Johann Gottfried von Herder

First published Tue Oct 23, 2001; substantive revision Fri Aug 25, 2017

Johann Gottfried von Herder (1744–1803) is a philosopher of the first importance. This judgment largely turns on the intrinsic quality of his ideas (of which this article will try to give some impression). But another aspect of it is his intellectual influence. This has been immense both within philosophy and beyond it (much greater than is usually realized). For example, Hegel’s philosophy turns out to be largely a sort of elaborate systematic development of Herder’s ideas (especially concerning language, the mind, history, and God); so too does Schleiermacher’s (concerning language, interpretation, translation, the mind, art, and God); Nietzsche is deeply influenced by Herder as well (concerning language, the mind, history, and values); so too is Dilthey (especially concerning history); even John Stuart Mill has important debts to Herder (in political philosophy); and beyond philosophy, Goethe was transformed from being merely a clever but rather conventional poet into the great artist he eventually became largely through the early impact on him of Herder’s ideas.

Indeed, Herder can claim to have virtually established whole disciplines that we now take for granted. For example, it was mainly Herder (not, as has often been claimed, Hamann) who established fundamental ideas concerning an intimate dependence of thought on language that underpin modern philosophy of language. It was Herder who, through those same ideas, his recognition of deep variations in thought and language across historical periods and cultures, his perception of the fundamental role of grammar in language and of grammar’s deep variation between languages, his empirical approach to languages, and in other ways, inspired Friedrich Schlegel, Wilhelm von Humboldt, and others to found modern linguistics. It was Herder who developed modern interpretation-theory, or “hermeneutics”, in ways that would subsequently be taken over by Schleiermacher and then more systematically formulated by the latter’s pupil August Boeckh. It was Herder who, by doing so, also contributed to establishing the methodological foundations of nineteenth-century German classical scholarship (which rested on the Schleiermacher-Boeckh methodology), and hence of modern classical scholarship generally. It was Herder who did more than anyone else to establish the general conception and the interpretive methodology of our modern discipline of anthropology. Finally, Herder also made vital contributions to the progress of modern biblical scholarship.

1. Life and Works

Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803) was born in Mohrungen in East Prussia. His father was a schoolteacher and he grew up in humble circumstances. In 1762 he enrolled at the University of Königsberg, where he studied with Kant, who accorded him special privileges because of his unusual intellectual abilities. At this period he also began a lifelong friendship with the irrationalist philosopher Hamann. In 1764 he left Königsberg to take up a school-teaching position in Riga. There he wrote the programmatic essay How Philosophy Can Become More Universal and Useful for the Benefit of the People (1765); published his first major work, concerning the philosophy of language and literature, the Fragments on Recent German Literature (1767–8); and also published an important work on aesthetics, the Critical Forests (1769). In 1769 he resigned his position and travelled—first to France, and then to Strasbourg, where in 1770 he met, and had a powerful impact on, the young Goethe. In 1771 he won a prize from the Berlin Academy for his best-known work in the philosophy of language, the Treatise on the Origin of Language (published in 1772). From 1771–6 he served as court preacher to the ruling house in Bückeburg. The most important works from this period are the essay Shakespeare (1773) and his first major essay on the philosophy of history, This Too a Philosophy of History for the Formation of Humanity (1774). In 1776, partly thanks to Goethe’s influence, he was appointed General Superintendent of the Lutheran clergy in Weimar, a post he would keep for the rest of his life. During this period he published an important essay in the philosophy of mind, On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul (1778); a seminal work on the Old Testament, On the Spirit of Hebrew Poetry (1782–3); his well-known longer work on the philosophy of history, the Ideas for the Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784–91); an influential essay on the philosophy of religion, God: Some Conversations (1787); a work largely on political philosophy, written in response to the French Revolution, the Letters for the Advancement of Humanity (1793–7); a series of Christian Writings (1794–8) concerned with the New Testament; and two works opposing Kant’s critical philosophy, A Metacritique on the Critique of Pure Reason (1799) (directed against the theoretical philosophy of the Critique of Pure Reason (Kant 1781/7)) and the Calligone (1800) (directed against the aesthetics of the Critique of the Power of Judgment (Kant 1790)). In addition to the works just mentioned, Herder also wrote many others in the course of his career.

Herder’s earlier works are often his best. He himself wrote in On the Cognition and Sensation (this article will use such abbreviated titles throughout) that “the first uninhibited work of an author is … usually his best; his bloom is unfolding, his soul still dawn” (HPW 219). Whether or not that is generally true, it does arguably apply to Herder himself.

2. Philosophical Style

In certain ways Herder’s philosophical texts are easier to read than others from the period. For example, he avoids technical jargon, writes in a way that is lively and rich in examples rather than dry and abstract, and has no large, complex system for the reader to keep track of. But his texts also have certain peculiarities that can impede a proper understanding and appreciation of his thought, and it is important to be alerted to these.

To begin with, Herder’s writing often seems emotional and grammatically undisciplined in ways that might perhaps be expected in casual speech but not in philosophical texts. This is intentional. Indeed, Herder sometimes deliberately “roughed up” material in this direction between drafts. Moreover, he has serious philosophical reasons for writing in such a way, including the following: (1) This promises to make his writing more broadly accessible and interesting to people—a decidedly non-trivial goal for him, since he believes it to be an essential part of philosophy’s vocation to have a broad social impact. (2) He believes in the expressive superiority of speech over writing. (3) One of his central theses in the philosophy of mind holds that thought is not and should not be separate from volition, or affect, that types of thinking that attempt to exclude affect are inherently distorting and inferior. Standard academic writing has this vice, whereas spontaneous speech, and writing that imitates it, do not. (4) Herder is opposed to any lexical or grammatical straitjacketing of language, any slavish obedience to dictionaries and grammar books. In his view, such straitjacketing is inimical, not only to linguistic creativity and inventiveness, but also (much worse), since thought is essentially dependent on and confined in its scope by language, thereby to creativity and inventiveness in thought itself.

Another peculiarity of Herder’s philosophical texts is their unsystematic nature. This is again deliberate. For Herder is largely hostile toward systematicity in philosophy (a fact that is reflected both in explicit remarks and in many of his titles: Fragments … , Ideas … , etc.). He is particularly hostile to the ambitious sort of systematicity that is aspired to in the tradition of Spinoza, Wolff, Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel: the ideal of a comprehensive theory whose parts display some sort of strict overall pattern of derivation. He has compelling reasons for this hostility: (1) He is very skeptical that such systematic designs can be made to work (as opposed to creating, through illicit means, an illusion that they do). (2) He believes that such system-building leads to a premature closure of inquiry, and in particular to a disregarding or distortion of new empirical evidence. Scrutiny of such systems amply bears out both of these concerns. Herder’s well-grounded hostility to this type of systematicity established an important counter-tradition in German philosophy (which subsequently included, for example, Friedrich Schlegel, Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, and Adorno).

On the other hand, Herder is in favor of “systematicity” in a more modest sense: the ideal of a theory that is self-consistent and supported by argument (this marks an important point of methodological contrast with Hamann, whom Herder already criticizes for failing to provide arguments in an essay from early 1765, Dithyrambic Rhapsody [G1:38]). He by no means always achieves this ideal (so that interpreting him calls for more selectivity and reconstruction than is the case with some philosophers). However, his failures to do so are more often apparent than real: First, in many cases where he may seem to be guilty of inconsistency he is really not. For he is sometimes developing philosophical dialogues between two or more opposing viewpoints, in which cases it would clearly be a mistake to accuse him of inconsistency in any usual or pejorative sense. And (less obviously) in many other cases he is in effect still working in this dialogue-mode, only without bothering to distribute the positions among different interlocutors explicitly, and so is again innocent of real inconsistency (examples of this occur in How Philosophy Can Become and This Too a Philosophy of History). Moreover, he has serious motives for using this method of (implicit) dialogue: (1) Sometimes his main motive is simply that when dealing with religiously or politically delicate matters it permits him to state his views but without quite stating them as his own and therefore without inviting trouble. But he also has philosophically deeper motives: (2) He takes over from the pre-critical Kant an idea (inspired by ancient skepticism) that the best way for a philosopher to pursue the truth is by setting contrary views on a subject into opposition with one another in order to advance toward, and hopefully attain, the truth through their mutual testing and modification. (3) In addition, he develops a more original variant of that idea on the socio-historical plane: analogously, the way for humankind as a whole to attain the elusive goal of truth is through an ongoing contest between opposing positions, in the course of which the best ones will eventually win out (this idea anticipates and indirectly influenced a central thesis of John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty (1859)). This yields a further motive for the dialogue-method (even when it does not lead Herder himself to any definite conclusion), in effect warranting the rhetorical question, And what does it matter to the cause of humankind and its discovery of truth whether those various opposing positions are advanced by different people or by the same person? Second, Herder’s frequent appearance of neglecting to give arguments is often, rather, a principled rejection of arguments of certain sorts. For example, he has a general commitment to empiricism and against apriorism in philosophy that usually leads him to avoid giving familiar sorts of a priori arguments in philosophy; and a commitment to sentimentalism in ethics that leads him to refrain from familiar sorts of cognitivist arguments in ethics.

3. General Program in Philosophy

The extent of Hamann’s influence on Herder’s best thought has been greatly exaggerated by some of the secondary literature (e.g., Isaiah Berlin). But Kant’s influence was early, fundamental, and enduring. However, the Kant who influenced Herder in this way was the pre-critical Kant of the early and middle 1760s, not the critical Kant (against whom Herder later engaged in the—rather distracting and ineffective—public polemics of the Metacritique and the Calligone).

Some of the pre-critical Kant’s key positions in the 1760s, sharply contrasting with ones that he would later adopt during the critical period, were: a (Pyrrhonist-influenced) skepticism about metaphysics; a form of empiricism; and a (Hume-influenced) sentimentalism in ethics. Herder took over these positions in the 1760s and retained them throughout his career. It should by no means be assumed that this debt to the early Kant is a debt to a philosophically inferior Kant, though; a good case could be made for the very opposite.

Herder’s 1765 essay How Philosophy Can Become More Universal and Useful for the Benefit of the People is a key text for understanding both his debt to Kant and the broad orientation of his philosophy. The essay was written under strong influence from Kant, especially, it seems, Kant’s 1766 essay Dreams of a Spirit Seer, which Kant sent to Herder prior to its publication (“a sheet at a time”, Herder reports [B2:259]).

Herder’s essay answers a prize question set by a society in Bern, Switzerland: “How can the truths of philosophy become more universal and useful for the benefit of the people?” This question was conceived in the spirit of the Popularphilosophie that was competing with school-philosophy in the German-speaking world at the time. Kant himself tended to identify with Popularphilosophie at this period, and Herder’s selection of this question shows him doing so as well. But in his case the identification would last a lifetime. Philosophy should become relevant and useful for the people as a whole—this is a basic ideal of Herder’s philosophy.

Largely in the service of this ideal, Herder’s essay argues in favor of two sharp turns in philosophy, turns that would again remain fundamental throughout the rest of his career. The first turn consists in a rejection of traditional metaphysics, and closely follows an argument of Kant’s in Dreams of a Spirit Seer. Herder’s case is roughly this: (1) Traditional metaphysics, through undertaking to transcend experience (or strictly speaking, a little more broadly, “healthy understanding”, which includes, in addition to empirical knowledge, also ordinary morality, intuitive logic, and mathematics), succumbs to unresolvable contradictions between its claims, and hence to the Pyrrhonian skeptical problem of an equal plausibility on both sides that requires a suspension of judgment (“I am writing for Pyrrhonists”, Herder says [HPW 8]). Moreover (Herder goes on to add in the Fragments of 1767–8), given the truth of a broadly empiricist theory of concepts, much of the terminology of traditional metaphysics turns out to lack the basis in experience that is required in order even to be meaningful, and is consequently meaningless (the illusion of meaningfulness arising through the role of language, which spins on, creating illusions of meaning, even after the empirical conditions of meaning have been left behind). (2) Traditional metaphysics is not only, for these reasons, useless; it is also harmful, because it distracts its adherents from the matters that should be their focus: empirical nature and human society. (3) By contrast, empirical knowledge (or strictly speaking, a little more broadly, “healthy understanding”) is free of these problems. Philosophy should therefore be based on and continuous with this.

Herder’s second sharp turn concerns ethics. Here again he is indebted to the pre-critical Kant, but he also goes somewhat further beyond him. Herder’s basic claims are these: (1) Morality is fundamentally more a matter of sentiments than of cognitions. (2) Cognitivist theories of morality—of the sort espoused in this period by Rationalists such as Wolff, but also by many other philosophers before and since (for example, Plato, the critical Kant, and G.E. Moore)—are therefore based on a mistake, and so useless as means of moral enlightenment or improvement. (3) But (and here Herder’s theory moves beyond Kant’s), worse than that, they are actually harmful to morality, because they weaken the moral sentiments on which morality really rests. In This Too a Philosophy of History and On the Cognition and Sensation Herder suggests several reasons why: (a) Abstract theorizing weakens sentiments generally, and hence moral sentiments in particular (this is perhaps his least interesting reason). (b) The cognitivists’ theories turn out to be so strikingly implausible that they bring morality itself into disrepute, people reacting to them roughly along the lines of thinking, If this is the best that even the experts can say in explanation and justification of morality, then morality must certainly be a sham, and I may as well ignore it and do as I please. (c) Such theories distract people from recognizing, and working to reinforce, the real foundations of morality: not an imaginary theoretical insight of some sort, but a set of causal mechanisms that inculcate and sustain the moral sentiments. (4) More constructively, Herder accordingly turns instead to discovering theoretically and promoting in practice just such a set of causal mechanisms. In How Philosophy Can Become he mainly emphasizes forms of education and an emotive type of preaching in this connection. But elsewhere he identifies and promotes a much broader set of mechanisms as well, including: the influence of morally exemplary individuals; morally relevant laws; and literature (along with other forms of art). Literature is a special focus of Herder’s theory and practice here. He sees literature as exerting a moral influence in several ways—for instance, not only through fairly direct moral instruction, but also through the literary perpetuation (or creation) of morally exemplary individuals (e.g., Jesus in the New Testament), and through the exposure of readers to other people’s inner lives and a consequent enhancement of their sympathies for them (a motive that lies behind his epoch-making publication of the Popular Songs [Volkslieder] [1774/1778–9], a collection of translations of poems from peoples around the world). Herder’s development of this theory and practice of moral pedagogy was lifelong and tireless.

