Contemporary Africana Philosophy

First published Mon Aug 9, 2021

Africana philosophy has in recent years become a going concern among professional academic philosophers. What counts as a contribution to this field and whether the field is sufficiently unified to count as a field are matters of some dispute, in part for reasons that scholars of Africana philosophy make it their business to explore. What is not in dispute is that reputable publishers now publish work in the area and reputable institutions now seek to hire scholars with specializations in the area, both states of affairs that did not obtain a few short years ago. (Another question these scholars sometimes explore: what counts as reputable, and why?)

The burden of this entry will be to indicate some lines of inquiry that have emerged since Africana philosophy began in earnest to consolidate its standing among professional philosophers. The entry will begin by introducing some framing themes, conditions, and principles, and will then gesture at the pre-history of contemporary Africana philosophy. The bulk of the work will then be devoted to exploring the way contemporary contributions fortify and expand the field while developing its animating themes.

1. Framing themes: circumscribing the topic

Early in his masterful Introduction to Africana Philosophy, Lewis R. Gordon defines his subject in a deceptively simple way that both anticipates important complexities and sets some basic boundaries. Africana philosophy, he says, is “as an area of philosophical research that addresses the problems faced and raised by the African diaspora” (Gordon 2008, 13). The references to problems and to the diaspora immediately point to two vital framing themes for the field.

1.1 Africanaity

The first theme has to do with the threshold metaphysical and socio-anthropological assumptions that underwrite the use of “Africana” as a modifier. Things that earn this modifier—people and practices most clearly, institutions and material objects somewhat less so—are supposed to be interestingly connected to the continent of Africa and, therefore, to each other. This raises obvious questions. What kind of connections count for this purpose? How strong do they have to be?

Arguments about how to account for the unity of the Africana condition comprise one of the recurring subjects of Africana philosophy. This has often taken the form of debates about “Africanity,” the key contours of which have been helpfully chronicled by Souleymane Bachir Diagne (2001).[1] Unfortunately, that concept is ambiguous between studies of African commonalities—of what, say, Ghanaians and Eritreans share that Britons of African descent may not—and studies of African diasporic continuities. In deference to the distinctiveness of the concerns animating these studies and of the conclusions they often reach, I will reserve the notion of Africanity for studies focused on the continent and introduce the notion of Africanaity to indicate an interest in wider diasporic connections.

This is not the place to consider in detail the threshold questions of Africanaity. Luckily it is a fairly intuitive concept, rooted in widely—if often dimly—understood facts about the social and political history of Africa and its peoples over the last several centuries. One can debate the precise meaning of these facts or the limits of the intuition underwriting the Africana idea. But the basic intuition, even for critics of its extended application in, say, a Pan-African politics, is provisionally useful as what Lucius T. Outlaw Jr. calls a “gathering notion,” used to capture the same insight that underwrites locutions like “of African descent,” and to prepare that insight for extension, critique, and elaboration (Outlaw 2004, 90).

1.2 Problematicity

The notion of Africanaity draws out the part of Gordon’s quick definition of Africana philosophy that focuses on the diaspora. But what about the rest? What does it mean to refer to the problems that the diaspora faces and raises? And why dwell on these problems as a way of framing this study?

Additional language from Gordon may be helpful. He explains:

Since there was no reason for the people of the African continent to have considered themselves African until that identity was imposed upon them through conquest and colonization in the modern era … this area of thought also refers to the unique set of questions raised by the emergence of “Africans” and their diaspora… . Such concerns include the convergence of most Africans with the racial term “black” and its many connotations. (Gordon 2008, 1)

Gordon’s point is that taking Africanaity seriously means asking about the conditions under which the concept came to have something to refer to. And to ask about these conditions is to explore a handful of social, methodological, and broadly philosophical problems, and to consider certain oddly robust links between these problems and the Africana condition.

I’ll refer to this constellation of problems and their connection to the Africana condition as problematicity. This second framing theme sets three vital tasks for the field.

First, it is important to grapple responsibly with the very real problems that face Africa and its diaspora. There are many obvious examples, from imperial incursions and forced migrations to asymmetric integration into the world economy and authoritarian post-independence governance. Philosophical inquirers may take these conditions as their subject matter, but they will also have to grapple with the way these conditions shape and constrain the prospects for intellectual work.

Second, it is equally important, if not more so, to call out and correct for the tendency to assume that Africana communities don’t just face problems but are also somehow inherently prone to them. The thought here is that the condition of Africanaity is not simply about facing problems, but also, in a way, about being a problem. I’ve borrowed this way of putting it from a germinal formulation by one of the canonical figures of Africana thought. Early in his career, W.E.B. Du Bois famously invited his readers to consider a puzzling question on behalf of people racialized as Black: how does it feel to be a problem? (Du Bois “Of Our Spiritual Strivings” [1903] 1986, 363). That is (in part) to say: how does it feel to move through life as a living representative of a society’s ethical lapses and epistemic incapacities, and to contend with the social pressure to think of oneself as the source of these problems? In light of the substantial overlap between Africanaity and Blackness, the tendency “to view Black people as a problem people” is very much at issue for Africa and its diaspora (West 1999, 104).

The phenomenological depth of this second mode of problematicity points to a third mode, which involves not simply facing or being a problem, but also raising problems. We’ve already seen this at work to some degree, in the way the Africana idea prompts questions in metaphysics, ethics, and epistemology. But Africanaity also raises deeper problems of method and world-view and, in some senses of the word, ontology. The discursive event that V. Y. Mudimbe (1988) dubs “the invention of Africa” complicates or, one might say, short-circuits certain standard modern modes of philosophical comportment—or, better put, forces philosophical Euro-modernity to misrepresent and perhaps misunderstand its actual animating imperatives. This complication leads Hegel to extrude Africa from his staging of world history while doing considerable violence to actual history and to geography. It leads figures like Thomas Jefferson and John Locke to mirror the contradictions of modern political thought in their works and their lives. It leads Fanon (in another germinal contribution to Africana thought) to note that reason walks out of the room when he walks in. Thoughts like these have inspired Gordon (2000) and others to organize a great deal of fruitful philosophical work around the epistemological challenges of “shifting the geography of reason” and of bringing the human sciences to bear on populations whose members are often only tenuously regarded as human.[2]

(To be clear: the claim here is not that African-descended people and cultures are somehow problematic by nature. Sober reflection on the empirical evidence and on plausible meanings of “by nature” cannot sustain that thought. The claim is that a) Euro-modernity was in some ways built on the conviction that African-descended people are inherently problematic, and that b) philosophical interventions that resist this conviction become problems, render themselves problematic, for hegemonic approaches to philosophy.)

The point of starting with these framing themes is to mark certain vital contexts for Africana philosophical reflection. To study Africana philosophy is, first of all, to do the things one does in other areas of philosophy: consider a range of characteristic questions and problems, study a cohort of canonical figures and texts, participate in living debates organized around familiar tropes and moves, and so on. But it is also to do these things in contexts defined by foundational questions—about, for example, the nature of philosophical inquiry, the structure and impact of concrete mechanisms for knowledge production, and even the humanity of the inquirers—to a degree that is fairly unusual. As an emblem of this, consider that the establishment of African philosophy as a respectable subject of study—in a sense of “respectable” to be fleshed out below—began with debates over a single, simple, now-obsolete question: can Africans even do philosophy?

