Abu Yusuf Ya‘qub ibn Ishaq Al-Kindi (ca. 800–870 CE) was the first self-identified philosopher in the Arabic tradition. He worked with a group of translators who rendered works of Aristotle, the Neoplatonists, and Greek mathematicians and scientists into Arabic. Al-Kindi’s own treatises, many of them epistles addressed to members of the caliphal family, depended heavily on these translations, which included the famous Theology of Aristotle and Book of Causes, Arabic versions of works by Plotinus and Proclus. Al-Kindi’s own thought was suffused with Neoplatonism, though his main authority in philosophical matters was Aristotle. Al-Kindi’s philosophical treatises include On First Philosophy, in which he argues that the world is not eternal and that God is a simple One. He also wrote numerous works on other philosophical topics, especially psychology (including the well-known On the Intellect) and cosmology. Al-Kindi’s work in mathematics and the sciences was also extensive, and he was known in both the later Arabic and the Latin traditions for his writings on astrology.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Influences on al-Kindi
- 3. Metaphysics
- 4. Psychology
- 5. Science
- 6. Legacy
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Al-Kindi was a member of the Arab tribe of Kinda, which had played an important role in the early history of Islam. His lineage earned him the title “philosopher of the Arabs” among later writers. We know that al-Kindi died after 866 CE, and his death date is usually put in the early 870s. His birth date is harder to pin down, but he is said to have served as a scholar under the caliph al-Ma’mun, whose reign ended in 833, and he was certainly associated with the court of the next caliph, al-Mu‘tasim (reigned 833–842). He is thus usually reckoned to have been born around 800 CE. He was born in Basra and educated in Baghdad. His philosophical career peaked under al-Mu‘tasim, to whom al-Kindi dedicated his most famous work, On First Philosophy, and whose son Ahmad was tutored by al-Kindi.
Al-Kindi’s philosophical activities centered around the translation movement that had been initiated and supported by the ‘Abbasid caliphs since prior to al-Kindi’s birth (on this see Endress 1987/1992, Gutas 1998). Al-Kindi oversaw one of the two main groups of translators in the ninth century (the other group was led by Hunayn ibn Ishaq). The “Kindi circle” (see Endress 1997) translated numerous works of philosophy and science from Greek into Arabic. (On the output of the circle see below, 2.1.) Al-Kindi seems to have been a mediator between the patrons of these translators and the scholars who actually did the translating, many of whom were Syrian Christians or of Syrian extraction. His own writings might be thought of as a sustained public relations campaign intended to display and advertise the value of Greek thought for a contemporary ninth century Muslim audience.
We are fortunate in having a list of titles of works ascribed to al-Kindi, which is found in the Fihrist of the tenth century bookseller Ibn al-Nadim. Thanks to Ibn al-Nadim we know that al-Kindi wrote hundreds of treatises on a very wide variety of scientific and philosophical disciplines. Indeed the scientific and mathematical titles far outnumber the philosophical titles. Many of the latter would now be lost if not for a single manuscript, held in Istanbul, which contains most of al-Kindi’s extant philosophical writings (edited in Abu Rida 1950 and 1953; several important texts are edited and translated in Rashed and Jolivet 1998). This includes the work for which he is best known, On First Philosophy. Our version of this treatise is incomplete, comprising only the first part, which is divided into four sections. The first section is essentially an exhortation to the reader to honor Greek philosophical wisdom. The second contains al-Kindi’s celebrated discussion of the eternity of the world. The third and fourth establish the existence of a “true One,” i.e. God, which is the source of unity in all other things, and consider the inapplicability of language to this true One.
The Istanbul manuscript also includes one of the few copies of al-Kindi’s On the Intellect to survive in Arabic (it is also preserved in Latin translation). This is the first treatise in the Arabic tradition to give a taxonomy of the types of intellect, such as will become familiar in al-Farabi, Avicenna and Averroes. Other works shed further light on al-Kindi’s psychology (i.e. theory of soul): the Discourse on the Soul consists of supposed quotations from Greek philosophers, That There are Separate Substances uses Aristotle’s Categories to prove that the soul is immaterial, and On Sleep and Dream gives an account of prophetic dreams in terms of Aristotle’s theory of the imagination. Related to al-Kindi’s psychological theories is his only significant surviving work on ethics, On Dispelling Sorrows. (He also composed a collection of ethical anecdotes and sayings ascribed to Socrates, for which see Fakhry 1963.)
