Eternity in Christian Thought

First published Thu Mar 22, 2018

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Natalja Deng replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

The term “eternity” plays a key role in discussions about how the God of Western theism relates to time. These discussions have a long and venerable history. They are also of lively contemporary interest.

The reason for this long-standing and continued interest is straightforward. How one sees God’s relationship to time has repercussions throughout philosophy of religion and philosophical theology. How much and in what ways does God’s relationship to time, and thus his nature, differ from ours? How much can meaningfully be said about what God is like, as opposed to how God is not? How, if at all, can an unchanging God interact with the world, affect history, or respond to petitionary prayer? And even, how should one think of the relation between science and theistic religion; can empirical findings (dis-) confirm theism? Thus, a conception of how God relates to time is a defining element of any conception of God.

This entry provides an overview of some key positions on God and time and discusses arguments for and against divine timelessness. The final section outlines some other philosophical contexts in which the concept of eternity can play a role.

1. Terminology

“Theism” will here refer to the view that there is a God who is omniscient, omnipotent, and omnibenevolent, who created the world, and who is still actively involved in the world.

In philosophical discussions about God and time, the term “eternity” has been used in different ways. On one usage, which will be followed here, “eternity” stands for the relationship to time that God has, whatever it is. When used in that way, the term is neutral between different ways of spelling out what God’s relationship to time is. Western theists agree that God is eternal; the task is to formulate and assess conceptions of what this eternality might amount to.

Broadly speaking, there have been two rival views of what God’s eternality consists in. On the first, God is timeless (divine timelessness); on the second, God is in time (divine temporality). Sometimes the term “eternity” is used to denote timelessness, but as mentioned, we will here use it as neutral between the timeless and temporal views. The term “everlasting” (or “sempiternal”) on the other hand, is mostly associated with the temporal view. On the temporal view, God is in time and thus exists at every time; there is no time at which God doesn’t exist.

2. Methodology

This discussion inherits the complexities of two very intricate philosophical debates (about God, and about time). Given the nature of the topic, it is perhaps not unreasonable to wonder what methodology can be fruitfully employed here.

As the topic is the God of Western theism, there are constraints arising from relevant passages in Western Scripture. Much of the discussion focuses on the Judeo-Christian, especially the Christian, tradition. (But note that specific Christian doctrines such as the doctrine of the Trinity or the Incarnation, while closely related, are not the focus here.) The Bible contains many passages calling God eternal, as well as ones that elaborate on God’s eternality. For example, there are passages telling us that God’s “years have no end” (Ps. 102:27, all quotations are from the New Revised Standard Version) and that God exists “from everlasting to everlasting” (Pss. 90:2, 103:17). God says, “let there be lights in the dome of the sky to separate the day from the night, and let them be for signs and for seasons and for days and years” (Gen. 1:14), and “I am the first and I am the last” (Isa. 44:6). Moreover, we are told that God promised us eternal life “before the ages began” (Titus 1:2), and that “He himself is before all things” (Col. 1:17). These passages require interpretation, and that’s where the philosophical work begins (see, e.g., Leftow 2005 for a formulation of constraints based on these passages).

One broad methodological choice concerns whether or not to let one’s theological commitments determine one’s views about the metaphysics, or even the physics of time. A salient alternative would be to do the opposite, for example by taking as one’s starting point the metaphysical view of time suggested by our best physical theories and then drawing out any theological implications. A third approach might involve giving equal weight to both poles and seeking to come to a coherent and adequate conception of both time and God as part of the same endeavor. There probably exist a variety of stances across the philosophical and theological landscapes (for explicit reflection on related methodological questions see, e.g., Murray & Rea 2008: 47; Mullins 2016: Ch. 1).

3. Brief Historical Remarks

Until recently, the timelessness view dominated in both philosophy and theology. For that reason, much of the historical discussion revolves around that view.

3.1 The Loci Classici

The loci classici are to be found in Book XI of the Confessions of Augustine (354–430) and Book V of Boethius’s (480–c.525) The Consolation of Philosophy. (The extent to which the Platonism of Philo of Alexandria [c. 25 BCE–CE 40], particularly as applied to the idea of creation [for example, in his De opificio mundi] was influential, is not clear.) However, the styles of these two thinkers are very different. Boethius presents the idea of timeless eternity as straightforward and relatively problem-free. Augustine wrestles with the idea and expresses continual puzzlement at the idea of time itself and with it the contrasting idea of timeless eternity.

In Boethius, the contrast is between timeless eternity, which only God enjoys, and everlastingness, which (following Plato) the world itself possesses.

It is the common judgement, then, of all creatures that live by reason that God is eternal. So let us consider the nature of eternity, for this will make clear to us both the nature of God and his manner of knowing. Eternity, then, is the complete, simultaneous and perfect possession of everlasting life; this will be clear from a comparison with creatures that exist in time.

…for it is one thing to progress like the world in Plato’s theory through everlasting life, and another thing to have embraced the whole of everlasting life in one simultaneous present. (Boethius Consolation, V.VI., transl. V. E. Watts 1969)

Boethius uses his view of eternity to address the problem of divine foreknowledge (see section 6.2). If God knows beforehand what we will do then how can we act freely? His answer is that this problem dissolves in the face of the fact that God does not know anything beforehand but has an immediate, atemporal knowledge of all things.

In Boethius, we find several analogies for timeless eternity. One is that between timeless eternity and the centre of a circle. The thought is that the centre bears the same relation to any point on the circumference of the circle, and in the same way timeless eternity bears the same relation to anything in time. (Aquinas develops this analogy later.) Another analogy is that between God’s timelessly eternal vision and someone at the summit of a hill taking in at a glance what is taking place beneath her.

Augustine connects God’s timeless eternity to God’s being the cause of all times and God’s immutability.

What times existed which were not brought into being by you? Or how could they pass if they never had existence? Since, therefore, you are the cause of all times, if any time existed before you made heaven and earth, how can anyone say that you abstained from working? (Augustine, Confessions, XI. xiii (15)).

