Alexander of Aphrodisias

First published Mon Oct 13, 2003; substantive revision Tue Apr 23, 2024

Alexander was a Peripatetic philosopher and commentator, active in the late second and early third century CE. He continued the tradition of writing close commentaries on Aristotle’s work established in the first century BCE by Andronicus of Rhodes, the editor of Aristotle’s ‘esoteric’ writings, which seem to have been designed for use in his school only. This tradition reflected a gradual revival of interest in Aristotle’s philosophy, beginning in the late second century BCE, and helped to reestablish Aristotle as an active presence in philosophical debates in later antiquity. Aristotle’s philosophy had fallen into neglect and disarray in the second generation after his death and remained in the shadow of the Stoics, Epicureans, and Academic skeptics throughout the Hellenistic age. Andronicus’ edition of what was to become the Corpus Aristotelicum consolidated a renewed interest in Aristotle’s philosophy, albeit in a different form: active research was replaced by learned elucidations of The Philosopher’s difficult texts. The commentaries themselves served as material for the exposition of Aristotle’s work to a restricted circle of advanced students. Hence each generation of teachers produced their own commentaries, often relying heavily on their predecessors’ work. Thus, the ‘scholastic’ treatment of authoritative texts that was to become characteristic of the Middle Ages had already started in the first century BCE. Alexander, due to his meticulous and philosophically astute exegesis of a wide range of Aristotle’s texts, in logic, physics, psychology, metaphysics and ethical topics, became known as the exemplary commentator throughout later antiquity and the Arabic tradition. He is often referred to simply as ‘The Commentator’ (ho exêgetês), later sharing this title with Avicenna or Averroes. Because there is little evidence on Alexander’s life and activities, his commentaries and his short treatises on topics related more or less closely to Aristotelian doctrine provide all the information we have about him as a philosopher and a man. As these writings show, his main contemporary opponents were the Stoics, but there is also some evidence of a controversy with Galen. Alexander is not only regarded as the best of the ancient commentators but also as the last strictly Aristotelian one, whose aim was to present and defend Aristotle’s philosophy as a coherent whole, well suited to engage contemporary philosophical discussions. The later commentators were members of the Neoplatonist schools and were concerned to document a substantial agreement of Platonic and Aristotelian thought, and to integrate Aristotle’s work into their Neoplatonist philosophical system. But they continued not only to consult and discuss, but also to criticize, Alexander’s work, a fact that probably accounts for its survival.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Date, Family, Teachers, and Influence

Next to nothing is known about Alexander’s origin, life circumstances, and career. His native city was (probably) the Aphrodisias in Caria, an inland city of southwestern Asia Minor. His father’s name was Hermias. The only direct information about his date and activities is the dedication of his On Fate to the emperors Septimius Severus and Caracalla in gratitude for his appointment to an endowed chair. Their co-reign lasted from 198 to 209 CE; this gives us a rough date for at least one of Alexander’s works. Nothing is known about his background or his education, except that his teacher was Aristoteles of Mytilene, rather than the more famous Aristocles of Messene, as had been conjectured by certain scholars since the 16th. century. He is also said to have been a student of Sosigenes and of Herminus, the pupil of the commentator Aspasius, the earliest commentator on Aristotle whose work has in part survived (for information concerning Alexander’s teachers and their philosophy, see Moraux 1984, 335–425). How much Alexander owed to his teachers is hard to guess, for he sometimes criticizes Sosigenes and Herminus extensively. But it is clear from the scope and depth of his work that he was a well-trained philosopher with a broad range of knowledge and interests.

Though the dedication to the emperors tells us that Alexander was appointed to a chair in philosophy, there is not sufficient evidence as to whether, as is often asserted, he obtained one of the four chairs, representing the four traditional schools, established in Athens by Marcus Aurelius in 176 CE. There were similar established chairs in several cities (on Athens see Lynch 1972, 192–207; 213–216). Given the amount and scope of his writing he must have been an active teacher with a flourishing school. It is therefore possible that some of the short essays attributed to Alexander are actually the production of one of his collaborators or disciples. But nothing is known about any of his associates and students (cf. Sharples 1990a). To us his work therefore represents both the heyday and the end of the series of commentators who explained Aristotle exclusively on the basis of Aristotelian texts, without commitment to some other doctrine. Alexander concludes the series of these purely ‘Peripatetic’ commentators (beginning with Andronicus of Rhodes in the first century BCE), who try to explain “Aristotle by Aristotle” (Moraux 1942, xvi, cf. Chiaradonna 2012). Though later commentators, starting with Porphyry, the disciple and editor of Plotinus, relied heavily on his works, they had a Neo-Platonist approach. Since Porphyry lived considerably later than Alexander (ca. 234–305/10 CE), Alexander’s school may have continued to exist until it became outmoded by the ‘Neo-Platonist turn’. Porphyry’s report that Plotinus included texts by Alexander ‘and related authors in his discussions’ (The Life of Plotinus, 14.13) makes this quite likely. Alexander’s commentaries formed a central part of the Arabic tradition and were heavily used by Maimonides. His work thereby influenced the Latin West after the revival of Aristotelianism in the Middle Ages. The scarcity of Latin translations of Alexander’s commentaries suggests a certain preference for the interpretation of the later, Neoplatonist, commentators. If William of Moerbeke confined his translations of Alexander’s commentaries to those on the Meteorologica and the De sensu that may in part be due to the availability of Boethius’ commentaries on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics and the Topics, but it leaves unexplained why Moerbeke did not translate the commentary on the Metaphysics (on the reception of Alexander in the Middle Ages and the Renaissance see Rossi/Di Giovanni/Robiglio 2021).

