this is arguably all that Riedel meant when he said that the beautiful is that which can please us “without possession.” It would not be reasonable, however, to claim that all that Kant meant by saying that the pleasure in beauty is disinterested is that it must be able to please anyone apart from personal possession and use or consumption of the beautiful object. He certainly seems to insist that the source of our pleasure in the beautiful has nothing to do with the sources of our pleasure in the agreeable and the good. Kant is apparently open to Herder’s criticism, if indeed Herder’s claim is that our pleasures in the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good all ultimately rest on our pleasure in the feeling of free and healthy life. However, before we consider whether the distance here between Kant and Herder is as great as Herder thinks, let us consider one last charge on Herder’s indictment of Kant, namely his objection to Kant’s theory that the experience of beauty is an experience of a free and conceptless play of the mental powers of imagination and understanding.

As noted earlier, Herder’s antipathy to Kant’s central notion of the free play of our cognitive powers is evident from the outset of Kalligone. In his Preface, Herder writes bitterly that “the self-named only possible philosophy” has transformed the arts “into a short or long, boring apelike play” (Kalligone, p. 648). In the body of the text, Herder argues both generally that all response to objects, feeling and sentiment as well as judgment, is accompanied with a concept of the object. He also argues that, more specifically, our pleasure in beautiful objects is always a pleasure in a sensed or felt recognition of their adaptation to their environment, whether natural or artificial, that is impossible without the application of a concept to the object. Herder launches his general attack immediately following his critique of Kant’s first moment. Kant’s second moment, Herder says, asserts that the “beautiful is what pleases without a concept,” and the third speaks of a “Form of purposiveness without representation of an end.” In Herder’s view, however, “ [t]hat something could please without a concept, and indeed please universally, is contrary to nature and experience” (Kalligone, p. 675). Depending on how we take this claim, of course, Herder may not be saying anything with which Kant would disagree: Kant more than anyone else argues that all experience of an object requires consciousness of a concept as well as of empirical intuitions of that object, the matter of which is sensation. But he also holds that we could have a feeling of pleasure in an object without considering what concepts apply to it, and on the basis of such a feeling make the judgment that it is beautiful. Herder is specifically rejecting that claim. On what basis does he do so?

He does so by means of the more particular argument that our pleasure in beauty is in fact a pleasure in our sensed or felt recognition of an object’s adaptation to its environment, together with the premise that such a pleasure cannot be felt without a recognition of the application of a relevant concept to the object. Herder argues for this premise by going through a series of cases, precisely the kinds of particular examples that he accuses Kant of neglecting. First he considers figures (Gestalten), then colors and tones, and then a series of kinds of natural things, from stones and crystals to a series of living things ranging from flowers to human beings. In all of these cases, he argues, we respond to a recognition of the character of a thing and its relation to its environment that is necessarily mediated by our application of a concept to it. Before we consider whether this is a fair objection to Kant, more generally whether there is as much distance between Kant’s views and Herder’s as Herder himself believes, let us ask why Herder thinks such perception of an object’s essence and its well-being in its environment is so pleasing to us and so important for our own sense of well-being.

The answer to this question is what we might call a harmonic or sympathetic theory of the connection between pleasure in well-being and truth: Herder thinks that the perception of true harmony and well-being in the things around us generates a parallel harmony and feeling of it in ourselves:

May we not rejoice that we live in a world of good order and good form [Wohlordnung und Wohlgestalt], where all results of the laws of nature in gentle forms reveal to us as it were a band of rest and motion, an elastic-effective constancy of things, in short beauty as the bodily expression of a corporeal perfection that is harmonious both within itself and to our feeling? (Kalligone, p. 687)

The key idea here is not that we take pleasure in the direct consumption of the fruits of a harmonious nature, but rather that there is a kind of resonance between harmony and well-being in nature and our own sense of well-being: the perception of harmony in nature makes our own being feel well-ordered, just as the perception of disharmony in nature inevitably although painfully attracts our attention. This is the underlying vision of Herder’s mature aesthetics: our feeling of beauty does not arise from a free play with forms that might be triggered by something in the objective world but is not constrained by it. Rather, the feeling of beauty is a subjective response to the perception of objective harmony, a subjective feeling of well-being triggered by empathy with the well-being of other things in the world.