It is not in time that you precede times. Otherwise you would not precede all times. In the sublimity of an eternity which is always in the present, you are before all things past and transcend all things future, because they are still to come. (Augustine, Confessions, XI. xiii (16)).

In you it is not one thing to be and another to live: the supreme degree of being and the supreme degree of life are one and the same thing. You are being in a supreme degree and are immutable. In you the present day has no ending, and yet in you it has its end: “all these things have their being in you” (Rom.11.36). They would have no way of passing away unless you set a limit to them. Because “your years do not fail” (Ps.101.28), your years are one Today. (Augustine, Confessions, I. vi (10))

3.2 Sources in Antiquity

As mentioned, Boethius finds the source of his conception of eternity in Plato. In the Timaeus (37E6–38A6) Plato contrasts the eternal forms with the time-bound created world, the world of change and becoming. Time was created along with the heaven (38B5)—meaning at least that time is the measure of change, and perhaps that it is identical with the movements of the heavenly bodies (a view later critiqued by Augustine (Confessions, Book XI. xxiii)). Plato’s idea of eternity in the Timaeus seems to be that of a timeless duration. The Forms endure in the temporal order in which “time is the moving image of eternity”. One can trace a similar idea of timeless eternity back to Parmenides (though exactly what he means is the subject of scholarly dispute).

While (in some places at least) Plato connects the necessary character of the Forms to timelessness, in Aristotle the connection is between necessity and everlastingness. What is necessary is what exists at all times. What is contingent is what at some time is not. God, being necessary, is everlasting. It may be said that the everlasting is not bounded by time (though it is unbounded in a weaker sense than Plato ascribes to the Forms) in that what exists everlastingly cannot age (Physics 221b30). Philo of Alexandria is thought to be the first to ascribe timelessness to God, to the God of the Jewish Scriptures. In Plotinus (ca. 185–254) timelessness and life are for the first time identified. Nous is eternal and beyond time, enjoying duration without succession.

3.3 Medieval Thinkers

Anselm (c. 1033–1109) presents a view similar to that of Boethius and Augustine.

Suppose, on the other hand, that it exists as a whole in individual times severally and distinctly. (A human being, for instance, exists as a whole yesterday, today and tomorrow.) In this case we should, properly, say that it was, is and will be. In which case its time-span is not simultaneously a whole. Rather it is stretched out in parts through the parts of time. But its time-span is its eternity and its eternity is precisely itself. The supreme essence, therefore, would be cut up into parts along the divisions of time. (Anselm, Monologion, Ch. 21)

For Anselm, the timeless eternity of God follows from God’s being that than which nothing greater can be conceived (cf. section 6.1). In the Proslogion, Anselm articulates a “grammar” of the divine powers, which determines what it makes sense to say of the most perfect being, including that being’s timelessness.

In the medieval period, the discussion embraces not only Christian but also Jewish and Islamic thinkers. In keeping with the sharp line drawn between the Creator and creation, Aquinas and the Jewish thinker Moses Maimonides (1131–1204) (who greatly influenced Aquinas) argue that God’s timeless eternity ought to be understood primarily in negative terms. For Aquinas, God’s timeless eternity is unending, lacking both beginning and end, and an instantaneous whole lacking succession. It is a correlate of divine simplicity (see the SEP entry on divine simplicity), and it is incapable of being defined or fully grasped by a creature. For Aquinas too, timeless eternity constitutes part of the “grammar” of talking about God. Since God is timelessly eternal it does not make any sense to ask how many years God has existed, or whether he is growing old, or what will he be doing later on in the year.

Despite differences with Thomas Aquinas regarding the nature of God’s relation to time, Duns Scotus (c.1266–1308) seems to have upheld divine timelessness (though see Leftow 1991: 228). In general, it would seem that commitment to divine simplicity, widespread if not universal in the medieval period, entails a commitment to divine timelessness (Mullins 2016: Ch. 3).

4. Some Views on God and Time

It has recently been suggested that there are actually two orthogonal issues regarding God’s relationship to time: (1) whether God is located in our spacetime—the spacetime investigated by modern physics; and (2) whether God is eternal or everlasting. (Note that this is the terminology not employed here.) God could be eternal, with a life that’s not marked by temporal succession, while being located at every spacetime point. Conversely, God could be everlasting while not located in physical spacetime at all (Murray & Rea 2008: Ch. 2).

At first sight, this distinction can seem to leave the second issue somewhat mysterious: if it is not being located in our, physical spacetime, then what is it? What can it mean to say that an entity is everlasting, or exists at all times, if that doesn’t commit one to a view on whether that entity is located in spacetime? What then are times—are they not somehow to be understood in terms of spacetime, ultimately?

But there are two distinct issues in the vicinity. One is about God’s life, or, for want of a better phrase, the nature of God’s experience. Whether or not a being experiences succession, and more generally, what the (a)temporal features of its experience are, is distinct from whether or not that being is located in spacetime.

However, there are also connections between these issues. The beings we are most familiar with, such as ourselves, are spatiotemporal and experience temporal succession; and for us, these facts are related. It is partly because we are located in spacetime that we experience succession, and there are interesting questions about the details of this connection.

This section outlines some views on God and time, with a focus on the contemporary literature; further reading suggestions appear at the end of this section. Each view may involve claims both about whether God is located in time/spacetime, and about (a)temporal features of God’s experience. Specifically, timelessness views may involve both the claim that God is not located in time/spacetime, and the claim that God’s life is atemporal, for example in the sense that God doesn’t experience succession. Similarly, temporal views may involve both the claim that God is in time/spacetime and that God’s life is temporal, for example in the sense that God experiences succession.

4.1 Divine Timelessness

4.1.1 Pure Atemporalism

On this view, God is not located in time and God’s life does not have any temporal features. This is a natural first gloss of the timelessness position. However, few defenders of divine timelessness sign up to this view. It has been suggested that Maimonides and Schleiermacher may hold it (Leftow 2005; actually, the view Leftow attributes to these authors is that God has no “typically temporal properties” (TTPs); see the end of section 4.1.3).