4. Philosophy of Language, Interpretation, and Translation

The Treatise On the Origin of Language from 1772 is Herder’s best known work in the philosophy of language by far. However, it is in certain respects both unrepresentative and inferior in comparison with other works, such as the Fragments and On the Cognition and Sensation, and should not monopolize attention.

The Treatise on the Origin is primarily concerned with the question whether the origin of language can be explained in purely natural, human terms or (as Süßmilch had recently argued) only in terms of a divine source. Herder argues in support of the former position and against the latter. His argument is quite persuasive (especially when supplemented on its positive side from the Fragments). But it should probably not constitute a modern philosopher’s main reason for interest in Herder’s views about language—deriving its zest, as it does, from a religious background that is, or ought to be, no longer ours.

Of far greater modern relevance are three interrelated theories that Herder develops: a philosophy of language concerning the very nature of language, thought, and meaning; a theory of interpretation; and a theory of translation. These theories are found scattered through a large number of Herder’s works. The following are their main features.

4.1 Philosophy of Language: Language, Thought, Meaning

Already in the mid-1760s—for example, in On Diligence in Several Learned Languages (1764) and the Fragments (1767–8)—Herder began advancing three fundamental theses in this area:

  1. Thought is essentially dependent on, and bounded in scope by, language—i.e., one can only think if one has a language, and one can only think what one can express linguistically. (This thesis is already prominent in On Diligence and in the Fragments. To his credit, Herder normally refrains from advancing a more extreme, but philosophically untenable, version of the thesis, favored by some of his successors, that simply identifies thought with language, or with inner language.)
  2. Meanings or concepts are—not the sorts of things, in principle autonomous of language, with which much of the philosophical tradition has equated them, e.g., the referents involved (Augustine), Platonic forms, or subjective mental ideas à la Locke or Hume, but instead—usages of words. (This thesis is already prominent in the Fragments. Herder also develops important arguments for it.)
  3. Conceptualization is intimately bound up with (perceptual and affective) sensation. More precisely, Herder develops a quasi-empiricist theory of concepts that holds that sensation is the source and basis of all our concepts, but that we are able to achieve non-empirical concepts by means of metaphorical extensions from the empirical ones—so that all of our concepts ultimately depend on sensation in one way or another. (For this thesis, see esp. Treatise on the Origin, On the Cognition and Sensation, and the Metacritique.)

The first two of these theses dramatically overturned the sort of dualistic picture of the relation between language, on the one hand, and thought/meaning, on the other, that had predominated during the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. They thereby essentially founded the philosophy of language as we still know it today.

Hamann has often been credited with introducing something like these two revolutionary theses and then passing them on to Herder (e.g., by Isaiah Berlin). But that is a mistake; Herder was already committed to them by the mid-1760s, Hamann only later and under Herder’s influence.

The third thesis, quasi-empiricism, would be far less widely accepted by philosophers of language today. However, it may well be correct too. Contrary to first appearances, it need not conflict with thesis (2), the equation of meanings with word-usages. And the most likely modern ground for skepticism about it, namely, a Fregean-Wittgensteinian anti-psychologism concerning meaning that is popular today, may well itself be mistaken.

In addition to making a fundamental contribution to the philosophy of language, these three theses also underpin Herder’s theories of interpretation and translation (as we are about to see).

4.2 Theory of Interpretation (Hermeneutics)

Herder’s theories of interpretation and translation both rest on a certain epoch-making insight of his: Whereas such eminent Enlightenment philosopher-historians as Hume and Voltaire had normally still held that, as Hume put it, “mankind are so much the same in all times and places that history informs us of nothing new or strange” (1748: section VIII, part I, 65), Herder discovered, or at least saw more clearly than anyone before him, that this was false, that peoples from different historical periods and cultures vary tremendously in their concepts, beliefs, values, (perceptual and affective) sensations, and so forth. He also recognized that similar, albeit usually less dramatic, variations occur even between individuals within a single period and culture. These positions are prominent in many of Herder’s works (see, e.g., On the Change of Taste [1766], This Too a Philosophy of History, and On the Cognition and Sensation). Let us call them together his principle of radical mental difference.

Given this principle, and the gulf that consequently often initially divides an interpreter’s own thought from that of the person whom he wants to interpret, interpretation is often an extremely difficult task, requiring extraordinary efforts on the part of the interpreter. (See in this connection, e.g., Herder’s discussion of interpreting ancient Hebrew in Treatise on the Origin.)

In particular, the interpreter often faces, and needs to resist, a temptation falsely to assimilate the thought that he is interpreting to someone else’s, especially his own. (This theme is prominent in This Too a Philosophy of History, for instance.)

How, given these challenges, is the interpreter supposed to achieve accurate interpretation? Herder’s answer comprises several points:

His three theses in the philosophy of language undergird his whole theory of interpretation and entail certain parts of the answer to the question just raised. It is an implication of his thesis that all thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language that an interpreted subject’s language is in a certain sense bound to be a reliable indicator of the nature of his thought, so that the interpreter at least need not worry that the interpreted subject might be entertaining ineffable thoughts or thoughts whose character is systematically distorted by his expression of them in language. It is an implication of Herder’s thesis that meaning consists in word-usage that interpretation essentially and fundamentally requires pinning down an interpreted subject’s word-usages, and thereby his meanings. Finally, it is an implication of Herder’s quasi-empiricist thesis concerning concepts that an interpreter’s understanding of an interpreted subject’s concepts must include some sort of recapturing of their basis in the interpreted subject’s sensations.

Herder also espouses three further important principles in interpretation-theory that contribute to answering the question raised above:

A principle of secularism in interpretation: Contrary to a practice that was still common in Herder’s day in relation to the Bible, the interpretation of texts must never rely on religious assumptions or means, even when the texts are sacred ones, but must instead rely only on secular ones. (This principle is already prominent in Herder’s writings on biblical interpretation from the 1760s.)

A principle of generic interpretation. In addition to the nature of a work’s meanings, interpretation must also identify the nature of its genre (i.e., roughly, a certain set of general purposes and rules that it aspires to realize and conform to). As in the case of meanings, genres vary from age to age, culture to culture, and even individual to individual, and the interpreter therefore faces, and needs to resist, constant temptations falsely to assimilate a work’s genre to others with which he happens to be more familiar (for example, Shakespearean “tragedy” to Sophoclean “tragedy”, or vice versa). (This principle is already prominent in the Critical Forests from 1769, but finds its classic statement in the essay Shakespeare from 1773.)

A principle of methodological empiricism in interpretation: Interpretation must always be based on, and kept faithful to, exact observations of relevant linguistic (and other) evidence. This applies when the interpreter investigates word-usages in order to discover meanings (a point that is already prominent in the Fragments); when he makes conjectures about an author’s psychology (see esp. On Thomas Abbt’s Writings [1768]); and when he attempts to pin down a work’s genre, or the purposes and rules that constitute it (see esp. Shakespeare).

So far, these principles will probably seem sensible enough. But beyond them, Herder also advances a further set of interpretive principles that are likely to sound much more touchy-feely at first hearing (the first of them rather literally so!). However, I want to suggest that they are in fact on the contrary quite hard-nosed.

Herder proposes (prominently in This Too a Philosophy of History, for instance) that the way to bridge radical mental difference when interpreting is through Einfühlung, “feeling one’s way in”. This proposal has often been thought (for example, by Friedrich Meinecke) to mean that the interpreter should perform some sort of psychological self-projection onto texts. However, that is not Herder’s main idea here—for making it so would amount to advocating just the sort of distorting assimilation of the thought in a text to one’s own that he is above all concerned to avoid. As can be seen from This Too a Philosophy of History, what he mainly has in mind is instead an arduous process of historical-philological inquiry. What, though, more specifically, is the cash value of his metaphor of Einfühlung? It has at least five components, which are quite various in nature and all quite sensible and deep: (1) First of all, the metaphor implies (once again) that the interpreter typically faces a radical difference, a gulf, between his own mentality and that of the interpreted subject, making interpretation a difficult, laborious task (it implies that there is an “in” there that the interpreter must carefully and laboriously “feel his way into”). (2) The metaphor also implies more specifically (This Too a Philosophy of History shows) that the “feeling one’s way in” should include thorough research not only into a text’s use of language but also into its whole geographical, historical, and social context. (3) It also implies a claim—based on Herder’s quasi-empiricist theory of concepts—that in order to understand an interpreted subject’s language the interpreter must achieve an imaginative reproduction of his (perceptual and affective) sensations. (4) It also implies (This Too a Philosophy of History again shows) that hostility in an interpreter toward the people whom he interprets will generally distort his interpretation, and should therefore be avoided. (Herder is equally opposed to excessive identification with them for the same reason.) (5) Finally, it also implies that the interpreter should strive to develop his grasp of linguistic usage, contextual facts, and relevant sensations to the point where it achieves something like the same immediacy and automaticness that it had for a text’s original author and audience when they understood the text in light of such factors (so that it acquires for him, as it had for them, the phenomenology more of a feeling than a cognition).

In addition, Herder insists (for example, in the Critical Forests) on a principle of holism in interpretation. This principle rests on several motives, including the following: (1) Parts of a text taken in isolation are typically ambiguous in various ways (in relation to background linguistic possibilities). In order to resolve such ambiguities, an interpreter needs the guidance provided by surrounding text. (2) That problem arises once a range of possible linguistic meanings is established for a piece of text. But in the case of a text that is separated from the interpreter by radical mental difference, knowledge of such a range itself presents a problem. How is he to pin down the range of possible meanings, i.e., possible usages, for a word? This requires a collation of the word’s actual uses and an inference from these to the rules that govern them, i.e., to their usages, a collation that in turn requires looking to remoter contexts in which the same word occurs (other parts of the text, other works in the author’s corpus, works by his contemporaries, etc.), or in short: holism. (3) Authors typically write a work as a whole, conveying ideas not only in its particular parts but also through the way in which these fit together to make up a whole. Consequently, readings that fail to interpret the work as a whole will miss essential aspects of its meaning—both the ideas in question themselves and meanings of the particular parts on which they shed important light.

In On Thomas Abbt’s Writings, On the Cognition and Sensation, and elsewhere Herder makes one of his most important innovations: interpretation must supplement its focus on word-usage with attention to the author’s psychology. Herder implies various reasons for this (several of which would subsequently be elaborated more explicitly by successors such as Schleiermacher and Friedrich Schlegel): (1) As was already mentioned, he embraces a quasi-empiricist theory of concepts that entails that in order to understand an author’s concepts an interpreter must imaginatively recapture the author’s relevant sensations. (2) As Quentin Skinner has recently emphasized, understanding the linguistic meaning of an utterance or text is only a necessary, not a sufficient, condition for understanding it tout court; in addition, one needs to establish the author’s illocutionary intentions. For example, I meet a stranger by a frozen lake who tells me, “The ice is thin over there”; I understand his linguistic meaning perfectly; but is he simply informing me?, warning me?, threatening me?, joking? … (3) Skinner tends to imply that one can determine linguistic meanings prior to establishing authorial intentions. That may sometimes be so (e.g., in the example just given). But is it generally? Herder implies not. And this seems right, because the linguistic meaning of a formula is often ambiguous (in terms of the background linguistic possibilities), and in order to identify the relevant meaning one must turn, not only (as was already mentioned) to larger bodies of text, but also to hypotheses, largely derived from them, concerning the author’s intentions (e.g., concerning the subject-matter that he intends to treat). This is a further reason why interpreters need to invoke psychology. (4) As was already mentioned, Herder implies that an author often conveys ideas in his work, not explicitly in its parts, but rather via these and the way in which they are put together to form a textual whole. It is necessary for the interpreter to capture these ideas, both for their own sake and because doing so is often essential for resolving ambiguities at the level of the parts. (5) Herder also refers to the second half of his doctrine of radical mental difference—individual variations in mode of thought even within a single period and culture—as a source of the need for psychological interpretation. Why does any special need arise here? Part of the answer seems to be that when an interpreter is dealing with a concept that is distinctive of a particular author rather than common to a whole period/culture, he typically faces a problem of relative paucity and lack of contextual variety in the actual uses of the word that are available as empirical evidence from which to infer the rule for use, or usage, constitutive of its meaning. Hence he needs extra help—and the author’s general psychology may provide this.

In On Thomas Abbt’s Writings, On the Cognition and Sensation, and elsewhere Herder also indicates that interpretation, especially in its psychological aspect, requires the interpreter to use “divination”. This is another principle that is liable to sound disturbingly touchy-feely at first hearing—in particular, it can sound as though Herder means some sort of prophetic process that has a religious basis and is perhaps even infallible. However, what he really has in mind here is instead, far more sensibly, a process of hypothesis, based on the meager empirical evidence that is available, but also going well beyond it, and therefore vulnerable to subsequent falsification, and abandonment or revision if falsified.

Finally, Herder also implies an additional important point concerning the general nature of interpretation:

After Herder, the question was explicitly raised whether interpretation is a science or an art. Herder does not himself explicitly raise or address this question. But his strong inclination would clearly be to say that interpretation is like rather than unlike natural science. He has several reasons for thinking so: (1) He assumes (as indeed did virtually everyone at this period) that the meaning of an author’s text is as much an objective matter as the subjects investigated by the natural scientist. (2) The difficulty of interpretation that results from radical mental difference, and the consequent need for a methodologically sophisticated and painstaking approach to interpretation in many cases, make for further points of similarity between interpretation and natural science. (3) The essential role of “divination”, qua hypothesis, in interpretation constitutes yet a further point of similarity between interpretation and natural science. Moreover, (4) even the subject-matter of interpretation is not, in Herder’s view, sharply different from that dealt with by natural science: the latter investigates observable physical processes in nature in order to determine the forces that underlie and produce them, but, similarly, interpretation investigates observable human verbal (and non-verbal) physical behavior in order to determine the forces that underlie and produce it (Herder explicitly identifying mental conditions, such as conceptual understanding, as “forces”).

