Isaac Albalag stands out as one of the most rigorous representatives of the school of Jewish Averroism which flourished in Western Europe in the thirteenth century and lasted until the Renaissance. The members of this school, such as Ibn Kaspi, Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera, Moses Narboni, Isaac Polqar, Gersonides, and Elijah Delmedigo, regarded Averroes’ philosophical writings, particularly his commentaries on Aristotle, as the main source for the study of science and philosophy. The impact of Averroes on these philosophers, varied as it was, extended to the question of the relationship between religion and philosophy. Many Jewish philosophers, drawing upon Averroes’ religious epistemology, which established a theoretical basis for reading Scripture and demonstrative sciences as different representations of the truth rather than conflicting truths, undertook to interpret Judaism as a philosophical religion, a philosophical-religious approach that was arguably championed by the prominent Jewish philosopher Maimonides (d.1204). Like most Jewish Averroists, Albalag occupied himself with purely philosophical questions of physics, metaphysics, and epistemology, addressing them through the lens of Averroes. Characteristically, Albalag holds unreserved admiration for and faithfulness to Aristotle whose teachings he deems synonymous with the truth and which he discovers in the writings of Averroes. Restoring Aristotelianism and establishing it among Jewish students of philosophy emerge as key goals of Albalag’s philosophical enterprise. Within the framework of that enterprise, Albalag also engages with the crucial question of the relationship between Judaism and philosophy, uniquely answering it by advocating the double truth doctrine.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Logic
- 3. Epistemology
- 4. Conception of Being and God’s Existence
- 5. God-world Relationship
- 6. Cosmology
- 7. Celestial Motion
- 8. The Relationship Between Religion and Philosophy
- 9. Theory of Prophecy
- 10. Political Thought
- 11. Conclusion
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1. Life and Works
Little is known about Isaac Albalag. All that we know about him is that he lived in the second half of the thirteenth century either in Catalonia or Provence (Sirat 1985: 238). References to Albalag in the medieval Jewish literature indicate that he was not a figure of favorable reputation. His name appears in a number of Jewish writings usually in association with humiliating accusations of heresy. The Kabbalist Shem Tov Ibn Shem Tov (d.1440), for instance, accuses Albalag of heresy for advocating a heretical view regarding the fate of the human soul (Sefer ha ʾemunot [the Book of Beliefs], I:1). In Sefer Neveh Shalom (Indwelling of Peace), the fifteenth-century Spanish thinker Abraham Shalom attacks Albalag for eliminating the doctrine of creation by radically naturalizing the account for celestial motion (Vajda 1960: 271). Albalag’s worth as a philosopher did not go unnoticed, notwithstanding. Isaac Polqar (14th century), the author of ʿEzer ha-dat (The Support of Faith) holds Albalag in great esteem and cites him approvingly in dealing with the controversial issue of the origin of the world (ʿEzer ha-dat: part II: p.46).
Albalag wrote only one treatise, Sefer Tiqqun ha deʿot (The Emendation of the Opinions)—I here employ Manekin’s translation of the title (Manekin 2007: 140)—which is a translation with commentarial notes on the first two sections of Abu Hamid al-Ghazali’s encyclopedic treatise kitāb Maqāṣid al-Falāsifah (The Opinions of the Philosophers), Logic and Metaphysics. The third section, Natural Philosophy, was completed by Isaac Polqar (Vajda 1960: 268).
Two goals stand behind the composition of the Tiqqun. The primary one, as the title reveals (Emendation of the Opinions), is corrective. Motivated by confidence in Aristotelianism, Albalag adopts a critical stance towards any doctrine that deviates from Aristotelian teachings and rules. For him, most errors in the philosophical discourse are instances of deviation from Aristotle or misunderstandings of his teachings. The cumulative literature of commentaries on Aristotle, excluding Averroes’ commentaries, is replete with such instances. Avicenna is particularly regarded by Albalag as a major source of error and thus the process of “emendation” (Tiqqun) largely consists in systematic critiques of Avicennian philosophy. But Avicenna is not the sole target of criticism, though he is the central one. Albalag also criticizes other philosophers such as al-Farabi, Maimonides, and al-Ghazali—it is not unlikely that Albalag thought, like Medieval Latin philosophers, that Maqāṣid al-Falāsifah was a genuine representation of al-Ghazali’s philosophical view (for al-Ghazali’s philosophical image in Latin literature see Salman 1999; Shihadeh 2011). Maqāṣid al-Falāsifah encompasses a concise presentation of the opinions of the philosophers, and as a result it furnishes Albalag with an ideal framework for pursuing the announced process of “emendation” (Tiqqun). In most of his discussions, critiques, and corrections Albalag derives what he regards as the correct understanding of Aristotle from Averroes’ writings.
The second goal of the Tiqqun is pedagogical. Here, again, al-Ghazali’s Maqāṣid al-Falāsifah serves as an adequate vehicle. Thanks to al-Ghazali’s style which is free of complexities and accords with “popular beliefs”, the Maqāṣid provides a suitable medium for instructing students who have little training in philosophy (Tiqqun preface: 4). By translating and commenting on al-Ghazali’s Maqāṣid, Albalag hopes to offer a piecemeal instruction in philosophy, starting with a presentation of Ghazali’s summary of the doctrines of the philosophers and culminating in the establishment of Aristotelian demonstrative doctrines. Overall, the Tiqqun follows the structure of the Maqāṣid except on some occasions where Albalag engages in large digressions.
The first part of the Tiqqun (Logic) is, more or less, a faithful translation of the Maqāṣid. Although this part is generally unoriginal, it may still be credited with a specific contribution. Manuscripts of the Tiqqun include a sympathetic discussion of the fourth figure of syllogism. This figure was attributed by most Medieval logicians to Galen, though this attribution remains disputed in modern scholarship (Rescher 1965; Sabra 1965), and was dismissed as lacking utility and “naturalness” (see Gersonides Sefer ha-heqqesh ha-Yashar [The Book of the Correct Syllogism]: 147). It is not clear, however, whether Albalag himself wrote this discussion or whether it was written by Abner of Burgos, a thirteenth-century Jewish-convert-to-Christianity philosopher, as suggested by some textual evidence (Vajda 1960: 275–276). In any case, the inclusion of this discussion in the Tiqqun independently of any explicit criticism indicates that Albalag agrees with its positive attitude towards the fourth figure of syllogism.
The Aristotelian syllogism does not determine a specific order for the major and minor premises. Hence, the terms comprising the premises, the “unique major” and “minor” terms and the shared middle term, may be arranged in three possible figures as follows:
- in the first figure, the middle term is subject in one premise and predicate in the other,
- in the second, it is subject in both premises, and
- in the third, it is predicate in both (Manekin 1996: 50).
