Notes to Contemporary Africana Philosophy

1. Parties to these debates, which center on the political and metaphysical dangers of unitary conceptions of specifically African identities, include Archie Mafeje, Achille Mbembe, and Ali Mazrui.

2. “Shifting the geography of reason” is the title of several Caribbean Philosophical Association conferences. See also Harney and Moten’s The Undercommons: Fugitive Planning and Black Study (2013).

3. This is a very quick gloss on Moten’s version of Robinson’s argument about Black Marxism’s determination to anticipate and repair certain Marxian oversights. Moten writes, “[T]he black radical tradition, as embodied in the figures of [C.L.R.] James and, for that matter, [Cedric] Robinson, has a complex origin of rupture and collision that moves across a range of negations of Europe. This is to say that the impossible location of the chain of origins of this tradition requires some movement in the not-in-between of conditions and foundations, some improvisation through that opposition, taking into account both retention and disruption, originality and response, in the tradition” (Moten 2017, 9–10).

4. See William R. Jones, Is God a White Racist 1973 [1998].

5. Ward Jones edited a 2011 special issue of the South African Journal of Philosophy devoted to commentaries on Vice’s original article; see South African Journal of Philosophy, 30 (4).

6. See, for example, Eze’s “African Feminism: Resistance or Resentment?” (2006) and Apusigah’s “Is Gender Yet Another Colonial Project? A Critique of Oyeronke Oyewumi’s Proposal” (2006).

7. The earlier article is Crenshaw’s ”Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex: A Black Feminist Critique of Antidiscrimination Doctrine, Feminist Theory and Antiracist Politics” (1989).

8. See Cohen’s “Punks, Bulldaggers, and Welfare Queens: The Radical Potential of Queer Politics?” (1997) and Snorton’s Black on Both Sides: A Racial History of Trans Identity (2017).

9. The promise of these projects is evident from Simpson’s “Black Philosophy and the Erotic” (2013) and James’s “Musing: A Black Feminist Philosopher: Is That Possible?” (2014).

10. For a reading and application of Appiah’s ideas, see Goodin’s “On the Very Idea of an Afro-Caribbeana Philosophy” (2000).

11. See also Metz’s “Ubuntu as a Moral Theory and Human Rights in South Africa” (2011) and Dladla’s “Towards an African Critical Philosophy of Race: Ubuntu as a Philo-Praxis of Liberation” (2017).

12. For an example of this work in an earlier period, see Taiwo’s “Post-Independence African Political Philosophy” (2004). Contemporary examples include Lamola’s “Senghor, Globalism, and Africanity” (2016), Diagne’s African Art as Philosophy: Senghor, Bergson and the Idea of Negritude (2012), and Abdel-Shehid and Kolia’s “In Light of the Master: Re-reading Césaire and Fanon” (2017).

13. Tracey Nicholls edited a 2011 special issue of the C.L.R. James Journal on the emancipatory thought of bell hooks; see C.L.R. James Journal 17 (1). See also Perry’s Looking for Lorraine: The Radiant and Radical Life of Lorraine Hansberry (2018) and Johnson’s forthcoming “Huey P. Newton and the Last Days of the Black Colony.”

14. “Afropessimism refers to the perception of sub–Saharan Africa as a region too riddled with problems for good governance and economic development” (Onwudiwe 2005, 33–35).

15. For one organization’s approach to the BLM idea, see Movement for Black Lives, “A Vision for Black Lives: Policy Demands for Black Power, Freedom & Justice.”

16. Monique Roelofs and Michael Kelly organized the Questioning Aesthetics Symposium on Black Aesthetics at Hampshire College in Amherst, Massachusetts, which took place from March 31–April 1, 2017. see Frankowski’s The Post-Racial Limits of Memorialization: Toward a Political Sense of Mourning (2015). A. W. Eaton and Charles Peterson edited a 2019 special issue of the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism on aesthetics and race; see Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 77 (4).

17. Nzegwu co-founded the organization with Olufemi Taiwo, John Ayotunde Isola Bewaji, and Leke Adeofe. See Taiwo’s “Presidential Address” at the 6th Annual Conference of the International Society for African Philosophy and Studies, University of Nairobi, Nairobi, Kenya, March 10–12, 2000, available at, accessed 7 October 2019.

18. For just one of many examples (many in the orbit of Gordon’s projects), see de Allen’s “In Search of Epistemic Freedom: Afro-Caribbean Philosophy’s Contributions to Continental Philosophy” (2012).

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