1.2 Works and their history

As the list of his works shows, Alexander was a prolific writer. His writings comprise both commentaries (hupomnêmata) on the works of Aristotle and several systematic treatises of his own (including works on ‘problems’, consisting of series of essays on different Aristotelian texts or topics). Of the commentaries, the following are extant: On Prior Analytics I, Topics, Metaphysics, Meteorologica, and On Sense Perception. Of the commentary on the Metaphysics only the first five books are by general consent accepted as genuine; the remaining nine books are attributed to the late commentator Michael of Ephesus (11th-12th century CE.). The commentary on the Sophistical Refutations, ascribed to Alexander in some manuscripts, is considered spurious. References by later commentators show that Alexander’s commentaries covered all of Aristotle’s theoretical philosophy, including his physical writings (with the exception of the biological works). The list of his lost works is long: there are references to commentaries on the Categories, De interpretatione, Posterior Analytics, Physics, and On the Heavens, as well as On the Soul and On Memory. Alexander did not write commentaries on Aristotle’s Ethics or Politics, nor on the Poetics or the Rhetoric. That he had quite some interest in ethical problems, however, is witnessed by the discussions in his own treatises. Among the extant short systematic writings the following are regarded as genuine: Problems and Solutions, Ethical Problems, On Fate, On Mixture and Increase, On the Soul and a Supplement to On the Soul (dubbed ‘De Anima libiri Mantissa’, lit. ‘make-weight for the book of the soul’, by its first modern editor, I. Bruns); they not only contain discussions of questions concerning psychology but also problems in physics, vision and light, ethics, as well as fate and providence. The ‘Mantissa’ may not be by Alexander but a compilation of notes by his students. The rest, Medical Questions, Physical Problems, and On Fevers are considered spurious. Of his lost works some have been preserved in Arabic because they were highly influential (see D’Ancona & Serra 2002): On the Principles of the Universe, On Providence, Against Galen on Motion, and On Specific Differences. Because of Alexander’s prestige and authority as an interpreter of Aristotle, many of his works now lost were incorporated in the commentaries of his successors, whether they name him or not. For example, Alexander’s commentary on On the Heavens can to some extent be reconstructed on the basis of Themistius’ paraphrase of Aristotle’s text and Simplicius’ commentary. Nothing certain is known about the relative chronology of Alexander’s writings, but this is not an issue of much importance, since his commentaries may well represent the results of many years of teaching, with later insertions and additions, in a way quite similar to Aristotle’s own texts. This would explain the lack of any attempt at elegance and the occurrence of inconsistencies or unclear transitions in Alexander.

2. Alexander as commentator and philosopher

In general, Alexander goes on the assumption that Aristotelian philosophy is a unified whole, providing systematically connected answers to virtually all the questions of philosophy recognized in his own time. Where there is no single, clearly recognizable Aristotelian point of view on some question, he leaves the matter undecided, citing several possibilities consistent with what Aristotle says. Sometimes Alexander tries to force an interpretation that does not obviously agree with the text, but he avoids stating that Aristotle contradicts himself and, with rare exceptions, that he disagrees with him. Readers will not always be convinced by his suggestions but they will often find them helpful and informative where Aristotle is overly compressed and obscure. As a remark in his commentary on the Topics shows, Alexander was quite aware that his own style of philosophical discussion was very different from that of the time of Aristotle (In top. 27,13): “This kind of speech [dialectic refutation] was customary among the older philosophers, who set up most of their classes in this way — not on the basis of books as is now done, since at the time there were not yet any books of this kind.” As this explanation indicates, however, he seems to have regarded the bookishness of his own time as an advantage over the dialectic style rather than a disadvantage.

Like the works of the other commentators in the ancient tradition, Alexander’s derive from his courses of lectures (‘readings’) on Aristotle’s works. In commenting, Alexander usually refrains from giving comprehensive surveys. He generally starts with a preface on the work’s title, its scope and the nature of the subject matter. He then takes up individual passages in rough succession by citing a line or two (this provides the ‘lemma’ for the ensuing discussion) and by explaining what he considers as problematic (in explanatory paraphrases, clarifications of expressions, or refutations of the views of others), often in view of what Aristotle says about the issue elsewhere. This procedure clearly presupposes that the students had their own texts at hand and were sufficiently familiar with Aristotle’s philosophy as a whole. Alexander does not generally go through the text line by line, but chooses to discuss certain issues while omitting others. Paraphrases are interrupted by clarifications of terminology, and sometimes, at crucial points, by notes on divergent readings in different manuscripts and a justification of his own preference concerning Aristotle’s original words. Decisions on such philological problems are based on what makes better sense in conforming with Aristotle’s intentions here or elsewhere. As Alexander indicates, such philological explorations were considered as part of the commentator’s work (cf. On Aristotle Metaphysics A, 59, 1–9): “The first reading, however, is better; this makes it clear that the Forms are causes of the essence for the other things, and the One for the Forms. Aspasius relates that the former is the more ancient reading, but that it was later changed by Eudorus and Euharmostus.” Alexander’s concern with textual problems makes him a valuable source for textual criticism, as can be seen from Kotwick’s (2016) monograph on the text of Aristotle’s Metaphysics.