4.1.2 Atemporal Duration

Boethius has strongly influenced the contemporary landscape. Much of this influence flows through work by Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann (hereafter S&K 1981, 1987, 1992).

Recall Boethius (Consolation, V.VI., here in a different translation, by Stewart et al. 1973): “Eternity […] is the whole, simultaneous, and perfect possession of boundless life”. Or again, eternity is the complete possession all at once of illimitable life.

Stump and Kretzmann distill four ingredients from this claim.

  • (1) A timeless being has life (of a non-biological kind), i.e. is alive. That is, abstracta (if there are any), like numbers or sets, don’t count. Neither would the world, even if it was sempiternal.
  • (2)The life of a timeless being is without limit and cannot be limited. It cannot begin or end. It is impossible for it not to have infinite duration.
  • (3) The life of a timeless being therefore involves a special sort of, atemporal, duration.
  • (4) A timeless being possesses its life all at once, completely. That is, it doesn’t experience succession. This, according to Stump and Kretzmann, is what makes it the case that a timeless being is outside of time. By contrast, a living being in time experiences succession, only ever possessing one moment of its life at a time.

Not only does a timeless being not experience succession, but its life’s events don’t involve succession. Since change requires succession, a timeless being doesn’t change. But a timeless being is still presently alive in some sense of “presently”. Moreover, the events in that being’s life are simultaneous in some sense, both with each other and with temporal items.

To show how, Stump and Kretzmann coin the notion of Eternal-Temporal Simultaneity (“ET-simultaneity”). First, define an “eternal present” to be an infinitely extended, pastless, futureless duration (strictly speaking, on the terminology used here, it should be “timeless present”). Then let Temporal Simultaneity (“T-simultaneity”) be existence/occurrence at the same time, and let Eternal Simultaneity (“E-simultaneity”) be existence/occurrence at the same eternal present. Each involves only one mode of existence, namely either the temporal or the eternal. ET-simultaneity, by contrast, relates items in different modes of existence, one temporal, and one eternal.

Stump & Kretzmann base their definition of ET-simultaneity on notions borrowed from some presentations of special relativity:

Let “x” and “y” range over entities and events. […]

(ET) For every x and every y, x and y are ET-simultaneous if and only if:

  1. either x is eternal and y is temporal, or vice versa; and
  2. for some observer, A, in the unique eternal reference frame, x and y are both present—that is, either x is eternally present and y is observed as temporally present, or vice versa; and
  3. for some observer, B, in one of the infinitely many temporal reference frames, x and y are both present—that is, either x is observed as eternally present and y is temporally present, or vice versa. (S&K 1981: 439)

They also offer the following image. Imagine two parallel horizontal lines. The lower line represents time, and the upper one represents timeless eternity. Presentness is represented by light. The temporal present is represented by a light that moves steadily along the lower line, while the eternal present is represented by the upper line being lit all at once. Each dot in the lower line, when it is temporally present, is ET-simultaneous with the whole of the upper line. Or at least this is so from the viewpoint of that time. From the viewpoint of eternity, the entire lower line is lit up; each time “insofar as [it] is temporally present” is ET-simultaneous with the whole upper line (S&K 1992: 475).

Since, by definition, two items can only be ET-simultaneous if one is temporal and the other eternal, and since any given item is only one of these, ET-simultaneity is not reflexive; in fact, it never holds between an entity and itself. Nor is it transitive; in fact, when x and y are ET-simultaneous and y and z are too, x and z never are. The non-transitivity of ET-simultaneity is needed to solve a pressing problem. If t is simultaneous with eternity, and eternity is simultaneous with \(t'\), then t is simultaneous with \(t'\). So, all times collapse into one:

But, on St. Thomas’ view, my typing of this paper is simultaneous with the whole of eternity. Again, on his view, the great fire of Rome is simultaneous with the whole of eternity. Therefore, while I type these very words, Nero fiddles heartlessly on. (Kenny 1979: 38–9)

The Stump & Kretzmann proposal has generated much discussion. Here are three questions that have been raised.

First, is the notion of an atemporal duration coherent? (See Fitzgerald 1985; also Craig 1999; Nelson 1987; Helm 1988: 35.) What licenses speaking of a duration here? The eternal present is supposed not to be pointlike, but to involve an infinite stretch or extension of some kind. This suggests that it should possess some of the formal features of extension. For example, it should be possible for two particulars to have the same or different amounts of the extension. If this is not the case with atemporal duration, then how is it a duration? And if it is the case, then how is it not a temporal duration?

A proponent of this view may insist that such features are not possessed by atemporal duration, because such features are had only if the extension in question is divisible (S&K 1987, 1992). And the eternal present is not. In support of this, they may suggest that not even all temporal extension is divisible. Consider our temporal experience on short time scales and the doctrine of the “specious present”. On that doctrine, temporal experience involves a temporally extended content. Perhaps this is not even conceptually divisible, even though it’s a temporal extension (S&K 1992: 468). The comparison is particularly apt if one wants to think of the eternal present as God’s specious present encompassing all of time (Alston 1984, also Leftow 1991: 143; though see Oppy 1998, in Other Internet Resources, for a critique of this idea).

Moreover (they may add), even if all temporal extension is divisible, this doesn’t show that all extension is. Pressed to justify their use of the term “extension” and explain its connection to ordinary usage, they point to other cases in theology of irreducibly analogical predication (see Rogers 1994 for objections to this move).

Second, what can it mean for something eternally present to observe something as in the temporal present, and vice versa? (See Lewis 1984; also Nelson 1987; Padgett 1992: 69; Swinburne 1993.) Suppose something eternal observes something as temporally present. If that means it observes something that comes to be, then doesn’t the observation itself come to be, making the being temporal? Conversely, how can a temporal entity observe something as being eternal? How can it observe anything without bringing that thing into the temporal series? After all, the event of x’s observing y at t is identical with the event of y’s being observed by x at t.