Herder’s theory of interpretation had an enormous and beneficial impact on subsequent hermeneutics. His theory was taken over almost in its entirety by Schleiermacher in his much more famous lectures on hermeneutics, delivered during the first third of the nineteenth century. In particular, such fundamental and famous positions in Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics as his supplementing of “linguistic” with “psychological” interpretation and his identification of “divination” as the main method of the latter are due entirely to Herder. Moreover, where Herder and Schleiermacher do occasionally disagree concerning interpretation, Herder’s position almost always turns out to be philosophically superior on inspection.

By decisively influencing Schleiermacher’s hermeneutic theory Herder also exercised an indirect decisive influence on that of Schleiermacher’s great pupil August Boeckh, whose Encyclopedia and Methodology of the Philological Sciences (posthumously published in 1877) essentially reproduced Schleiermacher’s theory with only modest elaborations, and became the standard methodological work for classical scholars and others. Moreover, Boeckh’s one significant departure from Schleiermacher’s theory, namely, his addition of generic interpretation to the aspects of interpretation that Schleiermacher had already distinguished, in effect simply reincorporated the strong emphasis that Herder had already placed on this.

4.3 Theory of Translation

Herder already in the Fragments of 1767–8 developed an important new theory of translation that subsequently went on to have an enormous and beneficial impact on both the theory and the practice of translation in Germany. The following are some of its key theses:

Translation (like interpretation) faces a deep challenge due to the phenomenon of radical mental difference. It especially does so because of the deep differences in concepts that occur between different historical periods and cultures, and even to some extent between individuals within a single period and culture.

As a result, translation is in many cases an extremely difficult undertaking.

Again as a result, translation commonly confronts a choice between two possible approaches: what Herder calls a “lax” approach (i.e., one in which the language and thought of the target text are allowed to diverge rather freely from those of the source text) and an “accommodating” approach (i.e., one in which they are made to conform closely to those of the source text).

Herder rejects the former approach. He does so largely because it fails to achieve the most widely accepted and fundamental goal of translation: semantic faithfulness.

He in particular rejects a certain rationale for it that Dryden and others had advocated, namely, that a translation should provide the work that the author would have written had his native language not been the one he actually had but instead the target language. Herder objects to this that in cases such as that of translating Homer, for example, the author could not have written his work in the modern target language.

So Herder urges that the translator should instead err in the other direction, toward “accommodating”.

But how is this to be achieved?

One essential means to achieving it that Herder identifies is that the translator must have interpretive expertise. So Herder requires this.

Another, much less obvious, means is a certain vitally important technique that Herder develops for overcoming conceptual discrepancies between the source language and the target language. That might seem simply impossible (indeed, some more recent philosophers, such as Donald Davidson, have mistakenly assumed that it would be). But Herder, drawing on his novel philosophy of language, finds a solution: Since meanings or concepts are word-usages, in order to reproduce (or at least optimally approximate) in the target language a concept from the source language that the target language currently lacks, the translator should take the closest corresponding word from the target language and “bend” its usage for the course of the translation in such a way as to make it mimic the usage of the source word. This technique essentially requires that the source word be translated uniformly across its multiple occurrences in a work (and also that the single target word chosen not be used to translate any other source words). Such an approach is far from being common in translation practice, so far indeed that it is rarely found in translations. However, Herder scrupulously uses it in his own translations, as does an important subsequent tradition that has followed him in adopting it (including Schleiermacher, Franz Rosenzweig, and Martin Buber).

Herder is well aware that using this “bending” approach will inevitably make for translations that are more difficult to read than those that can be produced by a more “lax” method (e.g., by using multiple words in the target language to translate a single word in the source language). However, he considers this price well worth paying in order to achieve maximal semantic accuracy.

Another key means that Herder adopts is to complement the goal of semantic faithfulness with that of faithfulness to the musical form of a literary work (e.g., meter, rhyme, alliteration, and assonance). As might be expected, his motives for doing this are partly extra-semantic: in particular, aesthetic fidelity, and fidelity to the exact expression of feelings that is effected by means of a literary work’s musical features. But they are also in part semantic: in his view, musical form and semantic content are strictly inseparable, so that fully realizing even the goal of semantic faithfulness in fact requires that a translation also be faithful to the work’s musical form. Why does he believe that musical form and semantic content are inseparable in this way? He has two main reasons: First, musical forms often carry their own meanings (think, for example, of the humorous and bawdy connotations of the meter/rhyme-scheme of a limerick). Second, as was recently mentioned, Herder believes that musical form is essential to an exact expression of feelings; but, as we saw earlier, he also thinks that feelings are internal to meanings (this is part of the force of his quasi-empiricism in the philosophy of language); so reproducing a work’s musical form in translation turns out to be essential even for accurately conveying the meanings of its words and sentences in translation.

In addition to being necessary in order to achieve translation’s traditional fundamental goal of exactly reproducing meaning (as well as aesthetic fidelity and fidelity in the expression of feelings) as fully as possible, the more “accommodating” sort of translation that has been described is also necessary, in Herder’s view, in order to achieve certain further important goals. One of these lies in a potential that translation has for enriching the target language (both conceptually and in musical forms). Herder argues convincingly that whereas “lax” translation forgoes this opportunity, “accommodating” translation capitalizes on it.

Another of these further goals lies in both expressing and cultivating in a translation’s readers a cosmopolitan respect for the Other—something that requires that the translation reproduce the Other’s meanings and musical forms as accurately as possible.

Herder holds that the preferred “accommodating” sort of translation demands that the translator be in a sense a “creative genius”, i.e., skilled and creative enough to satisfy the heavy demands that this sort of translation imposes on him, in particular, skilled and creative enough to invent the new conceptual and musical forms in the target language that it requires.

Despite his commitment to the central importance of this sort of translation (largely, as we have seen, due to its necessity for achieving translation’s traditional fundamental goal of faithfully reproducing meaning), Herder is also in the end quite liberal about the forms that translation—or interlinguistic transfer more generally, including, for example, what he sometimes distinguishes from “translation [Übersetzung]” proper as “imitation [Nachbildung]” or “rejuvenation [Verjüngung]”—can legitimately take. He allows that its possible forms are quite various, and that which one is most appropriate in a particular case will largely depend on the author or genre in question and on the translator’s (or transferer’s) purposes.

Herder’s theory of translation (as just summarized), together with his demonstration of its viability in practice, for example, in his sample translations of Shakespeare in the Popular Songs, had an enormous and beneficial impact on a whole generation of German translation theorists and practitioners—including Johann Heinrich Voss (the great translator of Homer), August Wilhelm Schlegel (an important translation theorist and the great translator of Shakespeare), Goethe (a significant theorist of translation), Wilhelm von Humboldt (a significant theorist of translation and translator), and Schleiermacher (an important theorist of translation and Germany’s great translator of the Platonic dialogues). Herder’s principle of complementing semantic faithfulness with faithfulness in the reproduction of musical form had an especially powerful impact on these successors. His principle of “bending” word-usages in order to cope with conceptual incommensurabilities was less widely followed, but was adopted by Schleiermacher among others.

Herder’s philosophy of language, interpretation, and translation owes significant debts to predecessors—for example, his philosophy of language to Leibniz, Christian Wolff, Spinoza, and Ernesti, his theory of interpretation again to Spinoza and Ernesti, and his theory of translation to Thomas Abbt. However, even his borrowings incorporate important refinements, and his overall contribution was enormous.

5. Role in the Birth of Linguistics and Anthropology

Herder’s philosophy of language and interpretation, together with several further philosophical principles that he developed, made a vitally important contribution to the birth of two whole new academic disciplines that did not yet exist in his day but which we today take for granted: linguistics and cultural anthropology. (For further details, see Section 1 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

6. Philosophy of Mind

In On the Cognition and Sensation from 1778 and elsewhere Herder develops a very interesting and influential position in the philosophy of mind. The following are some of its central features.

Concerning the fundamental mind-body problem, Herder tried out various positions over the course of his career, but the considered position at which he arrived was uncompromisingly naturalistic and anti-dualistic.

In On the Cognition and Sensation he tries to erase the traditional sharp division between the mental and the physical in two specific ways: First, he advances a theory that minds and mental conditions consist in forces [Kräfte] that manifest themselves in people’s bodily behavior—just as physical nature involves forces that manifest themselves in the behavior of bodies. He officially remains agnostic on the question of what force is, except for conceiving it as something apt to produce a type of bodily behavior, and as a real source thereof (not merely something reducible thereto). This, strictly speaking, absolves his theory of certain common accusations (for example, H.B. Nisbet and Frederick Beiser’s accusation that it is “vitalist”). But it also leaves it with enough content to have great virtues over rival theories: (1) The theory ties types of mental states conceptually to corresponding types of bodily behavior—which seems correct, and which therefore marks a point of superiority over both dualistic theories and mind-brain identity theories. (2) On the other hand, the theory avoids reducing mental states to bodily behavior—which again seems correct, given such obvious facts as that we can be, and indeed often are, in token mental states that happen to receive no behavioral manifestation at all, and which hence constitutes a point of superiority over behaviorist theories. (3) Moreover, Herder’s official agnosticism about what (mental) force is can be seen as showing recognition of the important conceptual fact (recently exploited by functionalists in their “multiple realizability argument”) that although the concepts of mind and mental conditions imply a real source of a type of behavior, they do not imply anything about the nature of that source’s constitution.

Second, Herder also tries to explain the mind in terms of the phenomenon of irritation [Reiz], a phenomenon that had recently been identified by the physiologist Albrecht von Haller, and which is paradigmatically exemplified by muscle fibers contracting in response to direct physical stimuli and relaxing upon their removal—in other words, a phenomenon which, while basically physiological, also exhibits a transition to mental characteristics. There is an ambiguity in Herder’s position here: Usually, he wants to resist physicalist reductionism, and so would be reluctant to say that irritation is purely physiological and fully constitutes mental states. However, in the 1775 draft of On the Cognition and Sensation, and even in parts of the published version, that is his position. And from a modern standpoint, this is arguably a further virtue of his account (though, of course, we would today want to recast it in terms of different, and much more complex, physiological processes than irritation).

This second line of thought might seem at odds with the first one (forces). But it need not be. For, given Herder’s official agnosticism about what forces are, this second line of thought could, so to speak, fill in the “black box” of the hypothesized real forces, namely in physicalist terms. In other words, it turns out (not indeed as a conceptual matter, but as a contingent one) that the real forces in question consist in physiological processes.

Herder’s philosophy of mind also advances another important thesis: that the mind is a unity, that there is no sharp division between its faculties. This thesis contradicted theorists such as Sulzer and Kant. However, it was not in itself new with Herder, having already been espoused by the Rationalists, especially Wolff (Herder’s introduction to his 1775 draft shows that he is fully aware of this debt). Where Herder is more original is in rejecting the Rationalists’ reduction of sensation and volition to cognition; establishing the unity thesis in an empirical rather than an apriorist way; and adding a normative dimension to it—this is not only how the mind is but also how it ought to be. This last feature might sound incoherent at first hearing, since if the mind is this way by its very nature, what sense can there be in prescribing to people that it should be so rather than otherwise? However, Herder’s idea here is rather the quite coherent one that, while the mind is indeed this way by its very nature, people sometimes behave as though one faculty could be abstracted from another, and try to effect such an abstraction, but this then leads to various malfunctions, and should therefore be avoided.

Herder’s overall thesis of the mind’s unity rests on four more specific doctrines concerning intimate mutual involvements between mental faculties, and malfunctions that arise from resisting them, doctrines that are in large part empirically grounded and hence lend the overall thesis a sort of empirical basis as well:

A first doctrine concerns the relation between thought and language: Not only does language of its very nature express thought (an uncontroversial point), but also (as we noted earlier) for Herder thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language. Herder largely bases this further claim on empirical grounds (for example, concerning how children’s thought develops in step with language acquisition). The normative aspect of his position here is that attempts (in the manner of some metaphysics, for example) to cut thought free from the constraints of language lead to nonsense.

A second area of intimate mutual involvement concerns cognition and volition, or affects. The claim that volition is and should be based on cognition is not particularly controversial. But Herder also argues the converse, that all cognition is and should be based on volition, on affects—and indeed, not only on such relatively anemic affects as the impulse to know the truth, but also on much less anemic ones. He is especially concerned to combat the idea that theoretical work in philosophy or the sciences is or should be detached from volition, from affects. In his view, it never really is even when it purports to be, and attempts to make it so merely impoverish and weaken it. His grounds for this whole position are again mainly empirical in nature.

A third area of intimate mutual involvement concerns thought and sensation. Conceptualization and belief, on the one hand, and sensation, on the other, are intimately connected according to Herder. Thus, he advances the quasi-empiricist theory of concepts that was mentioned earlier, which entails that all of our concepts (and hence also all of our beliefs) ultimately depend in one way or another on sensation. But conversely, he also argues (anticipating much important twentieth-century work in philosophy) that there is a dependence in the other direction: that the character of an adult human being’s sensations depends on his concepts and beliefs. Normatively, he sees attempts to violate this interdependence as inevitably leading to intellectual malfunction—for example, as has already been mentioned, he thinks that metaphysicians’ attempts to cut entirely free from the empirical origin of our concepts lead to meaninglessness. His grounds for this whole position are again largely empirical in character.

A fourth area of intimate mutual involvement concerns unity among the faculties of sensation themselves. For one thing, Herder implies that our underlying animal nature involves a sort of primordial fusion of perceptual with affective sensations (albeit that, unlike other animals, we also have a distinctive ability to suspend this fusion, an ability that he calls Besonnenheit). For another thing, he argues that the several faculties of perceptual sensation themselves form a sort of unity. His grounds for these two positions are again mainly empirical in character. In particular, he says that the unity of the several faculties of perceptual sensation is shown by clues that emerge in unusual situations and in pathological cases. Accordingly, he argues, for example, that the dependence of the mature sense of sight on the sense of touch is shown both by the way in which the sense of sight develops in young children and by the way in which it develops after medical operations on previously blind people such as Cheselden’s blind man.