Some later logicians distinguished the order of the major and minor premises with the result that the first figure was divided into two figures:
- in the first, the middle term is the subject in the minor and predicate in the major premises, and
- in the second, it is the subject in the major and the predicate in the minor premises (ibid, 1996: 50).
The additional fourth figure “is sometimes placed after the first figure, rather than the third” (ibid, 1996: 50).
The Tiqqun provides a quasi-defense of the fourth figure as a “valuable” form of reasoning (Tiqqun n.5:12). This interrupts Albalag’s overall adherence to Averroes who, like the majority of Medieval logicians, rejects the fourth figure due to considerations that have to do with “naturalness.” According to Averroes, “the form of reasoning embodied in the fourth figure of syllogism does not exist in us by nature” and involves “absurd self-predication” (Manekin 1996: 56). In Hebrew logical writings, limited attempts were advanced to establish the validity of that figure, most famously by Gersonides. The discussion in the Tiqqun is another attempt to this effect where the author, interestingly, subjects even Aristotle to criticism for omitting this form of reasoning (Tiqqun n.5: 12).
3.1 Knowledge, Belief and Intellectual Perfection
Like most Medieval Aristotelians, Albalag understands the ultimate goal of man in terms of intellectual perfection (Tiqqun preface: 2–3, n.30: 42; cf. Maimonides, Guide III:54; Farabi, Selected Aphorisms: 61; Averroes, Epistle on the Possibility of Conjunction: 103). To fulfill this goal one has to attain knowledge of existents in a manner “that dispels doubt” (Tiqqun preface: 3). The formula of “dispelling doubt” points to the conception of certainty (yaqīn), which is defined in the Arab Aristotelian tradition as a cognitive state in which the cognizer acquiesces that what she perceived is necessarily true and cannot be otherwise (see Black 2006: 15–25). In line with this tradition, Albalag specifies the logical tool of demonstration as the means for fulfilling the criterion of dispelling doubt (i.e., attaining certainty).
This, however, raises a difficulty, for the ultimate goal of man would seem to be exclusively tied to philosophy, while the role of religion would be meager. Although this difficulty is not peculiar to Albalag, it is particularly strong in the Tiqqun where a notable dichotomy between ʾemunah (belief) and yediʿah (scientific knowledge) serves to confine religion/Scripture to a domain of knowledge that is quantitatively and qualitatively different from demonstrative knowledge (i.e., prophetic knowledge). Whether this knowledge qualifies as an alternative or a parallel means to philosophy in fulfilling the epistemic requirement of intellectual perfection is a complex question. Insofar as the Tiqqun is concerned, ʾemunah can rightly be equated with fideism (see Tiqqun n.30: 38, 51), unlike the philosophical conception of belief (for which ʾiʿtiqād and taṣdīq were the basic technical terms in Arabic) advocated by many Jewish and Muslim philosophers and theologians (see, for instance, al-Farabi Book of Demonstration: 63–4; Saʿadia Gaʾon Book of Beliefs: 14; Maimonides Guide I:50). In view of the latter, belief consists in judgment or affirmation, following from cognitive processes and syllogistic reasoning, that a given perceived object is true. In this way, belief is said to be associated with certainty or approximation of certainty depending on the form of reasoning.
The Tiqqun, by contrast, points to a traditional conception of belief; one that amounts to simple acceptance of a given Scriptural doctrine or a set of doctrines as true without prior rational justification (Tiqqun n.30: 51). Simple belief can always be regarded as a source of certainty on account of prophetic authority and this appears to be the basic standpoint of the Tiqqun (for background on the conception of belief in Jewish thought see Wolfson 1942: 213–261; Kellner 1986; Rosenberg 1984: 273–307). Yet it is important to consider the implications that the Tiqqun’s extreme skeptical stance in regard to prophetic knowledge raises for this standpoint. The Tiqqun encompasses a number of significant remarks stressing the inaccessibility of the Torah's prophetic secrets to non-prophets —we will see below that the Torah has two layers of esoteric knowledge, prophetic and philosophical. What remains is the layer of philosophical knowledge to which philosophers, as Albalag points out, could have access. Accessing this layer of knowledge essentially depends on allegorical interpretation of Scripture in terms of what was learned from demonstrative sciences (see below). This means that whatever assent Scripture evokes in a person who is well-trained in demonstrative sciences (i.e., a philosopher) will be of the type of reason-based, namely demonstrative, assent (cf. Averroes Decisive Treatise: 17–18). It would, thus, be beside the point to speak of “simple belief” (ʾemunah pashoṭah), unless we grant that simple faith attaches to the surface layer of Scripture. But this, again, would be implausible, since Albalag admits that this layer is addressed to the multitude of people who, “like animals”, lack rationality, rather than philosophers (Tiqqun n.30: 45; for further discussion see Guttmann 1945).
3.2 Human Knowledge: Means and Limits
Although Albalag does not devote a specific discussion to the theory of knowledge, many questions pertaining to the limit, means, and features of human knowledge recur throughout the Tiqqun. His treatment of these questions show indebtedness to Aristotelian epistemological theories as expounded by Arab Aristotelians, in particular Averroes. Following the framework of the theory of representational knowledge, standard among Arab Aristotelians, Albalag divides knowledge into representation and assent. The former, which is a prerequisite for the latter, is acquired by definition, while assent is acquired by a proof (Tiqqun [Logic]: 98; cf. Maqāṣid: 12). As noted previously, Albalag adopts the Aristotelian theory of syllogism, assigning a primary significance to demonstrative syllogisms in evoking certain assent. Moreover, like Averroes, Albalag places conspicuous emphasis on the empirical foundation of human knowledge (for Averroes’ epistemology see Black 2019). Intelligible thoughts arise in the soul through the cognitive process of abstraction and syllogistic reasoning. Without external images, Albalag affirms, it would be impossible for the soul to apprehend the intelligible forms, just as it is impossible for a person who is deprived of visual data to apprehend the quiddity of colors (Tiqqun, n.11: 16, n.44: 71; cf. Aristotle De Anima III, 7, 431a, 14–17).
Although the Tiqqun is generally characterized by confident rationalism, it involves skeptical elements that echo Maimonides’ critiques of the limitation of the human intellect in regard to metaphysical knowledge (for these critiques in Maimonides see Pines 1979; Stern 2013). Albalag admits, like Maimonides, that attaining complete knowledge of immaterial beings lies beyond the capacity of the human intellect. The reason for this limitation is, first and foremost, the material component of human beings (ḥomer) which acts as both a constant impediment to the pursuit of knowledge and a cause of intellectual deficiency (Tiqqun n.11: 16, n.38: 58; cf. Guide III:9).