However, on several central points the differences between Kant and Herder are not quite as great as the latter supposed. First, Kant himself interpreted the feeling of the free play of the cognitive powers in aesthetic experience as a feeling of life, and thus at the deepest level his conception of the source of aesthetic pleasure is not that different from Herder’s. Second, although Kant began his analysis with the simplest case of the free judgment of natural beauty, which is supposedly not dependent upon our conceptualization of its object, it does not end there. As he complicated his analysis of aesthetic experiences to include the cases of the adherent beauty of works of nature as well as of human art in the general sense and of fine art in particular, Kant clearly recognized the rôle of conceptualization in our response to the work, and in the case of art in the production as the well the reception of the work, and transformed his conception of free play with the mere form of an object into a conception of felt harmony between the form and the concept of the object which is not so different from Herder’s conception of the harmony in a beautiful object. Finally, when Kant complicated his initial conception of the disinterestedness of aesthetic judgment to take account of our intellectual interest in the existence of natural beauty, he recognized that our experience of beauty is an experience of well-being and being at home in the world that is not unrelated to Herder’s conception of our experience of beauty. Nevertheless, as Kant’s terminology suggests, his conception of this interest may have remained more intellectual and moralistic than Herder himself would prefer.

Indeed, in his lectures on anthropology—which he began offering only in 1772–73, thus a decade after Herder had studied with him—Kant had made the connection between the free play of the faculties and the feeling of life clear and central to his aesthetic theory. There Kant argued that “Gratification or pleasure is the feeling of the promotion of life,” indeed that life itself “is the consciousness of a free and regular play of all the powers and faculties of human beings.” He equated the free play of our powers and faculties with their unhindered activity, and thus found the ultimate source of all pleasure in the unhindered activity of our powers:

The play of the powers of the mind [Gemüths Kräfte] must be strongly alive and free if it is to animate. Intellectual pleasure consists in the consciousness of the use of freedom in accordance with rules. Freedom is the greatest life of the human being, through which he exercises his activity without hindrance. (Vorlesungen über Anthropologie, 27:559–60)

In fact, Kant completes this discussion, which opens his lectures on the second part of psychology, on the faculties of approval and disapproval, with the remark that “All gratifications are related to life. Life, however, is a unity, and in so far as all gratifications aim at this, they are all homogeneous, let the sources from which they spring be what they are” (ibid., p. 561). Herder could have included these sentences in the footnote from Kalligone (pp. 672–3) in which he objects to Kant’s supposedly complete separation of the beautiful from the agreeable and the good.

Finally, perhaps the deepest of Herder’s criticisms of Kant is his attack upon the disinterestedness of aesthetic judgment, his insistence that there is a continuum rather than discontinuity between our responses to the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good. But on the matter of disinterestedness, too, Kant begins with a simple statement of a position that then turned out to be more complicated than it initially appeared. There can be no question that Kant wants to distinguish genuinely aesthetic experience from merely physiological gratification of the senses, from the approval of utility, or from moral approval, and that he does this by saying that aesthetic judgment neither presupposes nor gives rise to any interest in the existence of its object. But numerous factors complicate this picture.

First, Kant always defines pleasure as a state of mind connected with a disposition toward its own continuation, and in the first draft of the Introduction to the third Critique he adds that pleasure is a ground “for producing its object” (First Introduction to CPJ, section VIII, 20:230–1). There are technical reasons why Kant does not want to speak here of an interest in the continuation of pleasure and/or the production of its object, but it is certainly reasonable to say that on Kant’s own account any pleasure, including even the purest pleasure in beauty, is accompanied with some form of attachment to the possibility of its own continued and future experience, and therefore ordinarily to the availability of the objects that trigger that pleasure.

Further, Kant explicitly argues that the properly aesthetic pleasure in beautiful objects enters into combination with interests, also properly so called, in the existence of those objects. Under the rubric of the “empirical interest” in the beautiful, he argued that there are societal reasons for taking interest in the availability and possession of beautiful objects. Although he denies that there is any a priori relation of these reasons to the experience of beauty (CPJ, §41, 5:297), this is not to deny the existence of such attachments. Under the rubric of the “intellectual interest in the beautiful,” Kant then describes a reason for attachment to the beautiful that is apparently supposed to be a priori, namely, that the existence of beauty is a “trace” or “sign” that nature is amenable to the satisfaction of our moral interests (CPJ, §42, 5:300).

Kant’s conception of an intellectual interest in the beautiful does not seem entirely remote from Herder’s view that our sense of well-being in an object is accompanied with a corresponding sense of our own well-being, although there are two key differences. For one, Herder insists upon a recognition of an objective well-being to which our subjective feeling of well-being is a response, while for Kant well-being is always subjective, that is, our own, and the satisfaction of our aesthetic aims and of our moral aims may be parallel, but are both subjective. Our aesthetic pleasure in natural beauty is a sign of the possibility of our moral well-being in nature, not a response to a harmony in nature that has nothing to do with us. Second, Kant clearly wants to keep the connection between the satisfaction of our aesthetic aims and the satisfaction of our moral interests separate although connected, thus not collapsing aesthetic pleasure into moral satisfaction. Further, Kant seems to suggest that a sound moral interest in nature’s amenability to our objectives is a condition of the intellectual but aesthetic interest in the existence of (natural) beauty. From Herder’s point of view, that might seem to be an excessive moralization of an interest in the beautiful that should be entirely natural, although from Kant’s point of view Herder’s insistence on the continuity of the beautiful and the good might actually run the risk of an excessive moralization of aesthetic experience. So no doubt there are differences between them, but it is misleading of Herder to suggest that Kant simply fails to recognize that we have a real attachment to the interest in the beautiful. Kant did recognize that, but wanted to keep that attachment somewhat complicated and indirect in order to avoid the risk of an excessive moralization of the aesthetic but at the same time also avoid the risk of an excessive aestheticization of the moral.