Having worked through the themes that emerged from Gordon’s deceptively simple definition of Africana philosophy, we are now in a better position to receive a similar but more elaborate definition. Outlaw describes “Africana philosophy” as “a third-order, metaphilosophical, umbrella-concept… . [T]he name does not refer to a particular philosophy, philosophical system, method, or tradition” (Outlaw 2017, §1, par. 1). It refers instead to a field of study that emerges from the distinctive conditions that produce and implicate Africa and its diaspora, that takes seriously the experiences and reflections of the peoples who are most directly affected and implicated by those conditions, and that, as a result of the first two factors, tends to feature certain recurring preoccupations or themes. Some of those preoccupations and themes appear above, and will receive more attention, alongside several additional themes, in the sections to come.

(Outlaw also identifies a number of “key heuristic presumptions” that can help to ward off easy misconceptions [Outlaw 2017, §1, par. 2]. The most important of these presumptions are that a) there are responsible ways to account for the unity and distinctiveness of the phenomena that bear the predicate “Africana”; b) these accounts do not presuppose uniformity and homogeneity among Africana peoples and cultures, and they need not aspire to or prescribe such uniformity; and c) “contributors [to Africana philosophy] need not be persons African or of African descent” (Outlaw 2017, §1, par. 5). As noted above, this entry will not delve any further into these presumptions. Readers seeking reassurance about these issues may consult the foundational texts that Outlaw (2017) and Gordon (2008) explore in their overviews of the field.)

2. Framing conditions: coloniality, heterodoxy, and historicity

Studies of Africana philosophy and its subfields routinely begin by acknowledging that these became recognized areas of professional scholarly study only recently. These acknowledgments implicate three framing conditions that are crucial for understanding the field.

The first condition has to do with a version of what Elena Ruíz calls “epistemic imperialism.” This is her name for states of affairs in which hegemonic modes of epistemic practice “reproduce interpretive conditions favorable to the dominant assumptions.” Philosophical activity under these conditions “creates and maintains interpretive spaces in philosophy that are self-confirming rather than culturally open and plural,” and also “clears the way for the devaluation of non-dominant intellectual traditions through tacit methodological assumptions” (Ruíz 2018, 52–53). What this means is that oppressive conditions exclude their victims from knowledge production not simply by preventing people with certain bodies, backgrounds, beliefs, or other distinguishing features from entering the institutions charged with knowledge work, but also by engineering the conceptual and theoretical tools to promote epistemic numbness and turn exclusion into erasure.

Issues of epistemic imperialism bear on Africana philosophy because hegemonic institutions have historically recognized, and to a considerable degree still recognize, philosophic interventions as achieving scholarly respectability by appeal to standards calibrated to colonial and apartheid imperatives. One very short version of this story is that the most influential university systems in the contemporary world—including in Africa and the Caribbean—started as the creations and tools of European colonial powers or settler colonial authorities. (This is only one version of the story because it is not, of course, a story simply about university systems. It is also a story about, among other things, publishing houses, dictionaries, the word “philosophy,” and the baggage that European elite cultures attached to all of these things. Outlaw and Gordon also tell this story well.) Consequently, and not surprisingly, it was only in the years after colonized peoples won formal independence and apartheid regimes formally embraced democracy that these institutions began in any thoroughgoing way to credit research programs and curricular initiatives not animated by assumptions about African backwardness, savagery, or barbarism.

The fact that it took many, many years for hegemonic Euro-modern inquirers to begin to disentangle epistemic norms from colonial and apartheid imperatives highlights the second contextual consideration, call this “the condition of heterodoxy.” Much of the work that sets the agenda for Africana philosophy was produced largely outside of the forums that elite European-influenced intellectual cultures considered respectable. In some cases, this meant that African-descended scholars worked in alternative, often racially segregated, institutions and shared their research in alternative spaces. In other cases, it meant that these scholars worked on the margins of mainstream institutions, enjoying or enduring highly constrained interactions with the people who under different circumstances would have been their colleagues and interlocutors. In the vast majority of cases, it meant that people in African and African-descended communities refined and employed their own mechanisms for producing knowledge. In all of these cases, it meant that Africana intellectual work was importantly heretical or heterodox.

Africana philosophy’s relatively recent arrival on the scene of “respectable” knowledge production points to the third framing condition for the field, its manifest historicity. The field’s unavoidable status as an artifact of evolving sociopolitical conditions puts historical dynamics at issue here in a way that other fields (outside of the history of philosophy) can usually evade. Because of this, a study of contemporary activity must begin by attending to the development of the field over time, on at least three levels. It is important to attend to the development of certain ideas and to the canonization of certain texts and figures, to consider the evolving social and institutional conditions under which Africana philosophers did their work, and to credit the degree to which reconsiderations of the history constitute a thriving area of contemporary study.

3. History in contemporary perspective: guiding principles

Intellectual and institutional histories are unusually central to Africana philosophy, and are intertwined to an unusual degree, but this is not the place to explore the institutional histories in detail. The next section will provide a contemporary intellectual history, in order to establish the structural elements and thematic preoccupations that organize a great deal of the contemporary work we’ll soon consider. Still, it is important to organize the discussion in a way that makes room for responsible institutional histories and accommodates their insights.

Accordingly, three principles will guide the discussion to come. First, this study will focus on Africana philosophy as a field. This means that the contributions of individual thinkers, however provocative or insightful, will be relevant here largely insofar as they bear on the networks of intellectual exchange and institutional credentialing that invite description with terms like “discipline” and “tradition.” It also means observing a distinction between the history of Africana philosophy as an enterprise and the history of African-descended philosophers as a cohort. Many members of this cohort have of course made valuable, germinal contributions to the field, beginning with towering figures like Alexander Crummell, whose establishment of the American Negro Academy was an early exercise in building these networks. But many others, as Stephen C. Ferguson II points out, “need not (and have not) exclusively engaged the Africana experience as an area of inquiry” (Ferguson 2009, 23). The former will be part of the story told here; the latter will not.

Second, this study will focus, to some degree, on professional academic work. Philosophical activity outside of the academy—in other institutional spaces or prior to the emergence of contemporary universities and their professional scholars—will not be peremptorily excluded here, but will be relevant insofar as it bears on the work that happens or might happen in or near the academy. The academy is of course not the only site for responsible attempts at knowledge production, but it is a mechanism for systematically enshrining certain of these attempts as resources for more work. That is the aspect of Africana philosophy that I mean to take up here.

Third, the discussion will approach the field as a paradisciplinary formation, which is to say that it will focus on work that happens or might happen in and near philosophy departments. In speaking here of proximity to philosophy departments, I mean principally to capture two overlapping categories of thinkers: scholars who take up recognizably philosophical themes or resources in, say, departments of English or political science; and historical figures without the sort of departmental affiliation that registers for scholars now, but who make the kinds of moves and noises that encourage philosophers to invite them into their narratives of the field. Which is to say: if philosophy of social science can have Clifford Geertz and philosophy writ large can have Hume, Kierkegaard, Emerson, and Jane Addams, then Africana philosophy can have Patricia Hill Collins and Alexander Crummell (both of whom will return below).

