Notes to Isaac Albalag

1. Throughout the treatise, Albalag addresses his critiques to al-Ghazali and, in most cases, refers to the Avicennian background of the latter’s errors.

2. Albalag specifies that this premise, namely from what is one and simple only one thing may proceed, is wrong because it mistakenly treats two distinct things under the same standards. Albalag contends, a divine cause is different from empirical and natural causes. Thus, if an empirical cause produces only one effect at a time, it does not follow that the same is true in regard to divine causes.

3. It should be noted that, in view of Albalag’s cosmological scheme, the first intellect is not an effect to the First Principle but itself is the First Principle.

4. Separate intellects, according to Albalag, do not derive forms from material things. Because separate intellects are ontologically nobler than material things, it is unreasonable that they would extend their perfection from what is base, i.e., material things.

5. Although Post-Maimonidean philosophers generally understood Maimonides’ enterprise in these philosophical terms, it should be noted that Maimonides’ view of the relationship between religion and philosophy has elicited debates in modern scholarship see Strauss 1983; Pines 1986; Z. Harvey 2001; Fraenkel 2010).

Copyright © 2020 by
Bakinaz Abdalla <bakinaz.abdalla@wolfson.ox.ac.uk>

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