Though Alexander follows the Aristotelian texts quite conscientiously, he often concentrates on special points and the respective passages while passing over others with brief remarks. Thus in his comments on the first book of Aristotle’s Metaphysics he devotes more than half of his exegesis to the two chapters in which Aristotle attacks Plato’s theory of Forms (Metaph. A, 6 & 9). Since Aristotle there focuses on Plato’s attempt to connect the Forms with numbers, a theory that is not elaborated in the dialogues, Alexander’s disquisition turns out to be our most valuable source on the vexed question of Plato’s Unwritten Doctrines and also on the impact of these doctrines on the members of the Early Academy (see Harlfinger & Leszl, 1975; Fine 1993). Though on the whole Alexander adopts Aristotle’s critical stance towards Plato’s separate Forms, he sometimes at least indicates the possibility of dissent. When, for instance, Aristotle claims that Plato recognizes only two of his own four causes, the formal and the material cause, Alexander refers to the demiurge’s activities in the Timaeus as a potential example for an efficient cause acting for the sake of a final cause. But then he adds a justification to explain why Aristotle acknowledges neither of the two causes in his report on Plato (59,28–60,2): “The reason is either because Plato did not mention either of these in what he said about the causes, as Aristotle has shown in his treatise On the Good; or because he did not make them causes of the things involved in generation and destruction, and did not even formulate any complete theory about them.”

The idea that discrepancies in Aristotle’s texts are due to the development of his philosophy was as alien to Alexander as it was to all other thinkers in antiquity. Instead, he treats Aristotle’s philosophy as a unitary whole and tries to systematize it by forging together different trains of thought, and smoothing over inconsistencies. Thereby he contributed to the emergence of what was to become the canonical ‘Aristotelianism’ that was attacked in early modern times as a severe obstacle to new ideas and scientific development. Though Alexander indicates that he was aware of changes at particular points (he regarded the Categories as Aristotle’s earliest work and notes that it does not yet observe the systematic distinction between genus and species), he does not consider the possibility that there were different phases with substantial changes in the Master’s work. If such conservatism surprises us in view of the fact that Alexander’s own work shows traces of revisions and improvement, we must keep in mind that in the eyes of ‘The Commentator’ Aristotle was an authority quite outside the common order. The doctrine of the Master was not the product of an ordinary human mind, subject to trial and error, but a magisterial achievement in a class of its own.

In his systematic writings, Alexander presents an Aristotelian point of view that also reflects in many ways the conditions and discussions of his own time, also on questions that were not or not extensively discussed by Aristotle himself. For example, although Alexander is critical of Platonism, some Platonizing may be discerned in his own writings (see below). His Problems and Solutions (Quaestiones), in three books, are collections of short essays, which were apparently grouped together in different books already in antiquity. As their Greek title (Physikai scholikai aporiai kai lyseis. lit. ‘School-discussion of problems and solutions on nature’, cf. Sharples 1992, 3) indicates, these three books address problems in natural philosophy in the broadest sense. A fourth collection, Ethical Problems (Êthika problêmata) proceeds in a similar way. As the lists of the essays’ titles at the beginning of each collection show, they contain a hodgepodge of topics – such as matter and form, causes, colours, sleep, recollection – arranged in a quite loose order. The intellectual level of these discussions is uneven and the titles of the treatises are sometimes misleading. Some of the essays do present problems and solutions, but others contain exegeses of problematic passages in Aristotle’s texts. There are also mere paraphrases or summaries of certain texts, collections of arguments for a certain position, and sketches of larger projects that were never worked out. It is unclear when and by whom these collections were put together. As mentioned above, some of the essays may be the work of Alexander’s associates, or lecture-notes taken by his students. Most interesting from our point of view are those questions that deal with metaphysical issues, like the relation of form and matter, or with the status of universals in general (see section 4). Of particular interest are also those discussions in book II that are concerned with certain aspects of Aristotle’s psychology, because Alexander’s commentary on the De anima is lost; they supplement his treatise On the Soul, more on which below (see 3.3). Of interest are also the essays on the notion of providence (an important topic in Alexander’s time, in part due to the influence of the Stoics’ focus on divine providence). These essays defend the view that while there is no special care for individuals, providence over the objects in the sublunary sphere is exercised by the movement of the heavenly bodies in the sense that they preserve the continuity of the species on earth.

Overall, Alexander himself does not signal where he departs from Aristotle. In the past, the understanding was that he presented his own views only in his treatises, but today scholars tend to think that he departs from Aristotle both in his systematic works and in his commentaries. They may not go so far as to agree with the starch criticism of Plutarch: that Alexander, in his desire to expound his own doctrines, and bring down Aristotle to his level, only pretended to comment on Aristotle (about the commentary on De Anima, and reported by Philoponus, In dA 21). They might agree with the more appreciative version of that sentiment, however, that both the treatises and the commentaries have philosophical significance beyond their mere exegetical value.

3. Logic

As his commentaries on Aristotle’s logical works show, Alexander was fully familiar with the development of logic after Aristotle, under Theophrastus and the Stoics. On the whole, he presents the Aristotelian kind of logic as the obviously right one, treating the Stoic approach as wrong-headed. When he confronts problems in Aristotle’s syllogistic he sometimes expresses bafflement, and indicates the difficulties or even inconsistencies he sees in the text. But he usually tries to smooth them over or offers an alleged Aristotelian solution. In any case he avoids, if at all possible, openly criticizing Aristotle or contradicting him. As his analyses show, Alexander was not an original logician with innovative ideas of his own, as was his contemporary, Galen. He does not always get Aristotle right and sometimes blunders in his exegesis. In addition, his style is uninviting. If Aristotle is hard to comprehend on account of his clipped and elliptic style, Alexander is often hard to follow because of his long and tortuous periods (cf. the Introduction to his commentary on Prior Analytics I in trsl. Barnes et al. 1991). In the past this has made his commentary on the Prior Analytics inaccessible to all but experts. The English translations try to make up for these deficiencies by cutting up long periods into shorter sentences. This will greatly enhance the usefulness of Alexander’s reconstruction and assessment of those aspects of Aristotle’s logic that are still a matter of controversy nowadays.