In conclusion, Kant occupied a central place in eighteenth-century German aesthetics, although he is hardly the only important figure in the period. Rather, he synthesized the aesthetics of truth, especially moral truth, represented by the Wolffians with the aesthetics of play represented in Germany by Mendelssohn and Sulzer, but did so in a subtle and complicated way that resisted the simplifications that Schiller and Herder, for all their other insights, attempted to press upon him. At the same time, Kant refused to allow the importance of the arousal of emotions for its own sake in tasteful aesthetic experience, and thus rejected this aspect of aesthetic experience that had been recognized by Baumgarten and Meier and analyzed in considerable detail by Mendelssohn. So Kant’s synthesis of approaches to aesthetic experience was by no means complete. It might then be expected that the history of aesthetics in the period immediately following Kant would have turned to the task of integrating emotional impact into a complex theory of aesthetic experience. That is not what happened, however, as both Hegel and Schopenhauer developed different versions of purely cognitivist aesthetics, rejecting Kant’s theory of play, and downplayed the emotional impact of aesthetic experience even more than Kant had done. It would take the rest of the nineteenth century to integrate the three approaches to aesthetics that had been developed in the eighteenth century.


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  • –––, Practical Philosophy, edited and translated by Mary J. Gregor (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • –––, Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, in Kant, Religion and Rational Theology, edited by Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • –––, Vorlesungen über Anthropologie, Kant’s gesammelte Schriften, vol. 27, edited by Reinhard Brandt and Werner Stark for the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Sciences (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1997).
  • König, Johann Ulrich, Untersuchung von dem guten Geschmack in der Dicht- und Redekunst (“Investigation of good Taste in the Arts of Poetry and Oratory”) (Leipzig and Berlin, 1727), cited from Henning Boetius, Dichtungstheorien der Aufklärung (Tübingen: Max Niemeyer Verlag, 1971).
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, “Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas,” in Leibniz, Philosophical Papers and Letters, translated and edited by Leroy E. Loemker, second edition (Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1969).
  • –––, “On Wisdom” (1690s), in Philosophical Papers and Letters.
  • Lessing, Gotthold Ephraim, Laocoön: An Essay on the Limits of Painting and Poetry, translated by Edward Allen McCormick (Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1962; with a foreword by Michael Fried, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1984).
  • –––, Wie die Alten den Tod gebildet (Berlin: Christian Friedrich Voß, 1769).
  • Meier, Georg Friedrich, Frühe Schriften zur Ästhetischen Erziehung der Deutschen, edited by Hans-Joachim Kertscher and Günter Schenk, 3 vols. (Halle: Hallescher Verlag, 1999).
  • –––, Theoretische Lehre der Gemüthsbewegungen Überhaupt (Halle: Carl Hermann Hemmerde, 1744).
  • Mendelssohn, Moses, Aesthetische Schriften, edited by Anne Pollok (Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag, 2006).
  • –––, review of G.F. Meier, Auszug aus den Anfangsgründen aller schönen Künste und Wissenschaften, in Bibliothek der schönen Wissenschaften und der freyen Künste (1756–1759, III.1:130–8), reprinted in Mendelssohn, Gesammelte Schriften, begun by J. Elbogen, J. Guttmann, E. Mittwoch, continued by Alexander Altmann (Stuttgart-Bad Canstatt: Frommann Holzboog, 1929– ), vol. 4, edited by Eva J. Engel (1977), pp. 196–201.
  • –––, Morgenstunden, oder Vorlesungen über das Dasein Gottes, edited by Dominique Bourel (Stuttgart: Philipp Reclam Jun., 1979); translations in:
  • –––, Morning Hours: Lectures on God’s Existence, translated by Daniel O. Dahlstrom and Corey Dyck (Dordrecht: Springer, 2011), and
  • –––, Last Works, translated by Bruce Rosenstock (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2012).
