Notes to al-Farabi’s Metaphysics

1. These are all issues which Fârâbî in On the Aims of the Metaphysics says (rather tendentiously) that Aristotle treats in Metaphysics XII (see further in Section 2), and which Fârâbî himself treats in accord with his interpretation of Aristotelian metaphysics in the Perfect City and Political Regime (see Section 4). But Fârâbî thinks that the scientific resolution of these issues depends on a technical substructure discussing less immediately appealing issues, including the logical syntax of being and unity (see Section 3).

2. He says “ʿilm al-tawḥîd”, literally “science of unification”, i.e., the knowledge that there is only one God: this is a standard way of referring to kalâm.

3. This is the twelfth book on our count, but Fârâbî lists it as the eleventh rather than twelfth because the translation of the Metaphysics available to him is missing Book I, as it is also missing the last book, XIV: see Bertolacci 2005.

4. In Greek it is usually a phrase, “ta meta ta phusika” = “what is after physics”, only rarely contracted into “ta metaphusika”. The neuter plural definite article “ta” is standard in Greek for referring to a treatise, but strange in referring to a discipline, and seems to show that the phrase started as a name for a text and was transferred from the text to the science it contains. Fârâbî says “mâ baʿd al-tabîʿa”, a calque of the Greek phrase.

5.Sophia” means theoretical wisdom, i.e., whatever kind of knowledge is most intrinsically valuable, setting aside considerations of practical usefulness; “phronêsis” is practical wisdom, the ability to deliberate well, so as to guide practical action.

6. There is a controversy (see note 11) about whether Aristotle means by “separate” here “separate from matter” or “existing separately, i.e., as a substance, not as an attribute of some other underlying substance”, but he certainly thinks both of these are true of the objects in question. Aristotle describes first philosophy as “theology” at Metaphysics VI,1 1026a16–22, and at Metaphysics I,2 983a5–10 says that wisdom is a “divine science” in two ways, both because god is among the causes and principles it studies, and because it is the kind of science that a god would have. See Décarie 1961 for a survey of all the passages where Aristotle gives one or another description of wisdom or first philosophy.

7. Or Metaphysics XIII, since Metaphysics XIV was apparently not available to Fârâbî: see Bertolacci 2005.

8. For Porphyry on this, see Simplicius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca 9) 9,10–22: this would have come from Porphyry’s commentary on the first sentence of the Physics. Asclepius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca 6.2) 2,16–20 says that metaphysics demonstrates the principles of all the sciences.

9. Fârâbî also discusses “wisdom” [ḥikma] in the Attainment of Happiness, and “metaphysics” (and clearly equivalent expressions) in the Philosophy of Aristotle. In the Attainment of Happiness, and in some of the texts in the Philosophy of Aristotle, Fârâbî’s main points seem to be that wisdom is a theoretical knowledge which is constitutive of the highest aim for human beings, that the true statesman needs this knowledge, that it is the highest architectonic knowledge (i.e., that it uses the other kinds of knowledge, or is the knowledge of how to use the other kinds of knowledge, so that we will use them well only if we also have wisdom), or sometimes that prudence makes use of other things (including other kinds of knowledge) in order to secure our acquisition of wisdom and thus our attainment of our goal. In these texts Fârâbî seems to be following Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics VI and perhaps Plato’s Statesman (known through Galen’s synopsis), and perhaps connecting them with things Aristotle says about wisdom in Metaphysics I,1–2, to whatever extent he may have been aware of that text. None of this tells us what wisdom is a science of. Philosophy of Aristotle #99 speaks of Aristotle beginning from bodies and souls and discovering, as their highest causes, the separate agent intelligence and the mover or movers of the eternal rotations of the heavens. Physics or psychology can perhaps grasp that the agent intelligence and the movers of the heavens exist and are causes to the soul or to the heavens, but only metaphysics can grasp what the agent intelligence or the movers of the heavens are in themselves. Fârâbî’s description of metaphysics here is purely “theological”, concerned with first causes existing separately from matter and motion; he says nothing in the Philosophy of Aristotle about a science of being quâ being. He does however say in Philosophy of Aristotle #99 (without giving a justification) that these things do not fall under any of the Aristotelian categories, which connects with what he says in the Book of Letters about the objects of metaphysics: see discussion of the Book of Letters in Section 3 below.