Al-Kindi sets out his cosmological theories in two further texts found in the same manuscript, On the Proximate Agent Cause of Generation and Corruption and On the Prostration of the Outermost Sphere. Also relevant here are numerous works on meteorology and weather forecasting. These apply the same cosmological ideas to show how heavenly motion produces rain and other meteorological phenomena in the lower world where we live. While these works are influenced by Aristotle, al-Kindi also draws on other Greek sources, such as Ptolemy. His knowledge of the Greek scientific tradition was in fact extensive. For instance, he uses Euclid and ideas that can be traced to Ptolemy in a well-known work on optics, On Perspectives, which is preserved only in Latin. Al-Kindi’s extant scientific corpus is sizable and includes treatises on the manufacture of drugs, music, astrology, and mathematics (see further Rosenthal 1942). But the focus here will be on al-Kindi’s philosophical views.
As one would expect given his prominent role in the translation movement, al-Kindi’s works are suffused with ideas from Greek thought. His philosophical works are indebted in part to the mathematical and scientific authors translated by his day, for instance Nicomachus of Gerasa; Euclid influenced his methodology as well as his mathematics (cf. Gutas 2004). But the most important influence on his philosophy was from Aristotle, whose corpus al-Kindi surveys in a treatise called On the Quantity of Aristotle’s Books (Abu Rida 1950, 363–84; also Guidi and Walzer 1940, Cortabarria Beitia 1972, Jolivet 2004, Ighbariah 2012). This work provides a fairly thorough overview of Aristotle’s corpus, though al-Kindi clearly has not read some of the treatises he discusses. When al-Kindi comes to mention the contents of the Metaphysics he gives the following, rather surprising, summary:
His purpose in his book called Metaphysics is to explain things that subsist without matter and, though they may exist together with what does have matter, are neither connected nor united to matter; to affirm the oneness of God, the great and exalted, to explain His beautiful names, and that He is the agent cause of the universe, which perfects [all things], the God of the universe who governs through His perfect providence and complete wisdom.
While this may not look like an accurate description of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, it is a wholly accurate description of al-Kindi’s own conception of the science of metaphysics. That he conflates metaphysics with theology is clear from the opening of On First Philosophy, which says that since philosophy in general is the study of truth, “first philosophy” is “the knowledge of the first truth who is the cause of all truth.” And indeed Aristotle’s Metaphysics is a major influence on this work. However, as is typical of al-Kindi’s philosophical writings, On First Philosophy also makes extensive use of ideas from translations of Neoplatonic writings. The proof for the existence of a “true One” is based in part on Proclus (as shown in Jolivet 1979), and one can detect influences from the Arabic version of Plotinus produced in al-Kindi’s circle, the so-called Theology of Aristotle. Perhaps the most important single influence, however, is an attack on Aristotle by the Neoplatonist Christian thinker John Philoponus, over the issue of the world’s eternity.
On First Philosophy, then, is a particularly good example of how al-Kindi combines Neoplatonic and Aristotelian ideas in his vision of a coherent philosophy derived from the Greeks. The way for this synoptic conception of the Greek inheritance had actually been prepared by the Neoplatonists themselves, whose commentaries on Aristotle presage the harmonizing tendencies obvious in al-Kindi. But as a promoter of Greek wisdom, al-Kindi would in any case have been eager to deemphasize any tensions between Greek philosophers, or any failings on the part of Greek thinkers. For example he gives no sign that his position on the eternity of the world departs from that of Aristotle. (Interestingly he is more willing to recognize shortcomings on the part of Greek scientific thinkers, for instance in Euclid’s optics, though even here he emphasizes the need for a charitable approach.) Later in the first section of On First Philosophy, al-Kindi unleashes a torrent of abuse against unnamed contemporaries who criticize the use of Greek ideas:
We must not be ashamed to admire the truth or to acquire it, from wherever it comes. Even if it should come from far-flung nations and foreign peoples, there is for the student of truth nothing more important than the truth, nor is the truth demeaned or diminished by the one who states or conveys it; no one is demeaned by the truth, rather all are ennobled by it.
Although al-Kindi was unyielding in his support for the ideas disseminated in the translation project, he was inevitably influenced by the intellectual currents of his day. This comes out most clearly when al-Kindi uses Greek ideas to engage with the problems of his time, especially in the arena of theology.
Two examples of this engagement, to be discussed in more detail in the next section, are al-Kindi’s treatment of divine attributes, and his views on creation. As we will see al-Kindi held an austere view on the question of attributes, on the basis that predication invariably implies multiplicity, whereas God is unrestrictedly one. This has been compared (Ivry 1974, Adamson 2003) to the position of the Mu‘tazilites, who were the main contemporary theologians of the ninth century. Mu‘tazilite influence may also be present in al-Kindi’s theory that creation is a “bringing to be of being from non-being,” and especially in his denial that creation can be eternal. (This may be related to the Mu‘tazilite claim that the Koran is created and not eternal; see Adamson 2007, ch.4.)
