Supplement to al-Farabi’s Metaphysics

Fârâbî’s project of reviving the sciences of the ancients

Fârâbî did not, like some philosophers before him (Alexander of Aphrodisias) and after him (Averroes, Thomas Aquinas), work out his metaphysical thought in a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics. But on metaphysics, as elsewhere, many of his writings stand in close relations to ancient Greek texts as he knew them in Arabic translation.[1] While Fârâbî wrote commentaries on Aristotle’s logical works (only the commentary on On Interpretation survives), and perhaps on some other texts, more often he writes books with the same titles as works of Aristotle, i.e., with titles that were often used in Arabic to refer to those texts (Categories, On Demonstration = Posterior Analytics, Book of Letters = Metaphysics). Or he writes discussions of the aims of Aristotle or some other Greek thinker in some particular text, like his On the aims of the Sage in each book of the treatise which is called the Book of Letters, that is, the determination of Aristotle’s aim in his treatise the Metaphysics (abbreviated here as On the Aims of the Metaphysics); his On the Philosophy of Plato and On the Philosophy of Aristotle consist mainly of short summaries of what subject each text of these authors was devoted to and what the author aimed to accomplish in writing it. In these texts Fârâbî is picking up from the late ancient Greek commentators on Plato and Aristotle who wrote about the “aim” or “object” (Greek skopos) of each authoritative text, or of the science that that text was devoted to teaching. In some other texts, such as On Intelligence (or On the Intellect) he does not take some one Greek text as his overall model, but rather discusses the different things meant by one word, here “intelligence” (Arabic ʿaql, translating Greek nous), in different scientific disciplines and different texts, especially in Arabic translations of Greek philosophical texts: even if his official aim is just to disambiguate, to forestall confusions arising from different uses of the same term or from misleading translations, this in effect gives him a way of writing a systematic treatise, deriving from a range of Greek sources, on the different things called “intelligence” and how they are related.

Sometimes when Fârâbî writes about the aims of some Greek text, it is clear that he does not genuinely have access to the text. In fact, he does not seem to have read any of the Platonic texts that he describes in On the Philosophy of Plato: he gives no sign of knowing that Plato wrote in dialogue form. (He has, however, read the large majority of the texts by Aristotle that we can read now.) In cases where he does not have access to the primary source, he reconstructs from whatever sources of information are available to him. But this is a matter of degree: since Fârâbî does not read Greek, he never has access to the primary source, but at best to a translation, and Fârâbî suspects that the translations are systematically misleading, and takes it as a challenge to reconstruct the original thought behind the veil of the translations. (In some cases he does not have translations of the original text but, for instance, translations of late ancient summaries, such as Galen’s summaries of some Platonic dialogues.) Fârâbî’s interest in the Greek legacy is almost exclusively an interest in the Greek sciences, chiefly philosophy but also mathematics (including astronomy and music theory) and medicine. In this he is typical of Arabic-writing authors, whether Muslim or Christian or Jewish or Sabian. (This contrasts with Latin writers, whose reception of Greek culture includes, especially, imitating Greek poetry: the Arabs have their own proud tradition of poetry, and see no need to improve it by importing Greek mythological and polytheistic poetry.) He does not think that the Greeks had any monopoly on reason, or any special access to the sciences just because they were Greek, but he does think that Greek thinkers, especially Plato and Aristotle, possessed sciences which either are not still practiced in Fârâbî’s own time and in his own linguistic and religious community, or are practiced only imperfectly, in a sub-scientific way; and he thinks that we can acquire these sciences if we can reconstruct the thought of the original texts. When Fârâbî writes a description or close paraphrase of a Greek text, this is to help himself or his readers gain control over the text, but he is aiming at something more ambitious: to write the kind of text that Aristotle or Plato would have written, possessing the sciences they did, if they had been writing in Arabic, for a mostly Muslim audience, and were able to respond to discussions after their own lifetimes.

Why is it so important to recapture these ancient sciences, and especially the philosophical disciplines including metaphysics? The Fârâbian text which is clearest about the motivations is a text whose authenticity has been challenged, but which will provisionally be assumed here to be by Fârâbî, the Harmonization of the Two Sages, the Divine Plato and Aristotle.[2] This text starts by saying “I see most of the people of our time delving into and disputing over whether the world is generated or eternal” (#1), and claiming that Plato and Aristotle disagree, on various questions but especially on this one. Why are people so agitated about this particular issue, and why is it so important whether Plato and Aristotle disagree about it? As Fârâbî says later in this text,

Had God not rescued intelligent and mindful people by means of these two sages and those pursuing their approach … [on the issue of whether and in what sense the world is created] … mankind would have remained in perplexity and bewilderment. (#58)