It is important to remain in the orbit of the academic discipline of philosophy for at least three reasons: to preserve space for reflection on the distinctly philosophical questions that Africanaity puts in play, to cultivate distinctly philosophical resources for treating those questions, and to credit the contributions and career trajectories of the few African-descended philosophers who did their work before the field established itself as a going concern. At the same time, though, focusing just on work by card-carrying philosophers would be unduly restrictive. For one thing, the discipline and the profession have long been hostile both to sustained reflection on the issues that define the field and, in quite concrete ways, to the humans who attempted to undertake this reflection. As a result, much of this reflection has happened and continues to happen in other places—in political theory, sociology, literary theory, artistic practice, and more. In addition, and as a related matter, Africana philosophy has in practice long been remarkably ecumenical, as the contributor lists for key reference works makes clear. Excluding the political theorists, sociologists, Black studies scholars, and others who have worked, often in conversation with professional philosophers, to advance the field would not only needlessly limit the available resources but would also run counter to ongoing practice.

With these guiding principles in place, and in deference to the framing conditions of historicity, coloniality, and heterodoxy, the next section will present a swift history of Africana philosophy. Constructing historical narratives is always, to some degree, a presentist exercise: it is an attempt to read the past while guided by contemporary concerns and informed by contemporary resources. This reading will lean into that aspect of the exercise—it is, in effect, a reading of the history as seen in contemporary perspective, and is therefore also a way of wading a bit further into the contemporary preoccupations that are the subject of this entry.

This presentist orientation recommends sorting the history into two broad stages. The first is a long pre-history of the paradisciplinary formation under scrutiny here, a period, prior to the establishment of the field in hegemonic epistemic communities, during which many key themes, issues, texts, and figures emerged. The second is a shorter, more recent stage, itself composed of three shorter periods, during which the field established itself, achieved consolidation, and moved into the contemporary moment.

4. Stage one: emergence

Like other areas of philosophical study, Africana philosophy emerged and matured as its practitioners identified and continued to explore a set of core elements. Of the texts, figures, debates, movements, schools, and themes that have come to organize conversations in and contributions to the field, many came into focus during the first stage of Africana philosophy’s history. Some had long careers outside the academy as resources for political mobilization, existential sustenance, aesthetic experience, and critical edification, while others were the product of explicitly scholarly reflection. (And some were both.) Whatever their origin, many of these early heterodox elements have made or are making their way into an academic world that long wanted little to do with them, and they continue to set the agenda for contemporary work.

Precisely locating the start of this early period once more raises potentially knotty metaphysical and empirical puzzles. Before the idea of Africa as a unitary entity gained sufficient traction (precisely when this happened is the empirical puzzle), nothing interestingly identifiable as African or Africana philosophy existed. There was a great deal of philosophizing in the place that would come to be called Africa, and there may be reasons to link those early activities to the self-consciously African-oriented reflections that would emerge later. But Gordon is surely right to say that reading ancient Egypt or Kush as what some scholars call a classical African civilization “must … be a modern imposition onto the past” (Gordon 2008, 15). He is also right to point out that we typically allow this imposition, often without comment, in other contexts—in studies of Asian philosophy, for example, or in assuming the organic coherence of western philosophy from Greece to, say Germany.

Origin puzzles aside, the long run-up to Africana philosophy’s arrival as a professional paradisciplinary formation yielded a number of themes that figure prominently in accounts of the field. Section 4.1 will introduce some of these characteristic themes, while Section 4.2 will consider the question of thematic unity across regions, introducing some of the core thinkers along the way.

4.1 Characteristic themes

After noting the framing themes of (1) Africanaity and (2) problematicity, as discussed above, we might follow Gordon (2008) and Outlaw (2017) in noting additional preoccupations like the following:

  1. Philosophical anthropology (because the question of the human of course looms large for people whose assumed status as subhuman is one of the foundation stones of European modernity)
  2. Liberation (for obvious reasons, beginning with the ethical and existential burdens of living in oppressive circumstances and of finding the balance between justifiable resistance and unethical overreach)
  3. Meta-reflections on reason (because the meaning of reason looms large for people typically assumed to be emotive, sensual, non-rational brutes, people whose life chances were constrained by, among other things, powerful forms of what we now call epistemic injustice)
  4. Identity and self-consciousness (because epistemic injustice often hampers the pursuit of self-knowledge, and raises the ethical and existential stakes of responsibly constructing the self)
  5. Theoretical archaeology (this is Dotson’s (2017) term for, as Outlaw puts it (2004), the recovery of underappreciated contributions by African-descended individuals and cultures)

These themes are not at all the exclusive preserve of Africana thinkers. The key to Africana thought is the way these themes converge on and grow out of the condition of Africanaity, which is bound up with distinctive modes of racialization and rooted in a particular universe of overlapping but distinct histories, geographies, and cultural practices.

Africana philosophy of course puts many more themes in play than these few. But extending the list and reducing the space available for explaining what the list means is at this point less useful than considering what it means for this enterprise to be rooted in overlapping sociohistorical contexts. This requires shifting from a study of unifying themes to a reflection on the centrifugal forces that pull Africana philosophers in the direction of distinctive regional and methodological preoccupations.

Before moving on to these narrower considerations of region and method, though, a final overarching theme requires mention. Adeshina Afolayan and Toyin Falola conclude their introduction to the excellent Palgrave Handbook of African Philosophy by identifying a newly pressing need that informs their editorial approach. African philosophers have, they say, long focused on consolidating their professional standing and navigating intramural scholarly debates. However understandable that was, it is time, Afolayan and Falola suggest, for “African philosophy to get on the street and get their theories dirtied by the predicament on the continent” (Afolayan and Falola 2017, 12). In other words, African philosophy should embrace its status as what Outlaw (2017), following Leonard Harris (following Frederick Douglass), calls a “philosophy born of struggle.” This is clearly one of the overriding themes for Africana philosophy as a whole, and should be added to the list.

  1. Philosophy born of struggle (because philosophical reflection is not a leisure exercise devoted to unwinding abstract puzzles, or it is not just or always or most crucially that. It is (among other things) a practice of bringing philosophical impulses and resources to bear on certain pressing problems of life, and of exercising philosophical impulses unrelated to those problems—impulses related instead, say, to beauty, or to the theory of knowledge—despite the burdens of frequently problematic situations)

4.2 Regional continuities and discontinuities

Scholars routinely distinguish three broad regional approaches to Africana philosophy, one for the continent of Africa and two for the regions where the vast majority of participants in the diaspora reside: the Caribbean and the Americas. These regions are not just geographically distinct but also have importantly different histories and constellations of cultures, not least because of the internal complexities that complicate region-wide generalizations. In addition, these different regions occupy different places in global networks for mainstream knowledge production, which gives them different, and differently weighted, opportunities for publishing and scholarly exchange. In light of these conditions, it is not surprising that the occupants of each region often find themselves taking up distinctive questions and problems, and pursuing them using modes of philosophical reflection and generic touchstones—specific texts and figures—that are to some degree regionally specific.

Regional specificity notwithstanding, the condition of Africanaity means in part that important thematic continuities stretch across the regions. Some concern the role of violence in anti-racist struggle, the meaning of African roots for people in the diaspora, and the tensions between race-based, class-based, and gender-based approaches to social justice that call forth talk of intersectionality and related concepts. Others are importantly rooted in the overarching themes noted above, with special emphasis on decolonization, anti-slavery agitation, and anti-imperial struggle.