Al-Kindi uses philosophy to defend and explicate Islam in several works. He wrote a short treatise attacking the Christian doctrine of the Trinity, using concepts drawn from the Isagoge of Porphyry (al-Kindi’s refutation was the subject of a counter-refutation by the tenth century Christian philosopher, Yahya ibn ‘Adi; see Périer 1920). While this is the only extant work that engages in theological controversy, we know from the Fihrist that he wrote other treatises on similar themes. The extant corpus also contains passages in which al-Kindi expounds the meaning of passages from the Koran. Most striking, perhaps, is his discussion of creation ex nihilo in the midst of On the Quantity of Aristotle’s Books. This passage is a commentary on Koran 36: 79–82. Al-Kindi mentions the same Koranic passage, and discusses the special nature of prophetic knowledge, in a meteorological work entitled On Why the Higher Atmosphere is Cold (see Abu Rida 1953, 92–93). The cosmological work On the Prostration of the Outermost Sphere, meanwhile, is entirely devoted to explaining the Koranic verse “the stars and the trees prostrate themselves” (55: 6) in terms of al-Kindi’s account of heavenly influence on the sublunary world. Al-Kindi’s remarks here show his interest in the contemporary disciplines of grammar and Koranic exegesis.
A desire to integrate Greek ideas into his own culture is shown in a different way by On Definitions, a list of technical philosophical terms with definitions (see Abu Rida 1950, 165–79; also Allard 1972, Klein-Franke 1982). This work is ascribed to al-Kindi, and though its authenticity has been doubted it is almost certainly at least a production of al-Kindi’s circle. Most of the defined terms correspond to Greek technical terms, and thus build up an Arabic philosophical terminology which is intended to be equivalent to that of the Greeks. It is striking that, so early in the Arabic philosophical tradition, there was already a perceived need for a novel technical language for communicating philosophical ideas in a different setting (and of course for translating Greek into Arabic). Some, though certainly not all, of the terms listed in On Definitions will indeed become standard in the later philosophical tradition.
Al-Kindi’s most significant work, On First Philosophy (for which see Abu Rida 1950, 97–162, Ivry 1974, Rashed and Jolivet 1998, 9–99), is devoted to “first philosophy” or metaphysics, a science al-Kindi immediately identifies with the study of God. Since all philosophy is an inquiry into truth, first philosophy is the knowledge of God, who is “the first truth and the cause of all truth.” While this may not sound like it has much to do with Aristotle’s understanding of first philosophy as the science of being, al-Kindi closely associates being with truth (“everything that has being has truth”). For him, to say that God is the cause of all truth is tantamount to saying that God is the cause of all being, a point made more explicit at the end of what remains to us of On First Philosophy (see further below, 3.2).
The central concept in the theology of On First Philosophy, however, is neither truth nor being, but oneness. Indeed al-Kindi argues for a first cause of being precisely by arguing for a first cause of oneness, and asserting that “bringing something to be” means imposing unity of a certain kind. Al-Kindi’s philosophical theology thus has two main aspects: a proof that there must be some “true One” that is the cause of the unity in all things, and a discussion of the nature of this true One. These aspects are treated, respectively, in the third and fourth sections of On First Philosophy.
In the third section, al-Kindi first proves that nothing can be its own cause, a point that is not used explicitly in what follows, but may be intended to show that nothing can be the cause of its own unity. He then undertakes an exhaustive survey of the various types of “utterance (lafz).” Following Porphyry’s Isagoge, he classifies all predicates or terms (maqulat) into genus, species, difference, individual, proper accident, and common accident. Taking them in turn, al-Kindi argues that each type of predicate implies both unity and multiplicity. For example, animal is one genus, but it is made up of a multiplicity of species; human is one species but is made up of many individuals; and a single human is one individual but made up of many bodily parts. Finally, al-Kindi seeks an explanation for the association of unity and multiplicity in all these things. He argues that the association cannot be merely the product of chance; nor can it be caused by any part of the set of things that are both one and many. So there must be some external cause for the association of unity and multiplicity. This cause will be exclusively one, entirely free of multiplicity: al-Kindi expresses this by saying that it is “essentially” one, whereas the other things are “accidentally” one. He also speaks of it as “one in truth,” whereas other things are one “metaphorically.” In short, the cause in question is the “true One,” or God.
Now, since we have already seen that every sort of term or expression implies multiplicity as well as unity, it is no surprise that in section four of One First Philosophy al-Kindi goes on to argue that the various sorts of predicate are inapplicable to the true One. He sums up his conclusion as follows (Rashed and Jolivet 1998, 95):
Thus the true One possesses no matter, form, quantity, quality, or relation. And is not described by any of the other terms: it has no genus, no specific difference, no individual, no proper accident, and no common accident. It does not move, and is not described through anything that is denied to be one in truth. It is therefore only pure unity, I mean nothing other than unity. And every unity other than it is multiple.