Consider this revised definition of ET-simultaneity:

  • (ET′) For every x and every y, x and y are ET-simultaneous if and only if
  1. either x is eternal and y is temporal, or vice versa (for convenience, let x be eternal and y temporal); and
  2. with respect to some A in the unique eternal reference frame, x and y are both present—i.e., (a) x is in the eternal present with respect to A, (b) y is in the temporal present, and (c) both x and y are situated with respect to A in such a way that A can enter into direct and immediate causal relations with each of them and (if capable of awareness) can be directly aware of each of them; and
  3. with respect to some B in one of the infinitely many temporal reference frames, x and y are both present—i.e., (a) x is in the eternal present, (b) y is at the same time as B, and (c) both x and y are situated with respect to B in such a way that B can enter into direct and immediate causal relations with each of them and (if capable of awareness) can be directly aware of each of them. (S&K 1992: 477–8)

Does this provide an answer to the objection, or does it rely on one? As pointed out by Brian Leftow in a similar context (Leftow 1991: 173; also Fales 1997), on the view proposed, the temporal and the eternal can enter into causal relations only if they are in some sense simultaneous. That is the reason ET-simultaneity is invoked. If one then relies on a notion of ET-causality in the definition of ET-simultaneity one faces a problem of circularity.

Third, what role, if any, is special relativity playing in the proposal? The intended role is a considerable one. Considerations of the relativity of simultaneity are supposed to show that the difficulties with the notion of ET-simultaneity are “by no means unique” and “cannot be assumed to be difficulties in the concepts of ET-simultaneity or of eternity themselves” (S&K 1981: 439). But it is hard to see how they could show this. Stump and Kretzmann emphasize the finding that simultaneity is a three-place relation and present it as a response to a threat of incoherence (two distant events being both “simultaneous […] and not simultaneous” (S&K 1981: 437)). But the difficulties with ET-simultaneity arise whether it is two-place or three-place. They pertain to spelling out what an eternal present and the unique eternal frame of reference might be, and how there can be causal relations, including observational ones, between a being in it and us. No comparable difficulties are involved in special relativity (Fales 1997; also Padgett 1992: 71; Craig 2009).

4.1.3 The time of timeless eternity

For Brian Leftow, the central idea is that all things in time are also, with God, in timeless eternity. He finds this idea in Anselm. Like in the Stump and Kretzmann proposal, the idea is given a contemporary twist through appeals to the notion of a reference frame and special relativity.

Consider the claim that God has no spatial location. Since there can be a spatial distance only between things or locations in space, this implies that there is no spatial distance between God and things in space. From this, Leftow infers that the distance between God and any thing in space is zero (the “Zero Thesis”) (Leftow 1991: 222).

The Zero Thesis says not only that the distance between God and any spatial thing is zero, but also that it always is zero. Therefore nothing ever moves with respect to God. Moreover, all change supervenes on motion, e.g., change in color supervenes on motion in microparticles. So there is no change with respect to God (Leftow 1991: 227). Therefore, God and all spatial things share a frame of reference, the reference frame of eternity, in which nothing changes. In this reference frame, all events are simultaneous, including God’s actions and their effects. That is, they all occur at eternity, and eternity is something like another time, so they are all simultaneous. But in other, temporal reference frames, this is not the case. In these, God’s actions occur at eternity but their effects occur at particular points in time. So in these frames, they are nonsimultaneous. And this is where special relativity comes in. After all, the relativity of simultaneity shows that events simultaneous in one frame of reference may be nonsimultaneous in others.

Unfortunately, the Zero Thesis and Leftow’s case for it are problematic. From the fact that there is no spatial distance between spatial things and God, it does not follow that the spatial distance between spatial things and God is zero. A similar inference leads one to claim that all spatial things are spatially contiguous with yellow and the number 3. Leftow is of course aware of this consequence, and accepts it as a surprising finding about yellow and the number 3; he argues that the Zero Thesis only seems problematic because one fails to notice that a distance of zero is just an absence of distance (Leftow 1991: 225). However, a distance of zero would seem to be a distance, not an absence of distance (Oppy 1998, in Other Internet Resources).

As before, it’s hard to see how talk of reference frames and appeals to the relativity of simultaneity can be helpful or even relevant. A reference frame is a system of physical devices such as measuring rods and clocks that allow an observer to fix the positions of events. It’s not clear how timeless eternity can be such a system. Nor is it clear how timeless eternity can, in addition, be (like) a time, simultaneity with which can be the outcome of measurements.

Before turning to further elements of Leftow’s view, it is useful to pause to describe some background on the metaphysics of time (see also the SEP entries on time, John M.E. McTaggart, and being and becoming in modern physics). McTaggart distinguished between the A-series and the B-series of events. The A-series runs from the future through the present and into the past, while the B-series runs from earlier to later (McTaggart 1908). This distinction survives in the form of the contemporary opposition between the B-theory and (various versions of) the A-theory of time.

According to the B-theory (tenseless theory, block universe view), (a) all times and/or events exist and are equally real (this is known as eternalism—not to be confused with divine timelessness which has also sometimes gone by the same name); and (b) there is a complete tenseless description of temporal reality. A tenseless description is one that stays accurate, because it mentions only such things as which events happen when, and how they are temporally related to one another. So it mentions only facts about B-relations like simultaneity and succession. Call these tenseless facts. The B-theory combines eternalism with the claim that there is a complete description of temporal reality, a description of temporal reality at its most fundamental, that doesn’t mention any tensed facts, like that it’s 12:00 now.

Opposed to this are various versions of the A-theory, which deny one or both of (a) and (b). What these A-theoretic views (including eternalist and non-eternalist ones, like presentism or the growing block view) have in common is that they metaphysically privilege one time. Fundamental tensed facts capture this privilege. One prominent motivation for the A-theory is the conviction that time passes (robustly—i.e. in a sense that goes beyond mere B-theoretic temporal succession (see Skow 2015: 2); in what follows that’s what I mean by “temporal passage”). As time passes, the tensed facts change: first it’s a fundamental fact that it’s 12:00, then that it’s 12:01.