10. There is an English translation of On the Aims in McGinnis-Reisman 2007 (78–81), and another in Bertolacci 2006b (66–72).

11. The text of this passage is controversial, with the majority of modern scholars thinking that Aristotle really wrote “physics is about things that are separate but not unmoved” (“separate” meaning “existing as substances, not as attributes of some other underlying substance”). But Fârâbî, with the Greek commentators and with the Arabic translations (and indeed with all known Greek manuscripts), took Aristotle to have said “physics is about things that are inseparate but not unmoved” (“inseparate” meaning “inseparate from matter”). Aristotle says that “some of mathematics” is about unmoved things because he counts astronomy, which is about moved things, as part of mathematics.

12. In all this Fârâbî is following Aristotle Metaphysics IV,2, 1003b19–1004a31.

13. Avicenna, following and developing what Fârâbî says here, says that being is the subject [Arabic mawḍûʿ = Greek hupokeimenon] of metaphysics, i.e., the subject-genus whose attributes and causes it investigates, but the God is the object [Arabic maṭlûb = Greek zêtoumenon] of metaphysics, i.e., the ultimate cause which the science aims at discovering. For a full discussion and comparison of Avicenna with Fârâbî as well as with the Greek background, see Bertolacci 2006a.

14. There are Croatian and Turkish translations of the Book of Letters (Bučan 1999 and Türker 2008), and a translation of the second part (not on metaphysics) in Khalidi 2005. There are English translations of the Book of Letters and On the One and Unity in progress or in draft.

15. But on On the One and Unity see Janos 2016. There is a PhD dissertation in progress on On the One and Unity by Hakan Genc (McGill University). Much of the discussion here of the Book of Letters follows Menn 2008; see also Druart 2007 and Diebler 2005, and the discussions in Abed 1991 and in the long and thorough introduction to Zimmermann 1981. On Averroes’ reception of the Book of Letters and On the One and Unity, see Menn 2011.

16. “Particle” must thus be understood, in Arabic grammar, in a somewhat broader sense than is standard, e.g., in Greek grammar. Fârâbî gives an elaborate classification of particles in his Kitâb al-alfâẓ al-musta‛mala fî l-manṭiq (Mahdi 1968, 42–56). In Arabic all such words are short, sometimes a single letter. Likewise, “noun” must be taken broadly to include adjectives.

17. Fârâbî discusses the appearances created by the grammatical form of paronymous expressions, and instances in which they may mislead, notably in Book of Letters I,20–21, I,26, I,36 and I,84. Aristotle discusses sophisms of skhêma tês lexeôs in On Sophistical Refutations 4, 166b10–19, and at length in On Sophistical Refutations 22. Aristotle’s Categories 5 3b10–23 discusses the misleading grammatical appearance that a secondary substance-term like “human” signifies a this, as its skhêma tês prosêgorias (= skhêma tês lexeôs) would suggest.

18. The fragmentarily transmitted beginning of Book of Letters Part I says that the words “un” and “ûn” in Greek were particles of affirmation, comparable to “inna” in Arabic (thus something like a Fregean assertion-stroke), with “ûn” more strongly emphatic, and that the Greeks use “ûn” to signify God by contrast with all other beings, which they call “un”. Fârâbî may be thinking of the difference between Greek on and ôn, respectively neuter and masculine nominative singular of the present participle of the verb “to be” (Arabic does not have an “o”, and these would be written in Arabic is “un” and “ûn” respectively). “Ôn” is indeed used in the Bible as a name for God, notably at Exodus 3:14.

19. E.g., “out of”, V,24, is a particle in both Greek and Arabic; “before” and “after”, V,11, and “having”, V,23, are particles in Arabic and Fârâbî might have thought they would be particles in Greek too; but, e.g., “cause”, V,2, and “substance”, V,8, are not etymologically connected with particles in Arabic, and there is no clear reason why Fârâbî should think they would be in Greek either. For details and more examples see Menn 2008.

20. Notably, the meanings of the noun “principle” (Metaphysics V,1) track the meanings of the particle “whence” or “from which”. For details and more examples see Menn 2008.