As mentioned above, this conclusion has been compared to the view of those contemporary theologians referred to as Mu‘tazilites. They similarly took a strict view on the question of divine attributes, arguing that God’s simplicity ruled out the acceptance of any attributes distinct from God’s essence. However it is Greek antecedents that are clearly the main influence on al-Kindi here. His “true One” bears a strong resemblance to the first principle of the Neoplatonists. Indeed we might be reminded of Plato himself, insofar as al-Kindi’s God seems to function like a Platonic Form. Just as the Form of Equal is entirely equal and not at all unequal, and serves to explain equality in other things, so God is entirely one, not at all multiple, and explains the unity in other things.
This is, however, only a part of al-Kindi’s view on divine causation. Because, as we have seen, al-Kindi thinks that to be a thing of a certain kind is to be one in a certain way, he infers that the true One is the cause of being as well as unity (see further Adamson 2002b). In particular, he believes that God is an “agent” or efficient cause. This view is expressed in a succinct text (possibly a fragment from a longer, lost work) headed with the title On the True, First, Complete Agent and the Deficient Agent that is Metaphorically [an Agent] (Abu Rida 1950, 182–4). The text begins as follows:
We say that the true, first act is the bringing-to-be of beings from non-being. It is clear that this act is proper to God, the exalted, who is the end of every cause. For the bringing-to-be of beings from non-being belongs to no other. And this act is a proper characteristic [called] by the name “origination.”
Al-Kindi goes on to explain that whereas God is a “true” agent, since He is a cause of being and acts without being acted upon, all other agents are only “metaphorically” agents, because they both act and are acted upon. The force of the term “metaphorical” here is the same as it was in On First Philosophy: just as created things are both many and one, and thus not “truly” one, so they are both passive and active, and thus not “truly” agents.
This short text raises two interesting questions about how al-Kindi conceived of divine action. First, what does he have in mind when he describes God’s agency as being mediated by the action of “metaphorical agents” (God “is the proximate cause for the first effect, and a cause through an intermediary for His effects that are after the first effect”)? Second, what is involved in “bringing being to be from non-being”?
Regarding the first question, one might suppose that al-Kindi is following Neoplatonic texts, and that he has in mind a mediated emanation of effects from the first principle. If this is right, then the “first effect” will be the “world of the intellect” mentioned in other Kindian texts (e.g. the Discourse on the Soul, repeating this phrase from the Theology of Aristotle). This is supported by a non-committal remark in On First Philosophy that “one might think the intellect is the first multiple” (Rashed and Jolivet 1998, 87). But it seems at least as likely that the “first effect” mentioned here is the world of the heavens: by creating the heavens and setting them in motion, God indirectly brings about things in the sublunary world (see further below, 5.2). This would be a more Aristotelian version of the idea that divine causation is mediated.
Regarding the second question, the idea that God is an agent cause of being may likewise seem at first to be a departure from Aristotle. But in fact Neoplatonist authors like Ammonius had explicitly argued that Aristotle’s God was an efficient cause of being, not just a final cause of motion. And a passage in On the Quantity of Aristotle’s Books — the aforementioned discussion of Koran 36: 79–82 — understands creation on the model of Aristotelian change, in which something passes from one contrary to another. In the case of creation, one contrary is “non-being” and the other “being.” Al-Kindi’s discussion of this has parallels in ninth century theological discussions of creation (see Adamson 2003). But his main source, surprisingly, is Ammonius’ student John Philoponus, a Christian Neoplatonist who had also spoken of creation as bringing something to be “from non-being.” What separates al-Kindi and Philoponus from Aristotle is their idea that this kind of “change” from non-being to being requires no subject. For example, for there to be a change from non-white to white, there must be some subject or substrate for both the privation of the whiteness and the whiteness itself (for instance the fence that goes from being non-white to being white when it is painted). God, by contrast, can bring about being ex nihilo, with no subject for the change. Al-Kindi emphasizes also that God’s creative act requires no time to be realized.
These two points bring us to a more extensive use of Philoponus by al-Kindi, in the latter’s well-known argument that the world is not eternal (for which see Davidson 1969 and 1987, and Staley 1987). Most Greek philosophers followed Aristotle in holding that the world is eternal, meaning not only that it will never cease to exist, but that it has always existed. This was the doctrine of Aristotle and the Stoics, and also of orthodox Neoplatonists, who interpreted Plato’s Timaeus as likewise committed to the past eternity of the world. Philoponus was an exception to this rule. In a work rebutting the Neoplatonist Proclus’ arguments in favor of the world’s eternity, he argued at great length that Plato’s Timaeus rightly envisions a world with a beginning in time. And in another work directed against Aristotle, Philoponus tried to undermine the arguments of the De Caelo and Physics by which Aristotle had shown that the world is eternal.