In a further seminal move in the philosophy of mind Herder argues that linguistic meaning is fundamentally social—so that thought and other aspects of human mental life (since they are essentially articulated in terms of meanings), and therefore even the very self (since the self is essentially dependent on thought and other aspects of human mental life, and moreover defined in its specific identity by theirs), are so too. Herder’s version of this position seems intended only as an empirically based causal claim. It has since fathered a long tradition of attempts to generate more ambitious cases for stronger versions of the claim that meaning—and hence also thought etc. and the very self—is at bottom socially constituted (for example, in Hegel, Wittgenstein, Kripke, Burge, and Brandom). However, it may well be that these more ambitious cases and versions do not work, and that Herder’s original version is exactly what should be accepted.

Herder also, in tension though not contradiction with this principle of sociality, holds that (even within a single period and culture) human minds are as a rule deeply individual, deeply different from each other—so that in addition to a generalizing psychology there is also a need for a psychology oriented to individuality. This is an important idea that has strongly influenced many subsequent continental thinkers (for example, Schleiermacher, Nietzsche, Proust, Sartre, and Manfred Frank). Herder himself advances it only as an empirical rule of thumb. By contrast, a prominent strand in Schleiermacher and Frank purports to establish it as an a priori universal truth. However, Herder’s original version is again arguably the more plausible one.

Finally, like predecessors in the Rationalist tradition and Kant, Herder sharply rejects the Cartesian idea of the mind’s self-transparency—instead insisting that much of what occurs in the mind is unconscious, so that self-knowledge is often deeply problematic. This is another compelling position that has had a strong influence on subsequent thinkers.

This whole Herderian philosophy of mind owes much to predecessors, especially ones in the Rationalist tradition. But it is also in many ways original. The theory is important in its own right. And it exercised an enormous influence on Herder’s successors, including Hegel, Schleiermacher, and Nietzsche.

7. Aesthetics

Unlike his teacher Kant, who had little interest in or knowledge of literature or art, and whose treatment of them in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) is correspondingly weak, Herder had a passionate interest in and a deep knowledge of them, and as a result was able to develop a rich set of original and important ideas about them. In this respect he set a valuable precedent that would be followed in the next generation by the Romantics (especially Friedrich and August Wilhelm Schlegel) and Hegel.

Herder also anticipated and influenced the Romantics in another important way. One of the most striking and distinctive positions of the Romantics was a certain valorization of literature and art over other areas of culture (such as science, religion, and morality). But Herder had already developed such a position before them. First, from an early period he argued that song was the origin of all language (and consequently also of all thought). Second, in works such as the Treatise on the Origin and especially the essay On Image, Poetry, and Fable (1787) he argued that all language (and consequently also all thought) is fundamentally figurative or metaphorical in nature—for example, that its grammar typically projects the two genders onto the whole of nature, and that it pervasively involves a set of creative transitions from an object to a sensory stimulus to an individualistically formed image and thence to thought and language—and is thus poetic. Third, in works such as his Attempt at a History of Lyric Poetry (1764) and On the Spirit of Hebrew Poetry he also argued that poetry has been fundamental to religion from the beginning. And elsewhere he argued that non-linguistic art, especially sculpture, has played an important role in religion from an early period as well. Fourth, he also argued that poetry has a very important function in moral education, indeed one even more important than that of other mechanisms of moral education such as laws.

Besides the aforementioned, what are Herder’s most important contributions to aesthetics? He is skeptical about the sort of aprioristic and systematic aesthetics that the inventor of the discipline of aesthetics, the Rationalist philosopher Baumgarten, had recently developed. Instead, he calls for a bottom-up, or empirical, approach to the discipline. And his considered position concerning the ideal of an aesthetic system is dismissive as well. It is true that he began his career aspiring to something of the kind and that in the Critical Forests (1769) he accordingly set out to argue for the following little aesthetic system: whereas music is a mere succession of objects in time, and sculpture and painting are merely spatial, poetry has a sense, a soul, a force; whereas music, sculpture, and painting belong solely to the senses (namely, to hearing, feeling, and vision, respectively), poetry not only depends on the senses but also relates to the imagination; whereas music, sculpture, and painting employ only natural signs, poetry uses voluntary and conventional signs. It is also true that this system was later taken over (with only minor modifications) by Schleiermacher in his aesthetics lectures, and that it has sometimes been touted as Herder’s main achievement in aesthetics more recently (for example, by Robert Norton). But as Herder himself quickly came to realize after formulating it, it is a naive system. And his real achievements in aesthetics are other than and contrary to it.

Let us turn to those real achievements, then. One of them concerns the relation between art and language. As we saw earlier, Herder’s philosophy of language is committed to the two doctrines that thought is essentially dependent on and bounded by language, and that meaning is word-usage. This prompts certain questions. These doctrines make a plausible break with a common Enlightenment assumption that thought and meaning are in principle autonomous of whatever material, perceptible expressions they may happen to receive. Following Charles Taylor, we might call such a move one to “expressivism”. But what form should expressivism take exactly? Is the dependence of thought and meaning on external symbols strictly one on language (in the usual sense of “language”)? Or is it rather a dependence on a broader range of symbolic media including, besides language, also such things as painting, sculpture, and music—so that a person might be able to entertain thoughts that he was not able to express in language but only in some other symbolic medium? Let us call the former position narrow expressivism and the latter broad expressivism.

Hamann in his Metacritique espoused a version of broad expressivism. But, as his first two doctrines in the philosophy of language already seem to imply, Herder adopted narrow expressivism. Moreover, after much wrestling with the subject, he eventually developed a very compelling version of narrow expressivism. The key work here is again the Critical Forests. By the time of writing this work, Herder was already committed to the two doctrines in question, and, as this would suggest, from the start in the work he is committed to narrow expressivism. However, his commitment to it there is initially unsatisfactory and even inconsistent. For one thing, it initially takes the implausible form of denying to the non-linguistic arts any capacity to express thoughts autonomously of language by denying that they can express thoughts at all. This is the force of the naive theory recently described that the work at first set out to develop. Adding inconsistency to this unsatisfactoriness, Herder is from the start in the work also committed to saying (far more plausibly) that visual art often does express thoughts—for example, he intervenes in a quarrel between Lessing and Winckelmann on the question of whether linguistic art (especially poetry) or visual art (especially sculpture) is expressively superior in ways that tend to support Winckelmann’s case for visual art. This unsatisfactoriness and inconsistency mainly result from Herder’s oversight of a single fact: that it is perfectly possible to reconcile narrow expressivism with the attribution of thoughts to non-linguistic art, namely, by insisting that the thoughts expressed by non-linguistic art must be derivative from and bounded by the artist’s capacity for linguistic expression. However, by the time Herder writes the later parts of the Critical Forests, he has found this solution. Thus in the third part, focusing on a particularly instructive example, he notes that the pictorial representations on Greek coins are typically allegorical in nature. And by the time he writes the fourth part he is prepared to say something similar about much painting as well, speaking there, for example, of “the sense, the allegory, the story/history that is put into the whole of a painting” (G2:313). By 1778 he extends this account to sculpture as well. Thus in the essay Sculpture [Plastik] from 1778 he abandons the merely sensualistic conception of sculpture that had predominated in the Critical Forests and instead argues that sculpture is essentially expressive of, and therefore needs to be interpreted by, a soul. But this no longer forces him to be unfaithful to his principle that thought is essentially dependent on, and bounded by, language, for he now conceives the thoughts that are expressed by sculpture as having a linguistic source:

The sculptor stands in the dark of night and gropes toward the forms of gods. The stories of the poets are before and in him. (G4:317)

Subsequently, in the Theological Letters (1780–1) and the Letters for the Advancement, Herder extends the same solution to instrumental music as well.

The considered position at which Herder eventually arrived also implies that “non-linguistic” art is dependent on thought and language in another way: In the fourth part of the Critical Forests (which was only published posthumously in the nineteenth century) he develops the point that human perception is of its nature infused with concepts and beliefs, and consequently with language—which of course implies that the same is true of the perception of “non-linguistic” artworks in particular. So “non-linguistic” art is really doubly dependent on thought and language: not only for the thoughts that it expresses but also for those that it presupposes in perception.

With Herder’s achievement of this refined form of narrow expressivism and Hamann’s articulation of his broad expressivism, there were now two plausible but competing theories available. Nineteenth- and twentieth-century German theorists (e.g., Hegel, Schleiermacher, Dilthey, and Gadamer) would subsequently be deeply torn between them. And the issue remains an important one today. While the philosophical considerations involved are difficult, I believe, and have argued elsewhere, that Herder’s position is the correct one.

Herder’s position here also carries important implications for hermeneutics. Since, in his considered view, thought/meaning and language play important roles not only in literature but also in “non-linguistic” art, for him both cases present similar interpretive challenges, requiring similar interpretive solutions.

Another of Herder’s most important contributions to aesthetics lies in his historicism, or, a bit more broadly, his recognition that there are radical mental differences between historical periods, cultures, and even individuals. In connection with literature and art this position takes five main specific forms.

First, as we have already seen, Herder holds that concepts, beliefs, values, and so on vary deeply between historical periods, cultures, and even individuals. This obviously applies to literature in particular. Moreover, since, as we have just seen, for Herder seemingly non-linguistic arts such as painting, sculpture, and music likewise presuppose and express concepts, beliefs, and values, it also applies to them.

Second, Herder holds that genre—i.e., roughly, a certain set of purposes and rules—is an essential aspect of any work of literature or art. But he also holds that genres differ in deep ways between historical periods (as well as between cultures and even individuals), and this not only in the sense that new genres emerge and old ones die, but also in the sense that seeming continuities in genre typically in fact mask important differences. For example, in the essay Shakespeare (1773) he argues in detail that the genres of ancient Greek “tragedy” and Shakespearean “tragedy”, which interpreters have often assumed to be the same, are in fact deeply different from each other, constituted by different purposes and rules. Similarly, in This Too a Philosophy of History (1774), he argues, against Winckelmann, who had tended to assimilate the genres of ancient Greek portrait sculpture and Pharaonic Egyptian portrait sculpture, that whereas the former was dominated by the genre-purpose of portraying this-worldly life, charm, and beauty, the latter had the quite contrary genre-purpose of conveying ideas of death and eternity.

Third, Herder argues that literature began predominantly sensuous in character but then became increasingly intellectual as history proceeded. In the early essays On the Ode (1764/5) and Attempt at a History of Lyric Poetry he explains this development in terms of a diminution of strong feelings (e.g., fear) and an increase in mental complexity and science, and he regards it as a sort of decline. Later on, in the Letters for the Advancement, he retains the descriptive part of this account, but revises its conception that a decline is involved: the more sensuous poetry of the ancients and the more intellectualized poetry of the moderns are two different but equally legitimate types of poetry.

Fourth, Herder holds that aesthetic values such as beauty are ultimately a matter of feelings and that the feelings in question vary in important ways between one period, culture, or even individual and another. This theme is already prominent in On the Ode, where he discusses major differences in the feelings of beauty that occur between different periods/cultures—for example, between his own age and the age of the ancient Greeks. It is also prominent in On the Change of Taste (1766), where he adds that the changes involved are indeed sometimes extreme enough to amount to an outright inversion.

Fifth, Herder holds that it is an essential part of the function of literature and art to communicate moral values, but he also observes that the moral values communicated often differ in deep ways from one period, culture, or individual to another. For example, in Attempt at a History of Lyric Poetry he argues (very insightfully) that early Greek poetry, especially Homer, communicates a very different set of moral values than ours.

These historicist insights concerning literature and art are extremely important in their own right. In addition, both for Herder and in fact, they carry deep implications for the interpretation and the critical evaluation of literature and art. Let us reconsider the first two of them in this connection.

The first insight concerns radical differences in concepts, beliefs, values, and so on. Since literature paradigmatically expresses such things and is linguistic, Herder’s general hermeneutic principles for interpreting linguistic texts and discourse in the face of radical mental difference (as already discussed) of course apply to literature in particular. Accordingly, in the Critical Forests he emphasizes that it is important to penetrate Homer’s alien linguistic and conceptual world by using careful philological means; that it is always necessary to interpret the local features within a work, for example, “ridiculous” passages, such as the Thersites passage, in the Iliad (II: 211–277), in light of the economy of the whole work; and (this time in connection with the example of interpreting the odes of Horace) that the solution to the problem of achieving such holism despite the need to interpret the parts of a text sequentially lies in working through the text in sequence in order to arrive at a provisional interpretation of all its parts together, then applying this provisional interpretation of the whole text in order to refine the interpretation of each part, and so on indefinitely.

But since Herder also holds that such seemingly non-linguistic forms of art as painting, sculpture, and music likewise presuppose and express concepts, beliefs, values, and so on that are ultimately grounded in language, he believes that the same general hermeneutic principles for interpreting linguistic works in the face of radical mental difference also make an essential contribution to the interpretation of this sort of art.

Moreover, since understanding what a piece of literature or art presupposes or expresses is obviously a prerequisite for evaluating it properly, this sort of hermeneutic approach is not only essential for interpreting it but also for evaluating it.

Our second example concerns genre. Herder believes, plausibly, that a work of art is always written or made in order to exemplify a certain genre, and that it is vitally important for the interpreter to identify its genre in order to understand it.

Why does he believe that identifying genre is essential for understanding? He has at least three reasons (all of them good ones): First, grasping a work’s genre is itself an essential constituent of understanding the work and its contents (much as grasping a sentence’s illocutionary force is an essential constituent of understanding the sentence and its contents). Second, since an author intends his work to exemplify a certain genre, there will normally be aspects of the work’s meaning that are expressed, not explicitly in any of its parts, but rather through its intended exemplification of the genre. Third, correctly identifying the genre is also vitally important for accurately interpreting things that are expressed explicitly in the parts of a work.

However, as we noted, Herder introduces an important historicist insight about genre here: he recognizes that even when different historical periods, cultures, or individuals appear to share a single genre—for example, ancient Greek “tragedy” and Shakespearean “tragedy”, or Pharaonic Egyptian “portrait sculpture” and ancient Greek “portrait sculpture”—this appearance usually in fact masks important differences.