21. The Arabic translation of Aristotle’s On Interpretation which Fârâbî uses in his commentary on that treatise explicitly calls the word for existence (“wujûd” and the underlying word in Greek) a particle at 20a3–5 and 21b5–7, and Fârâbî takes that up in his commentary on those passages of On Interpretation (Kutsch & Marrow 1960, 128–9 and 165–7, English translation in Zimmermann 1981, 123–4 and 160–62).

22. At I,101–3 he comes back to give a discussion of being as a copula.

23. After a discussion of not-being in I,95–8, I,99 gives a discussion of being per se (drawing on the earlier discussion of “per se” and what is per se at I,76–9), which mentions at the end that what is, but not per se, is said to be per accidens. There was an earlier discussion of “per accidens” and what is per accidens at I,59–61, as part of a discussion of accident.

24. Fârâbî says maʿqûlât, literally “intelligibles”, but he uses this consistently for “thoughts”, calquing Greek noêmata: it has nothing to do with Platonic intelligible substances.

25. See Menn 2008 and Menn 2011, including discussion of Fârâbî’s notion of a “second intelligible” or “second intention”, which is the starting point for medieval Arabic and Latin discussions of second intentions, and, at least when Fârâbî uses it, means a second-order concept.

26. See Section 3.5 below for Book of Letters III on the ordered sequence of questions by which we can investigate whether something is, and what it is, in different senses of “is”.

27. Fârâbî is here interpreting Aristotle Metaphysics VIII,6 1045a36–b7.

28. For Aristotle on ways of giving the substance of X, i.e., ways of answering the question “what is X”, see Metaphysics V,8 and Metaphysics VII,3 1028b33–6. In speaking of the definiendum as an initially unarticulated whole which is the definition then articulates into its parts, Fârâbî is apparently following the difficult and contested Physics I,1.

29. Fârâbî is here following Aristotle Metaphysics VII,17 1041a6–b11.

30. Reading “sabab” with Mahdi’s later corrections rather than “musabbib” with his published text. “Musabbib” would mean literally what makes something to be a cause, as in the common kalâm formulation that God is musabbib al-asbâb, what makes causes to be causes, i.e., what uses other causes instrumentally to cause other things.

31. Literally “eldest”.

32. Following Mahdi’s later corrections for the words between the asterisks, where his published text had marked a lacuna and had conjectured just “is the cause in the quiddity of” to fill the lacuna. There are serious difficulties of text and construal throughout this chapter.

33. Fârâbî says here not the usual “allâh,” “God”, but “al-ilâh”, “the god”, following a literal translation of some Greek source, probably Posterior Analytics II,1 89b31–5; see note 46 for the terminological issue, but both expressions are acceptable from a Muslim point of view. Fârâbî says here “a cause of its existence” or “something by which its constitution [is]”.

34. See Kindî’s On First Philosophy, in Adamson-Pormann 2012, esp. 28–33 and 47–56.

35. Fârâbî does not explicitly say what the unity is in these cases, but he had said that the unity of what is one as continuous is the lack of limits separating its parts (#12), and the unity of what is one as contiguous is the bond that holds its parts together (#13).

36. In the last sentence, the word “equivalent” twice is musâwî (or rather the indefinite accusative singular musâwiyan), but it should probably be corrected to musâwiq (musâwiqan). Otherwise Fârâbî is using “musâwî”, the usual word for “equal”, in the sense of (necessarily) coextensive or mutually entailing, for which “musâwiq” is the standard technical term.

37. See Section 2 above.

38. Like the Republic, and like Fârâbî’s description of the Republic in the Philosophy of Plato (Rosenthal & Walzer 1943, 19–20, #25; Mahdi 1969b, 5, #31–32) these texts include not only descriptions of the best society ruled by philosophers and aiming at the perfection of its members, but also classifications of the defective types of society and how they arise. Fârâbî’s list of defective types of society is more complicated than Plato’s, and his description of the best society says nothing about the abolition of the family and private property for the ruling and military groups, or about the equality of men and women; he is not much interested in constitutional details, much more in the values informing different societies.