  • –––, Philosophical Writings, translated by Daniel O. Dahlstrom (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
  • Moritz, Karl Philipp, Werke, edited by Horst Günther, second edition, three volumes (Frankfurt am Main: Insel Verlag, 1993).
  • Poppe, Bernhard (ed.), Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten: Seine Bedeutung und Stellung in der Leibniz-Wolffischen Philosophie und seine Beziehungen zu Kant, nebst Veröffentlichung einer bisher unbekannten Handschrift der Ästhetik Baumgartens (Borna-Leipzig: Robert Noske, 1907).
  • Riedel, Friedrich Just, Theorie der schönen Künste und Wissenschaften: Ein Auszug aus den Werken verschiedener Schriftsteller (Jena: Cuno, 1767).
  • Schelling, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph, The Philosophy of Art, translated by Douglas W. Stott (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989).
  • Schiller, Friedrich, National Ausgabe der Werke Schillers, vol. 20, Philosophische Schriften, Teil 1, with cooperation by Helmut Koopman, edited by Benno von Wiese (Weimar: Böhlau, 1962) (“NA”).
  • –––, On the Aesthetic Education of Man: In a Series of Letters, edited and translated by Elizabeth M. Wilkinson and L.A. Willoughby (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1967).
  • –––, On Grace and Dignity, in Jane Curran and Christophe Fricker (eds.), Schiller’s “On Grace and Dignity” in Its Cultural Context: Essays and a New Translation (Rochester: Camden House, 2005).
  • –––, “On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry,” translated by Daniel O. Dahlstrom in Friedrich Schiller, Essays, edited by Walter Hinderer and Daniel O. Dahlstrom (New York: Continuum, 1993).
  • –––, Kallias or Concerning Beauty: Letters to Gottfried Körner, translated by Stefan Bird-Pollan, in J.M. Bernstein (ed.), Classic and Romantic German Aesthetics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).
  • Schlegel, Friedrich, On the Study of Greek Poetry, translated by Stuart Barnett (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2001).
  • Sulzer, Johann Georg, Allgemeine Theorie der schönen Künste, expanded second edition, four volumes (Leipzig: Weidmann, 1792–94).
  • –––, “Psychological Considerations on Moral Human Beings” (Psychologische Betrachtungen über den sittlichen Menschen, 1769), in Sulzer’s Vermischte Philosophische Schriften, volumes I and II (Leipzig: Weidmanns Erben und Reich, 1773, 1781, reprinted in one volume, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag, 1974), Volume I, pp. 282–306.
  • Winckelmann, Johann Joachim, Essays on the Philosophy and History of Art, with an introduction by Curtis Bowman, three volumes (Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2001).
  • –––, History of the Art of Antiquity, translated by Harry Francis Mallgrave, introduction by Alex Potts (Los Angeles: Getty Research Institute, 2006).
  • Wolff, Christian, Metafisica Tedesca, con le Annotazione alla Metafisica Tedesca, edited by Raffaele Ciafardone (Milan: Bompiani, 2003). (This edition presents Wolff’s German and an Italian translation on facing pages; the Italian translation may not help many readers of the present article, but this is the only edition of Wolff’s original text that is newly set in modern type rather than photographically reproducing the eighteenth-century Fraktur in which his German works were set. Since I will only refer to the German text, however, I will cite this edition as German Metaphysics.)
  • –––, Philosophia Prima sive Ontologia, new edition (Frankfurt and Leipzig: Renger, 1736), reprint edited by Jean Ecole (Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1962).
  • –––, Preliminary Discourse on Philosophy in General, translated by Richard J. Blackwell (Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1963).
  • –––, The Principles of Architecture, in The Principles of All Mathematical Sciences, new edition (Frankfurt, Leipzig, and Halle: Renger, 1750–57, reprint Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1999).
  • –––, Psycologia Empirica, edited by Jean École (Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1968).
  • –––, Rational Thoughts on the Aims of Natural Things, second edition (Frankfurt and Leipzig, 1726; modern reprint Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1980).