So apparently people are in disagreement about this and kindred questions, disagreement which threatens to be interminable, with arguments on both sides but no agreed criterion for deciding between them; and Plato and Aristotle claim to have rescued mankind (not only their own contemporaries but also Fârâbî’s) from this otherwise interminable disagreement, by founding the science of philosophy, which provides demonstrations and also provides methods for recognizing whether an argument is demonstrative and when it is dialectical or rhetorical or worse. Fârâbî says of Plato and Aristotle not only that they were the founders of philosophy, but also that “the recourse is to them” (#2):[3] this whole rescue-mission fails if it turns out that Plato and Aristotle themselves were in a disagreement about the disputed questions and were unable to resolve it.

To see why people in Fârâbî’s time were so concerned about the question of the createdness or eternity of the world, and why they might hope that Plato or Aristotle would help them resolve it, we need some context in the religious disputes within the early Islamicate world. There are apparently irresolvable disputes not only between religious communities (e.g., Muslims vs. Christians, Monophysite vs. Nestorian Christians), but also disputes within each community, notably within Fârâbî’s Muslim community, and these disputes may have implications for how both individuals and whole communities should live. The issues include particular questions of religious law or scriptural interpretation, and the basic “political” questions of who is legitimately a member, and who is legitimately a leader, of the religious community. But there are also fundamental issues about the nature of God and his relation to human beings and to the world. Some groups maintain that God is obliged to follow objective rules of justice, such as not punishing humans for any actions they did not freely choose; others maintain that all things, including human actions and rules of judgment, are determined by God’s will. Authoritative religious texts describe God as acting in ways similar to human beings (for instance, speaking), and give him a series of “names” or attributes. The Qurʾân, in particular, makes it an obligation to address God by his names (Q 7:180), but it also says that nothing resembles him (Q 42:11), which seems to imply that no name can be asserted univocally of God and of human beings or other creatures. Which of God’s actions and attributes should be taken as merely metaphorical, and if so metaphorical for what, and how can we tell? If all our words are designed for other things, and transferred metaphorically to God, will there be any content left in what we claim to know or to believe about God? All Muslims agree that God is one, and that there is no god but he. It is less clear what it would mean for something to be a god other than God (since there aren’t any, and presumably it is a necessary truth that there aren’t any), but one common way of interpreting “there is no god but God” is as “there is nothing eternal—i.e., nothing that has existed from eternity—other than God”. But if, as almost everyone agrees, there is no change in God, then it seems to follow, not only that God does not have parts (if God has two hands, then he has always had two hands, and so a plurality of beings has existed from eternity) but also that he has no attributes other than his essence (if God is just, then he has always been just, and so both God and his justice have existed from eternity). And, as Fârâbî suggests, there is an especially serious issue about whether the physical world has existed from eternity: if there is no change in God, then it seems to follow that God’s will and his action are eternally unchanging, so that if God produces the world at time t, he has also been producing the world from eternity before t and will be producing the world to eternity after t. This would contradict not only the straightforward meaning of saying that the world is created, but also the standard Jewish and Christian and Muslim belief that there is nothing existing from eternity other than God. And the issue is not only about time, but also about modality: there seems to be a line of argument starting from God’s perfection, running through his simplicity (the lack of any plurality in him) and unchangeability, and concluding to God’s lack of freedom to make the world if and when and as he chooses.

All of these are disputes that Fârâbî claims to be able to resolve by demonstrative methods. He is not the first to make such claims. Each religious community, after discovering that these disputes cannot be resolved simply by citing scripture or appealing to authoritative religious leaders, tries to develop disciplines for resolving these disputes by argument. In the Muslim community, the most important such disciplines are fiqh [Islamic jurisprudence] for practical and legal issues, and kalâm [Islamic theology] for theoretical questions, not only about God but also about human beings and the cosmos. Fârâbî in his Enumeration of the Sciences describes kalâm as

a disposition by which a human being is able to defend the specific opinions and actions that the founder of the religion declared and to refute by arguments whatever opposes it. (Butterworth 2001: 80)