4. Conception of Being and God’s Existence
Avicenna’s proof of God’s existence, famously known as “Burhān al-ṣidiqin”, Demonstration of the Truthful (Mayer 2001), occupies a good deal of Albalag’s critical discussion. The proof is meant to be a metaphysical proof, one that takes place in the science of Metaphysics and proceeds from analyses of the conception of existence qua existence.
Avicenna divides “actual” beings, as opposed to impossible things, into necessary in itself and possible in itself but necessary through another (Davidson 1987: 292–3; McGinnis 2010: 159–164). The necessary in itself is that which has existence in its essence and an impossibility arises whenever it is assumed not to exist. By contrast, the possible in itself but necessary through another is that which “has no existence in essence” and “no impossibility” arises whether it is assumed to exist or not (Avicenna al-Najāt: 546; cf. al-ʾisharāt: 122; cf. al-Ghazali Maqāṣid: 100–101). In other words, both existence and non-existence are equal states with respect to it. This latter point is crucial to Avicenna’s proof, for it stipulates that there must be an external cause that ultimately preponderates existence over non-existence in things that are possible. This cause must be necessary in itself. Considering all possible things as an “aggregate” (jumlah), two alternatives arise in regard to the cause of that aggregate (Avicenna, al-Najāt: 567–8): either the aggregate of possible things is self-caused or caused by something external. Avicenna dismisses the former alternative as impossible because the nature of what is possible in itself does not change independently of a cause; possible things become necessary only through other causes. Hence, an aggregate of possible things is also possible in itself and cannot be self-caused. Furthermore, “a chain” (silsilah) of possible things cannot continue ad infinitum and it must end to a being that is necessary in itself. The trait of “necessary existence” further entails a number of divine attributes such as oneness, simplicity and goodness, which permits identifying the Necessary Existent with the deity (Adamson 2013: 172).
To Albalag, Avicenna’s proof of God as Necessary Existent appeared to involve flagrant deviations from Aristotle. Firstly, Avicenna’s procedure for establishing the existence of the First Principle in the science of metaphysics is methodologically incorrect. (Tiqqun n.8: 13–14). Appealing to Averroes, Albalag argues that the existence of the prime mover must be accepted from natural philosophy—not insofar as it is the deity—while metaphysicians proceed therefrom in examining its states and attributes. Obviously, the theoretical basis for this argument is Aristotle’s rule that “no master of any art can demonstrate the proper principles of his art” (Metaphysics IV 1003a21–22), which, according to Averroes, means that a given science does not demonstrate the existence of its subject, but must concede to their existence either as something which is “self-evident” or as “something that has been demonstrated in another science” (Wolfson 1950–1 : 691). Since the First Principle is the subject matter of metaphysics, its existence cannot be established in that specific science.
Secondly, Avicenna breaks away from Aristotle in that he proceeds in establishing the existence of the First Principle from analyses of the conception of being rather than motion and moved objects (for Aristotle’s argument see Physics 7 & 8). In order to establish the Necessary Existent, Avicenna proceeds from a conception of being that Albalag, following Averroes, dismisses as spurious (for Averroes see al-kashf: 14). His discomfort with this conception has to do primarily with the fact that it is alien to Aristotle. But Albalag additionally speaks of errors and absurd implications, especially in the science of metaphysics, that follow from Avicenna’s method of distinguishing two types of necessary existents, i.e., that which is necessary in itself and that which is necessary by another. One implication pertains to the nature of separate intellects. Assuming that anything which is not necessary in itself involves two modes, necessity and possibility, as Avicenna holds, then separate intellects would also involve both necessity and possibility. This, however, absurdly clashes with the essential nature of separate intellects as immaterial beings, since possibility must reside in a substratum (Tiqqun n.8: 14, n.29: 27).
These deviations from Aristotle provided Albalag with sufficient reason to reject the metaphysical proof of God. Moreover, Avicenna’s supplementary arguments, as reproduced by al-Ghazali in the Maqāṣid, to the effect that the Necessary Existent is one, simple and incorporeal fall short of satisfying the epistemic criterion of dispelling doubt (i.e., certainty), unlike Aristotle’s argument from motion which, as Albalag asserts, “dispels doubt” (Tiqqun n.33: 53). But although Albalag only trusts Aristotle’s argument, he points to a subtle problem whose origin goes back to ancient commentaries on Aristotle: the problem of the relation of the Prime Mover to the deity (for this problem see Avicenna Shifāʾ [Metaphysics]: 13). Aristotle’s argument from motion arrives at the existence of a mover that is not a body or a force in a body. But whether that mover is the First Principle/Cause, i.e., the deity, or a first effect remains an open question (Tiqqun n.8: 14, n.38: 61). Philosophers hold no unanimous answer to this question. While Avicenna concludes that the deity is ontologically superior to the Prime Mover known from Aristotle’s analyses of motion (Tiqqun n.38: 61), Averroes identifies the Prime Mover with the deity in all his writings (see for instance the Commentary on Metaphysics: 172)—the exclusion being, as Albalag correctly notes, the Epitome of Metaphysics (see Talẖīṣ mā baʿd al-ṭabiʿah: 149) where Averroes follows Avicenna’s standpoint (Tiqqun n.69: 96).
Curiously, Albalag does not immediately side with either camp. However, his discussions of the relation of the Prime Mover to the celestial and sublunary realms confirm Averroes’ standpoint by establishing the primacy of the Prime Mover as a cause of all sublunary and celestial entities, and Its absolute unity and simplicity, two essential specifications of the deity (see below).
5. God-world Relationship
To reconstruct a rough picture of Albalag’s understanding of the God-world relationship, we consider three interrelated themes: the origin of the world, divine will, and divine wisdom.
5.1 The Origin of the World
On scientific grounds, Albalag dismisses the doctrine of temporal origination as “defective” and accepts the eternal existence of the universe as an indisputable truth (we will see below that he accepts the former on the authority of Scripture). Albalag, however, attempts to present the Aristotelian theory of eternity and its fundamental premises in a theologically appealing fashion. Thus, he introduces the theory of “eternal origination” (ḥidūsh neṣaḥi) which maintains that “there was no moment at which the universe was not originated” (Tiqqun n.30: 30; cf. Tahāfut al-Tahāfut, Third Discussion). That the universe has no temporal beginning is a premise that Albalag accepts based on Aristotle’s demonstration of the eternal existence of spheres and celestial motion (see for instance Tiqqun, n.30: 30, 60:84–97; cf. De Caelo I: 2–3). What remains is to show that the universe is not self-sufficient. This procedure is necessary in order to avoid confusing the philosophical doctrine of eternity with that of Epicurus which maintains that “the universe has no cause” (Tiqqun n.30: 45). More specifically, it shows that the philosophical conception of eternal causation is not heretical and does by no means eliminate the idea of origination.