In section two of On First Philosophy, and several other short works that repeat the same arguments found in this section, al-Kindi follows arguments that derive from Philoponus. (Exactly which text or texts by Philoponus he used is unclear, but it would seem that he at least knew parts of Against Aristotle.) Interestingly, al-Kindi completely ignores a major aspect of Philoponus’ polemic: in the De Caelo, Aristotle had argued that the heavens must be eternal, because they have perfect, circular motion and are therefore not made out of any of the corruptible four elements of our lower world. Whereas Philoponus attacks this cosmology with a lengthy and detailed refutation, al-Kindi simply accepts that the heavens are made out of an ungenerable and indestructible fifth element – but blithely adds that they are nonetheless originally brought into being by God with a beginning in time. (For this see the treatise That the Nature of the Celestial Sphere is Different from the Natures of the Four Elements, edited at Abu Rida 1953, 40–6.)
When al-Kindi comes to argue explicitly against the eternity of the world, he uses Philoponus’ strategy of using Aristotle against himself. Aristotle famously held that there can be no such thing as an actual infinite. Thus, for instance, the body of the world cannot be infinitely large. Because the cosmos is finite in spatial magnitude, argues al-Kindi, nothing predicated of the body of the cosmos can be infinite. Since time is one of the things predicated of this body, time must be finite; therefore the world is not eternal.
This argument seems to be a poor one. Even if Aristotle admits that nothing infinite can be predicated of a finite body, he will want to say that al-Kindi’s argument fails to take full account of the distinction between actual and merely potential infinities. An actual infinity is an infinity which is simultaneously present in its entirety – for example, an infinitely large body, or in general any set with an infinite number of members existing at the same time. A potential infinity is when a finite magnitude can be extended or multiplied indefinitely. For example, Aristotle thinks that any finite magnitude of space or time is potentially infinite, in that it can in principle be divided into as many parts as one wishes, with smaller divisions still possible. The body of the cosmos, as al-Kindi admits himself, is also potentially infinite, in the sense that there is nothing conceptually impossible about increasing its size indefinitely. Notice, though, that in either case the actual result of such a process will be finite: any determinate addition to the size of a body will still yield a body of finite size. Likewise, no matter how finely I divide a body, any particular act of division will yield a finite number of parts.
Now, Aristotle believes that the eternity of the world commits him only to a potential infinity. This is because saying that the world has always existed does not imply that any infinity is presently actual. Rather, it implies only that “the world has already existed for N years” will be true for any value of N. One can, so to speak, go as far as one wishes into the past, positing increasingly large (but still finite) periods of past time, just as one can divide a body as finely as one wishes. And it is far from clear that this sort of potential infinity is inapplicable to a finite magnitude. Does al-Kindi have any response to this?
He does, though his response comes only at the end of his treatment of the world’s eternity. The response, found also in Philoponus, is that even to reach the present moment, an actually infinite number of moments must already have elapsed. In other words, there is currently an actually infinite number of moments (or years, or whatever) that have elapsed “since the world began.” And, as Aristotle himself says, the infinite cannot be traversed. Whether this argument is successful is unclear. It seems to presuppose that we select an infinitely distant point in past time, and then reckon the number of years that have elapsed since then. But Aristotle will presumably want to block the initial move of selecting an infinitely distant point in past time, insisting that any particular point we choose in the past will be removed from the present by a merely finite number of years.
We have two works by al-Kindi devoted to the ontology of the human soul: That There are Incorporeal Substances and Discourse on the Soul. The two depend on very different Greek sources, and are very different in rhetorical presentation. But the doctrine that emerges from them is not necessarily inconsistent.
That There are Incorporeal Substances (Abu Rida 1950, 265–69, Adamson and Pormann 2009) is a creative application of ideas from Aristotle’s Categories to the problem of showing that the human soul is an immaterial substance. Al-Kindi takes up this task in stages, first proving that the soul is a substance, then showing that it is immaterial. He argues that the soul is a substance by drawing on the opening chapters of the Categories to claim that the essence of something shares a name and definition with that thing. Since the soul is the essence of the living being, and the living being is a substance, the soul is also a substance. Furthermore, it is an immaterial substance: for the soul is “the intellectual form of the living thing,” and an intellectual form is a species. But species, al-Kindi argues, are immaterial; therefore the soul is immaterial. Among the problematic moves in this train of argument is the identification of the human soul with the species of human. This would seem to be al-Kindi’s attempt to bring together the idea of species, which is a “secondary substance” in the Categories, with the doctrine of form found in such works as the De Anima and Metaphysics. Al-Kindi simply conflates the two, without argument – he does not address the obvious question of how there can be many human souls, all of which are identical with the single species human.