Besides enhancing our understanding of Aristotle, and despite their limitations, some developments of interest to the logician may still be found in Alexander’s commentaries. For example, even if they probably precede Alexander, some elements of late ancient logic seep into his discussions, such as in the commentary on Aristotle’s Topics. The “Peripatetic program” of merging Aristotelian and Stoic hypothetical logic shows up in his assumption that the Stoic indemonstrables are an invention of Aristotle’s, in his merger of Stoic and Aristotelian hypotheticals, and in his use of Stoic logical terminology for logical relations (Bobzien 2014). Another example is the introduction of a new kind of premise, the premise ‘not only at a certain instant in time.’ This type of premise seems to be reserved for statements about propria, which always hold, although they do not belong to the essence of a substance, and which are therefore neither described in necessity premises, nor in contingency premises, but in categorical premises that are true at more than one point in time (Gili 2012).

4. Metaphysics

In Alexander’s metaphysical writings, including his commentaries, we find some of the major points of ancient discussion concerning the core, not so much of metaphysics, but of Aristotelian metaphysics. At times, Alexander seems most focused on criticizing contemporaries from an Aristotelian perspective, and at times instead to defend Aristotelianism by elaborating in original ways that address possible criticisms. As an example of the former: in the treatise On Mixture and Increase Alexander expands on problems that Aristotle touched upon only briefly in On Generation and Corruption I 10, but his main concern is — as it is in his On Fate — to prove that the Stoic position, in this case their account of a ‘thorough’ mixture of two substances, cannot be maintained. This treatise suggests that at the beginning of the third century philosophical discussions between the traditional schools were still lively. We have, of course, no other evidence on that issue; but there would be little point in proving the superiority of the Peripatetic doctrine, as Alexander does in On Fate, in a work dedicated to the emperors, if the issue was by general consent regarded as obsolescent. It is unlikely, therefore, that Alexander’s polemics are only a kind of shadow-boxing against long-gone adversaries.

As an example of the second, apologetic feature: in his commentary on the Metaphysics, we find an elaboration of the question whether metaphysics can be a demonstrative science. Alexander makes an effort to show that it is in fact a demonstrative science in the sense of Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, i.e. with its own genus or subject matter, axioms, and derived theorems. As part of this effort, he understands the subject matter of metaphysics, being qua being, as referring to all beings, insofar as they are existent (Bonelli 2001). He also reshapes the concept of common notions, in such a way that in metaphysics common notions may serve as axioms, i.e. provide its fundamental principles. Common notions, which started out, in Aristotle and later the Stoics, as shared starting points for inquiry and argument, are expanded by Alexander to incorporate features of dialectical starting points, points about which there is general agreement, and scientific axioms. They are not innate, but immediately evident to everyone, and serve as indemonstrable starting points for scientific knowledge — the prime example for metaphysics being the principle of non-contradiction (de Haas 2021).

Another core problem in the Metaphysics for ancient readers of Aristotle, was the status of the eidos or form, and especially the relation between the individual as compound of matter and form, and the kind or species. One of the main questions concerning this relation, inspired especially by Met. Z, is whether individuals or kinds are the main substances, or, more broadly, where we find true being. In this debate, two key positions can be discerned, which in turn divide into varieties, roughly corresponding to contemporary positions (Rashed 2007, Kupreeva 2010): either individual substances are the primary beings, with their forms providing their structures or attributes (the ‘predicative’ reading of Aristotle); or eidê, forms in the sense of kinds or species are the primary beings, and hylomorphic compounds are substances in a derivative sense (the ‘substantialist’ reading). The predicative reading is the one adopted by Andronicus of Rhodes and Boethus of Sidon. A more extreme version of this view can be found in early peripatetic philosophy, such as that of Dicaearchus, who proposed a materialist reading of Aristotle. The substantialist view also comes in two main varieties, which we may call ‘idealist’ and ‘individualist.’ According to the idealist view, true being is found first and foremost in the eidos in the sense of the species. The species is the primary substance, and determines the hylomorphic compound consisting of a relation between it and indeterminate matter. We could also call this a Platonist view. The individualist interpretation, instead, gives priority of being to the individual eidos (Kupreeva 2010, Rashed 2007).

There is an ongoing debate about what precisely was Alexander’s view of Aristotle in this debate. Moraux (1942) stays close to the materialist view, in suggesting that Alexander was a kind of nominalist, based on his analysis of form in the commentary on de Anima. Alexander there seems to elaborate what we may call a ‘functionalist’ element of Aristotle’s natural philosophy (cf. Caston 2012): form, for Alexander, is precisely what gives a substance the power (dynamis) to perform certain activities (On the Soul 9). More recent scholarly work has added nuance to the discussion of Alexander’s position, as attempting to bring together Aristotle’s statements about substance in Categories, Metaphysics, and de Anima. Rashed (2007), elaborating on a view discussed by Sharples (2005), puts Alexander in the substantialist camp, by arguing for an understanding of Alexander’s theory of forms as an essentialism, in the sense that forms, rather than individuals, are primary beings, and that forms are kinds constituting the essences of individuals. These forms should not be understood in the idealist sense, i.e. not as unique paradigms, but as entities that may be multiplied to the number of existing individual hylomorphic compounds. They are called ‘common’ by Alexander insofar as they are considered separately from the material accidents of individual entities (see below), but in themselves they are particular, and not universal like Platonic forms, insofar as each individual has its own instantiation of the relevant form. They are eternal insofar as they are transmitted between generations of living beings, and they are essences in the sense that they are the active principles ‘informing’ individual beings (corresponding to the genus and differentia specifica in the definition). On this interpretation, Alexander ends up between the Platonist and the individualist camps.