For this purpose, Albalag engages in a philosophical discussion in which he sets out to demonstrate the consistency of the theory of eternal origination—in addition, he offers interpretive notes to show that the doctrine of eternal origination is not offensive to Scripture (for the interpretive notes see Feldman 2000: 19–30). His discussion indirectly links to some elements of al-Ghazali’s refutation of philosophers in Tahāfut al-Falāsifah concerning their conceptions of God and the universe. Al-Ghazali’s central point of contention is that the philosophers’ exposition of the relation of God to the universe dwells on two premises that form an oxymoron, namely that the universe is eternal and that it has an Agent and Maker (see Tahāfut al-Falāsifah third and tenth discussions). Contrary to al-Ghazali, Albalag holds these premises to be absolutely consistent. What is more, he introduces the theory of eternal origination as a more adequate way for articulating the universe and divine causation than the doctrine of temporal origination, the “defective” doctrine of the multitude which confines divine causation to temporality. If perfection indicates absoluteness, then the term “perfect” (shalem) applies to both “the absolute” (muḥlaṭ) universe, which eternally and immutably exists, and “the absolute” Creator whose act of creation is free from temporal or circumstantial limitations.
The doctrine of eternal origination rests on a conception of the universe as a moving entity in which the cause-effect relationship is a relation between a mover and a moved object (see Tiqqun n.30: 29; cf. Tahāfut al-Tahāfut: third discussion, 101). In the natural realm, all processes of generation and corruption consist in motion—for instance the movement from potential to actual existence—and occurs through motion. All natural changes depend on the movements of the celestial spheres, which in turn depend on the Mover of the outermost sphere, the Prime Mover (Tiqqun n.30: 29, n.39: 62).
Beyond this well-known Aristotelian conception of the Prime Mover as the ultimate cause of motion in the universe, Albalag seeks to prove that the very act of producing motion is sufficient to make the Prime Mover a cause/creator of the universe. To this end, he differentiates between two classes of existents in terms of their dependence on motion:
- existents whose subsistence requires motion, and
- existents whose subsistence do not require motion; only their coming-to-be requires motion.
Things belonging to the latter class continue to exist after their causes perish—for instance, a house continues to exist after the death of its builder. By contrast, things belonging to the former class perish as soon as motion ceases—for instance wind does not continue to exist as soon as the motion of air ceases (Tiqqun 30: 30; cf. Averroes Tahāfut al-Tahāfut, fourth discussion: 156–8). These things are said to be more in need of a cause than things belonging to the former class are, for should the cause disappear from existence “for a twinkling of an eye”, they would necessarily perish (Tiqqun n.30: 30). The universe as a whole belongs to this class. Both the natural and celestial realms subsist because their constituent “parts are eternally originated” through the motion produced by the Prime Mover; the parts of the natural and celestial realms referring to sublunary existents and the “successive” stages of celestial motion respectively (Tiqqun, n.30: 30).
5.2 Divine Will
Within the framework of the theory of eternal creation, Albalag deals with another problematic issue, which also links to al-Ghazali’s refutations of philosophers in Tahāfut al-Falāsifah: the nature of divine causation, whether it is voluntary or involuntary. In this treatise, Al-Ghazali maintains that volition is a fundamental characteristic of acting causes; “the agent must be willing, choosing and knowing what he wills ” (Tahāfut al-Falāsifah, third discussion: 135). Causes that act by necessity, that is, without willing or choosing, fall in the category of natural involuntary causes. Proceeding from this conception of agency, Al-Ghazali asserts that the conception of divine causation that philosophers espouse deprives the deity of volition. Again, the theory of eternity is brought into focus. Necessity is a key postulation of the scheme of eternity. Philosophers, according to al-Ghazali, hold the perpetual procession of the universe from God to be necessary in the same manner that the connection between “the sun and light” is necessary (Tahāfut, third discussion: 135; cf. Tiqqun n.23: 24). In opposition to al-Ghazali, Albalag broadens the conception of agency to include both involuntary natural and voluntary causes. However, he emphasizes that a natural cause is insufficient to produce an effect. It must primarily be moved by a voluntary agent. In the empirical world, natural causes bring forth effects inasmuch as they are being moved by close or remote voluntary agents. In this connection, Albalag states that “in this way all material effects are related to God and it is said of Him that He is their Maker”, vaguely indicating that God is the ultimate voluntary cause in the universe. Other than articulating the God-world causal relationship in terms of motion, Albalag barely explains the nature of divine will or the manner in which it causes the perpetual production of the universe.
In other contexts, Albalag argues, in opposition to al-Ghazali, that divine agency is neither natural nor voluntary, but an intermediary type that lies beyond human understanding. This, however, does not mean that God has no will. The truth is that God has a capacity that constitutes for Him what will constitutes for human beings. The exact nature of this capacity, which human beings call will, is obscure, even though demonstration establishes that it exists. Nonetheless, considering the defining criteria of the conception of divine perfection, it is inferred that this capacity shares no features with empirical will. Unlike empirical will which follows from a stimulus and seeks to fulfill a desire, divine will is self-sufficient. While empirical will is temporal, originates with a stimulus and perishes as soon as the desire is fulfilled, divine will, consistently with the eternal and immutable nature of God, is eternal and immutable, being characterized as a benevolent and immutable capacity to eternally “choose” the best of two opposite things:
Even though He possesses power over everything, the manner of His will is such that it constantly attaches itself to a single object, the best among two opposites. Certainly, if He willed evil He would be capable of doing it, but His will desires nothing but what is good only. (Tiqqun n.23: 24 [my translation]; cf. Guide III:25 where Maimonides states that God acts in the best way)
On this basis, the universe maintains a fixed natural order such that “nothing can be added to or reduced from it” (Tiqqun n.30: 39), since God’s will continuously and immutably chooses this order.
5.3 Divine Knowledge
If God possesses will, then He must also possess wisdom, since deliberation and choosing assume knowledge of the thing that is willed. That is to say, the God-world relationship is based on will and wisdom. In discussing the nature of divine knowledge, Albalag displays an obsession with divine perfection. Thus, he differentiates between divine and human knowledge on the basis of type rather than rank, removing any ground for comparing them or inferring premises about God’s mode of apprehension and knowledge from the characteristics of human knowledge and cognition. This idea of the distinctiveness of divine knowledge, and, indeed all divine attributes, is best expressed in terms of Maimonides’ theory of equivocation. According to Maimonides, terms such as wisdom, power and will are predicated of God and creatures only equivocally. When predicated of God and other creatures, these terms are semantically dissimilar, sharing only the names rather than meaning (Guide I:56; cf. Tiqqun n.23: 24). Epistemologically speaking, moreover, they are not informative; constituting an artificial language, which we predicate of God owing to our inability to fathom and signify the corresponding characteristics in Him (Benor 1995; Stern 2013: 198–204).