Now return to Leftow’s view. Let A-occurring be occurring now, and let B-occurring be occurring at a certain temporal location t that is now. (This is intended to be continuous with McTaggart’s distinction.) B-occurring entails A-occurring: if something occurs at a temporal B-location t that is now, it occurs now. But not vice versa. Something can occur now without occurring at a temporal B-location t that is now. Something can, that is, A-occur without B-occurring. Now define A-simultaneity as occurring “at the same now”. B-simultaneity, by contrast, is having the same temporal B-location in some B-series. If two events are B-simultaneous and they B-occur (i.e. they are located at the same B-temporal location that is now), they are A-simultaneous. And if two events occur at the same atemporal now and A-occur (i.e. occur now), they are also A-simultaneous.

The upshot is that

the A-simultaneity that obtains between a timeless God and temporal entities is univocal with the A-simultaneity that obtains between temporal entities. (Leftow 1991: 239)

This would make the relation between temporal entities and the timeless God less mysterious than it is on the Stump & Kretzmann proposal, on which ET-simultaneity is sui generis, obtaining only between one temporal and one eternal relatum.

But this seems to be an advance that was gained by stipulation, because the discussion started thus: “[L]et us so understand “now” that occurring now does not entail having a position in a B-series of earlier and later events. That is, let us in effect take “now” and “occurring now” as primitive terms univocally applicable to temporal and eternal or timeless things” (Leftow 1991: 239). It’s not surprising that given this initial stipulation, the ensuing definitions allow one to say that the A-simultaneity that obtains between temporal entities is the same relation that obtains between a timeless God and temporal entities.

According to Leftow, there can be no change in (timeless) eternity, and in eternity, all events happen (A-) simultaneously. However, in some places eternity is instead described as involving succession, namely as consisting of a number of different B-series corresponding to different temporal reference frames (Leftow 1991: 239). Prima facie, these are different, incompatible ideas. B-theorists, who hold that time, fundamentally, consists of events standing in B-relations of precedence and simultaneity, do not also hold that all of time collapses to a single time.

This is relevant to the notion of Quasi-Temporal Eternality (QTE, Leftow 1991: 120–2). Unlike Stump & Kretzmann, Leftow holds that atemporal duration, understood as QTE, involves distinct points but not parts. These points are (at least in some sense) earlier and later than one another, but they do not stand in the relation of succession. This seemingly paradoxical claim is partly defended via appeals to the B-theory. The idea is that Boethian eternity is like an extension in B-time, and that a QTE being’s life contains earlier and later points with no succession between them. In this respect, we are told, it is like life in B-time, only without an illusion of temporal passage.

There is a danger here of misinterpreting the B-theory. While the B-theory doesn’t posit temporal passage, it does posit succession. Relatedly, the traditional project of squaring our temporal experience with the B-theory is about explaining away an illusion of temporal passage, not about explaining away an illusion of temporal succession (see the SEP entry on the experience and perception of time). Since the B-theory posits succession (a B-relation), an experience of succession is non-illusory, on the B-theory. This makes trouble for Leftow’s appeals to the B-theory. After all, Leftow holds that a QTE being’s life, in which all times are experienced at once, is what a non-illusory experience of B-time would be like (Leftow 1991: 122). In other words, the thought is that an experience of temporal succession is illusory, on the B-theory.

Leftow also suggests that the sense in which QTE involves earlier and later points is not a temporal one, but a logical one. However, logical priority is not temporal priority, nor is it relevantly like temporal priority (Rogers 1994: 11).

A more recent idea is that of a typically temporal property (TTP). A property is a TTP if a term predicating it is “part of a definition of being temporal or figures appropriately in the right sort of nondefining sufficient condition for being temporal” (Leftow 2002). The right sort is for example “necessarily, whatever is past was temporal” rather than “necessarily, whatever is a pig is temporal”. The thought is that just like being bipedal helps make us human without being sufficient for making us human, so, e.g., being present helps make things temporal without being sufficient for making things temporal (and so there can be an timeless eternal present a la Boethius).

4.2 Divine Temporality

In recent times, there has been a notable shift away from divine timelessness. There are many different kinds of views that fall under the heading of divine temporality; many of these could also be classified as “intermediate” views. As in 4.1, the list is of course far from exhaustive.

4.2.1 Pure Temporalism

On this view, God is located at all times, God experiences succession, and God has lived through and will live through a non-finite past and future. The idea here is that God is in (our, physical) time/spacetime, and God is a temporal being in just the way we are, except that the temporal extent of God’s life is infinite. Compared to other temporal views, this one is conceptually straightforward. Arguably, however, it is in tension with current cosmology, which suggests that the universe has a finite past. Insofar as the view implies that God is bound by, or has no power over time, it may also be at odds with some of the constraints arising from Western Scripture (see section 2). The view is found at least in process theologians like Charles Hartshorne (Hartshorne 1947).

4.2.2 Relative Timelessness

On Alan Padgett’s view, God changes, so God is temporal. However, timelessness is not abandoned; instead, it is redefined.

[…] I have not abandoned timelessness. Instead, I have redefined “God is timeless” to mean that God is relatively timeless, i.e. he is not measured by time nor is he affected by the negative aspects of temporal passage. (Padgett 1992: 146; also 2001)

The idea is that God’s time is non-identical with our, “Measured Time”.

“Measured Time” is “the specifically human time of our history and our universe: the time of seconds, days, and centuries; the time of our space-time” (Padgett 1992: 130). In that sense of “time”, God is timeless. However, God is not timeless in the strict sense in which “time” refers to any kind of temporality, because God is in his own time. Does that mean God is only in his time and not in ours? No, he is in our time too (p. 131—at least saying this is “philosophically acceptable” (p. 126)), as we are in his. It’s just that he transcends our time. What does it mean to transcend our time? It means that God is the ground of time, that he is not negatively affected by the passage of time, and (things get a little circular here), that he is relatively timeless.