This has important consequences for interpretation. For example, it leads Herder to an emphatic rejection of apriorism as an approach to identifying a work’s genre—certainly the absolute apriorism of refusing in one’s definition of the genre to be guided by an observation of examples at all, but also the more tempting relative apriorism of indeed allowing oneself to be guided by the observation of examples though restricting these to a limited number of cases and excluding others to which the resulting genre-conception is then to be applied in interpretation. For in light of the historicist insight just mentioned even the latter procedure will usually turn out to be disastrous, in Herder’s view.

Instead, according to Herder, the interpreter should approach the task of identifying the genre that is involved in a work in a thorough and scrupulous empirical manner. As one might expect, this above all requires examining the work itself closely in order to discover which genre-purposes and -rules are operative within it. But it also requires taking into account the whole social context within which the work was produced and the historical genesis of its genre through antecedent genres. In addition, it may sometimes include taking into account an author’s or artist’s explicit statements about the genre that he is using.

Moreover, Herder also emphasizes that identifying the genre of a work correctly by these means is vitally important not only for interpreting the work correctly, but also for critically evaluating it correctly: French critics not only make an interpretive mistake when they go to Shakespeare with a genre in mind from the ancient world that was not in fact his, but they also, on this basis, make an evaluative mistake: because they falsely assume that he somehow must be aspiring to realize the genre-purpose and -rules that Aristotle found in ancient tragedy, they fault him for failing to realize these, while at the same time they overlook the quite different genre-purpose and -rules that he really does aspire to realize and his success in realizing these. Similarly, Winckelmann not only makes an interpretive mistake when he implicitly imputes to the Egyptians a Greek genre-conception for sculpture that was not theirs, but also, on this basis, makes an evaluative one: because he falsely assumes that the Egyptians somehow must be aspiring to realize the Greek genre-purpose and -rules, he faults them for failing to realize these, and at the same time he overlooks their success in realizing the very different genre-purpose and -rules that they really do aspire to realize.

Herder’s new historicist approach to interpreting and evaluating literature and art led to enormous progress in the actual interpretation and critical evaluation of both. For example, it enabled the Schlegel brothers to achieve a much deeper understanding of tragedy than had been achieved before, and it enabled Friedrich Schlegel to develop a new, highly sophisticated form of art history (especially in his work on paintings in the Louvre and on cathedral architecture), thereby preparing the way for nineteenth- and twentieth-century scholarship on tragedy and art history.

Herder also has important ideas concerning a topic that is often thought to be central to aesthetics: beauty. A first important idea he develops here (both in relation to art and more generally) is that standards of beauty vary greatly from one historical period or culture to another. At least, this is his normal position, from early works such as On the Ode and On the Change of Taste to late ones such as the Calligone (where he invokes it against Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment). Occasionally—for example, in the Critical Forests and even at points in the Calligone—he instead argues (as other thinkers, such as Hume, had done before him) that there is a deeper unity in standards of beauty across historical periods and cultures. However, the former position is his more considered one and is the more plausible one.

A second important idea, which he already develops in the Critical Forests (and then repeats later in the Calligone), concerns the very concept of beauty. He argues, plausibly, that the concept’s origins lay in visual experience (as, he thinks, is suggested by the etymological connection in German between the words schön [beautiful] and Schein [shine, appearance]), but that it has since been extended from that primary domain to cover virtually “everything that has a pleasurable effect on the soul”, that in this sense “sight … allegorizes the images, the representations, the conceits of the soul”, so that beauty becomes our most general term of approval for whatever we find pleasing in relation to any of the senses and indeed mental life more broadly (G2:289–291).

A third important idea that he develops is that beauty is in fact considerably less important in literature and art than it has often been thought to be. This demotion of beauty is not only encouraged by his somewhat deflationary genealogy of the concept just mentioned but also by his proto-Romantic conception that literature and art have fundamental functions in relation to language (and thought), religion, and morality, and by his mature insistence that meaning and thought play an important role even in “non-linguistic” art. He tended to advocate this demotion of beauty increasingly as time went on. Accordingly, whereas in early works such as On the Ode and the Critical Forests he still treated beauty as central to aesthetics, by the time he wrote the Calligone he had changed his mind and now insisted that it is not nearly as essential to art as it is often taken to be. In particular, he argues in the Calligone that art is much more essentially a matter of Bildung—cultural formation or education (especially in moral respects).

Finally, let us consider Herder’s thesis that literature and art have a morally educative function. In On the Effect of Poetic Art on the Ethics of Peoples in Ancient and Modern Times (1778), On the Influence of the Belles Lettres on the Higher Sciences (1781), and the Calligone he not only sees this as one of their most essential functions, but also holds that literature has a more powerful effect as an instrument of moral education than other instruments, such as law.

He also develops a nuanced account of how literature and art do and should perform this function. For example, in On the Influence he specifies three distinct ways in which literature or poetry promotes the formation of moral character. First, it does so “through light rules”—in other words, through a subtle articulation of ethical principles. Second, and more importantly in his view, it does so by presenting good moral role models in a positive light so that people will emulate them: “still better, through good examples”. Third, it also does so by conveying a range of practical experience that is conducive to the formation of moral character and which would otherwise have to be acquired, if at all, by the more arduous and painful route of first-hand experience. In addition, Herder elsewhere implies a fourth important way in which literature contributes to moral formation: it is a fundamental principle underlying his Popular Songs that by vividly conveying the inner lives—for instance, the fears, hopes, and joys—of other people to its audience or readership, literature will stir their sympathies for them and hence inculcate more moral attitudes toward them. Fifth, Herder in the Calligone adds a further point, concerning “non-linguistic” art, namely, that visual art has a power to make moral ideals attractive by presenting them blended with physical beauty, and that, similarly, music has a power to affect moral character either for good or for ill depending on the principles of conduct that are associated with it.

Herder’s conception that the formation of moral character both is and ought to be the primary function of literature and art serves him as an important criterion for evaluating individual works. Thus when he observes in On the Effect that in contrast to earlier poetry modern poetry has typically lost this function, he means this as a serious criticism of modern poetry. And he even applied this criterion as a ground for criticizing certain works by his friends Goethe and Schiller that he considered to be immoral or amoral in content.

8. Moral Philosophy

Herder also develops a philosophically powerful and historically influential moral philosophy. This consists of a set of positions in both meta-ethics and first-order morality. Let us consider the former first.

As in the philosophy of mind, Herder’s position in meta-ethics is naturalistic in spirit. Such a position was by no means uncontroversial in Herder’s day, as can be seen, for example, from his correspondence with Mendelssohn in 1769 concerning Spalding’s and Mendelssohn’s religious, afterlife-focused conception of humankind’s “vocation [Bestimmung]”, which Herder sharply opposed in favor of a this-worldly conception of the same.

As was mentioned earlier, Herder in particular holds a sentimentalist position concerning the nature of morality: rather than being a sort of knowledge of objective facts (as in Plato’s moral theory, for example) or a set of deliverances of universal reason (as in the critical Kant’s moral theory, for instance), morality is fundamentally an expression of human sentiments. Herder already espoused such a position in How Philosophy Can Become (1765), continues it in This Too a Philosophy of History (1774) (where he usually refers to the sentiments in question as Neigungen, inclinations), and still holds it in Letters for the Advancement (1793–7) (where he usually refers to them as Gesinnungen, attitudes).

Herder took over this position from his teacher, the pre-critical Kant, who had similarly espoused a form of sentimentalism in Dreams of a Spirit Seer (1766). Via Kant it can ultimately be traced back to the British sentimentalist tradition, especially Hume, whose main argument for it Herder seems to echo at points in This Too a Philosophy of History: moral judgment of its very nature motivates; but reason does not motivate, only sentiments do that; therefore moral judgment must fundamentally consist of sentiments.

However, Herder’s sentimentalism is not crude (as Hume’s arguably was), for he recognizes that cognition—i.e., concepts and beliefs—plays a major role in morality as well. This can already be seen from the Critical Forests (1769), where he argues against cruder theories of moral value that equate them with sentiments abstracted from all cognition, and where in the fourth part he indeed argues that sensations in general are concept-, belief-, and theory-laden. It can also be seen from On the Cognition and Sensation (1778). (Nietzsche would later take over this sophisticated form of sentimentalism from Herder.)

Where Herder’s position becomes most original, though, is in historicizing the moral sentiments in question—or (a little more broadly and more precisely) in seeing them as varying deeply from one historical period to another, one culture to another, and even one individual to another. He already champions such a position in On the Change of Taste (1766), for example, indeed going as far as to say that the moral sentiments in question sometimes even get inverted, so that what one period, culture, or individual found morally praiseworthy another finds morally reprehensible. This radical position can also be found in his published writings. This position makes Herder’s sentimentalism markedly different from Hume’s, rather a precursor of Nietzsche’s (which it again strongly influenced here).

Another radical thesis that Herder champions is that moral sentiments as a rule turn out to be both suitable to and explicable in terms of the particular type of society and mode of life to which they belong. This is a central thesis in This Too a Philosophy of History. Thus Herder tries to show there that the moral values of each of the major period/cultures that he considers in the work can be explained in terms of their suitability to the character of the society and the way of life to which they belonged—for example, the ancient Egyptians’ morality of diligence and civic faithfulness to their agricultural, industrial, and urban society and mode of life; the Romans’ morality of courage, prudence, and patriotism to their imperialistic, war-based society and mode of life; and so on. This thesis reinforces Herder’s Humean argument for sentimentalism by showing that moral attitudes are explicable in terms of their social function without recourse to moral facts. (Here again Herder’s approach would later be echoed by Nietzsche.)

Another major contribution that Herder makes in the area of meta-ethics is his application of his “genetic” method of explanation to the domain of morality. This method depends on Herder’s historicism. It purports to make a mentalistic phenomenon more intelligible by tracing it back to its historical origins and showing how these developed into it via a series of intermediate forms. Herder first developed this method in the mid-1760s in application to literary genres and language (in Attempt at a History of Lyric Poetry and the Fragments respectively), but he then went on to apply it to moral (and other) values in This Too a Philosophy of History (1774). Since moralities change over time, one can contribute to explaining or better understanding the morality of a late age, for example, eighteenth-century Europe, by identifying the earliest morality in its historical tradition and then showing how this developed through a chain of subsequent moralities into the late morality in question. Accordingly, This Too a Philosophy of History attempts to show (roughly) that after the authoritarian morality of the ancient Hebrews had laid the foundations, the Egyptians’ morality of diligence and citizen’s faithfulness arose; this then gave way to the Phoenicians’ morality of freedom and openness; the Greeks next synthesized the preceding moralities into a morality of citizen’s faithfulness and freedom; Rome then modified this inheritance into moral values of courage, prudence, and patriotism; following the collapse of the Roman Empire, the northern tribes, together with Christianity, developed a richer set of values that included courage, faith, honesty, reverence for gods, humanity, chastity, and knightly honor; and then finally the (professed) morality of modern Europe emerged as a result of this whole tradition. This Herderian approach to explaining, or contributing to a better understanding of, morality would subsequently be taken over and developed further by Hegel, Nietzsche (especially in On the Genealogy of Morality [1887]), and Foucault.

A further important aspect of Herder’s meta-ethics has already been touched on: the complex position that he already develops in How Philosophy Can Become that sentimentalism is the correct account of the nature of morality; that cognitivism is therefore useless as an account of morality or as an approach for inculcating it, and is moreover harmful because it provokes skepticism about morality and distracts people from the real foundations of morality and from reinforcing them; and that philosophy should therefore instead focus on identifying and reinforcing those real foundations, namely, a set of causal mechanisms that generate and support the moral sentiments.

As was also mentioned earlier, How Philosophy Can Become mainly emphasizes certain forms of education and an emotive type of preaching in this connection—both activities that Herder went on to theorize about at greater length elsewhere. But these are only two parts of a much broader theory and practice of moral pedagogy, or cultivation of the moral sentiments, that he developed over the course of his career, in what became one of his most central, distinctive, and consuming projects. The additional causal mechanisms that he identified and supported included the influence of morally exemplary individuals, the law, and literature (as well as the other arts).

Herder’s development of this whole theory and practice of moral pedagogy was lifelong and tireless. It constitutes perhaps the single most important philosophical contribution to moral pedagogy since the (strikingly similar) moral pedagogy that Protagoras developed in antiquity (as preserved in the Great Discourse of Plato’s Protagoras).

As can be seen from This Too a Philosophy of History, Herder believed that this project had a special historical urgency in his day because since the Renaissance and the Reformation the moral values that people profess, such as love of humanity, freedom, and honor, have largely become hollow, no longer genuinely anchored in moral sentiments, and therefore fail to serve the social function to which they would correspond.

A final very important aspect of Herder’s meta-ethics, prominent especially in This Too a Philosophy of History, flows from several of the meta-ethical positions that have already been mentioned, specifically, from sentimentalism, the thesis of the profound variability of moral sentiments between periods, cultures, and even individuals, and the thesis of the general suitedness of the various moralities that arise to the societies and modes of life to which they belong: there can be no justification for making differential evaluative comparisons between one morality and another, for saying that one morality is better or worse than another. This is the implication of a famous remark in This Too a Philosophy of History that where values are concerned

at bottom all comparison proves to be problematic … Each nation has its center of happiness in itself, like every sphere its center of gravity! (HPW 296–297)

This relativism (as it has often, and quite reasonably, been called) is arguably one of Herder’s main contributions to moral philosophy. However, it is also problematic, both in its relation to other parts of Herder’s philosophy and intrinsically. (For further details, see Section 2 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

Let us now turn more briefly to some of Herder’s distinctive positions in first-order morality. For at this level too he developed positions that are of great importance—for their intrinsic value, their influence on successors, or both.