On this conception of divine attributes, Albalag examines Avicenna’s theory of divine knowledge, as reproduced by al-Ghazali in the Maqāṣid, according to which “God knows particulars in a universal fashion” (Maqāṣid: 118). Avicenna’s theory of divine knowledge has been subject to different interpretations (Marmura 1962: 299–312; Adamson 2005: 257–278; Belo 2006: 177–199). For Albalag, it simply means that God’s knowledge is universal. Since this way of articulating divine knowledge implies a correspondence between divine and human knowledge, Albalag naturally rejects it and scolds al-Ghazali for diffusing improper doctrines about God. In opposition, he insists that God’s knowledge is opposite in characteristics, not merely superior in rank, to human knowledge: it is neither particular nor universal, it is atemporal, indivisible, absolutely actual and self-sufficient, being exclusively dependent on the mode of self-intellection which is peculiar to God and separate intellects (Tiqqun n.42: 76).
Given this radical notion of transcendency, it would seem that the celestial realm and sublunary species and individuals lie beyond the domain of God’s knowledge. But Albalag insists that God’s knowledge is all-encompassing. To establish this, he appropriates Averroes’ conception of the divine essence as a unified Form of the forms of all existents (Averroes Commentary on Metaphysics: 197). Through the very act of self-intellection, God, as Albalag concludes, apprehends all existents, including sublunary existents (Tiqqun n.42: 66). This conclusion is accompanied by an important clarification for the sake of maintaining divine perfection and transcendence unimpaired: forms contained in the essence of God do not exactly correspond to the forms of sublunary things insofar as they are material objects, but exist in the divine essence in the noblest possible manner, being absolutely simple, indivisible and independent of accidents.
5.4 The Problem of Determinism
In the Maqāṣid, al-Ghazali restates the basic elements of Avicenna’s deterministic metaphysics and its implication for the nature and domain of divine knowledge. He explains, in light of Avicenna’s conception of being, the manner in which God knows future events. Possible things are necessitated by their causes; when a cause exists, the effect must necessarily follow. As such, knowledge of a cause allows one to predict, beyond doubt, the occurrence of the associated effect or event. Inasmuch as God has complete knowledge of the hierarchy of the causes, He has knowledge of all future events (Maqāṣid: 118; cf. Avicenna al-Najāt: 587–599)
For Albalag, this deterministic worldview on which al-Ghazali’s account of God’s knowledge of future events dwells follows from a narrow understanding of the cause-effect relationship. Possible things, according to Albalag, are realized by either material or efficient causes, or both. Some of these causes are either volitional or natural. Volitional causes, “hinge solely on the power of the chooser”, which means that effects are not necessary and cannot be predicted. Effects arising from natural causes are necessary, only when the natural causes are necessary, that is, when they maintain a fixed order and cannot be hindered by other accidental or voluntary causes. An example of this is a solar eclipse. Foreknowledge of this event and ones like it are correspondingly necessary with respect to the knower. By contrast, some natural causes, despite having an order, can be impeded by voluntary or accidental causes. In such cases, the effects are not necessary, and hence it is not possible to make certain predictions about their occurrence.
I maintain that for any possible thing, if all its proximate an remote causes succeed each other essentially and maintain order in their actions, and no hindrance can prevent any of them, then it is to be judged the same as a necessary thing with respect to knower. However, regarding other possible things one cannot know with certain knowledge the fact or the time of their occurrence before their occurrence. (quotation from Manekin 2007: 141)
Albalag is aware that this note entails a denial of God’s knowledge of every future event. For this reason, he clarifies that his intention is not to propose that God is ignorant of future events, for, indeed, he thinks that God knows them, but in a manner that is different from human knowledge.
Although Albalag is critical, overall, of al-Ghazali’s account of God’s foreknowledge, he recommends teaching it to the multitude because it is easy for them to comprehend. Albalag still points to the theological implication associated with it.
When you examine al-Ghazali’s statements carefully you will find that they entail the annulment of man’s choice and the conclusion that his actions are compelled, as well as the annulment of the nature of the possible altogether. These opinions not only constitute repudiation of philosophy but also heresy with respect the Torah. (Quotation from Manekin 2007: 142)
In discussing the fundamental traits of the Necessary Existent, al-Ghazali considers the implications of the divine attribute of absolute simplicity to the scope of divine causation and conception of the universe. Al-Ghazali explains, following Avicenna, that from what is one and simple (i.e., the Necessary Existent) only one thing may proceed (Maqāṣid: 157; cf. al-Shifāʾ [Metaphysics]: 326–334; al-Najāt: 649–657). Underlying this understanding of the scope of divine causation is a conception of the relationship between cause and effect as one of correspondence; “the action must be consistent with the essential nature of its cause” (Kogan 1984: 249). Thus, a single cause has one act and produces only a single effect. In keeping with this conception, and considering the absolute simplicity of the First Principle, al-Ghazali, describes an emanationist cosmology in which the First Principle causes multiplicity not directly, but through a chain of emanative intermediaries that successively proceed from one another. The First Principle produces only one entity, the first intellect, by thinking Itself. In turn, the first intellect produces, by thinking its Cause and itself, the second intellect and the first celestial sphere (Maqāṣid: 157). The reason for this multiplicity is that the first intellect is not absolutely simple like the First Principle, but complex: in addition to thinking its Principle, it thinks itself insofar as it is possible and insofar as it is necessary by virtue of the First Principle. The process of emanation continues in a descending manner, terminating with the Active Intellect, the intellect of the sphere of the moon which is the immediate source of the forms of sublunary entities.
Convinced that the scheme of emanation constitutes an unsatisfactory deviation from Aristotle, Albalag devotes extensive discussions to elucidating its inconsistency and fallacies, and alternatively establishing what he regards as the correct Aristotelian scheme. Unlike the scheme of emanation, this scheme ascribes the universe’s manifold existents to God’s direct causation: “from what is one and simple many things can come to be” (Tiqqun n.96: 69). Albalag describes a hierarchical cosmological scheme of separate intellects and celestial spheres in which each separate intellect relates to the corresponding sphere as a cause of motion while the First Principle/Intellect relates to all separate intellects as a direct formal cause. Two theories account for this cosmological scheme:
- the theory of divine knowledge, which, as illustrated formerly, maintains that the First Intellect apprehends the forms of all existents by thinking Its essence, and
- the Aristotelian theory of “cognitive identification” according to which the knowing subject, the known object and thinking are identical in actual thinking (for further details about this theory see Black 1999).