39. However, Fârâbî’s description of the Republic in his Philosophy of Plato does not mention the account of the Forms in Republic V or the sun and cave and line comparisons and the account of the rulers’ mathematical and dialectical education in Republic VI–VII. But he says that

when this city had been rendered perfect in speech [sc. in the Republic], he next presented in the Timaeus an account of the divine and natural beings as they are perceived by the intellect and known by means of that science; [he showed] what distinguishes the sciences that ought to be set up in that city

and so on (Mahdi’s translation: Philosophy of Plato, Rosenthal & Walzer 1943, 20, #26; Mahdi 1969b, 65, #33). So it may be more accurate to say that Fârâbî saw the Perfect City and Political Regime as his equivalents not just to the Republic but to Republic-Timaeus or even to Republic-Timaeus-Laws-Critias-Epinomis (described through Rosenthal & Walzer 1943, 21, #28; Mahdi 1969b, 66, #35).

40. For the close modelling of the structure of the Perfect City on the structure of kalâm treatises, see Rudolph 2008.

41. Although Fârâbî might say that Aristotle’s Metaphysics XII,10 quickly sketches a downward way from God to the things that derive from him, and that Fârâbî’s work just fills in the details. But certainly Plotinus, and especially Proclus in the Elements of Theology, say far more about the downward way than Fârâbî could have found in Aristotle, and Fârâbî helps himself to some neo-Platonic devices for explaining how a plurality can arise from a single principle, or complex entities from simple entities, and for the basic idea that bodies and souls are derived from an intelligence (Greek nous, Arabic ʿaql), or intelligences, superior to souls, and these in turn from a God superior to intelligences. But the details are different. Fârâbî’s ontology is much sparser, with far fewer incorporeal realities, and everything is subordinated to the Aristotelian distinction between celestial and sublunar domains.

42. For the sources on Fârâbî’s life, and specifically his leaving Baghdad for Aleppo and Damascus, see Gutas 1999b. A note in some manuscripts of the Perfect City says that Fârâbî began that work in Baghdad and completed it in Damascus (see Walzer 1985, 20). See Section 1 and Linked Document 1 on Fârâbî’s project of establishing falsafa in the Islamic world outside the Christian or sectarian milieu.

43. Themistius’ paraphrase of Metaphysics XII is likely to have been an important model, and a guide to Fârâbî in going beyond what Aristotle actually says in Book XII—Fârâbî mentions in On the Aims of the Metaphysics that Themistius’ commentary on Book XII, and Alexander’s commentary on the first part of Book XII, were the only commentaries on any part of the Metaphysics available in Arabic. Themistius in his exposition of Metaphysics XII,10 develops Aristotle’s comparisons of the cosmos with an army or a household (with hierarchically ordered members), and adds a comparison to the constitution of a city or a kingdom. While this part of Themistius is extant only in a Hebrew translation of a lost Arabic translation, Themistius uses a phrase for the constitution which may well, in the Arabic, have been siyâsa madanîya, the title of Fârâbî’s Political Regime. Yoav Meyrav has now published an English translation of Themistius’ paraphrase of Metaphysics XII (Meyrav 2020), using the Arabic where available and the Hebrew elsewhere, which will make it much easier to compare Themistius’ and Fârâbî’s undertakings.

44. For a comparison of the two treatises, noting places where they diverge and suggesting some possible explanations for the divergences, see Galston 2015.

45. This list may be modelled on Proclus’ list of six kinds of principle (the efficient, final and paradigmatic causes, and the formal, material, and instrumental principles, which are not strictly “causes”), which becomes standard among 5th–6th century CE Platonists. For Proclus, each of these kinds of principle has its highest representative at a different level in the hierarchy of beings. While some details are similar between Fârâbî and Proclus, others differ.

46. Plotinus also says “the First” in Enneads V,4,1, “How what is after the First is from the First, and on the One”, which seems to have been an important model for Fârâbî for the beginning of the Perfect City. The Political Regime usually says “the First” (but at the first mention, in the first few lines of the treatise, “the first cause”); but, just once, “the First is that about which one should judge that it is god” (Butterworth 2015, 29, #2). Here Fârâbî says al-ilâh, “the god”, instead of the more usual Muslim (and Jewish and Christian) allâh (“God”), probably following a translation of Aristotle (or, e.g., of Themistius’ paraphrase of Metaphysics XII) which literally translated the Greek ho theos, “the god”. But al-ilâh is also perfectly acceptable in Islam, and allâh is originally just a contraction of al-ilâh; there is no difference in meaning.