Despite these continuities, concerns that distinguish the regions are not far to seek. For example, Gordon (2008) reasonably suggests that the question of the modern might be one of Africana philosophy’s unifying themes. But each region tends to adopt its own approach. African thinkers often explore the relationship between modernity and tradition, sometimes linking the prospects for liberation to the prospects for modernizing Africa, while at other times complicating the easy distinction between the traditional and the modern and the easy conflation of modernization with civilization and of both with Europe. Afro-Caribbean thinkers, by contrast, tend to be less interested in a distant “traditional” world than in the world that resulted from the collision of forced migrants, indigenous peoples, and settler colonists. This approach eventuates in, among much else, Edouard Glissant’s (1989) studies of creolité. In the Americas, finally, different demographic conditions and historical trajectories led many (but of course not all) prominent figures to turn the question of tradition into debates about racial uplift and racial integration.

4.3 Complications

The period of emergence set the stage for contemporary work in Africana philosophy by establishing many of the key elements that would come to define the field. Careful study of the period, however, reveals some important challenges that continue to confront contemporary work.

One important complication is the overlay of bias that constrains standard notions of what counts as an intellectual contribution and of who counts as a contributor. The standard notions tend to focus on the written output of elite men, even in studies of populations, cultures, and societies that are not at the top of the relevant social hierarchies. Considering the reasons for these biases is beyond the scope of this piece, though we can say that some reasons are better than others. (To be sure, writerly output—literature—is easier to track and preserve than orature. But even the written contributions of women are routinely ignored or excluded from the economies of writerly production.)

Suffice it to say for now that one of the recurring challenges of Africana thought in its philosophical modes has to do with crediting the philosophical labor that goes into assembling a responsible life under absurd conditions, when the laborers don’t look or act like standard-issue philosophers. For recent thinkers like Fred Moten (2017) in his study of artist Thornton Dial, this is sometimes a question about the philosophical significance of aesthetic productions. For others, as we’ll soon consider further, it is a question about the philosophical content of political activism or of vernacular cultures. It is almost always, of course, a question about crediting the work of women and people without wealth, high incomes, homes, and other markers of high socioeconomic status.

A second important complication is rooted in a simple question: what happens to local or national traditions if one focuses on broadly regional approaches to Africana philosophy? One way to ask this question is to focus on the differences between, say, Haiti and Jamaica, and on the differences between Antenor Firmin and Marcus Garvey. Another way is to insist on the integrity and importance of distinct national traditions of recognized and recognizably philosophical activity, as Teodros Kiros (2004) and a number of scholars do in relation to figures like the 17th century Ethiopian philosopher Zera Yacob.

There are two things to say about this possible tension between the regional or transnational and the local or national. First, it is eminently possible for analyses at different scales to co-exist. The question is just whether there is sufficient warrant to sustain an analysis at each level. One of the main aims of the early stages of professional Africana philosophy, as we’ll soon see, was precisely to show that there was a transnational enterprise related to Africanaity that required—and had long provoked—philosophical reflection. This in no way precludes more local studies. Second, one of the central claims of Africana philosophy is that local contexts are often profoundly informed by broader dynamics. Whether those dynamics matter in specific cases is a matter to be settled by appeal to the details of the cases. One undeniable feature of the modern world is the way globe-spanning ideas about things like race, reason, and civilization have shaped the life chances of large swathes of humanity for generations. This would seem to have some bearing on philosophical activity in African communities and communities in its diaspora.

5. Stage two: establishment and consolidation

The first phase of Africana philosophy’s emergence eventually gives way to a period of establishment and consolidation for the field as a field. During this time the themes and concerns from the earlier philosophies born of struggle, inflected by regional concerns, make their way into the orbit of professional philosophy. Along the way, they get translated into the distinctive vocabularies of the discipline’s subfields and methodological schools, creatively expanding those vocabularies in the process. (Or they acknowledge the possibility of this translation and resist or complicate it.)

We can say that the first phase ends and emergence gives way to establishment when the field begins to get traction among teachers and researchers in academic philosophy. Kwasi Wiredu explains in his classic Companion to African Philosophy that this didn’t begin to happen in African universities until the middle to late sixties, as independence ushered in “significant numbers of post-independence African academics” (Wiredu 2004, 2). Similarly, Outlaw points out that the field has become more established as “successive generations of persons of African descent have entered the profession” in the wake of anti-racist liberation struggles, and as these persons organized conferences and other mechanisms for networking and scholarly exchange, often across national and regional boundaries (Outlaw 2017, §10, par. 2).

If establishment begins with the arrival of Wiredu’s and Outlaw’s academics, it reaches its apex in the 1980s. This is the point at which a number of germinal contributions make their way into print. Think here of Richard A. Wright’s African Philosophy: An Introduction (1984), Cornel West’s Prophesy Deliverance! (1982), Angela Davis’s Women, Race, and Class (1983), the first edition of Leonard Harris’s Philosophy Born of Struggle (1983), V. Y. Mudimbe’s The Invention of Africa (1988), and Edouard Glissant’s Caribbean Discourses (1989).

The 1990s and early 2000s were the years of consolidation. This is the point at which a wave of more securely positioned scholarly professionals produced work destined for wider influence than the work of the previous era. Think here of Kwame Anthony Appiah’s In My Father’s House (1993), Charles W. Mills’s The Racial Contract (1997), Lucius T. Outlaw Jr.’s On Race and Philosophy (1996), Lewis R. Gordon’s Bad Faith and Antiblack Racism (1995), Paget Henry’s Caliban’s Reason (2000), Kwame Gyekye’s Tradition and Modernity (1997), the first edition of Patricia Hill Collins’s Black Feminist Thought (1990), and the revised edition of Bernard R. Boxill’s Blacks and Social Justice (1992).

As Africana philosophy becomes a professionally recognized field (as opposed to a vibrant but heterodox enterprise or tradition, overlapping only slightly with mainstream knowledge production), the work begins, one might say, to riff on the discipline’s accepted movements and schools. Africana professional philosophers put mainstream professional resources into conversation with many of the concerns and innovations that animated the earlier philosophies born of struggle. Far from simply applying sophisticated resources to pre-philosophical raw material, this exercise at its best blends two modes of philosophical reflection. One enjoys mainstream recognition, while the other benefits from testing and refinement by application in areas that its counterpart ignores; and each can, in principle, compensate for shortcomings in the other. What results is work that often—as Moten, following Robinson, says of Black radical Marxism—involves both “retention and disruption, originality and response” (Moten 2017, 9–10).[3] (It is also what one might say of the difference that Afro-diasporic musical practices made in and to European traditions, producing new forms like samba and jazz along the way. Hence the appeal to “riffing.”)

Understanding this transformative, improvisational relationship is a precondition to properly locating the contributions to the periods of emergence and consolidation. With this in mind one can acknowledge that Davis and Outlaw both contribute to and draw from the tradition of critical theory, without diminishing either their originality or their traditional fluency. In similar ways, West and Harris riff on the pragmatist tradition, Mudimbe and Glissant creatively appropriate and employ post-structuralist resources, Gordon and Henry, following William R. Jones and others,[4] develop an Africana form of existential phenomenology, and Appiah and Boxill represent Africana thought in an analytic key.