By definition, separate intellects are intellects in actu whose substantiation is the very act of thinking. Without knowledge, the essence of the separate intellect would be nullified. Thus, separate intellects, just like the First Intellect, have actual knowledge of the forms of all existents. In actual thinking, the knower, the known object, and the act of thinking are identical (Tiqqun n.42: 65), the relationship of identity being particularly formal as Aristotle’s dictum of cognitive identification establishes (De Anima 3.8 431b21). This means that in separate intellects “essence/form”, the known object and the act of thinking are the same. In this way, the First Intellect is said to be “the formal cause” of the separate intellects on the grounds that It provides them with “their forms”, i.e., the intelligible forms which they apprehend and by means of which they are what they are, intellects in actu (Tiqqun n.69: 98).
This cosmological account, however, calls for explaining how separate intellects are differentiated. After all, separate intellects share the feature of immateriality, hence they cannot be numbered. Furthermore, considering the fact that separate intellects share the same epistemological content (i.e., the forms of all existents derived from the First Intellect) and that the knower is identical with the object known, according to the Aristotelian dictum of “cognitive identity”, separate intellects should all be identical. In the Avicennian-emanative scheme, intellects are numbered on account of the causal relation between them, each intellect being the cause of an intellect emanating from it and “only God, who is at the top of the series is an uncaused caused” (Wolfson 1958 : 244). By rejecting the conception of an emanative causal relationship between intellects, Albalag, however, could not speak of a distinction in terms of causal relation. Alternatively, he follows Averroes in positing ontological hierarchy as the differentiating factor between intellects (Tahāfut al-Tahāfut: fifth discussion: 173). While each separate intellect derives its knowledge directly from the First Intellect, each stands in a specific hierarchical relation to the First Intellect, the ranking of each intellect being in accordance with the extent of purity of its mode of apprehension; the purer and simpler the mode of apprehension the closer the intellect in rank to the First Intellect. Overlap between these modes is not possible, which ensures that separate intellects remain differentiated.
Beyond this cosmological account, Albalag indicates that multiplicity in the sublunary realm also comes forth from the deity; the First is said to be the cause of multiplicity inasmuch as It is the ultimate cause of the cosmic unity. Were it not for the unifying force that holds the parts together, the universe as a totality and its parts—each of which comes to be by virtue of a unifying force that conjoins its constituent parts like matter and form and the elements—would not exist (Tiqqun n.69: 97; cf. Averroes Tahāfut al-Tahāfut, third discussion: 108).
7. Celestial Motion
In the Avicennian-emanative scheme celestial motion is ascribed to two principles:
- proximate movers (internal souls), and
- the separate unmoved intellects corresponding to the concentric spheres.
Whereas the soul functions as the efficient cause of motion, the separate unmoved movers function as the final cause of motion insofar as they represent an object of love and desire. The point is that since celestial souls are corporeal and finite, they are insufficient to account for the spheres’ perpetual activities. The perpetuation of motion, accordingly, must be the function of immaterial and incorruptible principles. These are the unmoved separate intellects of which the mover of the outermost spheres is the highest in rank (Avicenna Shifāʾ [Metaphysics]: 308; cf. Maqāṣid: 149).
As with many of Avicenna’s theories, Albalag raises a number of objections to this account of celestial motion. Firstly, Albalag dismisses the conception of complementary efficient-final causation as unwarranted, since, in his understanding, a final cause could hardly continue the activity of a terminated efficient cause. Secondly, Albalag rejects the theory of the spheres’ animation by souls (For background on this theory see Wolfson 1962: 65– 93; Freudenthal 2002: 111–137). His argument against that theory proceeds from the eternity premise as follows. Forces inhering in bodies (including celestial bodies) are finite. As such, they could hardly move the body in which they inhere infinitely. But we know that the nature of spheres is such that they move eternally and this means that celestial souls are superfluous in this regard. That Nature (ha tevaʿ) “does nothing in vain” (cf. Aristotle Politics 1252b30–1253a1; Averroes Commentary on Metaphysics: 178) prompts the conclusion that spheres do not have souls (Tiqqun n.61: 87). Although the basic lines of this argument are derived from Averroes, Albalag seems to adopt a firmer position than Averroes in denying the animation of spheres by souls. While Averroes rejects Avicenna’s twofold account of celestial motion and argues in some of his works (especially De Substantia Orbis: 71; cf. Commentary on Metaphysics: 164) that celestial motion could hardly be dependent on a finite force inhering in the celestial body, he uses the term soul interchangeably with form in reference to the principles of motion in celestial spheres: the immaterial separate intellects. In other works, we still find indications that spheres are ensouled (e.g., Tahāfut al-Tahāfut, fourth discussion). These variations in Averroes’ standpoint in regard to the theory of the spheres’ animation by souls have invited different interpretations (see Donati 2015; Kogan 1984: 190–201).
As for Albalag, his account of celestial motion consistently attributes celestial motion to the efficient, formal and final causation of separate intellects. Relaying on Averroes, while giving the credit to Aristotle, Albalag argues that the three modes of causation are one in the divine realm (cf. Averroes Commentary on Metaphysics: 149). While separate intellects are themselves invariable, they produce motion in the spheres in three different manners (Tiqqun n.64: 92).
8. The Relationship Between Religion and Philosophy
Albalag is most famous in modern scholarship for his view of the relationship between religion and philosophy. In the context of medieval Jewish and Islamic philosophy, he stands out as perhaps the only philosopher to straightforwardly stress, accept and account for the tension between philosophy and prophetic knowledge. His name is usually connected with the doctrine of the “double truth”, which maintains that the truth of prophecy and the truth of philosophy may contradict each other while at the same time remaining simultaneously true (Sirat 1985: 238; Zinberg 1973: 107]; Vajda 1960: 264–265). The origin of this doctrine had long been attributed to Averroes and Latin Averroists until recent studies challenged this attribution. Some scholars have argued that the double truth doctrine never existed as an actual dogma (Dales 1984). Similarly, some scholars question the attribution of the double truth doctrine to Albalag (Guttmann 1966: 227–229) and Elijah Delmedigo, another Jewish Averroist whose treatment of the question in discussion involves some elements alluding to the double truth doctrine (for Delmedigo, see Fraenkel 2013).