The mutakallimûn (practitioners of kalâm) are Fârâbî’s ideological opponents and professional rivals, and we should not trust what he says about them, but his picture of kalâm will be important for his picture of philosophy as an alternative. Kalâm, as Fârâbî understands it, is community-relative: Muslim kalâm is directed toward the opinions of Muḥammad, Jewish kalâm toward the opinions of Moses, neither simply toward objective truth. Kalâm is not concerned simply to defend the opinions of the founder against the opinions of people outside the community (e.g., to defend Muslim monotheism against Manichean dualism): there is also disagreement within the community, and each side will try to show that the founder agreed with them, and to defend the opinion of the founder, as they interpret it, against other parties within the community. Whether against external or internal opponents, its method is, as Fârâbî understands it, dialectical: that is, the mutakallim poses questions to his opponent and tries to refute him whichever way he answers, using as premises for the refutation whatever propositions the opponent will concede, either because they are common opinions or because they are the opinions of the opponent’s own party. Although kalâm begins as a method for refuting an opponent in face-to-face encounters, the mutakallimûn also try to apply the same method constructively, to argue on behalf of the “foundations of the religion” [uṣûl al-dîn] as they understand them. These will be, as Fârâbî says, the opinions laid down by the founder of the religion, but the mutakallimûn stress the value of knowing these things through reason or intelligence [ʿaql] rather than relying on a chain of human witnesses going back to the founder;[4] and if we can know by reason rather than by testimony, e.g., that God is just, we will also know what “just” means in this assertion (e.g., does God’s justice exclude his punishing people for doing something they had no power not to do?). A fairly standard list of topics to treat by kalâm in this way is: that there is a divine maker of the world, that he has neither a partner nor a contrary, God’s attributes and their relation to his essence, God’s acts and their relations to the acts of humans or other creatures (e.g., does God create human acts or do humans create their own acts), prophecy (and how to prove that some particular person is a prophet), imamate (the conditions for someone to be a legitimate successor to a prophet as the leader of his community), and “return” [maʿâd] (the state of a human being after death, and divine rewards and punishments). This is the model for the order of topics that Fârâbî himself will follow in his Principles of the Opinions of the People of the Perfect City, discussed below.

The problem is that different schools of kalâm reach contradictory results, and have no agreed criterion for adjudicating between them: their disputes seem just as irresolvable as the disputes between different religious communities, or different parties within a religious community, that they were trying to resolve. From Fârâbî’s point of view, this is just what we would expect, since (he would say) kalâm arguments are dialectical arguments, whose premisses are drawn from common opinions or from the opponents’ own claims, rather than the demonstrative arguments which according to Aristotle yield scientific knowledge; and it is possible to argue dialectically, but not demonstratively, for pairs of contradictory conclusions. For Fârâbî, the real trouble is that, when people’s hopes that kalâm arguments will produce knowledge are shaken by the experience of contrary arguments, they may lose faith in the power of reason to resolve disputes: they may conclude that any argument has an equally good counterargument, or anyway a counterargument good enough that we cannot rationally adjudicate between them. This is precisely the situation that Greek philosophy, and in particular Plato and Aristotle, are supposed to rescue us from. The rescue will fail if it turns out that Plato and Aristotle contradict each other, for instance on the question of the eternity of the world: if they do, the people of Fârâbî’s time will conclude that Plato and Aristotle have not, as they claim, given demonstrative arguments, but have simply given more dialectical arguments on both sides of a question; in which case Plato and Aristotle will not have given us reason to believe their claim that philosophy allows us to give demonstrative arguments and so to resolve the apparently irresolvable disputes about fundamental questions. (Fârâbî could have tried saying that Aristotle has given demonstrative arguments, including for the eternity of the world, and that Plato has given merely dialectical arguments for the opposite conclusions. There are some incidental reasons why he does not take this path—it might undermine the confidence in ancient Greek sages that could be conveyed by a united front, and some of Fârâbî’s late ancient sources had given similar harmonizations—but there are also deeper reasons why Fârâbî’s project would be in difficulty if it took this path.)