I’ll somewhat arbitrarily nominate 2003–2004 as the cutoff between the period of consolidation and the contemporary moment. These years saw the publication of Tommy L. Lott and John P. Pittman’s Companion to African-American Philosophy and Wiredu’s Companion to African Philosophy. I would say of both volumes something like what Afolayan and Falola say of the Wiredu volume: that they constitute “a significant nod to the appearance of African[a] philosophy in … global academe” (Afolayan and Falola 2017, 1).

6. Reading the contemporary—structure

Contemporary Africana philosophy builds on the periods of emergence, establishment, and consolidation in four broad ways. Some thinkers work to fortify and expand the field’s store of germinal texts and figures. Others continue to improvise on the defining traits of the mainstream schools and movements. Still others complicate and broaden the map of regional preoccupations. And interventions of all three types push new themes and debates, or new takes on older themes and debates, toward the center of the field. The first three will be the subject of this section, while the fourth will be the subject of Section 7.

6.1 Fortifying and expanding, tentpoles and theoretical archeology

One benefit of the long run-up to the contemporary moment in Africana philosophy is that a tradition of thought has emerged with core figures, texts, and questions. The tradition itself then becomes grist for the mill of philosophical activity. Some of this activity goes to identifying and shoring up (what some people think of as) the historical foundations of the field, while some goes to expanding the edifice that has been built atop those foundations.

One version of what I’m referring to as fortification or shoring up is the outcome of a heightened focus on a few high-profile icons—call this the “tentpole approach.” These are notables like Cooper, Du Bois, and Fanon, the touchstone figures—Gordon refers to them as the pillars of African American philosophy—with the clearest prima facie cases for canonical status. As more philosophers examine the work of these figures and produce more commentary on them and each other, subfields start to grow up around them. This gives Africana philosophy that familiar subdisciplinary shape, whereby anyone who knows anything about the area must have something to say about a handful of towering figures. One clear and influential example of this sort of intervention is Robert Gooding-Williams’s (2009) magisterial In the Shadow of Du Bois.

The tentpole approach is useful not just for fortification but also for expansion. The expansionist version focuses on iconic figures that have yet to receive the sort of attention from philosophers that they’ve received elsewhere. The aim here—sometimes explicitly undertaken as an exercise in Africana thought, sometimes simply as an exercise in responsible scholarship—is to give figures like James Baldwin, Martin Luther King, Jr., Lorraine Hansberry, and Audre Lorde the kind of attention that Gordon’s pillars have received. Tommie Shelby and Brandon M. Terry’s (2018) volume on King and Imani Perry’s (2018) study of Hansberry exemplify this tendency.

An alternative to the tentpole approach, also with expansionist and fortificationist varieties, focuses less on iconic figures than on the broader sweep of the tradition that has grown up around the icons. The fortificationist approach here involves recovering the figures and ideas with which the icons were in conversation, thereby recovering not just the work of individual thinkers but also their environing epistemic communities and discursive contexts. This is the spirit in which Brittney Cooper’s (2017) Beyond Respectability recovers the work of Fannie Barrier Williams with the National Association of Colored Women at the turn of the twentieth century. The expansionist version of this approach studies neglected texts or figures, either to mine them for philosophical insight or to fill in otherwise piecemeal histories. In this spirit, John H. McClendon III and Stephen C. Ferguson II (2019) offer their remarkable new volume African American Philosophers and Philosophy to press for the recovery of card-carrying academic philosophers of African descent.

6.2 Transforming schools and movements

A second broad category of activity in contemporary Africana philosophy involves something like the improvisational approach discussed above. Here we find scholars creatively reinventing mainstream philosophical traditions, schools, and methods using resources from Africana thought. For reasons of space, I can only mention a few examples here, and must do so swiftly, on the way to covering this category with nowhere near the depth or breadth it deserves.

The clearest examples of this transformative tendency often carry the same misleadingly simple adjectival labels as Cedric Robinson’s Black Marxism. Consider Gordon’s pioneering efforts, in Existentia Africana (2000) and elsewhere, to define an Africana and decolonial mode of existential phenomenology, and to build what has become a globe-spanning intellectual community around it. Or consider what Gordon calls “African-American pragmatism,” which has continued to grow and develop in the wake of the germinal interventions by West and Harris (Gordon 2008, 93–99). Eddie Glaude (2007) in particular makes clear that this work is not simply about Black people appropriating canonical philosophic resources (or, less kindly, about canonical theory “in blackface,” as it were). Very much in the spirit of Robinson’s intervention, it is about the way Africana intellectual traditions sometimes anticipate and improve upon the moves that define our artificially circumscribed mainstream traditions, and about contemporary scholars putting these traditions into mutually enriching conversation.

What Gordon calls “African American analytical philosophy” (2008, 110) deserves special mention here, as it brings tools from the dominant philosophical paradigm in the Anglophone world to bear on Africana thought’s distinctive themes, issues, and figures. Mills and Shelby, who join Gordon in the top tier of Africana philosophy’s most visible and influential figures, work squarely and creatively in the ethico-political wing of this tradition, building on the work of founders like Boxill and Appiah with results that will receive further consideration below. Similar inroads are becoming apparent in aesthetics (Taylor 2016), epistemology (Dotson 2017), philosophy of language (Anderson 2015), and other fields.

6.3 Shifting geographies

A third broad focus in contemporary Africana philosophy reimagines the regional mapping discussed above. The common tripartite division between the continent, the Caribbean, and the Americas is reasonable, as far as it goes. But some newer work emphasizes the areas that this scheme leaves out.

One area of focus refuses to reduce the diaspora to the Caribbean and the United States, and explores relatively underappreciated Africana communities. One approach here, championed by Chike Jeffers (2012), Peter James Hudson and Aaron Kamugisha (2014), and others, considers the prospects for specifically Canadian forms of Africana thought. Another approach focuses on the diaspora in Europe. Alanna Lockward’s (2013) BEBoP (Black Europe Body Politics) curatorial project is one striking example of this work, as are the contributions by Barnor Hesse (2009) and others to the volume Black Europe and the African Diaspora.

A second area focuses on certain internal complexities of the standard racialized geography. This is the spirit in which a growing cohort of thinkers is taking up the question of Africa’s white inhabitants. These descendants of the settler colonial populations have come of age at some remove from the colonial incursion, were born on the continent, and, especially in South Africa, have their fortunes and senses of themselves bound up in complicated ways with Africa’s prospects. It is unsurprising, then, that their place on the continent and, as we’ll see below, in the discipline, has become a subject of philosophical reflection. Samantha Vice’s (2010) germinal essay, “How Do I Live in This Strange Place?”, anchored a version of this discussion in South Africa.[5]

7. Reading the contemporary—evolving themes

While the three broad categories of activity discussed so far explore themes that bear on the structure of Africana philosophy as a field, the fourth category reflects more directly on the field’s evolving thematic emphases. A number of contemporary interventions update these defining themes in light of evolving conditions, debates, and conceptual resources. Several suggestive examples follow.

7.1 Gender and sexuality

One of the key areas of contemporary interest in Africana philosophy—the study of gender and sexuality—is both promising and difficult to summarize. In fact, describing it as a single area would be unforgivably misleading were it not for the expository constraints of this exercise and for all of the qualifications that will soon follow. It is less an area than an array of topics and issues that have yet to come into focus as a subfield in Africana philosophy in the way they have elsewhere. A detailed study of the reasons for the field’s elusiveness are beyond the scope of this entry, but it is worth noting that the most obvious factors—the existence of structures that have historically discouraged or openly excluded the study of these issues or the participation of the people most likely to take an interest in them—are among the subjects that researchers in this area take up.