The discussion of the question of the relationship between religion and philosophy in the Tiqqun is complex and spans a number of contexts. On the one hand, Albalag states in the preface to the Tiqqun that there is no essential distinction between philosophy and the Torah except that the former, addressing the select few, conveys the truth in a demonstrative manner, while the latter, addressing the multitude, conveys the truth in a figurative language in accordance with their limited comprehension. By this means, Albalag seems to align with the understanding of religion as an imitation of philosophy which was founded by al-Farabi and adopted by many Muslim and Jewish philosophers, most significantly Averroes and arguably Maimonides (see al-Farabi The Book of Letters: 19–26; Maimonides Guide: preface; Averroes Decisive Treatise: 1–3, 7–10). Both philosophers not only maintain that religion and philosophy are compatible, but also accord philosophy a crucial role in arriving at the true meaning of Scripture (Maimonides Guide: preface; Averroes Decisive Treatise: 1–3, 7–10). Furthermore, Averroes sets forth a religious epistemology based on the principle that “truth does not oppose truth; rather, it agrees with and bears witness to it” (Decisive: 9). On this principle, contradictions between al-Shariʿah (Religious Law) and philosophy are viewed as mere apparent, rather than essential, contradictions that result from the literary form of Scripture—consisting in similes, metaphors and stories—which is directed to the multitude. Since al-Shariʿah cares for all people, “the red and black”, it conveys the truth in different methods in accordance with the diverse intellectual capacities of people and types of assent they are fit for (ibid, 8). Only those who are adept in science (al-rasiẖuna fi-lʿilm) can have access to the internal meaning of Scripture, which is designed according to the truth as it is, thereby attaining certain, demonstrative, assent to Scripture. Drawing on Averroes’ religious epistemology, post-Maimonidean philosophers, continuing Maimonides’ philosophical-religious enterprise, undertook to interpret Judaism as “a philosophical religion” by giving principles of Judaism that appeared to be in conflict with philosophy naturalistic interpretations (for the concept of philosophical religion see Fraenkel 2012: 5). In a similar vein, Albalag engages in allegorical interpretations of some elements of the Account of the Beginning, stating, in an obviously apologetic tone, that “it is possible to extract the philosophical doctrine of eternal creation from the Torah” (Tiqqun n.30, 33).
On the other hand, Albalag reveals ambivalence about the feasibility of the philosophical approach to religion. His main stated concern is that the true meaning of Scripture is not readily accessible. The reason is that prophetic knowledge, as Albalag repeatedly affirms, is exclusive to prophets and even the ablest philosopher has no access to the “intention” of the prophet. Thus, when philosophers assign philosophical meanings to verses of the Torah they may just be swerving away from their actual tenor. Albalag finds Maimonides to be particularly at fault in this regard and therefore he labels him as one of the “hasty” people (nemharim) of our time who did harm not only to “faith”, but also to “wisdom” (Tiqqun n.1: 5; Tiqqun n.30: 44). In their attempts to rationally support religious doctrines they acted “with ignorance” as they
- denied demonstrative philosophical doctrines, advocating, instead, weak speculative arguments, and
- unhesitatingly ascribed meanings to Scripture in terms of these arguments and based on their understanding of Scripture.
Two points of contention seem to underlie this critique. The first is that those “hasty” people tend to compromise philosophy in order to satisfy theological considerations. The second is sceptical. While many philosophers confidently interpret Scripture allegorically on the assumption that the internal meaning of Scripture accords with philosophy, Albalag merges his interpretive notes on the Account of the Beginning—the sole context where he offers interpretations of that sort—with remarks emphasizing the inaccessibility of prophetic knowledge to non-prophets.
In response, Albalag offers what may be characterized as a restrictive scheme for interpreting the Jewish Scripture in terms of philosophy. This scheme regards demonstration as the means for attaining the truth and Scripture as a divine source for the truth. Scripture contains two layers of secrets: philosophical and prophetic. A philosopher arrives at the former layer by engaging in allegorical interpretation after he has obtained knowledge through demonstrative reasoning:
for one who seeks the truth, it is not proper [for him] to seek its premises from what he apprehends from Scripture by his own effort without primarily [engaging in] demonstrative reasoning. Rather, he has to learn the truth first through demonstration and thereafter seek support from Scripture. (Tiqqun n.30: 37; cf. Averroes Decisive Treatise: 7)
When Scripture does not agree with demonstrative knowledge, this points to the presence of a deeper layer of secrets, prophetic secrets to which only a prophet has access. On this occasion, the disharmony between demonstrative and prophetic knowledge is treated with fideism, by accepting the Scriptural doctrine on the basis of simple faith. One should not, however, abandon the demonstrative doctrine. Both doctrines remain “true” (ʾemet) to the philosopher-believer.
These claims lie behind the attribution of the double truth doctrine to Albalag in modern scholarship. It should be noted, however, that the scope of application of the double truth doctrine in the Tiqqun is meagre, being limited to the tension between religion and philosophy in regard to the issue of the origin of the world. Towards the end of his discussion of this issue Albalag declares that he accepts as “true” both the philosophical doctrine of eternal creation and the biblical doctrine of temporal creation, the former based on analysis of “nature” and by means of “demonstration” and the latter based on “the authority of the prophet by way of miracle” (Tiqqun n.30: 52). This peculiar way of treating the question of the relationship between religion and philosophy draws a parting line between Albalag and the tradition of Arab Aristotelians and Jewish Averroists in which religion and philosophy are held to be seemingly different representations of the same truth.
9. Theory of Prophecy
Underlying the double truth doctrine is a unique theory of prophecy that credits Albalag with novelty. Deviating from the widely accepted conception of prophecy in medieval Jewish and Islamic philosophy, which views prophets as accomplished philosophers and qualitatively equates prophetic knowledge with philosophy, this theory links prophets and prophetic knowledge to the divine realm (i.e., the realm of separate intellects) while at the same time stressing the absolute transcendence and unknowability of that realm. It correspondingly stresses essential distinctions between philosophical reasoning and knowledge, on the one hand, and prophecy and prophetic knowledge, on the other. Prophets, according to Albalag, are extraordinary human beings endowed with a special mode of apprehension. Thanks to this mode of apprehension prophets have access to knowledge that differs from philosophical knowledge in both content and type. Not only do prophets arrive at answers to questions that lie beyond the capacity of human reason, but they also grasp the truth in a transcendent manner, independently of physical tools and the cognitive processes necessary for rational knowledge (Guttmann 1945: 86).
Their [the philosopher’s and prophet’s] modes of apprehension are distinct. Not only that, but they are [like two] opposites, since this [the philosopher] perceives intelligible [forms] through sensory objects, whereas the latter [the prophet] perceives sensory objects through intelligible [forms]. (Tiqqun n.30: 44 [my translation])
This note suggests that the prophetic mode of apprehension is similar to that of separate intellects which is described in the Tiqqun in similar terms: “if there exists a separate intellect in the universe whose knowledge is not obtained through physical tools”, its “grasp of things would be completely opposite to that of the human [intellect]” (Tiqqun n.11: 16; cf. n.42: 67). The distinction in the mode of apprehension entails fundamental distinctions in the characteristics of the perceived knowledge. Human knowledge passes from potentiality to actuality. It is either universal or particular. It is temporal and involves features of multiplicity, compositeness and materiality. By contrast, divine knowledge is transcendent; it is “neither particular nor universal.” It is constantly actual and absolutely indivisible, simple and atemporal (Tiqqun n.42: 67). In this way, prophetic knowledge, like knowledge of the separate intellects, is said to be qualitatively distinct from philosophical knowledge. Radically maximizing the distinction between prophecy and philosophy, Albalag emphasizes the possibility of contradiction.