This brings us to two other topics of interest, namely Alexander’s views on universals, and on matter. With respect to Alexander’s discussions on universals, the established view is that, as opposed to Aristotle, he emphatically distinguishes forms from universals (Sirkel 2011, following Tweedale 1984). This is true only, however, if we understand ‘universal’ here as the common concept (to koinon, Quaestio 1.3 or to katholou, 1.11) which thought abstracts from particulars that in turn are caused by an eternal and common essence, form, or nature, as Alexander also calls it. The hylomorphically compound individual is posterior to the form. The individuals in turn are prior to the universal or abstracted ‘common’, or the genus. Alexander’s argument is that what a thing is, its form or nature, is not dependent on there being many instances, whereas the definition, and so the genus, are dependent on what the instances have in common. These instances need not exist at the same time. (Quaestio 1.11, 1.3, with Sirkel 2011, Rashed 2007). So Perictione and her great-granddaughter have their individual human nature in common, i.e. their being a human has all features in common, even if both have features the other does not, and the common features or the universal, which we abstract from individual humans, can be expressed in a definition. Because this definition ultimately relies on a correct abstraction of an eternal essence, it founds the possibility of scientific knowledge (Rashed 2007). At the same time, however – and this again seems to be a polemical point against Platonism – such universals depend for their being on the activity of intellect. If they are not thought, they are not there. Thus universal concepts are like enmattered forms, but in intellect, and active thoughts are their instantiations (De Anima 90 with Sirkel 2011; see also 3.3).

What stands out in Alexander’s writings on matter is that he is the first to elaborate Aristotle’s views into what became the classic conception of prime matter. Starting from Aristotelian inspiration, and emphasizing the distinction between simple and compound bodies, Alexander develops his conception of prime matter (prima materia, or kuriôs hulê, ‘matter properly speaking’). Simple bodies consist only of matter and form (as opposed to compound bodies, which consist of other bodies), and their matter has to be formless. This prime matter cannot exist independently of form, but it is not tied to any specific form either. In a simple body like fire, for example, prime matter happens to take on heat and dryness, while it could take on their opposites just as well (On the Soul 4–5, see also Caston 5 and n.16). This feature of having the capacity of taking on opposite attributes in turn, poses a problem for the heavens, which do not share this feature, yet have to have a material substrate in order to be natural, i.e. inherently moving. Distinguishing heavenly matter from sublunary matter, however, which Aristotle also required for safeguarding the incorruptible nature of the heavens, results in the issue that the prime matter underlying the sublunary world is no longer unqualified. Alexander solves this (logical) problem by stating that the difference between the two is not qualitative: matter, both below and beyond the moon, is the ultimate unqualified substrate; being capable of receiving opposites in turn is not a quality of sublunary matter in the sense of a differentia distinguishing one species of matter from another (Quaestio 1.10, 1.15, with Rashed 2007). Although Alexander does not say this explicitly, the underlying thought seems to be that ultimately receiving opposites is not a necessary attribute of sublunary matter, but a contingent one. The best definition of prima materia, then, for Alexander, is that it is the unqualified substrate.

As we will see, Alexander’s views on these features of hylomorphism are important for his understanding of the relation between soul and body, and at times are elaborated with that relation specifically in mind.

5. Psychology

In the realm of psychology, Alexander again in general elaborates on Aristotle, while also responding to challenges offered by other contemporary schools. His most interesting contributions concern the relation between soul and body, and the nature of the intellect. Especially the latter had a very long shadow, that has only recently been recognized as a shadow thrown by Alexander, rather than Aristotle. Alexander’s naturalist approach in psychology is revealed in his treatment of the human soul as the perishable form imposed upon the bodily elements to constitute a living human being. Aristotelian psychology, according to which the soul is a form of the body, has to maneuver between the Scylla of Platonism and the Charybdis of reducing soul to a mere attribute of the body. According to Platonic dualism, body and soul are both substances in the sense of independent beings, which was unacceptable for Aristotle for a couple of reasons, among which primarily the fact that the independence of soul had to be reconciled with its role as formal cause. Understanding the soul in a functionalist sense, however, risks reducing the soul to an accident, which means robbing it of the possibility of being the cause of activity, a source of motion. Alexander finds a safe course between the two, by conceiving of forms as causal powers or dispositions of substances (see above), and by viewing the soul as supervening on the body. This means that a specific type of soul fits only a body made of a certain kind of mixture, i.e. a body that is suitable to performing certain functions, and that it supervenes on the body which is its sufficient condition. The ontological priority of soul or form over body is still guaranteed by the fact that the soul is not the mixture of bodily elements, but the causal power that emerges in it (Caston 2012).

The most debated aspect of Alexander’s psychology is no doubt his theory of the intellect. There are some problems regarding the consistency between and within On the Soul and Mantissa but we will here assume that they contain the same theory, albeit with different emphases and within different contexts. One of the most interesting elements of that theory, also in light of its later reception, is the elaboration of Aristotle’s passive and active intellect (dA 3.5). Aristotle, after introducing the intellect and its capacities in de Anima 3.4, in 3.5 presents a distinction of two kinds of intellect: passive and active. The passive is also called material and potential, the active is also called productive, separable, impassible and unmixed, immortal and eternal. There are as many readings of this distinction as there are readers, with the differences centering around the following questions: how do active and passive intellect relate? And is Aristotle separating two aspects of the human intellect, or is he instead distinguishing human from divine intellect?