For Arabic-readers of Fârâbî’s time, the texts of Greek philosophy have been preserved, in translations or in looser summaries, by the mainly Syriac-speaking Christian communities within the Islamicate world. Syriac-speaking Christian communities when they were governed by the Eastern Roman Empire included people who studied philosophy in Greek, and who sometimes came back to teach philosophy in Syriac in their own communities, and they continued to do philosophy in Syriac after the Islamic conquest, when they had become part of a larger dominantly Arabic-speaking and Muslim society, and when their links with the Greek language and with living Greek-speaking communities had become very weak. And gradually they start operating in Arabic, as they become more integrated into an Arabic-speaking society and as the larger society beyond their own community starts taking an interest in the Greek sciences, including philosophy, which the Christians have preserved. Arabic-speaking Muslims could be interested in Greek philosophy for reasons having nothing to do with religion—for instance, because they were interested in Galenic medicine and Galen presented philosophy as the foundation of medical science. But Fârâbî is not the first Muslim to hope that the discipline of philosophy, preserved by the Christians, could also give demonstrations that would resolve the disputes about the foundations of religion (proving the existence of God and the denial of a partner or contrary, giving the right understanding of God’s attributes and acts and causal relations with the world, the immortality and happiness or misery of the human soul, etc.) that were of concern to the Muslim community. But he thinks that previous attempts have not yielded genuine demonstrations or genuinely resolved the disputes; worse, they may convince people that philosophy, the discipline practiced by the Greeks (and named in Arabic by words derived from the Greek word “philosophia”), is no more demonstrative than the native Arabic Muslim discipline of kalâm, so that importing this foreign discipline will not help to solve the problems of the community. So it is very important for Fârâbî to distinguish what he is doing, not only from kalâm, but also at earlier attempts at philosophy in the Islamicate world—yes, these degenerate heirs of the Greeks produced only dialectical arguments, but Plato and Aristotle had demonstrative science, and I, Fârâbî, have gone back to the source and recaptured the ability to produce demonstrations, and to discern when an argument is demonstrative and when it is merely dialectical or sophistical or rhetorical. He manages to preserve almost complete silence about the two main earlier Muslim philosophers, al-Kindî and Abû Bakr al-Râzî, although he must have known their work and often seems to have them in mind (the one explicit mention that has been found in Fârâbî’s corpus is a criticism of a musical text of Kindî’s);[5] instead he speaks only of Christian philosophers within the Islamicate world. And he claims that the Christians stopped their study of Aristotle with the Prior Analytics (indeed with Prior Analytics I,1-7, before Aristotle’s discussion of modality), i.e., that they stopped short before encountering the demonstrative method given in the Posterior Analytics, supposedly because it would endanger the doctrines of their community.[6] Fârâbî himself, as a Muslim student of Christian teachers, claims to be the first person to have mastered the Posterior Analytics, or as he (like late ancient Greek writers) calls it, the On Demonstration. He is also implicitly contrasting himself with doctor-philosophers like Abû Bakr Râzî who had drawn on Galen’s On Demonstration: the suggestion is that Galen’s methods are good enough for doctors but do not yield real demonstrations by Aristotelian standards.[7]

Fârâbî is hoping to normalize philosophy in the larger Muslim society, breaking its association with the Christian community. He wants to show that it can do successfully what kalâm tried and (in Fârâbî’s view) failed to do: namely, by giving demonstrative arguments, to resolve disputes about fundamental religious questions, and thereby also to determine the correct meaning of authoritative religious assertions. (For instance, when the Qurʾân attributes a certain predicate to God, what is the meaning of that predicate-term? If philosophy can determine what attributes God has, and if we add the premise that Qurʾân must be right, we can determine what it means by these terms.) In that sense Fârâbî is trying to establish philosophy as a “religious science” [ʿilm al-dîn] within Islam, competing with kalâm and the other already established religious sciences. But while Fârâbî treats kalâm as community-relative, philosophy will not be community-relative, and will not be restricted to Muslims any more than to Christians, or to Arabic-speakers any more than to Greek- or Syriac-speakers: it is supposed to be an objective demonstrative science (or group of related sciences) accessible to people in any linguistic and religious community, and if it gives the “inner meaning” of authoritative Muslim religious texts, that will be a meaning that they share with non-Muslim texts. The Arabic grammarian Sîrâfî, in a debate on the comparative merits of grammar and logic, had accused Fârâbî’s Christian teacher Abû Bishr Mattâ, not only of not knowing the rules of the language in which he had to express himself, Arabic, but also of being captive to the grammar of another language he did not know, Greek: according to Sîrâfî, what Abû Bishr Mattâ presents following Aristotle as universal rules of logic, normative for any rational being, are simply rules of Greek grammar, as translated from Greek through Syriac into Arabic and probably damaged in translation.[8] Against this charge, Fârâbî wants to show that logic, and philosophy is general, is not community-bound like Arabic grammar or Muslim kalâm. Logic is to thought as the grammar of a particular language is to that language: its rules apply to all thought insofar as it is correct, whatever language it may be expressed in, and they give the common core shared by all languages, abstracted from the merely conventional and community-relative aspects of particular languages. And philosophy, including metaphysics, physical cosmology, and moral-political philosophy, is to religion as logic is to grammar, giving rules for how to think about God and the physical world and human beings, and therefore for how to act to achieve the aim of human life, which apply to all humans insofar as they reason and act correctly; and these rules give the common core of doctrines and practical prescriptions shared by all religions, or at least by a plurality of correct religions,[9] abstracted from the merely conventional and community-relative aspects of particular religions.

Copyright © 2021 by
Stephen Menn <>

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