Just as the ways through which they [the philosopher and the prophet] apprehend things are so distinct, their respective grasps of things are so distinct that it is possible for the former [the philosopher] to perceive from below [based on nature and reasoning] the opposite (hefekh) of what the latter [the prophet] perceives from above. (Tiqqun n.30: 45 [my translation])
This theory of prophecy parts ways with the standard contemporary theory of prophecy according to which prophets are accomplished philosophers endowed with a strong imaginative faculty. By virtue of this faculty, prophets, unlike philosophers, are able to carry out the necessary political role of establishing laws conducive to the welfare of society, and reformulate theoretical knowledge in a language easy for the multitude to understand. Whatever theoretical knowledge a prophet attains through emanation from the Active Intellect—the intellect of the sphere of the moon to which philosophers variably ascribed epistemological and ontological roles in the sublunary realm—accords with philosophical knowledge; the difference being particularly quantitative (Macy 1986; Rahman 1958). Even the Avicennian theory of prophecy, which links the prophetic mind to the divine realm, does not ascribe to prophetic knowledge a specific qualitative merit above philosophical knowledge; prophets apprehend the principles of all existents, the middle term of every syllogism and intelligible forms instantaneously and effortlessly through divine intuition (ḥads). (Rahman, 1958: 32; Marmura 1963: 49–51; Morris 1992: 84). That is, there are no grounds for contradiction, as Albalag’s theory of prophecy suggests.
10. Political Thought
In the context of medieval Jewish and Islamic philosophy, political thought was largely concerned with investigating the connection between social good and human happiness, on the one hand, and philosophy and religion on the other. In the last section of the Metaphysics of the Maqāṣid, al-Ghazali recapitulates Avicenna’s view of the relationship between social welfare and religion. Proceeding from the Aristotelian dictum that “man is political by nature” (Aristotle Politics 1252b30–1253a1), al-Ghazali stresses that human beings cannot dispense with social interaction and cooperation for fulfilling their basic needs and for the sake of attaining the highest good of man. This, however, is not possible unless society is stable and justly governed. The realization of these conditions is tied to the existence of a lawgiver that enacts laws and promotes doctrines that are conducive to the social and spiritual well-being.
Remarkably, Albalag starts the Tiqqun with the political theme with which al-Ghazali concludes the Maqāṣid. The preface to the Tiqqun offers a gloss on the political nature of human beings, emphasizing the essentiality of society to the individual’s well-being and human survival in general. But, again, society can be conducive to well-being only under specific circumstances. From the point of view of a Medievalist like Albalag, pluralism stands as a major enemy to social stability. The more diversified the society the less stable and more conflict-fraught it is. Pluralism may result in constant warring among people to such an extent as to threaten human existence. Thus comes the need for a lawgiver who promotes social harmony by unifying people in creed and praxis.
Albalag accommodates the Torah into this political theme, assigning it a crucial role in establishing social and political order and maintaining the divinely ordained perpetual existence of the human species. Nothing in this outlook deviates from the view of Medieval Aristotelians regarding the socio-political benefit of Divine Law. Maimonides, for instances, deems the Torah a key factor in the establishment and preservation of social well-being. Still Albalag departs from Maimonides, as well as prominent Muslim philosophers such as al-Farabi and Averroes, in that he confines the Torah to this specific socio-political purpose. These philosophers define divine Law in terms of its goal: unlike man-made laws which care only for the welfare of society, divine Law cares for both the welfare of society and welfare of the soul (Fraenkel 2012: 175; Z. Harvey 1980: 199–200). Maimonides particularly emphasizes that the Torah’s goal does not exclusively focus on the practical domain and that it concerns itself with theoretical virtues. Even practical actions prescribed in the Torah are conducive to the fulfillment of the commandment to “love the Lord” (Deuteronomy 6:4–5), which in Maimonides’ interpretation is an injunction for the true worship of God: intellectual worship. The Torah, accordingly, calls upon people to seek knowledge of all existents by virtue of which man attains intellectual perfection, truly worshiping God (Eight Chapters: 78; cf. Guide III:53).
Unlike Maimonides, Albalag scarcely associates the Torah with any explicit role in promoting theoretical virtues. Indeed, he differentiates between philosophy and the Torah in terms of their respective final goals. While philosophy aims for the happiness of the select few, the Torah aims for the happiness of the multitude, the former type of happiness is intellectual whereas the latter is exclusively civic. In this connection, Albalag defines four basic principles of the Torah, which, as he states, are also foundational to philosophy and religious systems. These principles are:
- reward and punishment,
- the survival of the soul after death,
- the existence of a deity that rewards and punishes, and
- the existence of a divine providence that watches over human beings, each according to his deeds.
As many scholars noted, these four principles belong to the category of principles that are necessary for social well-being (Touati 1962: 44–47; Schweid 2008: 320–321; Guttmann 1945: 90–91). Furthermore, Albalag explains that the Torah adopts a strategy of concealment. Revealing or concealing doctrines is determined on the basis of their respective benefits to society and social well-being. All in all, the preface to the Tiqqun stresses the value of the Torah as a political treatise that is necessary for the establishment of justice and social well-being.
Sefer Tiqqun ha deʿot represents a significant development in the domain of Jewish thought in particular and philosophy in general. In a time when post-Maimonidean philosophers exerted efforts to enhance the philosophical-religious enterprise of Maimonides (as they understood Maimonides’ enterprise to be), Albalag highlights the shortcomings of that enterprise, advocating as an alternative the double truth doctrine. In application, however, this doctrine is strikingly restricted to a very narrow scope, while the superiority of philosophy as a source of true knowledge and certainty is made noticeable throughout the Tiqqun. Unlike the religious domain in which truth is qualified by degrees, the ultimate of which being exclusively accessible to prophets, and subject to human interpretations, truth in the philosophical domain is absolute. It can be obtained through demonstrative reasoning and learned from Aristotelian sciences. It is this understanding of philosophical truth that motivated Albalag to undertake scrutiny of the philosophical discourse in order to purge it from errors and reinstate correct Aristotelianism, as he understands it through the writings of Averroes, the Commentator. On the whole, Albalag’s enterprise marks an attempt to break away from some of the major Neo-Platonic trends that had characterized the Avicennian-Farabian interpretation of Aristotle.
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Other Internet Resources
- Adamson, Peter, 2016, “Masters of the University: ‘Latin Averroism’”, in History of Philosophy without any gaps, episode 251, King’s College London.
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