One question one might have about this is what “Measured Time” and “God’s time” are, and how plausible it is to think there are both. Padgett maintains that in everyday speech, “time” refers “not to an ontological category” but to “the human time of our history and our universe” (1992: 130). The distinction is supported by appeals to the differences between this sense of “time” and “the strict ontological sense of ‘time’ used in philosophy” (p. 140). But this may still leave one wondering about the distinction. For one thing, few contemporary ontologists take themselves to be investigating a time distinct from “the human time of our history and our universe”. Nor do they tend to think of the time of the universe as specifically human. For another, there are a number of different philosophical views about time.

4.2.3 Timeless Without and Temporal With Creation

William Lane Craig’s view is that God is timeless without creation, and temporal with creation (Craig 2000). God exists timelessly “without” creation rather than before creation, because there isn’t literally a before. And so it can’t literally be the case that God becomes temporal, since becoming anything involves being first one thing and then the other. Nonetheless, God is “timeless without creation and temporal subsequent to creation ”, God “enters time at the moment of creation” (Craig 2000: 33). God exists changelessly and timelessly, but by creating, God undergoes an extrinsic change “which draws Him into time” (Craig 2000: 29).

The problem is that even extrinsic change still presupposes a before and after (Leftow 2005: 66). Craig is aware of the difficulty:

[O]n such a view, there seem to be two phases of God’s life, a timeless phase and a temporal phase, and the timeless phase seems to have existed earlier than the temporal phase. But this is logically incoherent, since to stand in a relation of earlier than is by all accounts to be temporal. (Craig 2000: 32)

His solution is

that “prior” to creation there literally are no intervals of time […] no earlier and later, no enduring through successive intervals and, hence, no waiting, no temporal becoming. This state would pass away, not successively, but as a whole, at the moment of creation, when time begins.

And this state, he says, “looks suspiciously like a state of timelessness” (Craig 2000: 33).

But this solution looks suspiciously like a re-statement of the view. The problem was that we could only talk of a “before” in quotation marks. Yet we needed there to literally be such a before on the view in question. (This is unless we decline to make literal sense of all this, but that is not Craig’s approach.) What can it mean to say God underwent a change at the end of which God was temporal? Craig’s answer seems to be that there is timelessness before time’s beginning, or rather, “before” time’s beginning.

Craig endorses Padgett’s distinction between “Measured Time” and “Ontological Time” (God’s time). Unlike Padgett, he identifies the latter with Newton’s absolute time. He defends a “neo-Lorentzian” interpretation of special relativity, according to which there is a privileged reference frame that is in principle undetectable due to the effective Lorentz invariance of the dynamical laws. In addition, he points to the cosmic time of some general relativistic spacetime models as a candidate for absolute time. Each of these claims is made in support of a strong prior commitment to the A-theory, shared with Padgett. However, each claim faces problems, and their connection is unclear, since the “neo-Lorentzian” approach to special relativity doesn’t allow for as natural a development in the direction of general relativity as does the standard approach (see, e.g., Balashov & Janssen 2003, Wüthrich 2013).

Craig and Padgett differ over whether cosmic time gives a “proper measure” of God’s time, and thus effectively over whether, on this kind of view, we have any epistemic access to God’s time (which we are also in). Craig answers in the affirmative, but still hesitates to identify cosmic time with God’s time, preferring instead to say that the two “coincide” (Craig 1990: 344).

4.2.4 Metrically Amorphous Time

Richard Swinburne originally defends timelessness (Swinburne 1965), but then switches allegiance to a temporal view. According to his later view, before creation God lives alone in a metrically amorphous time (Swinburne 1977, 1993, 1994). (Padgett also describes God’s time as metrically amorphous.) Once God creates the world and institutes the laws of nature, time acquires a metric. There then begin to be facts of the matter about how long temporal intervals are.

Further Reading:

  • Defenses of Divine Timelessness: Helm 1988, 2001; Yates 1990; Rogers 2000, 2007.
  • Defenses of Divine Temporality: Lucas 1973, 1989; Wolterstorff 1975, 2000a,b, 2001; Hasker 1989, 2002; Zimmerman 2002; DeWeese 2002, 2004; Mullins 2016.

5. Arguments against Divine Timelessness

5.1 Arguments from Divine Omniscience and Tensed Facts

Recall that the theistic God is omniscient. Presumably then, God knows what temporal reality is like at its most fundamental. If there are fundamental tensed facts (like that it’s 12:00), God knows them. But since these facts change, what God knows changes constantly. So God changes constantly; so God is in time.

Argument 1

  • (1) God is omniscient.
  • (2) If God is omniscient, then God knows the fundamental temporal facts.
  • So (3) God knows the fundamental temporal facts. (From (1), (2))
  • So (4) if there are fundamental tensed facts (i.e. the A-theory is true), then God knows them. (From (3))
  • (5) If God knows fundamental tensed facts, then what God knows changes.
  • (6) If what God knows changes, then God changes.
  • (7) If God changes, then God is temporal.

Therefore, if the A-theory is true, then God is temporal. (From (4), (5), (6), (7))

Various versions of this argument have been defended (Craig 2000, 2001; DeWeese 2004; Hasker 2002; Kretzmann 1966; Padgett 1992, 2001; Wolterstorff 1975; Mullins 2016: Ch. 4). Since many participants of the debate think the A-theory is true, it is treated as an argument for divine temporality. In response, advocates of timelessness challenge one or more of the argument’s premises (Wierenga 1989, 2002; Alston 1989a; Ganssle 1993, 1995, 2002). Others respond by giving up on the A-theory and accepting the B-theory (Helm 1988, 2001; Rogers 2000). The thought is that this argument can’t be run for the B-theory, since on the B-theory, the fundamental (tenseless) temporal facts don’t change. The parallel argument would get stuck at the analogue of step (5): it’s not the case that if God knows fundamental tenseless facts, then what God knows changes. So while the argument itself is silent on whether the B-theory allows one to combine timelessness with omniscience, part of the point of making it is that the parallel argument can’t be run for the B-theory.