47. Fârâbî, following Aristotle, thinks that the sensible world has existed from eternity, and that each species of plant and animal in it has also existed from eternity, so in this sense he allows infinite causal regresses, e.g., from me to my father to his father and so back ad infinitum. Anyone who wants to follow Aristotle consistently has to find a way to reconcile this with Metaphysics II,2, where Aristotle says that there is no infinite regress of any of the four kinds of cause. One standard thing to say is that my father is not the cause of my existence but only of my coming-to-be; this might be filled out by saying that if he were a cause of my existence, then when he ceases to exist I will also cease to exist. So perhaps when, in the Perfect City, Fârâbî speaks of X as a “cause of existence” to Y, he means to restrict this to cases where X exists at every moment when Y exists (he clearly does not intend to restrict it to cases where X and Y exist at precisely the same moments). If there were an infinite regress of such “causes of existence”, then the whole infinite series would have to exist simultaneously, and Fârâbî might be relying on the Aristotelian principle of the impossibility of actual infinities in rejecting this possibility. We might also say that if X is a cause of existence to Y and Y is a cause of existence to Z, then Y can only act to produce Z if X is also cooperating in producing Z, and that X is the primary cause of Z’s existence, and Y is only a secondary or instrumental cause; and if so we might say that if there is an infinite regress of such causes, there will be no sufficient cause for Z’s existence. Both of these arguments are developed by many medieval philosophers.

48. I will use “intelligence” for Arabic ʿaql = Greek nous: this Greek word and its Arabic equivalent can mean many things, and Fârâbi wrote a whole treatise working out a theory of the different things it can mean and how they are related, translated as “On the Intellect” in McGinnis-Reisman 2007 (68–78). The word “Reason” (with a capital R) might be a better translation than “intelligence”, but then it would be hard to translate the cognate verb: I have translated the finite verb, awkwardly, as “intellectually cognize” (we might say “intelligize”) and the passive participle as “intelligible”. The translation “intellect” is misleading, since in many uses ʿaql or nous is not a kind of soul or a part of a soul or a power of a soul: sometimes it is an act of a soul (a kind of cognition), or a disposition for such an act (an intellectual virtue), and sometimes it is the kind of separately existing substance, a Reason or Intelligence which acts on souls or in which souls participate. Aristotle describes this last kind of intelligence both in On the Soul III,5 and in Metaphysics XII, at least as these texts are interpreted by late ancient commentators. For Fârâbî on intelligence see the entry on al-Farabi’s psychology and epistemology and the sources there cited.

49. As he says, “there is not, in the same degree as its existence, any existence which could belong to it which it has not already received in full” (Walzer 1985, 56,13–15).

50. Literally, “the things by which its substantiation”. Fârâbî here uses the unusual word tajawhur, apparently equivalent to qiwâm, translated here as “constitution”.

51. Aristotle argues in Metaphysics XII,10 that two contrary first principles (like Empedocles’ Love and Strife, or Plato’s One and Indefinite Dyad) could not act on each other, but could only both act on a common matter, which would not be contrary to either of them but would be in potentiality to both of them. He then argues that the contrary principles would be dependent on the matter for their actualization, and so would not be pure actuality; he also argues that they would depend on some higher principle that would determine when one thing can act on another. Fârâbî discusses actuality and potentiality in distinguishing an intelligence which is essentially actually cognizing from an intelligence which is of itself potentially cognizing and depends on something else for its actualization, but he says very little about actuality and potentiality until he starts discussing intelligence.

52. Perhaps “caused by the interposition of the earth between the moon and the sun” is the differentia added to the genus “darkening of the moon”. Fârâbî says in Book of Letters I,89, following Aristotle’s Metaphysics VII,12, that the ultimate differentia as what is proper to the definiendum (i.e., what is not shared with anything else) has a special claim to be called the existence [wujûd, ousia in Aristotle’s Greek] of the thing.

53. See Section 3.4 for discussion of difficulties of text and construal here.

54. Caution: the word khâṣṣ, translated “specific” here, is not connected with the word for “species”, but with what is distinctive to a thing and so specifies it as opposed to other things.