Apart from brief opening and closing remarks, Discourse on the Soul (Abu Rida 1950, 272–80; also D’Ancona 1996, Genequand 1987, Jolivet 1996) consists entirely of supposed quotes from Greek authorities – Plato, Pythagoras, and Aristotle – about the nature of the soul. The actual sources used are unclear, though the Republic is the ultimate source for a section describing Plato’s tripartite soul. The section on Aristotle is a fable about a Greek king, and has nothing to do with any extant Aristotelian work. The tenor of these remarks is hortatory, ascetic and even visionary: our task is to cleanse our souls from the “stains” that adhere to it from the body, and to ascend through the heavenly spheres, ultimately to the “world of the intellect” where it will reside in “the light of the Creator.” The soul in question here would seem to be the rational soul: the lower parts of Plato’s tripartite soul (the irascible and concupiscent parts) are described as faculties seated in the body. The point of this psychological doxography is not unlike that of Incorporeal Substances: the soul is a “simple substance,” separate from body. Indeed this is presented as the overall message of the treatise in al-Kindi’s closing remarks.
This rigorously dualist psychology has far-reaching effects in al-Kindi’s epistemology and ethics. It is clear from the Discourse that when al-Kindi speaks of the soul as separate from body, even during our worldly life, he is referring only to the intellective or rational soul. While this does not by itself rule out that intellection and reason are somehow grounded in bodily experience, al-Kindi does not pursue an empiricist program in contexts where he addresses epistemological issues.
The most important text on epistemology is al-Kindi’s best-known work apart from On First Philosophy, namely On the Intellect (Abu Rida 1950, 353–8; also McCarthy 1964, Ruffinengo 1997). This treatise has received an unusual amount of attention, despite its brevity and compressed argument, because it is the first Arabic work to show the influence of Greek taxonomies of the intellect into levels or types. (See especially Jolivet 1971, with Endress 1980.) These taxonomies, with various versions put forward by Alexander, Themistius, Philoponus and other commentators, were in turn attempts to systematize Aristotle’s remarks on intellect in De Anima book 3 and elsewhere.
Far from grounding intellect in sensation, al-Kindi argues in On the Intellect that the human intellect has a parallel, but separate, function to human sense-perception. (For a similar contrast see also On First Philosophy, section 2.) Just like sensation, the human intellect in itself begins in a state of potentiality. This is the first type of intellect, the potential intellect, which is merely an ability to grasp intellectual forms. Once it grasps a form and is actually thinking, it becomes “actual intellect.” We are then able to think about these forms at will. Our ability to do so is what al-Kindi calls the “acquired intellect” (not to be confused with “acquired intellect” in al-Farabi, who means by this a comprehensive attainment of the many intellectual forms). Notice that these types of intellect are really only the same, human intellect in three different states: wholly potential, wholly actual, and temporarily potential but able to actualize at will.
But how in the first place do we get from potential intellect to actual intellection? It is here that al-Kindi might have told some sort of empiricist story, perhaps involving abstraction; such a story plays at least some role in al-Kindi’s successors al-Farabi and Avicenna. But instead al-Kindi gives a thoroughly intellectualist account of how we come to think, one which is parallel to, but distinct from, his account of sensation. Just as sensation is actualized by an external sensible form, so intellect is actualized by an external intelligible form. This form will reside in the final type of intellect, the “first intellect,” which is al-Kindi’s version of the infamous “maker intellect” in Aristotle’s De Anima 3.5. While it is unclear what position this first intellect is meant to have in al-Kindi’s ontology, it is clear that it is distinct from human intellect. The first intellect is “always in act,” which means that it can serve as an external source for intelligible forms, just as sensible object serves as an external source for a sensible form.
We get some sense of how al-Kindi might have applied this highly intellectualist epistemology in specific contexts from works on recollection and on dreams. His On Recollection (for which see Endress 1986 and 1994) argues explicitly that we cannot derive intelligible forms from sense-perception. Thus we do not “learn” these forms, but simply “remember” them from before the soul entered into the body. Here al-Kindi is of course broadly following the account of recollection given by Plato in the Meno or Phaedo, though how he might have known of this account remains obscure. (Most likely it is from an Arabic version, perhaps in summary, of the Phaedo.)
A longer and more detailed text is On Sleep and Dream (Abu Rida 1950, 293–311; also Ruffinengo 1997), which gives a naturalistic account of why prophetic dreams occur, and how they may be interpreted. Here al-Kindi’s chief source was Aristotle’s Parva Naturalia, which include the works On Sleep, On Dreams, and On Prophecy in Sleep. The extant Arabic version of these texts, which may well be related to the version used by al-Kindi, is importantly different from the Greek version, in that it admits that genuinely prophetic dreams can be sent from God (cf. Pines 1974). If al-Kindi knew this version then he follows it only in part: he embraces the idea of prophetic dreams, but does not claim that they come to us from God. To explain dreams al-Kindi invokes a faculty we have not yet discussed, namely imagination or phantasia. Following Aristotle, al-Kindi says that dreams occur when we are sleeping because the senses are no longer active, and the imagination has free rein to conjure up forms on its own. We are also given a physiological account of sleep, which departs from Aristotle by placing the imaginative faculty in the brain. Whereas Aristotle has some difficulty explaining, and is in fact rather skeptical about, the phenomenon of prophetic dreams, al-Kindi is enthusiastic about them. He even explains the various types of dream, with their accuracy determined by the physical state of the brain. But despite the physiological aspects of al-Kindi’s account, the fundamental explanatory work is done by the incorporeal soul, which “announces” its visions of the future to the imagination. Again, the rational soul grasps its objects by itself. Tellingly, al-Kindi thinks that sensation hinders this power of the soul, rather than contributing anything to it.
