Notes to Agent-Based Modeling in the Philosophy of Science

1. NK-landscapes were first applied to the modeling of biological systems (Kauffman & Levin 1987; Kauffman 1993). They are named after the two parameters underlying their generation: N—representing the number of components (or aspects) of the system that contribute to its performance (such as its fitness), and K—representing the degree to which the contribution of each component is dependent on other components. For the application of NK-landscapes to epistemic landscape models see Alexander, Himmelreich, & Thompson 2015; Pöyhönen 2017; for their use in problem-solving search see, for instance, Lazer & Friedman 2007; for a mathematical characterization of NK-landscapes see, for instance, Csaszar 2018.

2. The fiendishness of a landscape is formally expressed as the probability that for n random points on the landscape, the highest point is not within the basin of attraction of the global maximum, i.e., within the set of points on the landscape for which hill-climbing leads to the maximum (Grim, Singer, Fisher, et al. 2013: 444).

3. Hegselmann and Krause’s model is closely related to the model by Deffuant and Weisbuch (e.g., Deffuant, Neau, Amblard, & Weisbuch 2000; Deffuant, Amblard, Weisbuch, & Faure 2002).

4. Such an update of one’s opinion is modeled with the following function:

\[x_i (u+1) = \alpha\frac{1}{|X_i(u)|} \sum_{j \in X_i(u)} x_j(u) + (1 - \alpha)\tau\]

where \(x_i(u)\) is the opinion of agent \(x_i\) after the uth update, \(\alpha \in {(0,1]}\) is the weighting factor determining how much the opinions of others and one’s own research influence the change of one’s belief, \(\tau \in {(0,1]}\) is the true value of the parameter of interest,

\[X_i(u):= \{j : |x_i(u) - x_j(u) | \leq \varepsilon\}\]

where \(\varepsilon \in [0,1]\) is the confidence interval determining the agents whose opinions are taken into account, and \(|X_i(u)|\) the cardinality of \(X_i(u)\). The basic model, in which agents update only by averaging over opinions of others within their confidence interval while ignoring the signal from the world, is a special instance of the above function where \(\alpha=1\). For an overview of variations of the model see Douven 2019.

5. While O’Connor & Bruner 2019 and Bruner 2019 employ computational models with infinite populations, O’Connor 2017 develops ABMs to study the robustness of these results.

6. Some of the dynamics commonly used in these models are the ‘replicator dynamics’ or the ‘myopic best response’ dynamics. The replicator dynamics, typically employed in infinite population models, is based on the idea that strategies resulting in higher payoffs are increasingly adopted by the community, while those that give lower payoffs are gradually dropped. In the ‘myopic best response’ dynamics agents consider which strategy would have gotten them the best payoff in the current round and use that one in the next round.

7. For a complementary rational-choice model see Rueger 1996, who showed that if we assume scientists are risk-averse inquirers, it is rational for each individual to split their working time across different research lines (already in view of epistemic goals), thereby individually contributing to theoretical diversity. For more recent game-theoretic models studying credit-based incentives of scientists and their impact on the division of labor see, e.g., Zollman 2018; Heesen 2019.

8. See also models by Lazer & Friedman (2007); Fang, Lee, & Schilling (2010); Derex, Perreault, & Boyd (2018) developed in organizational sciences, which gave similar results as Zollman’s model while employing different representational frameworks. Empirical studies in the form of computer-based experiments by Mason, Jones, & Goldstone (2008); Derex & Boyd (2016) also came to similar conclusions, while an experiment run by Mason & Watts (2012) indicated that a higher degree of connectivity is rewarding once the exploration/exploitation trade-off is relaxed.

9. See Hartmann, Martini, & Sprenger (2009) for another formal treatment of issues pertaining to peer disagreement, based on the Lehrer-Wagner model (Lehrer & Wagner (1981)), which focuses on the notion of epistemic peerhood and the ‘equal weights view’ by Elga 2007.

10. Šešelja (2021b) argues that the results of these models concern methodological norms, rather than the epistemic ones. See also Douven and Kelp (2011) for an overview of arguments on the problem of peer disagreement in science obtained by means of ABMs.

11. For an earlier model of polarization by Axelrod (1997), see the entry on computational philosophy.

12. The reason for this is that agents in the minority learn how to interact with the majority members at a faster rate than the other way around, leading them to learn faster that making low demands is a safe strategy. Bruner (2019) and O’Connor (2017) call this phenomenon the “cultural Red King effect” in analogy to the “Red King effect” in biology, according to which organisms in mutualistic relationships may under certain conditions evolve slowly to gain advantage over the other. Mohseni, O’Connor, & Rubin (2021) obtained similar findings by means of an experimental study.

13. For a collection of papers on the epistemology of computer simulations in social sciences see Squazzoni (2009); for a discussion of various cognitive functions of simulations see Epstein (2008) and Edmonds (2017); for an overview of discussions on the cognitive functions of models in science in general see the entry on models in science.

14. See, e.g., Epstein & Axtell (1996), Axelrod (1997), Hegselmann & Krause (2002), Epstein (2006). In contrast to the KISS approach, Edmonds & Moss (2004), argued for an alternative ‘KIDS’ (Keep it Descriptive, Stupid) approach, which emphasizes integration of ABMs and empirical studies and aims at developing models that are descriptively adequate with respect to central features of the empirical target, where any simplification has to be justified.

15. See, e.g., Grüne-Yanoff (2009); Alexandrova (2008); Reiss (2012); Reutlinger, Hangleiter, & Hartmann (2018); Nguyen (2020); Fumagalli (2016); Ylikoski (2014).

16. The notion of HPE was introduced by Dray (1957) in the context of explanations in history. Subsequently, it became the subject of extensive debates in the literature on scientific modeling, especially in biology and in social sciences (see, e.g., Bokulich (2014, 2017); Forber (2010, 2012); Reydon (2012); Hempel (1965); Ylikoski & Aydinonat (2014).

17. Sensitivity analysis is a more general method of investigating how the output of the simulation changes given variations in the inputs (Saltelli et al. 2008).

18. Whether a positive outcome of RA has any evidential value has been a matter of controversy (for an overview of the discussion see Houkes, Šešelja, & Vaesen 2023).

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