55. Fârâbî is drawing on an interpretation of Aristotle On the Soul III,4 430a6–7, which was taken in late antiquity and the Middle Ages as saying that things that have matter are only potentially intelligible. The implication would be that things that exist without matter would be intelligible of themselves, but that forms existing in matter would need to be separated or “abstracted” from matter in order to become intelligible. This interpretation would help to explain the role in intellectual cognition of the “active intelligence” of On the Soul III,5, which Aristotle’s discussion leaves obscure: the active intelligence would act on forms to abstract them from matter in such a way that they could be received in a potential intelligence, i.e., in a rational soul, and the soul’s receiving those forms would constitute its cognizing them. This interpretation of On the Soul III,4–5 is now controversial. For Fârâbî on intelligence see the entry on al-Farabi’s psychology and epistemology and the sources there cited.

56. “It is intelligible [or intellectually cognized] inasmuch as it is intelligence, since that whose essence [huwiyya] is intelligence is intelligible to that whose essence is intelligence, and does not require, in order to be intelligible [or intellectually cognized] some other substance [dhât] outside itself which will intellectually cognize it; rather it itself intellectually cognizes itself” (70,7–10 in Walzer 1985).

57. Fârâbî’s formula that it is “intelligence and intelligent and intelligible” (ʿaql, ʿâqil, maʿqûl; Greek nous noôn noêton or nous noêsis noêton), although not verbatim in Aristotle, is a standard summary of Aristotelian conclusions, found in Plotinus V.3.5 and in Themistius.

58. This is a major theme of the Theology of Aristotle: see Adamson 2002.

59. Likewise the Political Regime: “when the First exists with the existence which belongs to it, it necessarily follows that there exist from [the First] all the natural beings which do not depend on human choice for the existence which they have” (in Butterworth 2015, 42, #27; Butterworth’s translation is rather different), with a close verbal parallel in the Perfect City (Walzer 1985, p.88).

60. The words here translated by “order” and “rank” are immediately cognate: the metaphor is of ranks in an army arrayed for battle, and comes from Aristotle’s explicitly military metaphor of the “order” of the cosmos in Metaphysics XII,10 1075a11–15.

61. Thus the Political Regime distinguishes between the intelligence governing each heavenly sphere, the soul of that sphere, and the body of the sphere, where the Perfect City apparently distinguishes only between the intelligence and the sphere, without also positing a soul of the sphere.

62. At the end of On the Intellect (McGinnis-Reisman 2007, 77–78) Fârâbî argues that because the intelligence governing each heavenly sphere must produce two things, it must be complex, and therefore cannot be the First, which must be simple. His immediate aim here is to show that the First is not, as a straightforward reading of Aristotle would suggest, the mover of the outermost heaven, but rather something prior which produces the mover of the outermost heaven. But if his argument here succeeds, it would also show that, contrary to what the Political Regime would suggest, the First cannot directly produce all of the intelligences governing the heavenly spheres. This supports the suggestion that the Perfect City is later than the Political Regime: perhaps it was this argument, as given in On the Intellect, that pushed him to work out the more complicated and indirect emanation-scheme of the Perfect City. In any case On the Intellect and the Perfect City seem to fit better with each other than with the Political Regime.

Notes to Fârâbî’s project of reviving the sciences of the ancients

1. For a survey of Fârâbî’s works, both those that are extant and texts that are referred to in (not always reliable) later medieval sources, see Rudolph 2017.

2. For an argument against the ascription of the Harmonization to Fârâbî, see Rashed 2009. The most recent edition of the Harmonization, with an Italian translation, is Martini Bonadeo 2008, which accepts the attribution to Fârâbî. There is an English translation in Butterworth 2001 (125–67). This text will be cited in Butterworth’s translation unless otherwise noted, and by Butterworth’s paragraph numbers. Even if the Harmonization is not by Fârâbî, there are similar things about the need to overcome apparently interminable disputes and establish scientific knowledge, and to go back to Plato and Aristotle in order to do so, in Fârâbî’s Attainment of Happiness (on Plato and Aristotle specifically #63–4) and its sequels, the Philosophy of Plato and Philosophy of Aristotle. These texts are translated in Mahdi 1969b.

3. “wa-ilaihimâ al-marjiʿ”: diverging from Butterworth, who undertranslates, “we turn to them”.

4. But see Fârâbî’s dismissive account of the standards of “ʿaql” in kalâm in his On the Intellect, in McGinnis-Reisman 2007 (70, #5).