With respect to that last question, and this may well be his most influential interpretation of Aristotle, Alexander chooses the second option: the passive intellect is the one found in humans, but the active intellect is transcendent and divine (although there is a sense in which the human intellect can be called active, and productive, rather than passive, see below). The passive or material intellect is also “natural”, because it is found in all healthy humans (On the Soul 81). It is tied to the corporeal world in two ways: it is focused upon enmattered forms, in its laying hold of the universal as the common feature of particulars (On the Soul 83, Mantissa 110), and it is embodied in the sense that it is a capacity of the soul which is a form of a human body. This is not why it is called material, however. ‘Material’ in this context refers to the other standard meaning of matter, i.e. of being a substrate, because the material intellect is purely receptive. Following Aristotle, Alexander argues that all forms are objects of intellect, and if the intellect had any form itself, that form would interfere with its intellectual reception of other forms (On the Soul 84, Mantissa 106–7; it is moreover receptive in two manners: as receiving the theoretical and the practical disposition). It is therefore nothing in actuality, but potentially everything, which is why it is also called the potential intellect. Aristotle’s analogy of the empty writing tablet (dA 429b30–430a2) therefore has to be understood, according to Alexander, not as emphasizing that the material intellect is analogous to the tablet, but to its emptiness: it is a condition or an aptitude of the soul (On the Soul 84).

For a further stage of development of the potential intellect, Alexander introduces a separate term: once it has reached its first actualization, or fully developed its natural capacity, the material intellect may be called the “dispositional intellect.” This label refers to the disposition reached by the acquisition of scientific understanding (epistêmê). This stage is also called “common”, as not all humans reach it, but most do at least reach a certain degree of such universal and synthetic knowledge (On the Soul 82, Mantissa 107), or knowledge of essences as expressed in definitions (On the Soul 87). The final stage of development is the second actualization, when the intellect actively engages in intellectual acts, and becomes that which it knows. It is then itself intellect in act, and it knows and becomes intelligibles in act (as opposed to the potential intelligibles, i.e. enmattered forms), so in this sense it may be said to know itself (On the Soul 87–8, Mantissa 108). As creating the very intelligibles it knows, it may moreover be called active and productive, rather than passive, to distinguish it from the senses (Mantissa 111). The intelligibles in act, although analogous to the enmattered forms, are quite emphatically described by Alexander as a different kind of forms (Guyomarc’h 2023).

There is a tension in Alexander’ view of the material intellect, as it seems to combine complete receptivity, and hence passivity, with some kind of cognitive activity, to begin with abstraction. The role of receptivity guarantees the objectivity of our abstractions, but it is not quite clear how intellection starts (Tuominen 2010). In some interpretations, Alexander tries to solve this problem using the active intellect and what Guyomarc’h calls the Principle of Maximal Causality. That principle is a metaphysical argument with roots in Plato, but also present in Aristotle, which assumes that for all degrees of a property, there has to be something which has that property to the fullest, and that that something has to be the cause of the lower degrees (cf. Guyomarc’h 2023). So Alexander states that besides the human intellect developing from potentiality to actuality, there has to be an intellect that is always already essentially in act, preceding all potentiality (cf. Aristotle Met. 12). This active or productive intellect is the most intelligible form (On the Soul 88–90, Mantissa 107–110, 113), and because it is immaterial, it also has a separable or separate existence, and is impassible and unmixed, immortal and eternal. Alexander thus has the active intellect transcend the human soul, and rules out personal immortality by identifying this separate active intellect, mentioned by Aristotle in De anima 3.5, with pure form and with God, the divine intellect from Aristotle’s Met. 12, and possibly even with the Good from Plato’s Republic, as the cause of all goodness, knowledge and being (On the Soul 89–90 with Caston 1999, Fotinis 1979, Guyomarc’h 2023).

How, according to Alexander, this active intellect and the human, passive intellect are related, is not an easy question to answer. It seems clear, however, that the active intellect is a necessary condition for development in the potential intellect, whose pure potentiality prevents it from being the agent that starts its own cognitive process. Three main interpretations have been offered for the causal role of the active intellect: that it is an efficient cause, that it is a final cause, and that it is both (for the latter see Nyvlt 2012 and Schroeder 2014). That Alexander calls the active intellect the productive (poietikos) cause of all other intelligibles, is the main argument for understanding it as the efficient cause of intellection. This reading is problematic, however, insofar as it would require the active intellect to focus on something other than thinking itself – and therefore render it a potential intellect to some extent. For the view that it is merely the final cause (Tuominen 2006, de Haas 2021, Guyomarc’h 2023), pleads Alexander’s claim that the intellect “from outside” (thurathen) is the cause of our knowing because as pure form it is the ultimate object of our intellection, and as pure act the ultimate paradigm, which confers on our material intellect the disposition to think what is potentially intelligible: “it does not make [our intellect] intellect, but by its own nature perfects the intellect that exists [already] and leads it to the things that are proper to it” (Mantissa 111–2). This notion of the intellect “from outside” is taken from Aristotle’s On Generation of Animals 437b, where it is meant to solve the problem of the emergence of the soul, and especially the rational powers, in embryos: only intellect, Aristotle says, does not at some point arise in the development of the embryo, but somehow comes “from outside” and is divine. Following Platonist criticisms of Peripatetic discussions of that emergence, Alexander elaborates and interprets the “intellect from outside” in an original manner, as referring to the transcendent divinity and the prior and independent existence of the intellect in act, with respect to our intellects and cognition. This intellect is present in us from outside, only in the sense that when we think (of) the active intellect, our intellect thereby becomes the active intellect “in some way” (On the Soul 89). This does not mean that the active intellect itself is somehow present in us, except analogously, as object and hence state of our thought. It is then, that we are closest to the divine (On the Soul 91, Mantissa 113; on the notion “from outside” in Alexander see also Roreitner 2023, Guyomarc’h 2023, de Haas 2021, Opsomer and Sharples 2000, Schroeder and Todd 1990). A problem for this interpretation is that it is still not clear how our initially purely potential intellect kicks into gear. A possible solution would be that the initial stages of development in the intellect are passive, due to the repeated reception of enmattered forms through repeated reception, and that the first grasping of the universal (as described in An. Post. II 19), as immaterial and intelligible form, is the moment our intellect intelligizes the divine active intellect by becoming an active intellect itself (cf. de Haas 2021).

