Supplement to al-Farabi’s Metaphysics

Fârâbî on the word for being, in Greek and Arabic

Fârâbî says:

in all other languages [i.e., other than Arabic], such as Persian and Syriac and Sogdian, there is an expression which they use to signify all things without specifying one thing as opposed to another thing [i.e., it is a predicate which is true of any subject whatever], and they also use it to signify the connection [ribâṭ, elsewhere translated “copula”] between the predicate and what it is predicated of: this is what connects the predicate with the subject when the predicate is a noun or when they want the predicate to be connected with the subject absolutely, without any mention of time. (Book of Letters I,82, p.111,4–8)

This contrasts with Arabic, which expresses tensed and tenseless sentences using different grammatical constructions. If the predicate is a verb, then its inflectional form marks it for tense. If the predicate as well as the subject is a noun,[1] then the sentence can be either tensed or tenseless. In sentences marked for tense, Arabic uses a (tense-marked) verb to connect the subject and the predicate (typically using the perfective verb kâna to mark the past or its imperfective yakûnu to mark the future). But where the speaker does not wish to mark the sentence for tense, usually the subject-noun is simply followed by the predicate-noun without any word serving as a copula, although sometimes a pronoun “he” [huwa] or “she” [hiya] is used to separate the subject from the predicate, mostly in cases where the two nouns in sequence would otherwise be heard as a noun-phrase rather than as a complete sentence. Fârâbî thinks that it is a good thing, i.e., a grammatical reflection of an important underlying logical structure, for a language to be able to express tenseless as well as tensed propositions; this is especially important for expressing science, since scientific propositions are tenseless. He assumes that Greek must be at least as logically expressive as Arabic, and so must distinguish syntactically between tensed and tenseless sentences. But he also assumes that Greek must be free of what he sees as the Arabic flaw of not (usually) expressing the copula in tenseless sentences: the copula is “necessary in the theoretical sciences and in the art of logic” (Book of Letters I,83 p.112,3), in order to distinguish the subject and predicate sides of an assertion, and to distinguish a subject-predicate sentence from a subject-attribute noun phrase. Because, according to Aristotle’s definition of “verb” in On Interpretation 3, a verb must “consignify a time”, the tenseless copula cannot be a verb. Nor can the copula be a noun: if to predicate one noun of another we must insert a third noun between them, there will be an infinite regress of copulas. So the tenseless copula, in Greek as Fârâbî reconstructs it, must be a particle, although there will also be tensed copulas which are verbs paronymously derived from this particle. Similarly it should be possible to say “X exists” or “there are X’s” without specifying any particular time at which X exists, and since this expression “exists” is tenseless it cannot be a verb. It might be a noun, like “thing”, but Fârâbî thinks that in a logically perspicuous language we would say not “X thing” but “X is a thing”, using the tenseless copula, and he thinks that then the noun “thing” would be otiose: it would be more logically perspicuous to say just “X is”, using the same tenseless expression that also serves as a copula. So Fârâbî assumes that the Greek word estin (or astîn) is a particle serving both in 2-place and in 1-place contexts, i.e., serving both in tenseless predicative statements “X is Y” and in tenseless statements of existence “X is”; and he assumes that this is the word that Aristotle is discussing in the chapter on the meanings of being, Metaphysics V,7.

Fârâbî says (Book of Letters I,83–86) that the Arabic translators of Greek philosophical texts had difficulty with “astîn”, since no word in Arabic does exactly what “astîn” does in Greek. He says that the translators have chosen two different strategies, each with some advantages and some disadvantages. Sometimes they have coined a new Arabic word “huwiyya”, artificially derived from the pronoun “huwa”, not in its normal use to mean “he”, but in its special use in separating a subject-noun from a predicate-noun and so functioning as a tenseless copula (although Arabic does this only in a restricted class of sentences). But more usually (and this is the usage that Fârâbi himself generally follows) they translate Greek terms for being by metaphorically extending passive forms of the Arabic verbal root w-j-d, “to find”. One advantage of this strategy is that it is possible to express both tensed and tenseless copulas with forms from the same root: for tensed copulas the translators use the perfect and imperfect passive verbs, “wujida” = “has been found” and “yûjadu” = “will be found”, so that they say literally “X will be found Y” to mean “X will be Y”; and for a tenseless copula the tenseless passive participle “mawjûd” = “found”, saying “X [is] found Y” to mean “X is [tenselessly] Y”.[2] Another advantage is that we can use the same expression in both 1-place and 2-place contexts, saying either “X wujida Y”, “X has been found Y” = “X was Y”, or simply “X wujida”, “X has been found” = “X has existed” (and likewise in the other forms). The disadvantage is that “mawjûd”, the tenseless word for 1-place or 2-place being, is grammatically paronymous, unlike the Greek word it translates, so that its grammatical form does not correspond to its logical form. This gives rise to the misleading appearance that everything that is mawjûd is so, perhaps through someone’s having found it, or else through a wujûd, an existence, distinct from it and present in it, as everything that is white is so through a whiteness distinct from it and present in it. This wujûd might be God, conceived as something like a Platonic Form of being (as in Kindî and in some Arabic reworkings of Greek neo-Platonic texts), or it might be something else, as later in Avicenna. The Book of Letters’ account of the logical syntax of being, discussed in the main article, is designed to expose and root out these errors, but also to give the ontological foundations for a positive metaphysical account of God as the first cause of being.

Copyright © 2021 by
Stephen Menn <>

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