One might, however, wonder whether there are arguments in the vicinity of Argument 1 that can be run on the B-theory too. Consider first the following, somewhat similar argument.

Argument 2

  • (1′) God is omniscient.
  • (2′) If God is omniscient, then God knows what time it is.
  • So (3′) God knows what time it is. (From (1′), (2′))
  • (4′) What time it is changes.
  • So (5′) what God knows changes. (From (3′), (4′))
  • (6) If what God knows changes, then God changes.
  • (7) If God changes, then God is temporal.

Therefore, God is temporal. (From (5′), (6), (7))

Unlike in the case of Argument 1, the connection to the A-theory here is not straightforward. There is certainly a sense in which (4′) is true on the B-theory, even though there is, on the B-theory, no change in the fundamental temporal facts. At each time, that time is present—not in the absolute, metaphysically privileged sense of the A-theory, but in a relative, perspectival sense. Each time is present at itself, just like each spatial location is here relative to itself. Moreover, on a standard B-theoretic account of tensed language (e.g., Mozersky 2015; but see Torre 2010 for an alternative account), at each of those times, a temporal subject S can know, and have a true belief about, what time it is. At noon, S believes that it is noon; that belief is made true by a tenseless fact, such as that S holds the belief at (a time simultaneous with) noon. At 12:01, S believes truly that it is 12:01, where this belief is made true by another tenseless fact, such as that this later belief is held by S at (a time simultaneous with) 12:01, and so on.

Admittedly, it is not the case, on this B-theoretic account, that knowing what time it is (at different times) involves knowing different things at different times. The reason is that the tenseless contents that are believed can be believed by S at all times equally (and typically will be). So while, at each time, S has a tensed belief with a tenseless content that differs from the tenseless content of S’s tensed beliefs at previous times, S may not come to believe, or know, anything new. This suggests that the same applies to God, and that (5′) doesn’t follow from (3′) and (4′).

However, what matters is not just what S knows and believes, but how S knows and believes it. Tensed beliefs have rather different cognitive significance from the corresponding tenseless ones. What matters for timely action is believing the tenseless content via a tensed representation, by having a true tensed belief (“it is noon (now)”). The point is a more general one that applies equally to indexicals other than “now”, such as “I” or “here”: the cognitive significance of indexical beliefs differs from that of the corresponding non-indexical ones.

Therefore, if a B-theoretic subject S knows (at more than one time) what time it is, then they undergo changes. The reason is that how they believe what they believe changes. They need to keep track of their temporal perspective by having appropriately varied tensed beliefs (“it’s noon”, “it’s 12:01”). At least this is so for anyone whose temporal nature relevantly resembles our own. Does this group include God? If so, then on the B-theory too, there is reason to worry about the combination of omniscience with timelessness.

Argument 3

  • (1′) God is omniscient.
  • (2′) If God is omniscient, then God knows what time it is.
  • So (3′) God knows what time it is. (From (1′), (2′))
  • (4″) If S knows what time it is, then how S believes (what S believes) changes.
  • (5″) How God believes (what God believes) changes. (From (3′), (4″))
  • (6″) If how God believes changes, then God changes.
  • (7) If God changes, then God is temporal.

Therefore, God is temporal. (From (5″), (6″), (7))

5.2 Arguments from Divine Action

One might reason as follows. When God creates the universe, God begins to stand in the relation of coexisting with to the universe, and also in the relation of sustaining it in existence. Acquiring these and other relations to the universe makes God temporal, because it constitutes a change that God undergoes at the moment of creation. Even if God was timeless before, God is temporal after creation (Craig 2009).

The problem with this line of thought is again that it is not clear how to understand the notions of before and after, of acquiring, and of beginning, as applied to a timeless God.

However, the point can be made in another way. God is thought to be causally active in the world, where those causal relations include God’s responding to petitionary prayer and being actively involved in world history. Similarly, God coexists with the world and sustains it in existence at every moment. God loves, and knows about the lives of, God’s creatures. All these are relations. God stands in causal and other relations to a temporal world. Doesn’t this make God temporal (Mullins 2016, Ch. 5)?

Each version of divine timelessness tries to address this concern in some way. One somewhat radical response, given by Aquinas and others, is that while the world is related to God, God is not related to the world.

5.3 Arguments from Divine Personhood

Suppose that whatever is a person does at least some of the following: remembering, anticipating, reflecting, deliberating, deciding, intending, and acting intentionally. If timelessness precludes one from doing any of these, then being timeless is incompatible with being a person. Since God is a person, God is not timeless.

But is it the case that being a person requires one to do at least some of the above? Instead one might hold that at most, it requires one to be capable of doing at least some of the above. And perhaps a timeless God is capable of doing some of the above, even if God does not do them.

Alternatively, one might question the grounds for thinking that these activities tend to be precluded by timelessness. It is true that they all seem to involve change, namely a change in one’s mental states. But defenders of timelessness may think we should leave room in our conceptual scheme for a timeless, changeless version of each of these activities (Craig 2009; Murray & Rea 2008: Ch. 2).

6. Arguments for Divine Timelessness

6.1 Arguments from Divine Perfection

There are a number of considerations speaking in favor of divine timelessness that arise out of perfect being theology. Perfect being theology is the approach to theology that involves figuring out what God is like on the basis of God’s being the most perfect (or greatest possible) being. A general argument goes as follows. The most perfect being, God, has the most perfect mode of existence. But temporal existence is a less perfect mode of existence than timeless existence. Therefore, God has a timeless mode of existence.

Why think that temporal existence is less perfect than timeless existence? Note that we’re here mostly concerned with the second issue distinguished at the beginning of section 4, namely the nature of God’s experience (rather than the first, namely whether or not God is located in time/spacetime). The thought is that ordinary temporal experience involves gain and loss, and an awareness of the inescapable passage of time. Relatedly, for ordinary temporal beings, neither the distant past nor the future are perceptually accessible. We remember parts of the past, but imperfectly, and we merely anticipate the future. We know much less about the future than the past. We can’t change or re-experience the past, nor can we skip ahead to later moments, except one at a time.