Given that al-Kindi sharply divides the rational soul from the body and the lower psychological faculties, and that he sees the rational soul as our true “self” or “essence” and as the only part of us that survives the death of the body, it is no surprise that his ethical thought is likewise highly intellectualist. Unfortunately, the numerous works on ethical and political topics ascribed to him in the Fihrist are almost all lost. The most significant remaining text is On Dispelling Sadness (Ritter and Walzer 1938, also Butterworth 1992, Druart 1993, Jayyusi-Lehn 2002, Mestiri and Dye 2004). This is also the work of al-Kindi that will be most often cited by subsequent thinkers, for example by Miskawayh in his Tahdhib al-Akhlaq (The Refinement of Character).
On Dispelling Sadness, as its title indicates, is a work in the genre of philosophical consolation. Much of the text consists in practical advice, maxims and anecdotes that one may bear in mind when one finds oneself affected by sorrow. One particularly striking passage allegorizes our earthly life as a temporary landfall during a sea voyage; this image derives ultimately from Epictetus. The philosophical foundations of the treatise, though, are laid in the early sections, where al-Kindi gives a principled argument against placing value on physical objects. By their very nature, he says, wealth and other physical goods are vulnerable and transitory. No one can be sure that their possessions will not be taken from them – they may “be seized by any power.” And more crucially, the very fact that they are physical means that they are subject to generation and corruption, and are therefore fleeting. Instead, we should value and pursue things that are stable and enduring, and that cannot be taken from us: these will be the things in the now familiar “world of the intellect.” To the extent that one’s desires are directed solely towards intelligible things, one will be invulnerable to sadness. This argument, then, shows that sadness is always needless. The anecdotes and more practical “remedies” offered in the rest of the treatise are intended to make it easier for us to accept and live in accordance with this conclusion.
Despite the anti-empiricist character of al-Kindi’s epistemology noted above, he devoted enormous energy to various branches of the physical sciences. Particularly well represented in the extant corpus are his work on optics and medicine, especially the compounding of drugs (for optics see Rashed 1997; for medicine see Gauthier 1939, Klein-Franke 1975, Celentano 1979; for these aspects of al-Kindi’s thought generally see Adamson 2007, ch.7). What is characteristic about al-Kindi’s approach to such topics is the use of mathematics. It has been persuasively argued that mathematics was fundamental to al-Kindi’s own philosophical method (Gutas 2004, cf. Endress 2003); a good example is his mathematical approach to Aristotle’s categories, which makes quantity and quality fundamental for Aristotelian logic (Ighbariah 2012). Certainly he missed no opportunity to apply mathematical techniques to what we would now think of as “scientific” topics. In addition, he wrote numerous works on music (edited in Zakariyya’ 1962), which for the ancients and al-Kindi himself was a branch of the mathematical sciences. He also wrote extensively on more recognizably mathematical topics, as is attested by the Fihrist, though again much of this material is lost.
A good example of how al-Kindi applied mathematics to other fields is his use of geometry in optics (see further Lindberg 1971, Rashed 1997, Adamson 2006). On this subject al-Kindi followed the tradition inaugurated by Euclid, and carried on by Ptolemy and others, in which geometrical constructions were used to explain phenomena such as visual perspective, shadows, refraction, reflection, and burning mirrors. This procedure implies that light and vision can be formalized as geometrical lines, an implication that al-Kindi and his sources embrace by claiming that vision occurs when “rays” emitted from the eyes along straight lines strike a visual object. Likewise, objects are illuminated when a light source emits light rays that strike the objects’ surfaces. Aspects of al-Kindi’s account anticipate that of Ibn al-Haytham, who some decades later would be the first to explain vision accurately.
Now, this account based on “rays” also seems to underlie al-Kindi’s most ambitious work on the physical sciences: a lengthy treatise entitled On Rays (de Radiis, for which see D’Alverny and Hudry 1974) and preserved only in Latin. There is some question as to its authenticity, but it seems plausible that On Rays represents al-Kindi’s attempt to explain all physical interaction – from heating and cooling, to vision, to astral influence, to magical incantations – in terms of a fundamentally geometrical mechanism. (For connections to the optical works, see Travaglia 1999.)