These difficulties notwithstanding, studies of gender and sexuality are becoming increasingly prominent in Africana philosophy, thanks in part to a thaw in the historically constraining structures mentioned above. The issues driving these studies are not new, however, so one way to choose a path through this sprawling territory involves simply tracking the impact of some germinal texts and influential authors from earlier periods. Proceeding in this way will require speeding past a version of the important question posed by Saba Fatima and her colleagues (2017): how do the various fields that might implicate or transect Africana studies of gender and sexuality—fields like decolonial feminism, Black queer theory, women of color feminism, third world feminism, Black feminism, and so on—relate to each other? Treating this difficulty with the care it deserves is beyond the scope of this project. I will simply stipulate to two assumptions: that the categories “Black” and “Africana” overlap sufficiently to justify treating studies of Black gender and Black sexuality as relevant for Africana thought; and that expanding the zone of overlap to include thinkers who might self-identify with one of the other categories (decolonial, third world, etc.) will reveal some useful continuities in the various projects.

One influential text to consider is Collins’s Black Feminist Thought. The editors of the journal Ethnic and Racial Studies introduce an anniversary symposium on the book by noting that its publication “can be seen as a turning point in the study of the intersections between race, class and gender… . Indeed, in terms of books on race and ethnicity that have been published over recent decades, few, if any, have surpassed it in terms of its reach as well as its influence” (Bulmer and Solomos 2015, 2314). This influence extends well into philosophy, as indicated by the two philosophers, both black feminists, who participated in a 2015 symposium otherwise made up of (theory-oriented) social scientists. Focusing briefly on their work will provide useful windows onto emerging developments in the field.

Kristie Dotson and Kathryn Belle testify eloquently in word and deed to Collins’s impact on their work, and thereby to Collins’ impact on the field. Dotson describes Black Feminist Thought as “one of the most comprehensive treatments of knowledge problems and the oppression of black women in the USA to date,” and praises the way it “highlights epistemological failures as an important layer of oppression” (Dotson 2015, 2323). Dotson’s research (2012, 2017) draws this (and many other influences) out in the direction of (among much else) a political epistemology that engages vigorously with the conditions that have both excluded Black feminism from philosophy and obscured the coherence and relevance of Black feminist intellectual traditions. This scholarly production is continuous with Dotson’s efforts in other spheres, like her work with Kimberlé Crenshaw’s African American Policy Forum and the trainings she offers on feminist pedagogy.

While Dotson focuses on the epistemological dimensions of Collins’s exercises in “critical social theory” (Collins 1989, xiv), Belle focuses on its existential and phenomenological dimensions. She explains that Collins’s work “underscores the importance of safe spaces for Black women to speak freely as a necessary condition of resistance and empowerment” (Belle 2015, 2345). This orientation to agency, voice, and discursive community clearly informs Belle’s work as a scholar (Davidson, Gines, and Marcano 2010). But it also shapes her work as an institution-builder, most clearly as the driving force behind the Collegium for Black Women Philosophers, which since 2007 has aimed, as she puts it, “to create a safe space for Black women philosophers … to support, encourage and learn from one another” (Belle 2015, 2345).

If the opportunity to “inherit” the work of Patricia Hill Collins (as Dotson [2015] puts it in the title to her piece on Collins) has inspired two influential figures in contemporary U.S. Black feminist philosophy, the issues at the heart of another author’s germinal text help drive another strain in Africana philosophical studies of gender and sexuality. Nigerian sociologist Oyeronke Oyewumi’s The Invention of Women (1997) helped make her, as Azille Coetzee and Annemie Halsema put it, “one of the most famous and at the same time contested scholars in African feminist thought” (Coetzee and Halsema 2018, 179). Douglas Ficek explains that her “central claim is that gender is not an indigenous organizing principle in Yorùbáland, that the ‘body-reasoning’ and ‘bio-logic’ of the West are present neither in the language nor in the epistemology of the Yorùbá” (Ficek 2006, 543). This view immediately inspired considerable pushback, including sustained scrutiny from multiple contributors to the special African feminisms issue of Quest: A Journal of African Philosophy that appeared in 2006.[6] Oyewumi’s arguments still help frame contemporary efforts to rethink the role of gender in African life, as evidenced by her prominent role in the articles on gender and feminism in the recent Palgrave Companion (e.g., du Toit and Coetzee 2017).

Legal theorist Kimberlé Crenshaw has provided another cornerstone for ongoing contemporary reflection on gender and sexuality, but has important (and underappreciated) implications well beyond these areas. In two germinal articles from 1989 and 1991, she introduced an account of intersectionality that inspired “the kind of interdisciplinary and global engagement” that “[v]ery few theories have generated” (Carbado et al. 2013, 303). She says in the second of these articles that she began using the notion of intersectionality “to denote the various ways in which race and gender interact to shape the multiple dimensions of Black women’s employment experiences” (Crenshaw 1991, 1244).[7] A cottage industry of commentary and analysis has grown up from this simple beginning, with scholars, artists, critics, and activists debating the meanings and proper uses of “intersectionality” nearly as much as they employ it. Intersectionality remains a hotly contested notion in part because it raises a variety of deeply philosophical questions. Scholars have asked, for example, what intersectionality means for theories of personal identity, whether it adequately captures the complexity of human experience, how it bears on the prospects for coalition politics, why this notion stands out from a family of related, older notions in social theory that do similar work, whether standard approaches to intersectionality take Black masculinity seriously enough, and much more besides.

The best way to close this section would be to discuss queer theory’s growing impact on Africana philosophy, but there is frustratingly little to say. Many studies outside of philosophy exhibit considerable philosophical depth, starting with the pioneering work of Cathy Cohen in political science and continuing with the work of figures like C. Riley Snorton.[8] I have to this point been willing, on the principled grounds noted above, to put card-carrying philosophers into conversation with thinkers outside the discipline; but the size of the gap between work inside and outside the field is so stark in this case that it deserves special comment.

Africana philosophy has yet to take up in earnest the challenge that has roiled Black studies and related fields over the last decade and a half. Dwight McBride stated this challenge clearly in 2007:

Telling the truths of Black life in the United States requires a multiplicity of voices. It takes voices invested in the stories and experiences of Black men and women; Black heterosexuals and Black gays, lesbians, bisexuals, and transgender folk … Black single parents … and so very much more. When we allow ourselves to be summed up by sanitized versions of Black life in adherence to a form of Black respectability, we tell only part of our story. (McBride 2007, 438–439)

McBride offers these remarks on the way to calling for a “new Black Studies” that attends more carefully to issues of intra-racial diversity. Some version of this call is surely relevant for Africana philosophy. For this reason, forthcoming work by V. Denise James and Anika Simpson is particularly welcome in the U.S. context. (I’ll leave it to commentators with more intimate knowledge of other contexts to comment on the promising developments elsewhere.) James is working on a philosophical treatment of Audre Lorde, and Simpson is preparing a study of the way a responsible engagement with single black motherhood requires a queering of standard philosophical approaches to family, sexuality, gender, and political life.[9]