General Studies and Specialized Histories

  • Baeumler, Alfred, 1923, Das Irrationalitästsproblem in der Ästhetik und Logik des 18. Jahrhunderts, Halle: Martin Niemeyer. (This author later became a leading instrument in the Nazification of the German universities.)
  • Barck, Karlheinz, et al., 2000–05, Ästhetische Grundbegriffe, 7 vols. Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler Verlag.
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 2009, Diotima’s Children: German Aesthetic Rationalism from Leibniz to Lessing, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, 1999, The Roots of Romanticism, Bollingen Series XXXV:45. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bosanquet, Ernest, 1904, A History of Æsthetic, Second edition. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Brady, Emily, 2013, The Sublime in Modern Philosophy: Aesthetics, Ethics, and Nature, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Buchenau, Stefanie, 2013, The Founding of Aesthetics in the German Enlightenment: The Art of Invention and the Invention of Art, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1916, Freiheit und Form: Studien zur deutschen Geistesgeschichte, Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • –––, 1951, The Philosophy of the Enlightenment, translated by Fritz C.A. Koelln and James P. Pettegrove, Princeton: Princeton University Press, Chapter VII.
  • Costelloe, Timothy M. (ed.), 2013, The Sublime: From Antiquity to the Present, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Croce, Benedetto, 1922, Æsthetic: As Science of Expression and General Linguistic, Translated by Douglas Ainslie. Revised edition. London: Macmillan & Co. (Part I, on the history of aesthetics, is not included in the 1992 translation by Colin Lyas.)
  • Doran, Robert, 2015, The Theory of the Sublime from Longinus to Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dupré, Louis, 2004, The Enlightenment and the Intellectual Foundations of Modern Culture, New Haven and London: Yale University Press, Chapter 4.
  • Dürbeck, Gabriele, 1998, Einbildungskraft und Aufklärung: Perspektiven der Philosophie, Anthropologie und Ästhetik um 1750, Tübingen: Max Niemeyer Verlag.
  • Ferry, Luc, 1993, Homo aestheticus: The Invention of Taste in the Democratic Age, Translated by Robert de Loaiza. Chicago: University of Chicago Press. Chapters 1–3.
  • Gethmann-Seifert, Annemarie, 1995, Einführung in die Ästhetik, Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Gilbert, Katherine Everett, and Helmut Kuhn, 1953, A History of Esthetics, Second edition. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Goubert, Jean-François, and Gérard Raulet, 2005, Aux sources de l’esthetique: Les débuts de l’esthetique philosophique en Allemagne, Paris: Éditions de la Maison des Sciences de L’Homme. Essays on and extracts (in French translations) from Wolff, Gottsched, Baumgarten, Meier, Bodmer and Breitinger, and Sulzer.
  • Grote, Simon, 2017, The Emergence of Modern Aesthetic Theory: Religion and Morality in Enlightenment Germany and Scotland, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Guyer, Paul, 2014, A History of Modern Aesthetics, Volume I: The Eighteenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hammermeister, Kai, 2002, The German Aesthetic Tradition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Harrison, Charles, Paul Wood, and Jason Gaiger (eds), 2000, Art in Theory 1648–1815: An Anthology of Changing Ideas, Oxford and Malden: Blackwells Publishers.
  • Hohner, Ulrich, 1976, Zur Problematik der Naturnachahmung in der Ästhetik des 18. Jahrhunderts, Erlangen: Palm & Enke.
  • Kirwan, James, 2005, Sublimity, London: Routledge.
  • Kondylis, Panajotis, 2002, Die Aufklärung im Rahmen des neuzeitlichen Rationalismus, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag. Chapter VIII.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann, 1868, Geschichte der Ästhetik in Deutschland, Munich: Cotta.
  • McCarthy, John A., 2002, “Criticism and Experience: Philosophy and Literature in the German Enlightenment.” In Nicholas Saul (ed.) Philosophy and German Literature 1700–1990, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Pp. 13–56.
  • Makkreel, Rudolf A., 2006, “Aesthetics,” in Knud Haakonssen (ed.), The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Vol. I, pp. 516–66.
  • Nida-Rümelin, Julian, Monika Betzler, and Mara-Daria Cojocaru (eds), 2012, Ästhetik und Kunstphilosophie von der Antike bis zur Gegenwart, 2nd edition. Stuttgart: Alfred Kröner Verlag. Includes entries on Baumgarten, Gottsched, Herder, Kant, Lessing, Moritz, Schiller, Sulzer, and Winckelmann.
  • Nivelle, Armand, 1971, Kunst- und Dichtungstheorie zwischen Aufklärung und Klassik, Second edition, Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter & Co..
  • Paetzold, Heinz, 1983, Ästhetik des deutschen Idealismus: Zur Idee ästhetischer Rationalität bei Baumgarten, Kant, Schelling, Hegel und Schopenhauer, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Poppe, Bernhard (ed.), 1907, Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten: Seine Bedeutung und Stellung in der Leibniz-Wolffischen Philosophie und seine Beziehungen zu Kant, nebst Veröffentlichung einer bisher unbekannten Handschrift der Ästhetik Baumgartens (Borna-Leipzig: Robert Noske).
  • Scheer, Brigitte, 1997, Einführung in die philosophische Ästhetik, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft. Chapter III on Baumgarten, chapter IV on Kant.
  • Schmidt, Horst Michael, 1982, Sinnlichkeit und Verstand: Zur philosophischen und poetologischen Begründung von Erfahrung und Urteil in der deutschen Aufklärung (Leibniz, Wolff, Gottsched, Bodmer und Breitinger, Baumgarten), Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Schmidt, Jochen, 1985, Die Geschichte des Genie-Gedankens 1750–1945, Volume I, Von der Aufklärung bis zum Idealismus, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Sommer, Robert, 1892, Grundzüge einer Geschichte der Deutschen Psychologie und Aesthetik von Wolff-Baumgarten bis Kant-Schiller, Würzburg: Stahel.
  • Wellek, René, 1955, A History of Modern Criticism: 1750–1950, Volume I: The Later Eighteenth Century, New Haven: Yale University Press. Chapters 8–11.
  • Zelle, Carsten, 1995, Die doppelte Ästhetik: Revisionen des Schönen von Boileau bis Nietzsche, Stuttgart: Verlag J.B. Metzler.