One very fundamental, original, and attractive principle that he develops here is what might be called pluralist cosmopolitanism, in contradistinction to homogenizing cosmopolitanism. Cosmopolitanism already had a long history by Herder’s day that reached back to (Cynicism and) Stoicism in the pagan Greek world. That tradition had usually championed a homogenizing form of cosmopolitanism, i.e., a form of it that grants equal ethical respect to all human beings only on the basis of an assumption that they all share much in common psychologically, especially in their moral values. In particular, Herder’s Enlightenment predecessors, including Kant, had held such a position. Moreover, this version of cosmopolitanism continues to be predominant among moral philosophers and worthy organizations such as the United Nations to this day. There is a huge problem with this form of cosmopolitanism, however: its assumption that human beings all share a great deal in common psychologically, especially in moral values, is false (and attempting to make it true would require massive coercion). Herder recognized this problem, but he did not throw out the baby of cosmopolitanism with the bathwater of homogenization. Instead, he developed a distinctive pluralist form of cosmopolitanism: a commitment to equal moral respect for all human beings despite, and indeed even in part because of, the diversity of their psychologies, and in particular their moral values. This position is prominent in the Letters for the Advancement, for example. This pluralist cosmopolitanism also undergirds Herder’s strong stance against imperialism and colonialism in This Too a Philosophy of History, the Ideas, and the Letters for the Advancement.

A second moral principle of Herder’s that deserves to be mentioned here is the closely related principle of humanity [Humanität], which he develops in the Ideas and the Letters for the Advancement. This principle has both descriptive aspects—in particular, an implication of the unity of the human species and of the mere superficiality of racial differences—and normative ones. Among the latter, it includes an implication of cosmopolitanism. It also includes implications of specific standards of decent treatment (e.g., not killing, physically abusing, or deceiving people). And it also functions as a sort of substitute for the concept of human rights, a concept that constitutes a closer specification of cosmopolitanism but which Herder tends to shy away from for various reasons (see for this the section on Political Philosophy).

A further noteworthy component of Herder’s first-order morality is his moral ideal of Bildung, in the sense of autonomous, individualistic development of all one’s capacities into a harmonious whole. He already worked out this ideal in writings from 1769. Later, in On the Cognition and Sensation, he developed some deeper philosophical foundations for it: an account of human autonomy or freedom as something compatible with the laws of nature (an account closely related to one he had already given in the Treatise on the Origin according to which a distinctive characteristic of humankind is a certain sort of flexibility, or freedom from determination by narrow instincts); a quasi-Leibnizian account of individuality as a general feature of all nature, including human nature as a special case; and an account of the deep interdependence of the psychological faculties, which undergirds the “harmonious whole” component of the ideal. This ideal would later go on to have an enormous influence on successors such as Schiller, Wilhelm von Humboldt (who saw its realization as the highest purpose of the state and indeed even of the whole universe), and Hegel.

Besides these several striking moral ideals, Herder is also committed to a range of much less surprising ones, especially ones associated with the Christian moral tradition, such as sympathy, love, forgiveness, honesty, justice, and equality. Although not surprising in themselves, these ideals help to illustrate another striking feature of Herder’s moral philosophy: his firm avoidance of the sort of moral monism that began in antiquity with Plato’s Protagoras (specifically, with its argument for the unity of the virtues) and which has continued in modernity with Kant (in his commitment to the categorical imperative as the sole moral principle) and Utilitarianism (with its commitment to happiness as the sole moral criterion), in favor of moral pluralism: a commitment to an irreducible plurality of moral values or ideals. This is arguably another great merit of his moral philosophy.

Finally, Herder’s ethical theory is important not only for what it includes but also for what it omits. In particular, he shows little interest in the issue of free will, hardly ever if at all implying that such a thing exists or that it is a precondition of moral responsibility. (Freedom in the sense of a sort of autonomy, or flexibility, that exists within the limits of laws of nature and merely amounts to a certain liberty from constraint by narrow instincts and political freedom are another matter; he is interested in these.) This position contrasts sharply with that of most modern moral philosophers, including Hume and Kant, for example. However, it looks much less idiosyncratic if one takes a broader perspective and notices, for instance, that neither the earlier Greeks (e.g., Homer) nor the Chinese ethical tradition have had any conception of free will or any inclination to think that such a thing is required for moral responsibility. Moreover, I would argue that Herder’s position here, like that of these other traditions, turns out to be a great virtue, since the very conception of free will and of morality’s dependence on it, which has dominated western philosophy and religion since late antiquity, turns out to be thoroughly misbegotten.

9. Philosophy of History

Herder’s philosophy of history mainly appears in two works: first in This Too a Philosophy of History and then later in the Ideas.

His philosophy of history is striking for its development of a teleological conception of history as the progressive realization of “reason” and “humanity”—a conception that anticipated and strongly influenced Hegel, among others. However, this conception is very dubious on reflection, and is arguably not one of Herder’s most intrinsically important achievements in this area.

His most intrinsically important achievement arguably rather lies in his development of the thesis already mentioned earlier—contradicting such Enlightenment philosopher-historians as Hume and Voltaire—that there exist radical mental differences between different historical periods (and cultures), that people’s concepts, beliefs, values, sensations, and so on differ in deep ways from one period (or culture) to another. This thesis is already prominent in On the Change of Taste (1766) and it lasts throughout Herder’s career. It had an enormous influence on successors such as the Schlegel brothers, Schleiermacher, Hegel, Nietzsche, and Dilthey.

Herder makes the empirical exploration of the realm of mental diversity that this thesis posits the very core of the discipline of history. For, as has often been noted, he takes relatively little interest in the so-called “great” political and military deeds and events of history, focusing instead on the “innerness” of history’s participants. This choice is quite deliberate and self-conscious. Because of it, psychology and interpretation inevitably take center-stage as methods in the discipline of historiography for Herder.

Herder has deep philosophical reasons for this choice, and hence for assigning psychology and interpretation a central role in historiography. To begin with, he has negative reasons directed against traditional political-military historiography. Why should historiography focus on the “great” political and military deeds and events of the past, after all? There are several possible answers: (1) A first would be that they are fascinating or morally edifying. But Herder will not accept this. For one thing, he denies that mere fascination or curiosity is a sufficiently serious motive for doing historiography. For another thing, his antiauthoritarianism, antimilitarism, and borderless humanitarianism cause him to find the acts of political domination, war, and empire that make up the vast bulk of these “great” deeds and events not morally edifying but morally repugnant.

This leaves two other types of motivation that might be appealed to for doing the sort of historiography in question: (2) because examining the course of such deeds and events reveals some sort of overall meaning in history, or (3) because it leads to efficient causal insights that enable us to explain the past and perhaps also predict or control the future. Herder is again skeptical about these rationales, however. This skepticism is perhaps clearest in the Older Critical Forestlet (1767–8) where, in criticism of rationale (2), he consigns the task of “the whole ordering together of many occurrences into a plan” not to the historian but instead to the “creator, … painter, and artist”, and in criticism of rationale (3), he goes as far as to assert (on the basis of a Hume- and Kant-influenced general skepticism about causal knowledge) that with the search for efficient causes in history “historical seeing stops and prophecy begins”. His later writings depart from this early position in some obvious ways, but they also in important ways remain faithful to it. (For further details, see Section 3 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

Herder’s arguments against these three rationales are all briefly summarized in Letters 121–122 from the 10th Collection of the Letters for the Advancement (though they are more fully stated individually elsewhere).

Complementing this negative case against the claims of traditional political-military history to be of overriding importance, Herder also has positive reasons for focusing instead on the “innerness” of human life in history. (1) One reason is certainly just the sheer interest of this subject-matter (though, as was mentioned before, that would not be a sufficient reason in his eyes). (2) Another reason is that his discovery of radical diversity in human mentality has shown there to be a much broader, less explored, and more intellectually challenging field for investigation here than previous generations of historians have realized. Two further reasons are moral in nature: (3) He believes, quite plausibly, that studying people’s minds through their literature, visual art, and so on generally exposes one to them at their moral best (in sharp contrast to studying their political-military history), so that there are benefits of moral edification to be gleaned here. (4) He has cosmopolitan and egalitarian moral motives for studying people’s minds through their literature, visual art, and so forth: in sharp contrast to studying unedifying and elite-focused political-military history, this promises to enhance our sympathies for peoples, and moreover for peoples at all social levels, including lower ones. Finally, doing “inner” history is also important as an instrument for our non-moral self-improvement: (5) It serves to enhance our self-understanding. One important reason for this is that it is by, and only by, contrasting one’s own outlook with the outlooks of other peoples that one comes to recognize what is universal and invariant in it and what by contrast distinctive and variable. Another is that in order fully to understand one’s own outlook one needs to identify its historical origins and how they developed into it (this is Herder’s justly famous “genetic” method, about which more will be said in a moment). (6) Herder believes that an accurate investigation of the (non-moral) ideals of past ages can serve to enrich our own ideals and happiness. This motive finds broad application in his work. One example is his exploration of past literatures in the Fragments largely with a view to drawing from them lessons about how better to develop modern German literature.

Herder’s decision to focus on the “innerness” of history’s participants, and his consequent emphasis on psychology and interpretation as historical methods, strikingly anticipated and strongly influenced Dilthey. So too did his rationale for this decision, as described above, which is indeed arguably superior to Dilthey’s, especially on its positive side.

Another of Herder’s major contributions to the philosophy of history, likewise based on his insight into radical mental difference, is the “genetic” method recently mentioned. This was a revolutionary invention that proved to be of enormous intrinsic value and which exercised a huge influence on the philosophies of important successors such as Hegel, Nietzsche, and Foucault.

Herder’s genetic method is first and foremost a means toward better understanding, or explaining, psychological outlooks and psychologically laden practices—especially a means toward better understanding one’s own, toward better self-understanding. The method achieves its distinctive contribution to better understanding such outlooks and practices, saliently including one’s own, by showing, in a naturalistic (i.e., non-religious, non-mythical, non-transcendent) way, that and how they have developed historically out of earlier origins prior to which they were not yet really present at all and from which they have emerged via a series of transformations.

Herder initially developed this method in the 1760s mainly in relation to poetry and language. His unpublished Attempt at a History of Lyrical Poetry (1764) contains his earliest presentation of the method and applies it to poetry. His slightly later published work, the Fragments (1767–8), refines his presentation of it and applies it to language. He then goes on to apply the method to moral (and other) values. Thus in This Too a Philosophy of History (1774) he largely focuses on moral, aesthetic, and prudential values, developing the large-scale “genetic” thesis that history has consisted of a great chain of cultures (Oriental patriarchal culture, then Egyptian, then Phoenician, then Greek, then Roman, and so on) that have built on each other cumulatively and thus eventually generated modern European culture (toward which he is strikingly ambivalent). For example, he claims that Greek culture combined antecedent Oriental and Egyptian culture’s obedience with antecedent Phoenician culture’s freedom in a new synthesis, and then passed this on to subsequent European cultures.

Hegel, especially in his Phenomenology of Spirit (1807), Nietzsche, especially in On the Genealogy of Morality (1887), and Foucault subsequently took over this method and modified it in various ways.

How exactly is Herder’s method supposed to advance (self-)understanding? It aspires to do so in two distinguishable ways, which together constitute what one might call the essential model of genetic explanation.

The method’s first contribution to (self-)understanding is roughly as follows. Someone who possesses his or her own distinctive concepts, beliefs, values, sensations, customs, art forms, and so on but does not compare them with perspectives that have lacked them altogether or possessed variant alternatives runs a grave risk of taking them to be universal and indispensable, and also of overlooking what is distinctive in their character. The genetic method counteracts both of these types of (self-)misunderstanding by making one familiar with earlier historical periods that have lacked the relevant concepts etc. altogether and with intervening historical periods in which they were indeed anticipated but only in forms significantly different from the form in which one possesses them oneself, thereby making it possible both to perceive the non-universality and dispensability of the concepts etc. in question and to compare them with others in order to reveal their distinctive character.

The method’s second main contribution to (self-)understanding consists at its most basic level in showing two things: first, that the concepts etc. in question, rather than, say, either having been innate and therefore present in human minds all along or else having emerged ex nihilo fully formed at some point in history, are the products of historical developments before which they did not really exist at all and in the course of which they only existed in variant forms; second, what exactly these historical developments that produced them have been. At a less basic level, it normally also includes a provision of one or another further sort of explanation that is more specific in character. For example, the method shows that lyric poetry began as, and then continued throughout its transformations to be, an expression of deep emotions; that languages developed gradually from primitive beginnings to achieve their striking later complexity; or that modern culture and its values arose through a series of accumulations and transformations of earlier cultures and their values.

Finally, Herder is also impressive for having recognized, and, though not solved, at least grappled with, a problem that flows from his picture of history (and intercultural comparison) as an arena of deep variations in human mentality. This is the problem of skepticism. (For further details, see Section 4 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

10. Political Philosophy

Herder is not usually thought of as a political philosopher. But he was one, and moreover one whose political ideals are more admirable, theoretical stances more defensible, and thematic focuses of more enduring relevance than those of any other German philosopher of the period. His most developed treatment of political philosophy occurs relatively late, in a work prompted by the French Revolution of 1789: the Letters for the Advancement of Humanity (1793–7) (including the early draft from 1792, which is important for its frank statement of his views about domestic politics).

What are the main features of Herder’s political philosophy? Let us begin with his political ideals, first in domestic and then in international politics. In domestic politics, the mature Herder is a liberal, a republican, a democrat, and an egalitarian (this, it should be noted, in historical circumstances where such positions were by no means commonplace, and were embraced at a personal cost).

His liberalism is especially radical in that it advocates virtually unrestricted freedom of thought and expression (including freedom of worship). He has several reasons for this position: (1) He feels that such freedom belongs to people’s moral dignity. (2) He believes that it is essential for individuals’ self-realization. (3) He believes that people’s capacities for discerning the truth are very limited and that it is only through an ongoing contest between opposing viewpoints that the cause of truth gets advanced. (John Stuart Mill would later borrow from these considerations—largely via Wilhelm von Humboldt—to form the core of his own case for freedom of thought and expression in On Liberty.)

Herder is also committed to republicanism and democracy (advocating a much broader franchise than Kant, for example). He has several reasons for this position, ultimately deriving from an egalitarian concern for the interests of all members of society: (1) He feels it to be intrinsically right that the mass of people should share in their government, rather than having it imposed upon them. (2) He believes that this will better serve their other interests as well, since government by also tends to be government for. (3) He in particular believes that it will diminish the warfare that is pervasive under the prevailing autocratic political régimes of Europe, where it benefits the few rulers who decide on it but costs the mass of people dearly.

Finally, Herder’s egalitarianism also extends beyond this. He does not reject class differences, property, or inequalities of property outright. But he does oppose all hierarchical oppression; argue that all people in society have capacities for self-realization, and must receive the opportunity to fulfill them; and insist that government must intervene to ensure that they do receive it, for example, by guaranteeing education and a minimum standard of living for the poor.