6. Ethics and Fate

Since Alexander did not write a commentary on Aristotle’s ethics, his Ethical Problems, despite their somewhat disorganized state, are of considerable interest (cf. Madigan 1987; Sharples 1990; 2001, 2). For, apart from parts of Aspasius’ early commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics there are no extant commentaries on Aristotle’s ethics before the composite commentary by various hands of the Byzantine age (Michael of Ephesus in the 11th/12th c. and his contemporary Eustratius, together with some material extracted from earlier authors, cf. Sharples 1990, 6–7, 95). This gap may suggest that ethics had become a marginal subject in later antiquity. Alexander’s Ethical Problems are therefore the only link between Aspasius and the medieval commentaries. His essays are moreover worth studying because many of the ‘questions’ address central issues in ancient ethics. Some, for instance, are concerned with the notion of pleasure as a good and pain as an evil; with pleasure as a supplement of activity supporting its connection with happiness; with the relation supervening upon it and between virtues and vices; with virtue as a mean; and with the concept of the involuntary and the conditions of responsibility. Alexander’s discussions confirm not only his thorough familiarity with Aristotle’s ethics, but also reflect the debates of the Peripatetics with the Epicureans and Stoics in Hellenistic times, as shown especially by the terminology he uses, as well as debates within the Peripatetic school. For example, he elaborates on pain as, like pleasure, a supplement of activity, but with a reverse value in respect to the activity (pain accompanying bad activities is good), in what is apparently a debate between a pleasure-friendly and a pleasure-hostile trend in the Peripatetic school (cf. Cheng 2014). In discussing such ethical problems, Alexander pays special attention to logical and (meta)physical aspects, as in this case the supervenience and causality of pleasure. This approach may be explained from the Hellenistic context in which he is working, and the (often implicit) debates of his time. Another example is his discussion of the coming to be of opposites not from each other, but from privation as an intermediate state, starting from the relation between justice and injustice (Eth. Pr. 30, possibly to underpin the anti-Stoic thesis of Eth. Pr. 3).

The best example of Alexander’s procedure is his construal of an Aristotelian conception of fate in the treatise On Fate. This essay, though not easy to read, is probably the most interesting for a general public (cf. Sharples 1983 and 2001, 1). Not only is it the most comprehensive surviving document in the centuries-long debate on fate, determinism, and free will that was carried on between the Stoics, the Epicureans and the Academic Skeptics, it also contains some original suggestions and points of criticism, as a comparison with Cicero’s On Fate would show. It is unclear whether there had been a genuinely Peripatetic contribution to this debate before Alexander, although the fact that Justin Martyr, his slightly older contemporary, uses much the same terminology, suggests that they may have been inspired by a common source. In any case, Alexander appears to have filled a significant gap in the Peripatetic school. Though Aristotle himself in a way touches on all important aspects of the problem of determinism — logical, physical, and ethical — in different works, he was not greatly concerned with this issue, nor does he entertain the notion of fate (heimarmenê) as a rational cosmic ordering-force, as the Stoics did. In De interpretatione 9, he famously proposed to solve the problem of ‘future truth’ by suspending truth-values for statements in the future tense concerning individual contingent events. In his ethics he deals with the question of whether individuals have free choice, once their character is settled. As Aristotle sees it, there is little or no leeway, but he holds individuals responsible for their actions because they collaborated in the acquisition of their character (EN III, 1–5). In his physical works Aristotle limits strict necessity to the motions of the stars, while allowing for a wide range of events in the sublunary realm that do not happen of necessity but only for the most part or accidentally (Phys. II, 4–6). Though he subscribes to the principle that the same causal constellations have the same effects, he also allows for ‘fresh starts’ in a causal series (Metaph. E 3). Given these various limitations, Aristotle had no reason to treat determinism as a central philosophical problem either in his ethics or in his physics. The situation changed, however, once the Stoics had established a rigorously physicalist system ordered by an all-pervasive divine mind. It is this radicalization of the determinist position that sharpened the general consciousness of the problematic, as witnessed by the relentless attacks on the Stoics by their opponents, most of all by the Academic skeptics and the Epicureans, which lasted for centuries.

This long-standing debate prompted Alexander to develop an Aristotelian concept of fate by identifying it with the natural constitution of things, including human nature (On Fate, ch. 2–6). Since there is always the possibility that something happens against the natural and normal order of things, there are exceptions to what is ‘fated’ and there is room for chance and the fortuitous. Most of the treatise is occupied not with the defense of this Peripatetic position, but rather with attacks on the various aspects of the determinist position. Alexander claims to show why the Stoics’ attempt (though he nowhere names them) to defend a compabilitist position must fail. The determinists, he says, are neither entitled to maintain a coherent concept of luck and the fortuitous, nor of contingency and possibility, nor of deliberation and potency. The bulk of this polemical discussion concentrates on the difficulties for the Stoic position by claiming that their concept of fate makes human deliberation superfluous and therefore imports disastrous consequences for human morality and life in general (chs. 7–21). Alexander also presents, albeit in a dialectical fashion intended to lead to the defeat of the Stoic tenets, the arguments used by the Stoics in their defense of contingency, chance, and human responsibility. As he claims time and again, the Stoics can defend the use of these terms at best in a verbal sense. In addition, their notion of divine foreknowledge and prophecy turns out to be incoherent (chs. 22–35). The stringency and originality of Alexander’s critique cannot be discussed here (cf. Sharples 1983; Bobzien 1998; Adamson 2018). While his presentation is not free from repetition and while the order of the arguments leaves something to be desired, it is an interesting text that displays a lively engagement with the issues and quite some philosophical sophistication. He argues that truly free action requires that at the time one acts, it is open to one both to do and not to do what one does in fact then do. Thus Alexander originates the position later known as ‘libertarianism’ in the theory of free action. Alexander’s construction of an Aristotelian account of fate and divine providence that limits them to nature and its overall benign order clearly argues for a weak conception of fate; but it is the only one that Alexander regards as compatible with the principles of Aristotelian philosophy of nature and ethics. That the concept of fate greatly intrigued him is confirmed by the fact that he returns to the issue in his Supplement (henceforth Mantissa) to the treatise On the Soul and in some of his Problems (2.4.5, cf. Sharples 1983, esp. the Introduction).