Secondary Literature: Individual Authors

[See also works listed in the previous section. Where a work listed here covers several authors, it is usually listed under the first author it covers.]


  • Birke, Joachim, 1966, Christian Wolffs Metaphysik und die zeitgenössische Literatur- und Musiktheorie: Gottsched, Scheibe, Mizler, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter & Co.
  • Krüger, Joachim, 1980, Christian Wolff und die Ästhetik, Berlin: Wissenschaftliche Schriftenreihe der Humboldt-Universität.


  • Dahlstrom, Daniel O., 1986, “Die Aufklärung der Poesie.” Zeitschrift für Ästhetik und allgemeine Kunstwissenschaft 31: 139–68.
  • Möller, Uwe, 1983, Rhetorische Überlieferung und Dichtungstheorie im frühen 18. Jahrhundert: Studien zu Gottsched, Breitinger und G.Fr. Meier, Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Rieck, Werner, 1972, Johann Christoph Gottsched, eine kritische Würdigung seines Werkes, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag.

Baumgarten and Meier

  • Dumouchel, Daniel, 1991, “A.G. Baumgarten et la naissance du discour esthétique.” Dialogue 30: 473–501.
  • Franke, Ursula, 1972, Kunst als Erkenntnis: Die Rolle der Sinnlichkeit in der Ästhetik Alexander Gottlieb Baumgartens, Studia Leibnitiana, volume 9. Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Gregor, Mary J., 1983, “Baumgarten’s Aesthetica,” Review of Metaphysics 37: 357–85.
  • Gross, Steffen W., 2001, Felix aestheticus: Die Ästhetik als Lehre vom Menschen: zum 250. Jahrestag des Erscheinens von Alexander Gottlieb Baumgartens “Aesthetica.” Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Jäger, Michael, 1980, Kommentierende Einführung in Baumgartens “Aesthetica”: Zur entstehenden wissenschaftlichen Ästhetik des 18. Jahrhunderts in Deutschland, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • McQuillan, J. Colin, 2018, “Baumgarten, Meier, and Kant on Aesthetic Perfection,” in Daniel O. Dahlstrom (ed.), Kant and His German Contemporaries: Volume II, Aesthetics, History, Politics, and Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 13–27.
  • Parret, Herman, 1992, “De Baumgarten à Kant: sur la beauté.” Revue philosophique de Louvain 90: 317–43.
  • Schenk, Günter, 1994, Leben und Werk des halleschen Aufklärers Georg Friedrich Meier, Halle an der Saale: Hallescher Verlag.
  • Solms, Friedhelm, 1990, Disciplina aesthetica: Zur Frühgeschichte der ästhetischen Theorie bei Baumgarten und Herder, Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta.
  • Witte, Egbert, 2000, Logik ohne Dornen: Die Rezeption von A.G. Baumgartens Ästhetil im Spannungsfeld von logischem Begriff und ästhetischer Anschauung, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.


  • Altmann, Alexander, 1969, Moses Mendelssohns Frühschriften zur Metaphysik, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr (Paul Siebeck).
  • –––, 1973, Moses Mendelssohn: A Biographical Study, University, AL: University of Alabama Press.
  • Guyer, Paul, 1993, “The Perfections of Art: Mendelssohn, Moritz, and Kant.” In Paul Guyer, Kant and the Experience of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Chapter IV.
  • –––, 2018, “Mendelssohn, Kant, and the Aims of Art,” in Daniel O. Dahlstrom (ed.), Kant and His German Contemporaries, Volume II: Aesthetics, History, Politics, and Religion, Camnbridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 28–49.
  • –––, 2020, Reason and Experience in Mendelssohn and Kant, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hochman, Leah, 2014, The Ugliness of Moses Mendelssohn: Aesthetics, Religion, and Morality in the Eighteenth Century, London: Routledge.
  • Meier, Jean-Paul, 1977, L’esthétique de Moses Mendelssohn (1729–1786), Dissertation. Paris.
  • Munk, Reinier (ed.), 2011, Moses Mendessohn’s Metaphysics and Aesthetics, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Pollok, Anne, 2010, Facetten des Menschen: Zur Anthropologie Moses Mendelssohns, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag.
  • Will, Frederick, Jr., 1955, “Cognition through Beauty: Moses Mendelssohn’s Early Aesthetics.” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 14: 97–105.