Concerning international politics, Herder has often been classified as a “nationalist” or (perhaps even worse) a “German nationalist” (for example, by R.R. Ergang in Herder and the Foundations of German Nationalism [1931] and K.R. Popper in The Open Society and its Enemies [1945]). Some other philosophers from the period deserve such a characterization (for instance, Fichte). But where Herder is concerned it is deeply misleading and unjust. On the contrary, his fundamental position in international politics is a committed cosmopolitanism, an impartial concern for all human beings. This is a large part of the force of his ideal of “humanity”. Hence, for example, in the Letters for the Advancement he approvingly quotes Fénelon’s remark, “I love my family more than myself; more than my family my fatherland; more than my fatherland humankind” (HPW 389). Moreover, unlike Kant’s cosmopolitanism, Herder’s is genuine: Kant’s is vitiated by a set of empirically ignorant and morally inexcusable prejudices that he harbors—in particular, racism, antisemitism, and misogyny. By contrast, Herder’s is free of these prejudices, which he indeed worked tirelessly to combat.

Herder does also insist on respecting, preserving, and advancing national groupings. However, this is entirely unalarming, for the following reasons: (1) For Herder, this is emphatically something that must be done for all national groupings equally—not just or especially Germany! (In the Letters for the Advancement he emphatically rejects any such notion of a “favorite people [Favoritvolk]”, as he puts it [HPW 394].) (2) The “nation” in question is not racial but linguistic and cultural (in the Ideas and elsewhere Herder indeed criticizes and rejects the very concept of race). (3) Herder does not seek to seal off nations from each other’s influence or to keep them static; he regards inter-linguistic and -cultural exchange and linguistic-cultural development as normal and welcomes them. (4) Nor does his commitment to national groupings involve a centralized, militarized state (in the Ideas and elsewhere he strongly advocates the disappearance of such a state and its replacement by loosely federated local governments with minimal instruments of force). (5) In addition, his insistence on respecting national groupings is accompanied by the strongest denunciations of military conflict, colonial exploitation, and all other forms of harm between nations; a demand that nations instead peacefully cooperate and compete in trade and intellectual endeavors for their mutual benefit; and a plea that they should indeed actively work to help each other.

Moreover, Herder has compelling reasons for this insistence on respecting national groupings: (1) The deep diversity of values between nations entails that homogenization is only a fantasy: non-existent and impracticable. (2) Such diversity also entails that, to the extent that it is practicable, it cannot occur voluntarily but only through external coercion. (3) In practice, attempts to achieve it, for example, by European colonialism, are moreover coercive from, and subserve, ulterior motives of domination and exploitation. (4) Furthermore, real national variety is positively valuable, both as affording individuals a vital sense of local belonging and in itself.

Indeed, Herder’s pluralist cosmopolitanism is an important and attractive alternative to the homogenizing forms of cosmopolitanism, based on delusions concerning either the fact or the prospect of universally shared values, that have predominated since the Enlightenment and are still popular today, both among philosophers (especially in the Anglophone world) and in international political organizations such as the United Nations.

Another important part of Herder’s political philosophy, which bears on both domestic and international politics, is his striking preference for an ideal of humanity over his age’s ideal of human rights. (For further details, see Section 5 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

Now that we have surveyed the various political ideals that make up Herder’s political position, one final issue still needs to be addressed. It might still be objected that all of this does not yet really amount to a political theory—such as other philosophers have provided, including some of Herder’s contemporaries in Germany. In a sense that is true, but philosophically defensible; in another sense it is false.

It is true in the following sense. There is indeed no grand metaphysical theory underpinning Herder’s position—no Platonic theory of forms, no correlation of political institutions with “moments” in a Hegelian Logic, no “deduction” of political institutions from the nature of the self or the will à la Fichte or Hegel, or whatnot. But that is quite deliberate, given Herder’s skepticism about such metaphysics. And is this not indeed philosophically a good thing?

Nor does Herder have any account purporting to justify the moral intuitions at work in his political position as a sort of theoretical insight (in the manner of Kant’s theory of the “categorical imperative” or Rawls’s theory of the “original position”, for example). But that is again quite deliberate, given his sentimentalism in ethics, and his rejection of such theories as both false and harmful. And is he not again right about this, and the absence of such an account therefore again a good thing?

Nor is Herder sympathetic with such tired staples of political theory as natural rights, the state of nature, the social contract, the general will, and utopias for the future. But again, he has good specific reasons for skepticism about these notions. So this again seems like a good thing.

This, then, is the sense in which the objection is correct; Herder does indeed lack a “political theory” of these sorts. But he lacks it on principle, and is arguably quite right to do so.

On the other hand, in another sense it is false to say that he lacks a “political theory”. For he does have a “political theory” of a different, and arguably far more valuable, sort. First, consistently with his general empiricism, his position in political philosophy is deeply empirically informed. For instance, as can be seen from the Dissertation on the Reciprocal Influence of Government and the Sciences (1780), his thesis concerning the importance of freedom of thought and expression, and the competition between views that it makes possible, for producing intellectual progress is largely based on the historical example of ancient Greece, and in particular Athens, as contrasted with later societies, such as Rome, that lacked the freedom and competition in question. And in the 1792 draft of the Letters for the Advancement he even describes the French Revolution and its attempts to establish a modern democracy as a sort of “experiment” from which we can learn (for example, learn whether democracy can be successfully extended to nations that are much larger than ancient Athens).

Second, in conformity with his general sentimentalism in ethics, he is acutely aware that his political position ultimately rests on moral sentiments—his own and, for its success, other people’s as well. For example, in the 10th Collection of the Letters for the Advancement he emphasizes that people’s moral “dispositions” or “feelings” play a fundamental role as essential supports for his political position’s realization. This standpoint absolves him of the need to do certain sorts of theorizing—not only precluding any need for cognitivist groundings of the moral intuitions in question, but also promising short, effective solutions to various problems that might look like real brain-teasers to a cognitivist. However, it also leads him to engage in theorizing of another sort, namely, theorizing about the ways in which, and the causal means by which, people’s moral sentiments should be molded in order to realize the ideals of his political position. His discussion of moral “dispositions” in the 10th Collection is an example of such theorizing—concerning the ways in which, rather than the causal means by which. Some of his extensive theorizing about causal means (education, exemplary individuals, laws, literature, and so on) has already been discussed earlier in this article.

These two sorts of political theorizing—empirical theorizing and theorizing about moral sentiments—are deeply developed in Herder. And they arguably have much more point than the sorts that are not.

In short, to the extent that Herder’s political philosophy really is theoretically superficial, it is, to borrow a phrase of Nietzsche’s, “superficial—out of profundity” (whereas more familiar forms of political philosophy are profound—out of superficiality). And in another, more important, sense it is not theoretically superficial at all.

11. Philosophy of Religion

In Herder’s day German philosophy was still deeply committed to a sort of game of trying to reconcile the insights of the Enlightenment, especially those of modern natural science, with religion, and indeed more specifically with Christianity. Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, Schleiermacher, and many others played this game—each proposing some new reconciliation or other. Herder was part of this game as well. This was not a good game for philosophers to be playing. But it was not until the nineteenth century that German philosophy found the courage to cut the Gordian knot and turn from apologetics for religion and Christianity to thoroughgoing criticism of them (the prime examples being Marx and Nietzsche). This situation imposes certain limits on the value of Herder’s philosophy of religion (as on that of the other reconciling philosophers just mentioned).

Also, it should be noted that while Herder’s philosophy of religion was generally very enlightened and progressive in both his early and his late periods, there was a spell in the middle, the years 1771–6 in Bückeburg, during which he fell into the sort of religious irrationalism that is more characteristic of his friend Hamann. This happened as the result of what would today be classified as a mild nervous breakdown (documentable from his correspondence at the time), and should basically be discounted.

Notwithstanding these qualifications, Herder did make important contributions to the philosophy of religion—that is, important in terms of their intrinsic value, their influence, or both.

One of these contributions (important mainly for its influence) lies in his neo-Spinozism. Herder’s sympathetic engagement with Spinoza’s work goes back at least as far as 1769. But its main expression occurs in God: Some Conversations from 1787. Herder published this work in the wake of Jacobi’s Letters on the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785), in which Jacobi had revealed that the highly respected philosopher, critic, and dramatist Lessing—who was much admired by Herder in particular—had confessed to him shortly before his death that he had abandoned orthodox religious conceptions in favor of Spinozism. Jacobi had himself argued, sharply to the contrary, that Spinozism, and indeed all fundamental reliance on reason, implies atheism and fatalism, and should therefore be rejected in favor of a leap of faith to a conventional Christian theism. Jacobi’s work, along with a reply by Moses Mendelssohn that disputed the attribution of Spinozism to Lessing though not the perniciousness of such a position, caused a public furor. In God: Some Conversations Herder intervened. In this work he supports Lessing as Jacobi had characterized him by developing a version of “Spinozism” that modifies the original in some significant respects, largely with a view to defusing Jacobi’s objections.

Herder shares with Spinoza the basic thesis of monism, and like Spinoza equates the single, all-encompassing principle in question with God (which of course already calls into question Jacobi’s charge of atheism). But whereas Spinoza had characterized this single, all-encompassing principle as substance, Herder instead characterizes it as force, or primal force. This fundamental modification involves several further ones that Herder also finds attractive, including the following: (1) Whereas Spinoza had tended to conceive the principle in question as an inactive thing, Herder’s revision rather turns it into an activity. (2) Spinoza’s theory had attributed thought to the principle in question, but had rejected conceptions that it had intentions or was a mind. By contrast, Herder claims that it does have intentions. And since his general philosophy of mind identifies the mind with force, his identification of the principle in question with force also carries an implication that it is a mind (he does not yet quite say this in God: Some Conversations, but a few years later in On the Spirit of Christianity of 1798 he explicitly describes God as a Geist, a mind). In these ways, Herder in effect re-mentalizes Spinoza’s God (thereby further undermining Jacobi’s charge of atheism). (3) Whereas Spinoza had conceived nature mechanistically, in keeping with his Cartesian intellectual heritage (and had thereby invited Jacobi’s charge of fatalism), Herder (though officially still agnostic about what force is) rather tends to conceive the forces at work in nature as living, or organic (a conception of them that he mainly owes to Leibniz). (4) Herder believes that Spinoza’s original theory contained an objectionable residue of dualism (again inherited from Descartes) in its conception of the relation between God’s two known attributes, thought and extension (and similarly, in its conception of the relation between finite minds and bodies). By contrast, Herder’s own conception of God as a force (and of finite minds as likewise forces) is designed to overcome this alleged residual dualism. For forces are of their very nature expressed in the behavior of extended bodies. (5) Herder also sketches a more detailed account of nature as a system of living forces based in the primal force, God—an account that in particular ascribes an important role in this system to the sort of opposition between forces that is exemplified by the magnet, and characterizes the system as a self-development toward higher and higher forms of articulation.

During the last quarter or so of the eighteenth century and then well into the nineteenth century a wave of neo-Spinozism swept through German philosophy and literature: in addition to Lessing and Herder, further neo-Spinozists included Goethe, Schelling, Hegel, Schleiermacher, Hölderlin, Novalis, and Friedrich Schlegel. This wave was largely a result of Herder’s embrace of neo-Spinozism in God: Some Conversations (and in Goethe’s case, of Herder’s sympathy with Spinozism even before that work). Accordingly, it for the most part took over Herder’s modifications of Spinoza’s position.

However, Herder’s most intrinsically valuable contribution to the philosophy of religion concerns the interpretation of the Bible. In this connection, as has already been mentioned, he champions a strict secularism. This was already his position in the 1760s. At that period he argued firmly, in the spirit of Galileo, for disallowing revelation any jurisdiction over natural science—though he did so not in an anti-religious spirit but in the hope and expectation that an autonomous natural science would confirm religion. And he made a parallel case for the autonomy of interpretation: Religious assumptions and means have no business interfering in the interpretation of texts either, even when the texts are sacred ones. Instead, even the Bible must be interpreted as the work of human beings, and by means of the same sorts of rigorous hermeneutic methods that are employed for interpreting other ancient texts—any religious enlightenment coming as a result of such interpretation, not entering into the process itself. This whole position remained Herder’s considered position in his later period as well.

The general principle that the Bible should be interpreted in the same way as other texts was not the commonplace in Herder’s day that it has become since, but nor was it entirely new with him. In adopting it he was self-consciously following the lead of several recent Bible scholars—in particular, Ernesti, Michaelis, and Semler. However, his secularism is more consistent and radical than theirs, in particular because it foreswears not only any reliance on a divine inspiration of the interpreter but also any assumption that the Bible, as the word of God, must be true and consistent throughout. (For further details, see Section 6 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

Another important interpretive principle of Herder’s, closely related to his strict secularism, is an insistence that interpreters of the Bible must resist the temptation to read the Bible as allegory (except in those relatively few cases—such as the parables of the New Testament—where there is clear textual evidence that a biblical author intended to convey an allegorical meaning). In On God’s Son, the World’s Savior (1797) Herder gives a perceptive general diagnosis of how the temptation to allegorical interpretation arises: over the course of history people’s beliefs and values change, leading to discrepancies between the claims made by their traditional texts and their own beliefs and values; but they expect and want to find their traditional texts to be correct; and so they try to effect a reconciliation of them with their own beliefs and values by means of allegorical readings.

Herder’s theoretical commitment to strict secularism and to non-allegorical readings in biblical interpretation led him to interpretive discoveries concerning the Bible that were themselves of great importance. For example, concerning the Old Testament, his commitment to applying normal interpretive methods enabled him to distinguish and define the different genres of poetry in the Old Testament in a way that was superior to anything that had been achieved before. The same commitment, and his consequent readiness to find falsehood and even inconsistency in the Bible, allowed him to make such important interpretive observations as that the ancient Hebrews’ conceptions about death, the afterlife, the mind, and the body had changed dramatically over time. (For both of these achievements, see especially On the Spirit of Hebrew Poetry.) And his rejection of unwarranted allegorical interpretations allowed him to substitute for the prevailing interpretation of the Song of Solomon as religious allegory an interpretation of it as simple erotic love poetry that is today generally accepted as correct.