5. Fârâbî in On the Appearance of Philosophy (preserved in a later historical compendium, Ibn abî Uṣaibi‛a, and translated in Rosenthal 1975, 50–51), keeps complete silence on all earlier Muslim philosophers, including Kindî and Abû Bakr al-Râzî, representing himself, a Muslim student of Christian teachers, as the person who brought scientific philosophy into Islam. He is certainly aware of Kindî and Râzî, but as far as currently appears he never names Râzî, and names Kindî only once, in a musical text, the Kitâb iḥṣâʾ al-îqâ‛ât, which attacks Kindî for wrongly tracing certain rhythms in Arabic music back to the Greek philosophers. There is a summary of the treatise in Shiloah 1971; extracts were subsequently published in Mahdi 1976. There was also earlier Muslim philosophy in Shi‛ite, and especially Isma‛ili, circles. The Brethren of Purity are of uncertain date, but Ibn al-Haitham (not the famous mathematical scientist Ibn al-Haitham but the Fatimid propagandist whose memoir is edited and translated by Madelung-Walker 1999) is certainly earlier than Fârâbî, and by his own account he was not the first in this vein. The Isma‛ilis want to give content to the knowledge of the inner meaning of the Qurʾân or of religious law that their imam supposedly possesses, and often they turn to (a popularized version of) Greek philosophy to fill in the content. Fârâbî too wants philosophy to supply this inner meaning (which for him too is known by the imâm, though certainly not only by the imâm), but he would regard the Isma‛ili versions of philosophy as unscientific, and he wants to break philosophy out of Muslim sectarian confines as well as out of Christian confines.

6. So Fârâbî’s On the Appearance of Philosophy (in Rosenthal 1975, 50–51). Fârâbî’s account there of the history of Greek and Arabic philosophy is a series of reworkings of myths, designed ultimately to magnify his own position, and should never be taken on faith, but sometimes there are real facts behind it, in however distorted a form. The story about the bishops banning the study of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic and theory of demonstration because it would endanger Christian faith is historically nonsense (designed to tell a Muslim audience, “show us by your tolerance of logic that you don’t have anything to be afraid of, as the Christians do!”), but Gutas 1999a has argued that it reflects a decision in the Alexandrian medical schools to require the teaching of Aristotle’s logic only up to the non-modal syllogistic, on the ground that this is as much as a practicing doctor needs. For some doubts about Gutas’ conclusions, and some broader context, see Watt 2008.

7. On Fârâbî on Galen see Zimmermann 1981 (lxxxi–lxxxiv). Fârâbî says in Attainment of Happiness #63,

The philosophy that answers to this description was handed down to us by the Greeks from Plato and Aristotle only. Both have given us an account of philosophy, but not without giving us also an account of the ways to it and the ways to reestablish it when it becomes confused or extinct.

Fârâbî sees himself as reestablishing scientific philosophy when it has become, at best, confused. Book of Letters III,222 p.210,12–15 mentions the possibility that some science which the ancients had finished discovering has gone extinct and needs a new dialectical investigation in order to reestablish it as a science; and, he says, this can also happen within some one (linguistic or religious) community that has not received philosophy in a finished form.

8. There is an old-fashioned English translation of Abû Ḥayyân al-Tawḥîdî’s account of this debate in Margoliouth 1905, and a more recent French translation in Elamrani-Jamal 1983.

9. For a Muslim audience it would be uncontroversial that there are a plurality of correct religions, each founded by a prophet sent from God, typically each with their own sacred book and religious law, a law which would include (but not necessarily be limited to) a set of rituals, taboos, and so on, binding on that community but not on the rest of the world.

Notes to Fârâbî on the word for being, in Greek and Arabic

1. “Noun”, in a Greek or Arabic context, must be taken to include adjectives as well as what we would call common and proper nouns.

2. Normal Arabic would be to use perfect and imperfect forms of the verbal root k-w-n, saying “X kâna Y” for the past and “X yakûnu Y” for the future, and when not expressing a tense to say either just “X Y” or “X huwa Y”. But then either the tenseless copula is not expressed or it is not linguistically related to the tensed copulas. There is no reasonable way either to give a tenseless copula cognate with k-w-n or to give a tensed copula cognate with huwa; using w-j-d instead solves this problem.

Copyright © 2021 by
Stephen Menn <>

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