  • Baur, Michael, 2018, “Winckelmann’s Greek Ideal and Kant’s Critical Philosophy,” in Daniel O. Dahlstrom (ed.), Kant and Hist Contemporaries, Volume II: Aesthetics, History, Politics, and Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 50–68.
  • Décultot, Élisabeth, 2000, Johann Joachim Winckelmann: Enquête sur la genèse de l’histoire de l’art, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • –––, 2018, “Eighteenth-Century Anthropological Studies of Ancient Greece: Winckelmann, Herder, Caylus, and Kant,” in Daniel O. Dahlstrom (ed.), Kant and His Contemporaries, Volume II: Aesthetics, History, Politics, and Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 71–90.
  • Fried, Michael, 1986, “Antiquity Now: Reading Winckelmann on Imitation.” October 37: 87–97.
  • Hatfield, Henry C., 1943, Winckelmann and His German Critics 1755–1781: A Prelude to the Classical Age, New York: King’s Crown Press.
  • Morrison, Jeffrey, 1996, Winckelmann and the Notion of Aesthetic Education, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Potts, Alex, 1994, Flesh and the Ideal: Winckelmann and the Origins of Art History, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.


  • Richter, Simon, 1992, Laocoon’s Body and the Aesthetics of Pain: Winckelmann, Lessing, Herder, Moritz, Goethe, Detroit: Wayne State University Press.
  • Wellbery, David E., 1984, Lessing’s Laocoon: Semiotics and Aesthetics in the Age of Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wessel, Leonard, 1983, “Lessing as an Aesthetic Thinker.” Lessing Yearbook 15: 177–211.


  • Berlin, Isaiah, 1976, Vico and Herder: Two Studies in the History of Ideas, London: The Hogarth Press.
  • Forster, Michael N., 2018, Herder’s Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gjesdal, Kristin, 2017, Herder’s Hermeneutics: History, Poetry, Enlightenment, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Herder, Johann Gottfried, 1992, Selected Early Works, 1764–1767, Edited and translated by Ernest Menze, Karl Menges, and Michael Palma. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Morton, Michael, 1989, Herder and the poetics of thought: unity and diversity in “On diligence in several learned languages.” University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Norton, Robert E., 1991, Herder’s Aesthetics and the European Enlightenment, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Sikka, Sonia, 2011, Herder on Humanity and Cultural Difference: Enlightened Relativism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Waldow, Anik and Nigel DeSouza (eds.), 2017, Herdere: Philosophy and Anthropology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Zammito, John H., 2002, Kant, Herder, and the Birth of Anthropology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Zuckert, Rachel, 2019, Herder’s Naturalist Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.


  • Baker, Nancy Kovaleff and Thomas Christensen (eds), 1995, Aesthetics and the Art of Musical Composition in the German Enlightenment: Selected Writings of Johann Georg Sulzer and Heinrich Christoph Koch, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dobai, Johannes. 1978, Die bildenden Künste in J.G. Sulzers Ästhetik, seine Allgemeine Theorie der schönen Künste, Winthertur: Stadtbibliothek.
  • Tumarkin, Anna, 1933, Die Ästhetiker Johann Georg Sulzer, Frauenfeld: Huber.


  • Allkemper, Alo, 1990, Ästhetische Lösungen: Studien zu Karl Philipp Moritz, Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Boulby, Mark, 1979, Karl Philipp Moritz: At the Fringe of Genius, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Costazza, Allessandro, 1999, Genie und tragische Kunst: Karl Philipp Moritz und die Ästhetik des 18. Jahrhunderts, Bern, New York: Peter Lang.
  • Kosenina, Alexander, 2006, Karl Philip Moritz: Literarische Experimente auf dem Weg zum psychologischen Roman, Göttingen: Wallstein Verlag.
  • Niklewski, Günter, 1979, Versuch über Symbol und Allegorie (Winckelmann, Moritz, Schelling), Erlangen: Verlag Palm & Enke.
  • Saine, Thomas P., 1971, Die ästhetische Theodizee, Karl Philipp Moritz und die Philosophie des 18. Jahrhunderts, Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Schrimpf, Hans Joachim, 1980, Karl Philipp Moritz, Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler Verlag.
  • Woodmansee, Martha, 1994, The Author, Art, and the Market: Rereading the History of Aesthetics, New York: Columbia University Press.


  • Davies, Martin, 1995, Identity or History? Marcus Herz and the End of the Enlightenment, Detroit: Wayne State University Press.