7.2 Critical ethnophilosophy

The notion of ethnophilosophy arose in the context of debates about African philosophy’s proper content and methods, and was most commonly deployed, most prominently by Paulin Hountondji, “as a kind of negative characterization of … the traditionalist approach to African philosophy” (Wiredu 2004, 3). Hallen describes the worrisome version of this approach:

Ethnophilosophy presents itself as a philosophy of peoples rather than of individuals; in African societies one is therefore given the impression that there can be no equivalent to a Socrates or to a Zeno. Ethnophilosophy speaks only of Bantu philosophy, Dogon philosophy, Yoruba philosophy… . Ethnophilosophy’s sources are in the past, in what is described as authentic, traditional African … prior to ‘‘modernity.’’ These are to be found primarily in products of language: parables, proverbs, poetry, songs, myths… . [E]thnophilosophy therefore tends to portray African beliefs as things … that are somehow timeless … placing minimal emphasis upon the rigorous argumentation and criticism that are prerequisites to the … search for truth. (Hallen 2004, 122)

I refer to this as the worrisome version of traditionalism because Hountondji and others have made room for the possibility of a less worrisome, more critical form of traditionalism. Paget Henry, for example, has reclaimed the notion of ethnophilosophy to denote an historically and culturally rooted corrective to overly abstract accounts of the unity of Africana philosophy. He puts it this way: “In spite of the controversy that has raged over the practice of ethnophilosophy, I think it is a necessary component … of all Africana-oriented philosophies” (Henry 2000, 154).

Henry here joins Appiah (1993) in calling for a kind of critical ethnophilosophy, which excavates the insights of Africana cultures and makes them philosophically cognizable without insulating them from critical scrutiny or freezing them in the precolonial amber.[10] The prospect of this sort of work continues to draw attention and inspire researchers. One of the clearest examples of this, apart from Henry’s approach to Afro-Caribbean philosophy, is in the growing literature seeking to bring specifically African philosophical concepts into contemporary debates in ethics and political philosophy. The notion of ubuntu is probably the most frequent and prominent recipient of this treatment, in ways that have generated considerable controversy (to which we will return). But there are many other examples. Consider, for example, Mbih Jerome Tosam’s (2014) study of the philosophical underpinnings of Kom proverbs or Adebola B. Ekanola’s (2017) examination of the Yorùbá conception of peace. Outside of the continent, and alongside Henry’s redeployment of traditionalism, one finds a growing number of pieces like Lindsey Stewart’s (2017) study of Hoodoo love rituals as models for the practice of freedom.

An important set of debates in critical ethnophilosophy grew up around the study of ubuntu in South Africa, and around the role of white philosophers in this work. Thaddeus Metz (2007) and Mogobe Ramose (2015) have been perhaps the clearest spokespersons for the positions that, for current purposes, are the keys to the debate.[11] On one side are scholars who aim to treat the concept of ubuntu as another resource for the work of ethics and political philosophy, and who regard this approach as an expression of respect for indigenous African resources. On the other side are scholars for whom the sudden “mainstreaming” of African concepts is extremely suspicious, often for reasons very much like the ones that motivate worries about the misappropriation of cultural practices related to aesthetic experience. A short, gentle version of the worry might go like this: In a majority black country with a majority white philosophy professoriate, a country in which the professoriate assumed its shape over time not by dint of natural forces or by accident but thanks to the careful hoarding of resources and opportunities along racial lines, it is unseemly and perhaps blameworthy for white philosophers to start mining resources from African cultures without first transforming its institutional structures to grant substantive access to people from those cultures (and, Ramose [2015] points out, often without learning the relevant languages the way they would learn Greek to study the Stoics in earnest). There are of course ways to develop this worry and ways to respond to it; the point right now is simply to mark debates around it as an example of an area of recent interest in and around Africana philosophy.

7.3 Political thought in context

A third theme in contemporary work also has obvious roots in older trends. As an enterprise “born of struggle,” Africana philosophy attends with unusual frequency and consistency to the ethical and political issues facing its inquirers. The ethical implications of studies in nearly every area, including metaphysics (related, say, to the concept of the person) and epistemology (related, say, to issues of testimonial injustice), are rarely far from view. But straightforward political philosophy remains as lively an area of investigation as it was when Odera Oruka famously identified “nationalist-ideological” theorizing as one of the four major areas of African philosophical activity (Oruka 1981, n.p.).

Africana philosophies of politics constitute much too massive an area to cover responsibly in anything like the space available here. In addition, this is an area in which regional and local differences loom particularly large, thereby complicating any broad generalizations. Nevertheless, three trends are worth noting.

First, commentary on iconic figures remains a common undertaking, though the range of figures available for this treatment has of course changed over time. The iconic figures in each region remain live options for study, as evidenced by recent special issues of the Journal on African Philosophy on Nkrumah and Azikiwe, persistent interest in a variety of venues in Du Bois and Cooper, and recent attempts to rethink the legacies of Senghor and Cesaire.[12] The contemporary difference is that this work now more often shares space with studies of people like C.L.R. James, Huey Newton, Lorraine Hansberry, and bell hooks.[13]

Second, and similarly, while scholars continue to undertake context-sensitive investigations of particular, local issues, those issues have changed in the wake of certain epochal, geopolitical shifts. The sheer range of issues in play here is particularly daunting, but Ivan Karp and D. A. Masolo provide a helpfully capacious frame. They suggest three roughly ten-year stages in the development of post-independence African philosophy. The 1970s, they say, were about the ethnophilosophy debates, while the 1980s were about criticizing African modes of cultural production, from traditional practices to elite intellectual work. The 1990s, meanwhile, took up a new challenge:

This new phase … is both a response to and an attempt to theorize the crisis of the postcolonial African state, and it coincides with the emergence of economic, social, and environmental problems that were not imagined to be possible in the utopian worlds of newly independent nations. (Karp and Masolo 2000, 2, as quoted in Afayolan and Falola 2017, 9)

Karp and Masolo’s (2000) description of this new, post-utopian phase tracks important dynamics unfolding in Africana communities across the world. In some places it often took the form of reflections on the disappointments of post-racialism, in many places focused intently on the exaggerated optimism and subsequent disappointments of the Obama era. Elsewhere it took the form of reflections on neoliberalism or on the imperatives not of anti-colonial struggle or post-colonial critique but of decolonial transformation. Central to all these cases, though, was the challenge of adapting Africana philosophical resources to evolving political conditions in the wake of the Cold War, in the throes of a global war on terror and a multipolar scramble for post-imperial influence.

A third trend shaping Africana philosophies of politics is simply that a variety of new theories and concepts have come into play. Some of these come, as we have seen, from exercises in critical ethnophilosophy, like the ubuntu debates in South Africa. Others result from creative conceptual engineering by attentive scholars grappling with their social worlds. Consider here the notion of Afropolitanism, first authoritatively theorized in the early 2000s by Achille Mbembe, who used it to argue that “the meaning of ‘being African’ had to be dislodged from race … and be opened to the flows of global networks and worldly hybridities” (Balakrishnan 2017, §4, par. 5). Or consider Tommie Shelby’s introduction and refusal of the “medical model” of social theorizing in relation to urban “ghettos” (Shelby 2016). Or, finally, consider the continuing reverberations from Mills’s enormously influential racial contract argument (1997).