Similarly concerning the New Testament, Herder’s commitment to applying normal interpretive methods, including his readiness to discover falsehood and inconsistency, enabled him to treat the authors of the four gospels as individual human authors rather than as mere mouthpieces of the deity, to perceive inconsistencies between their accounts, to establish the relative dates of the gospels correctly for the first time (Mark first, Matthew and Luke in the middle, John last and late), and to give a broadly correct account of their genesis in oral sermon and of their likely relations to each other (achievements that he attained above all in two late works from 1796–7, On the Savior of Mankind and On God’s Son, the World’s Savior).

Herder’s strict secularism and resistance to allegory in interpretation would shortly afterwards be adopted by Schleiermacher, who similarly embraced the principle that the interpretation of sacred texts must treat them as the works of human authors and apply exactly the same interpretive methods to them as are applied to profane texts, and who similarly followed through on this commitment, in particular finding not only falsehoods but also inconsistencies in the Bible.

Herder’s great achievements in this whole area also have something of the character of the early acts of an inexorable personal tragedy, however. As was mentioned, he did not by any means intend his championing of the cause of intellectual conscience in insisting on the autonomy of natural science and interpretation to undermine religion in general or Christianity in particular; on the contrary, his hope and expectation was that both sorts of autonomy would in the end support religion and Christianity. However, this hope has been sorely disappointed. Autonomous natural science has increasingly made religion generally and Christianity in particular look untenable. And Herder’s policy of reading the Bible with the aid of normal interpretive means as a collection of human texts, with all of the foibles of human texts, has increasingly led to an undermining of the Bible’s claims to intellectual authority (a landmark here was the publication of David Friedrich Strauss’s The Life of Jesus (1835–6)). Much of what Herder has ultimately achieved in this area would therefore be deeply unwelcome to him.

12. Intellectual Influence

Now that we have surveyed Herder’s main achievements as a philosopher, we are in a better position to see not only their intrinsic value but also their enormous intellectual influence, as adumbrated at the start of this article—an influence that occurred both within philosophy and beyond it, and that extended even to the founding of whole new disciplines. (For further details, see Section 7 of the Supplementary Discussion.)

13. Guide to the Literature

General Treatments

Adler and Koepke 2009 (an excellent collection of articles covering a wide range of topics); Beiser 1987 (ch. 5 covers several subject helpfully, including Herder’s philosophies of language, mind, and religion); Berlin 1976 (concise and excellent); Clark 1955 (detailed and useful, though unimaginative); Forster forthcoming (covers the subjects treated in this article in more detail); Gillies 1945 (not philosophically sophisticated, but good on Herder’s relation to literature and on his influence); Greif, Heinz, and Clairmont 2016 (a useful reference work); Haym 1880 (a classic, detailed intellectual biography; still by far the best general book on Herder available); Heise 1998 (a good short introduction); Irmscher 2001 (an excellent short introduction); Nisbet 1970 (a helpful general account of Herder’s views about science); Sauder 1987 (contains helpful contributions on a wide range of topics); Wiese 1939 (a helpful overview).

Intellectual Life

Adler 1968; Beiser 1987 (ch. 5); Berlin 1976; Clark 1955; Haym 1880.

Philosophical Style

Adler 2009; Berlin 1976; Clark 1955; Haym 1880; Zammito 2001 (an excellent, thorough study).

General Program in Philosophy

Heinz 1994; Zammito 2001 (very good on this subject).

Philosophy of Language

Aarsleff 1982; Coseriu 2015; Forster 2010, 2011a, 2013; Hacking 1988, 1994; Sapir 1907 (an excellent discussion of the Treatise on the Origin by an important twentieth-century linguist); Taylor 1991, 1996, 2016.

Theory of Interpretation (Hermeneutics)

Forster 2010 (especially chs. 1–5), 2011a (especially ch. 9), 2016; Gjesdal 2004, 2017; Irmscher 1973 (a very influential article that attempts to assimilate Herder’s position to Gadamer’s, an ambition that is both interpretively and philosophically controversial); Willi 1971 (a helpful treatment of Herder’s approach to interpreting the Old Testament).

Theory of Translation

Berman 1984; Forster 2010 (ch. 12); Huber 1968; Huyssen 1969; Kelletat 1984 (a helpful treatment of Herder’s interest in world literature, and of his theory and practice of translation); Purdie 1965; Sauder 2009.

Linguistics and Anthropology

Broce 1986; Coseriu 2015; Forster 2010 (ch. 6), 2011a (especially ch. 4); Gjesdal 2013; Mühlberg 1984; Pross 1987; Zammito 2001.

Philosophy of Mind

Beiser 1987 (ch. 5); Forster 2011c.


Forster 2010 (chs. 1, 3, and 5), 2011a (ch. 6), 2016; Gjesdal 2017; Guyer 2007; Irmscher 1987; Mayo 1969; Norton 1991 (helpful both on aspects of Herder’s aesthetic theory and on his general relation to the Enlightenment); Wiora 1953.

Moral Philosophy

Berlin 1976; Booher 2015; Crowe 2012; DeSouza 2012a, 2012b, 2014; Forster 2017b and forthcoming; Sikka 2011.

Philosophy of History

Barnard 2003; Beiser 2003; Bollacher 1994; Forster 2011b, 2012a; Gadamer 1942; Irmscher 1984, 2010; Lovejoy 1948 (helpful and concise); Maurer 1987; Meinecke [1936] 1972 (ch. 9 on Herder is very helpful); Otto and Zammito 2001; Staedelmann 1928; Wells 1960; Zammito 2009.

Political Philosophy

Barnard 1965 (chs. 3–5 cover Herder’s political thought very well); Beiser 1992 (ch. 8 on Herder’s political philosophy is excellent); Berlin 1976; Bernasconi 1995; Ergang 1931 (helpful on Herder’s political thought and on his intellectual influence, but marred by a false assimilation of Herder’s nationalism to later German nationalism, and by an unduly warm assessment of such a position); Forster 2010 (ch. 7), 2017a; Sikka 2011.

Philosophy of Religion

Bell 1984; Forster 2012b; Lindner 1960; Vollrath 1911; Willi 1971.

Herder’s Influence

Ergang 1931; Forster 1998, 2010, 2011a, 2011b, 2011c, 2012a, 2012b, 2012c, 2016, 2017b; Gillies 1945; Harris 1972; Heinz 1997; Jacoby 1911; Taylor 1975; Zammito 1992, 1997.


Primary Texts

In German

There are two main German editions of Herder’s works:

  • Johann Gottfried Herder Sämtliche Werke, B. Suphan et al. (eds.), Berlin: Weidmann, 1877–.
  • [G] Johann Gottfried Herder Werke, U. Gaier et al. (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Deutscher Klassiker Verlag, 1985–.

The latter edition includes very helpful notes.

  • [B] Johann Gottfried Herder Briefe, W. Dobbek and G. Arnold (eds.), Weimar: Hermann Böhlaus Nachfolger, 1977.


  • On World History: Johann Gottfried Herder, an Anthology, Hans Adler and Ernest A. Menze (eds.), Armonk, NY: M.E. Sharpe, 1996. Contains short excerpts on history from a variety of works, prominently including the Ideas.
  • J.G. Herder on Social and Political Culture, F.M. Barnard (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969. Includes (partial) translations of Herder’s
    • Journal (1769)
    • Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772)
    • This Too a Philosophy of History for the Formation of Humanity (1774)
    • Dissertation on the Reciprocal Influence of Government and the Sciences (1780)
    • Ideas for the Philosophy of the History of Humanity (1784–91)
    plus a very helpful introduction.
  • Against Pure Reason: Writings on Religion, Language, and History, Marcia Bunge (trans. & ed.), Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1993.
  • God: Some Conversations, Frederick H. Burkhardt (ed.), New York: Veritas Press, 1940. Reprinted Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1962.
  • Outlines of a Philosophy of the History of Man, T. Churchill (ed.), London: J. Johnson/L. Hansard, 1803. (This is a translation of the Ideas.)
  • [HPW] J.G. Herder: Philosophical Writings, Michael N. Forster (trans. & ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. Contains translations of
    • How Philosophy Can Become More Universal and Useful for the Benefit of the People (1765), pages 3–30
    • Fragments on Recent German Literature (1767–8), (excerpts on language), pages 33–64
    • Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772), pages 65–164
    • On Thomas Abbt’s Writings (1768), (selections concerning psychology), pages 167–177
    • On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul (1778), pages 187–244
    • On the Change of Taste (1766), pages 247–256
    • Older Critical Forestlet (1767/8), (excerpt on history), pages 257–267
    • This Too a Philosophy of History for the Formation of Humanity, pages 272–358
    • Letters for the Advancement of Humanity (1792), (excerpts), pages 370–424
    as well as other pieces.
  • Sculpture: Some Observations on Shape and Form from Pygmalion’s Creative Dream, Jason Gaiger (ed.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 2002. (This is a translation of Plastik [1778].)
  • Reflections on the Philosophy of History of Mankind, Frank E. Manuel (ed.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1968. Contains excerpts from Churchill’s 1803 translation of the Ideas.
  • The Spirit of Hebrew Poetry, James Marsh (ed.), Burlington, VT: Edward Smith, 1833.
  • Johann Gottfried Herder: Selected Early Works, 1764–7, Ernest A. Menze, Karl Menges, Michael Palma (eds.), University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1992. Contains several early essays, including On Diligence in Several Learned Languages (1764), and selections from the Fragments.
  • Selected Writings on Aesthetics, Gregory Moore (ed.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2006. Contains
    • Critical Forests (1769), first and fourth books
    • Shakespeare (1773)
    • On the Influence of the Belles Lettres on the Higher Sciences (1781)
    • On Image, Poetry, and Fable (1787)
    and several other pieces on aesthetics.
  • On the Origin of Language, John H. Moran and Alexander Gode (eds.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1986. Contains a partial translation of Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772).
  • German Aesthetics and Literary Criticism: Winckelmann, Lessing, Hamann, Herder, Schiller, Goethe, H.B. Nisbet (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985. Contains two pieces of Herder’s in aesthetics, including his important essay Shakespeare.

Primary Works by Others

  • Boeckh, August, 1877, Enzyklopädie und Methodologie der philologischen Wissenschaften (Encyclopedia and Methodology of the Philological Sciences), Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Ernesti, Johann August, 1761, Institutio interpretis Novi Testamenti, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Hegel, Georg, 1795/6, The Positivity of the Christian Religion, in his Early Theological Writings, T.M. Knox (trans.), Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1971.
  • –––, 1798–1800, The Spirit of Christianity and Its Fate, in his Early Theological Writings.
  • –––, 1807, Phenomenology of Spirit, A.V. Miller (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • –––, 1837, Reason in History, R.S. Hartmann (trans.), Upper Saddle River, NJ: Library of Liberal Arts, 1997.
  • –––, 1832, Science of Logic, A.V. Miller (trans.), Amherst, NY: Prometheus, 1991.
  • Hume, David, 1748, An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, London: Millar.
  • Jacobi, Friedrich, 1785, Über die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an Herrn Moses Mendelssohn (On the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Mr. Moses Mendelssohn), Breslau: Löwe.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1766, Dreams of a Spirit Seer, in his Theoretical Philosophy, 1755–1770, David Walford and Ralf Meerbote (trans. & ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • –––, 1790, Critique of the Power of Judgment, Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (trans. & ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Mill, John Stuart, 1859, On Liberty, Stefan Collini (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich, 1873, On Truth and Lying in an Extra-moral Sense, in Friedrich Nietzsche on Rhetoric and Language, Sander L. Gilman, Carole Blair, and David J. Parent (trans. & ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • –––, 1882/7, The Gay Science, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1974.
  • –––, 1886, Beyond Good and Evil, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1966.
  • –––, 1887, On the Genealogy of Morality, Maudemarie Clark and Alan Swensen (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1998.
  • Schlegel, Friedrich, 1795/7, On the Study of Greek Poetry (Über das Studium der griechischen Poesie), Stuart Barnett (trans.), Albany: State University of New York Press, 2001.
  • –––, 1808, On the Language and Wisdom of the Indians (Über die Sprache und Weisheit der Indier), in The Aesthetic and Miscellaneous Works of Friedrich von Schlegel, E. Millington (trans.), London: H. G. Bohn, 1848.
  • Schelling, Friedrich, 1792, Antiquissimi de prima malorum origine philosophematis explicandi tentamen criticum, in his Sämmtliche Werke, Stuttgart: Cotta, 1856–1861, div. 1, vol. 1.
  • –––, 1792/3, Ueber Mythen, historische Sagen und Philosopheme der ältesten Welt (On Myths, Historical Legends, and Philosophemes of the Oldest World), in his Sämmtliche Werke, div. 1, vol. 1.
  • –––, 1795, On the I as the Principle of Philosophy or On the Unconditional in Human Knowledge, F. Marti (trans. & ed.), Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press, 1980.
  • –––, 1795, Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism, in his The Unconditional in Human Knowledge.
  • –––, 1797, Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature, Errol E. Harris and Peter Heath (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • –––, 1798, Von der Weltseele (On the World Soul), Hamburg: Perthes.
  • Strauss, David Friedrich, 1835–6, Das Leben Jesu, kritisch bearbeitet (The Life of Jesus Critically Examined), Tübingen: C.F. Osiander.

Secondary Literature

  • Aarsleff, Hans, 1982, From Locke to Saussure: Essays on the Study of Language and Intellectual History, Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Adler, Emil, 1968, Herder und die deutsche Aufklärung, Vienna: Europa.
  • Adler, Hans, 2009, “Herder’s Style”, in Adler and Koepke 2009: 331–350.
  • Adler, Hans and Wulf Koepke (eds.), 2009, A Companion to the Works of Johann Gottfried Herder, Rochester, NY: Camden House.
  • Barnard, Frederick M., 1965, Herder’s Social and Political Thought: From Enlightenment to Nationalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2003, Herder on Nationality, Humanity, and History, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 1987, The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Enlightenment, Revolution, and Romanticism: The Genesis of Modern German Political Thought, 1790–1800, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
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