  • Adair, Stephanie, 2018, The Aesthetic Use of the Logical Functions in Kant’s Third Critique, Berlin and Boston: Walter de Gruyer,
  • Allison, Henry E., 2001, Kant’s Theory of Taste: A Reading of the ‘Critique of Judgment’, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Basch, Victor, 1927, Essai Critique sur L’esthétique de Kant, Second edition. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Bartuschat, Wolfgang, 1972, Zum systematischen Ort von Kants Kritik der Urteilskraft, Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann.
  • Berger, David, 2009, Kant’s Aesthetic Theory: The Beautiful and Agreeable, London: Continuum.
  • Böhme, Gernot, 1999, Kants Kritik der Urteilskraft in neuer Sicht, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag.
  • Brady, Emily, 2013, “Imagination and Freedom in the Kantian Sublime,” in Michael L. Thompson (ed.), Imagination in Kant’s Critical Philosophy, Berlin and Boston: Walter de Gruyter, pp. 163–82.
  • Breitenbach, Angela, 2009, Die Analogie von Vernunft und Natur, Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Bruno, Paul W., 2010, Kant’s Concept of Genius: Its Origin and Function in the Third Critique. London: Continuum.
  • Budd, Malcolm, 2002, The Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Budick, Sanford, 2010, Kant and Milton, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Caygill, Howard, 1989, Art of Judgment, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Clewis, Robert R., 2009, The Kantian Sublime and the Revelation of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, Alix A. (guest editor), 2008, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science: Special Issue-Kantian Philosophy and the Human Sciences, Amsterdam: Elsevier.
  • Cohen, Hermann, 1889, Kants Begründung der Ästhetik, Berlin: Dümmler.
  • Cohen, Ted and Guyer, Paul (eds.), 1982, Essays in Kant’s Aesthetics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press (multiple-author anthology; includes extensive bibliography).
  • Crawford, Donald W., 1974, Kant’s Aesthetic Theory, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Crowther, Paul, 1989, The Kantian Sublime: From Morality to Art, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2010, The Kantian Aesthetic: From Knowledge to the Avant-Garde, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dickie, George, 1996, The Century of Taste: The Philosophical Odyssey of Taste in the Eighteenth Century, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dörflinger, Bernd, 1988, Die Realität des Schönen in Kants Theorie rein ästhetischer Urteilskraft: Zur Gegenstandsbedeutung subjektiver und formaler Ästhetik, Bonn: Bouvier Verlag.
  • Dumouchel, Daniel, 1999, Kant et le Genèse de la Subjectivé Esthétique: Esthétique et Philiosophie avant la Critique de la Faculté de Juger. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Esser, Andrea Marlen, 1997, Kunst als Symbol: Die Struktur ästhetischer Reflexion in Kants Theorie des Schönen, Munich: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Esser, Andrea (ed.), 1995, Autonomie der Kunst? Zur Aktualität von Kants Ästhetik, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Franke, Ursula (ed.), 2000, Kants Schlüssel zur Kritik des Geschmacks: Ästhetische Erfahrung heute—Studien zur Aktualität von Kants “Kritik der Urteilskraft”, Sonderheft des Jahrgangs 2000 der Zeitschrift für Ästhetik und allgemeine Kunstwissenschaft. Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag.
  • Fricke, Christel, 1990, Kants Theories des reinen Geschmacksurteils, Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Friedlander, Eli, 2015, Expressions of Judgment: An Essay on Kant’s Aesthetics, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1999, Truth and Method, Second revised edition. Translated by Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall. New York: Continuum.
  • Ginsborg, Hannah, 1990, The Role of Taste in Kant’s Theory of Cognition, New York: Garland Publishing Company.
  • –––, 2015, The Normativity of Nature: Essays on Kant’s Critique of Judgment, Oxford; Oxford University Press.
  • Guyer, Paul, 1993, Kant and the Experience of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1997, Kant and the Claims of Taste, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1979; second edition, with additional chapter: Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2003, Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment: Critical Essays, Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield. (includes extensive bibliography)
  • –––, 2005a, Values of Beauty: Historical Essays in Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005a.
  • –––, 2005b, “The Ethical Value of the Aesthetic: Kant, Alison, and Santayana,” chapter 8 of Guyer 2005a, pp. 190–221.
  • –––, 2006a, “Bridging the Gulf: Kant’s Project in the third Critique,” in Graham Bird (ed.), A Companion to Kant (Oxford and Malden: Blackwell Publishing, 2006), pp. 423–40.
  • –––, 2006b, “The Ideal of Beauty and the Necessity of Grace: Kant and Schiller on Ethics and Aesthetics,” in Walter Hinderer (ed.), Friedrich Schiller auf dem Weg in die Moderne (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann). Pp. 187–204.
  • Henrich, Dieter, 1992, Aesthetic Judgment and the Moral Image of the World: Studies in Kant, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Hoöffe, Otfried, 2008, Immanuel Kant: Kritik der Urteilskraft, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Hughes, Fiona, 2007, Kant’s Aesthetic Epistemology: Form and World, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • –––, 2010, Kant’s Critique of Aesthetic Judgment: A Reader’s Guide, London: Continuum.
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Work on this entry was facilitated by a Laurance S. Rockefeller Visiting Fellowship at the Princeton University Center for Human Values. Section 7 draws on Guyer 2005b and Guyer 2006a. Section 8 draws on Guyer 2006b.

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Paul Guyer <paul_guyer@brown.edu>

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