Mills and Shelby are particularly noteworthy in this connection. Until their early work earned the attention it now enjoys around the world and across academic disciplines, it was easier to worry that analytic approaches to Africana thought did relatively little with the transformative potential that Africanaity brings to professional philosophy (see Taylor 2009, Gordon 2006). But both have recently called explicitly for “black radical” approaches to standard political-theoretic positions like egalitarianism and liberalism (Mills 2017, Shelby 2016). And both have backed up this call by reinventing core theoretical resources from one tradition in light of the other. For example, Mills (1997) reworks the social contract tradition by examining it from the perspective of (a kind of) decolonial or black radicalism, while Shelby (2005) uses elements of Rawlsian contract theory to rework the black nationalism of figures like Crummell, Du Bois, and Karenga.

7.4 Black life and social death

A final theme in contemporary Africana philosophy brings us full circle, in a way. It reflects the imperatives of a philosophy born of struggle, it draws out and builds on the core idea of problematicity, and it reflects the ongoing effort, just discussed, to find ever more adequate conceptual tools for engaging deep problems. This theme—call it a focus on Black life and social death—unites several different currents of thought and activism, all radically distinct but all interested in the ethical and existential stakes of Black life in a world that remains anti-Black not just at the level of individual prejudices but also at the level of sociopolitical, epistemic, axiological, and ontological structures.

One approach to this work eventuates in the Afro-pessimism of Frank Wilderson, Saidiya Hartman, and others, or in the debates about the view between its advocates and those who decline to claim it, like Moten. This is a notoriously difficult approach to pin down, in small part because a very different view, much more prominent in international relations than in political theory and philosophy, goes by the same name.[14] With respect to the philosophical view that is our concern here, Jared Sexton, quoting Bryan Wagner, describes it as “among other things, an attempt to formulate an account of [Black] suffering … ‘without recourse to the consolation of transcendence’” (Wagner 2009, 2, as quoted in Sexton 2016, par. 8). Elsewhere in this remarkable essay, aimed at clearing away the misconceptions and misguided criticisms that swirl around the view, Sexton explains:

Afro-pessimism is not an intervention so much as it is a reading or meta-commentary… . It is a reading of what is gained and lost in the attempt—the impulse—to … delimit the “bad news” of black life, to fix its precise scope and scale, to find an edge beyond or before which true living unfolds. (Sexton 2016, par. 16)

The content of and motivation for this reading involves “both an epistemological and an ethical project” (Sexton 2016, par. 15). The ethical project involves resisting a lazy, bad faith optimism that bases struggle and activism on hope rather than on a clear-eyed confrontation with the challenges of Black life in an anti-Black world. The epistemological project involves finding the tools for achieving this clear-eyed confrontation. In the hands of figures like Hartman and Christina Sharpe, this means enacting certain vital conceptual reorientations, like insisting on the afterlife of the transatlantic slave trade in contemporary modes of social organization.

A second way of engaging black life and social death philosophically crystallizes in the various organizational forms and anti-organizational tendencies that constitute the Black Lives Matter movement. This is of course not an academic enterprise, but it grows from many of the same roots, intellectually and ethically, as much of the work under consideration here. The driving forces behind the movement—people like Alicia Garza, Patrice Cullors-Khan, and Opal Tometi, the authors of the phrase-cum-social media archiving tool that gives the movement its name—take up expressly philosophical questions about, for example, the requirements of justice, the role of the state (and the legitimacy of state violence), the workings of power, and the meaning of the human. What’s more, they often do so in ways informed by figures like Fanon, Audre Lorde, Steve Biko, and Cedric Robinson. This is philosophy in action: it is “about finding, articulating, and promoting answers to philosophical questions” as well as about “modeling a kind of philosophical responsiveness to the conditions of human striving”—call this a robustly engaged version of the art of living well (Taylor 2019, 297).[15]

A third approach to the questions of black life and social death actually runs through both of the approaches mentioned so far. The study of Black aesthetics and of African-derived cultural practices have become scholarly growth areas thanks in part—but only in part—to the central role that aesthetic practices play in the work of antiracist resistance. I say “only in part” because some of the most interesting work in this area prominently resists the temptation to reduce aesthesis to anti-racism. Life in communities of African-descended persons and others racialized as Black, like life everywhere, has its irremediably aesthetic dimensions and resources. These resources are sometimes invested in defensive efforts, warding off assaults on Black or African humanity. But they are much more often invested in celebrations of life, reflections on community, parables of love, provocations for the mind and senses, and so on. In fact, a plausible reading of the transnational, transhistorical tradition of Black aesthetics suggests that this work routinely circles around the tension between responsibly facing life’s problems and celebrating and enjoying life’s possibilities (Taylor 2016). This tension motivates Albert Murray’s charges against Toni Morrison (and others), it inspires West’s critique of Du Bois, and it runs through, without quite defining, Moten’s refusal of Afro-pessimism.

The contemporary concern with aesthetics in and near Africana thought extends a long tradition. Frederick Douglass, for example, complemented his achievements as a writer and orator with vigorous efforts to construct his public image through photography, thereby making a germinal contribution to modern transatlantic visual culture (Gates 2016). The U.S. “New Negro” movement (usually associated with the Harlem Renaissance), the Negritude movement, and the various Black arts movements around the world were all animated by philosophical commitments, and in the first two cases prominently featured philosophers (Alain Locke and Leopold Senghor, to start). Moving closer to the present, the companion volumes that marked Africana philosophy’s establishment feature contributions on art and aesthetics by Nzegwu (2004) and others. Contemporary thinkers follow in their footsteps with special issues on race and aesthetics, symposia on Black aesthetics, and studies of the philosophical import of memorials and monuments in racialized spaces.[16]

8. Conclusion

To discuss studies of black life and social death in the context of this entry is to return to one of the recurring tensions in the field of Africana philosophy. It is a field not just born of struggle but also emerging from the crucible of racialization. Africana philosophy is importantly related but not reducible to a responsible philosophical race theory: it is a constellation of views, approaches, traditions, problems, debates, and figures that owes its existence as a somewhat unitary enterprise at least in part to the practices of race-making, but that reaches deeper into the lives of particular communities than race theory can, with results—like studies of the Yoruba conception of peace—that in no way depend on race-theoretic analysis for their import.

This study of course leaves out much more than it includes. There is, for example, nothing here about Nkiru Nzegwu’s innovative institution-building efforts with the International Society for African Philosophy and Studies (ISAPS)[17] and the Africa Knowledge Project, or about Sylvia Wynter’s impactful interventions in decolonial and Afro-Caribbean philosophy.[18] Nor will there be space to explore Achille Mbembe’s studies of necropolitics, George Yancy’s remarkable reinvention of critical phenomenology, the long shadow of Molefi Asante’s Africology, the innovations of Tommy Curry’s Black male studies, Anita Allen-Castellitto’s insightful studies of privacy and her eloquent commentaries on the profession, or the dynamic Afro-futurism of figures from Sun-Ra to Janelle Monae.

Silences and oversights are inevitable in a short study of a sprawling constellation of related areas of inquiry. For that reason it is fitting to end with language from Outlaw’s version of a similar study. One might say of this entry what Outlaw says of his: that it “is not meant to be exhaustive,” but instead “provides examples and solicits additional contributions in order to make the account more comprehensive and accurate” (Outlaw 2017, §2, par. 23).


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