A central part of On Rays explains that the stars and planets bring about events in the sublunary world by means of rays emitted from the heavenly bodies to points on the earth’s surface. This differs from an account found in several other cosmological treatises by al-Kindi, where he follows Alexander of Aphrodisias in holding that the heavenly bodies literally heat up the lower world by means of friction as they pass over it. In either case, however, the account given is intended to explain the efficacy of the science of astrology. Al-Kindi wrote numerous works on this subject, and his associate Abu Ma‘shar was the greatest figure in Arabic astrology. Both of them saw astrology as a rational science, undergirded by a well-worked out theory of physical causes (see further Burnett 1993, Adamson 2002a).
Al-Kindi’s corpus includes several treatises on cosmology, explaining and defending a picture of the cosmos as four concentric circles of elements, which are mixed together by the outer, heavenly spheres to yield complex compound substances like minerals, plants, and animals. Though al-Kindi’s main influences are works of Aristotle and his commentators, especially Alexander, he also knows something of the Timaeus, as is shown by a treatise explaining why Plato associated the elements and heavens with the Platonic solids (Abu Rida 1953, 54–63; also Rescher 1968).
One respect in which al-Kindi follows Alexander is his conviction that the heavenly spheres are the means by which God exercises providence over the sublunary world (see Fazzo and Wiesner 1993). Al-Kindi’s bold claims for astrology already commit him to the idea that a wide range of specific events can be predicted on the basis of astral causation. His doctrine of providence goes further by implying that all events in the lower world are caused by the stars, which are carrying out the benign “command” of God. This doctrine is set out in On the Prostration of the Outermost Sphere (Abu Rida 1950, 244–261, Rashed and Jolivet 1998, 177–99) and On the Proximate Agent Cause of Generation and Corruption (Abu Rida 1950, 214–237). The former explains that the heavens are possessed of souls, and freely follow God’s command so as to move in such a way that the providentially intended sublunary things and events will come about. This, according to al-Kindi, is what the Koran refers to when it says that the stars “prostrate” themselves before God. In Proximate Agent Cause, meanwhile, al-Kindi gives a more detailed account of the means by which the heavens cause things in the lower world (here he invokes friction, not rays). The most obvious effect of the stars on our world is of course the seasons, because the sun (due to its size and proximity) is the heavenly body with the most powerful effect. If there were no such heavenly causation, according to al-Kindi, the elements would never have combined at all, and the lower realm would consist of four spheres of unmixed earth, water, air and fire.
Al-Kindi’s account of astral causation and providence is a very good example of his philosophical method: combining and building on ideas taken from Aristotle, later Greek philosophers, and “scientific” authors like Ptolemy, he gives a rational account of a central concept in Islam. Prostration shows that he is even willing to use such an account to expound the Koran itself. Al-Kindi is confident that, once exposed to judicious presentations of Greek wisdom, his more enlightened contemporaries and sponsors will agree that these foreign texts can be used — jointly with autochthonous “Arabic” disciplines like grammar — in the service of a deeper understanding of Islam itself.
Al-Kindi’s optimism on this score was not necessarily borne out in subsequent generations. But among thinkers influenced by al-Kindi, one can discern a continuing tendency to harmonize “foreign” philosophy with the “indigenous” developments of Muslim culture. This is one feature of what might be called the “Kindian tradition,” an intellectual current that runs up through the tenth century, which is most obviously represented by first and second generation students of al-Kindi’s. Particularly prominent among these figures is al-‘Amiri, a well-known Neoplatonist thinker who was a second generation student of al-Kindi’s (the link was al-Kindi’s student Abu Zayd al-Balkhi). Also influenced by al-Kindi were the Jewish thinker Isaac Israeli (on whom see Altmann and Stern 1958) and the aforementioned tenth century polymath Miskawayh.
While al-Kindi is only rarely cited by authors writing in Arabic later than the tenth century, he was a significant figure for Latin medieval authors. Most influential were his works on astrology (see Burnett 1999); but works like On the Intellect were also translated, and as noted above there are works in the Kindian corpus that are extant only in Latin. One of these, On Rays, was the target of a polemic composed by Giles of Rome.
To this we might add that philosophy in the Islamic world was itself a broader legacy of al-Kindi’s, and this in two respects. Firstly, the translations produced in the Kindi circle would become standard philosophical texts for centuries to come – particularly influential would be their translations of certain Aristotelian works (such as the Metaphysics) and of Plotinus, in the Theology of Aristotle. Secondly, though authors like al-Farabi and Averroes hardly mention al-Kindi by name (al-Farabi never does so, and Averroes does so only to criticize his pharmacological theory), they are carrying on his philhellenic project, in which the practice of philosophy is defined by an engagement with Greek philosophical works.
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