But then again, God is no ordinary temporal being. The defender of temporality can reply that while God’s life has temporal features, in that God experiences succession, God’s temporal experience is otherwise very much unlike ours (Mullins 2014). For example, God is omniscient, so God forgets no part of the past and already knows all about the future. It’s true that experiencing succession means experiencing things one at a time. But, the defender of temporality might add, this very feature is necessary for, e.g., the ability to enjoy music, which is good and therefore something the most perfect being would have.

There are more indirect ways of arguing from perfection to timelessness. For example, suppose that the most perfect mode of existence involves immutability, and that immutability requires timelessness. Or suppose that perfection requires divine simplicity, and that simplicity requires timelessness (for more, see the SEP entries on divine simplicity and immutability).

6.2 Arguments from Divine Foreknowledge

One line of thought is that complete knowledge of future contingent events is impossible for beings in time. Since God is omniscient, and therefore knows all that will happen, God is timeless.

Another line of thought is that while God is omniscient, and therefore knows all that will happen, some of our actions are genuinely free. But these two facts are in tension with one another, and the tension can be resolved by thinking of God as timeless.

Here is this line of thought in more detail. First consider an argument for theological fatalism, the view that divine foreknowledge and freedom are incompatible (Pike 1965; Murray & Rea 2008: Ch. 2). God is omniscient. So God knows all that is true and believes nothing false. Now consider the proposition p that you will read this section 1,000 years hence. Suppose p was true 1,000 years ago. Then God believed p then. And you never had a choice about whether God believed p 1,000 years ago. Nor have you ever had a choice about anything that follows from God’s believing p 1,000 years ago, including that you read this section today. So you never had a choice about whether you read this section today, which means you’re not doing it freely.

One proposed solution is to deny that p was true 1,000 years ago. (Aristotle responds in this way to a similar, non-theological argument for logical fatalism.) For more on this solution, see the SEP entries on foreknowledge and free will and fatalism.

A defender of divine timelessness may attempt another solution (inspired by Boethius). God is not located in time, so God does not know or believe things at times. So it is not the case that God believed p 1,000 years ago. Rather, all temporal events are before God’s mind “at once”, or in an atemporal present. However, some argue that a similar problem still arises (Zagzebski 1991: Ch. 2).

6.3 Arguments from Relativity Theory

God is immaterial. Suppose it follows from this that God is not in space. Then one might argue that relativity theory implies that God is not in time either, because according to relativity theory, anything that is in time is also in space (Leftow 2005: 272).

While the basic thought is clear enough, one might worry about the details of this argument. In relativity theory, there are no such things as times or spatial locations, at the fundamental level. So it would be at least misleading to say that according to relativity theory, anything that is located at times is located at spatial locations. But a defender of the argument probably has in mind precisely this implication of (special) relativity, that spatiotemporal regions are fundamental, because there is no unique decomposition of spacetime into space at times. Presumably the lesson of relativity theory for the present debate can be suitably reformulated.

Further Reading on God and Time: Pike 1970; Braine 1988; Yates 1990; Gale 1991; Mawson 2008; Craig 1998, 2001, 2009; Murray & Rea 2008; Leftow 2010; Tapp & Runggaldier 2011; Oppy 2014; Mullins 2016; and Ganssle (Other Internet Resources).

7. Other Debates about Eternity

Both timelessness or atemporality, and permanence or everlastingness, are widely applicable concepts. This section outlines a few non-religious philosophical debates in which the concept of eternity, in the sense of atemporality, can play a role (McDaniel 2016).

Consider questions about the nature of propositions, mathematical objects, or other abstracta. Perhaps these are atemporal entities, existing outside of time/spacetime, and not standing in any spatiotemporal relations to other entities. What sorts of considerations might bear on whether they are or not? Take propositions, the true or false things sentences express. Take a sentence that changes its truth-value over time (e.g., “It’s sunny”). Does such a sentence express different propositions at different times (that it’s sunny at \(t_1\), that it’s sunny at \(t_2\), etc.)? Or does it express the same proposition over time (that it’s sunny)? If it’s the former, then the propositions expressed don’t themselves change truth-value. If it’s the latter, the proposition (that it’s sunny) itself changes truth-value. In this latter case, that might give one reason think that the proposition is located within time rather than outside of it. On the other hand, it might not. After all, the truth-value also seems to vary with spatial location; yet we may be reluctant to infer from this that the proposition has spatial locations.

As another example, consider the view that time does not exist, for example as argued for by speculative metaphysicians such as McTaggart or F. H. Bradley. On such views, everything is eternal (in the sense of atemporal).

The view that time is unreal was also argued for by Kurt Gödel on the basis of general relativistic considerations (Gödel 1949). Gödel’s starting point is his discovery of solutions to Einstein’s Field Equations that permit the existence of closed timelike curves. Such spacetimes, he argues, do not contain a temporal dimension, since time only exists if there is genuine passage of time, and there cannot be genuine passage of time in such worlds. This in turn suggests that time does not pass, and thus does not exist, in the actual world either (for more on the argument see Savitt 1994; Dorato 2002; Yourgrau 2005).

More recently, some physicists and philosophers of physics working on approaches to quantum gravity have entertained the view that spacetime may not be fundamental (see the SEP entry on quantum gravity). Of course, whether the concept of atemporality applies in this context depends on how the claim that spacetime is not fundamental is best understood.

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

The author wishes to thank Paul Helm, for graciously giving permission to reuse verbatim some paragraphs from sections 2, 4, 5 and 6 of the previous entry in this entry’s section 3. Many thanks also to Brian Leftow, Ryan Mullins, Yuri Balashov, Baptiste Le Bihan, Evan Fales, Ulrich Meyer, Ludwig Neidhart, and participants of a workshop in Bonn on “God and Time”, August 2017, for comments on earlier drafts.

Copyright © 2018 by
Natalja Deng <nmdeng@gmail.com>

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