7. Importance and Influence

There is no information concerning the impact of Alexander’s teaching in his lifetime. But certain indications of critical attacks on his contemporary Galen (129–216 CE), for example of his criticism of Aristotle’s unmoved mover, suggest that he was engaged in controversy with other contemporaries as well. Whether his polemics against contemporary versions of Stoic doctrine were part of a personal exchange or rather a bookish exercise is unclear. If Alexander held the chair of Peripatetic philosophy at Athens it is quite possible that he was in direct contact with the incumbents of the other philosophical chairs there. He was, of course, not the first commentator on Aristotle. But posterior exegetes certainly treated as exemplary his method and his standards for explaining problems and obscurities in Aristotle’s texts. This is indicated both by explicit references in later commentators, and by the unacknowledged exploitation of his work in some extant later commentaries on the same texts, as well as in systematic writings – including some in the Platonic schools, as shows from the use of Alexandrian material by Platonists such as Plotinus and Syrianus (for examples see Chiaradonna 2012). As the translations of his work into Arabic and, to a lesser degree, into Latin show, he continued to be treated as a leading authority and his work influenced the Aristotelian tradition throughout late antiquity, the Middle Ages, and in the Renaissance (see Rossi/Di Giovanni/Robiglio 2021). In the modern age interest in Alexander, both as a commentator and as a philosopher, was greatly enhanced when, under the general editorship of Hermann Diels, the Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca (together with the many-volumed Suppelementum Aristotelicum) were published by the Prussian Academy of Science between 1882–1909. Scholars nowadays continue to make use of his commentaries, not only for historical reasons but also because his suggestions are often worth considering in their own right. Because in recent years much more attention has been paid to the philosophers in late antiquity, not only to the Neo-Platonists, Alexander’s work has come under detailed scrutiny in various respects by specialists, as witnessed by an increase in publications both on general and on special aspects of his exegetical and philosophical work. The accessibility of most of his writings in translations makes apparent to a more general readership that Alexander’s work is not only relevant for specialists in the history of philosophy, but opens up an interesting age of transition in the history of philosophical and scientific ideas.


A. Primary Sources

1. Commentaries

  • Diels, H. (ed.), 1882–1909, Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca, Berlin: Reimer.
    • Hayduck, M. (ed.), 1891, Vol. 1, On the Metaphysics.
    • Wallies, M. (ed.), 1883, Vol. 2.1, On Prior Analytics 1.
    • Wallies, M. (ed.), 1891, Vol. 2.2, On the Topics.
    • Wallies, M. (ed.), 1898, Vol. 2.3, On Sophistical Refutations.
    • Wendland, P. (ed.), 1899, Vol. 3.1, On De sensu.
    • Hayduck, M. (ed.), 1901, Vol. 3.2, On Meteorology.

2. Treatises considered genuine and fragments

  • Accattino, P., & Donini, P. (eds.), 1996, Alessandro Di Afrodisia: L’Anima: Traduzione, Introduzione e Commento. Roma/Bari: Laterza.
  • Bergeron, M., & Dufour, R. (eds.), 2008, Alexandre d’Aphrodise. De l’âme. Texte Grec Introduit, Traduit et Annoté. Paris: Vrin.
  • Bruns, Ivo (ed.), 1887, 1892 Scripta Minora, vols. 1 and 2, Berlin: Reimer.
  • Groisard, J. (ed.), 2013, Sur la mixtion et la croissance d’ Alexandre d’Aphrodise, Texte établi, trad. et commenté, Paris: Belles Lettres.
  • Rashed, M. (ed.), 2011, Alexandre d’Aphrodise, Commentaire perdue à la Physique d’Aristote (livres IV-VIII). Les scholies byzantines, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Rescigno, A. (ed), 2004/2008, Alessandro di Afrodisia: Commentario al De caelo di Aristotele, 1. Frammenti del primo libro, 2. Frammenti del secondo, terzo e quarto libro, Amsterdam: Hakkert.
  • Thillet, P. (ed.), 1984, Traité Du Destin, Texte établi et traduction, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.

3. Spuria

  • Kapetanaki, S. & R. W.Sharples, 2006, Pseudo Aristoteles (Pseudo Alexander), Supplementa Problematorum (edited with introduction and annotated translation), Berlin: De Gruyter.

B. Translations

1. Latin translations

  • Alexandre d’Aphrodiasias. Commentaire sur les météores d’Aristote. Traduction de Guillaume de Moerbeke, A.J. Smet (ed.), Paris: Nauwelaerts, 1968.
  • Alexandre d’Aphrodisias. De fato ad imperatores: Version latine de Guillaume de Moerbeke, P. Thillet (ed.), Paris: Vrin, 1963.
  • Alexander Aphrodisias: Enarratio de anima ex Aristotelis institutione, Hieronymus Donatus (trans.), reprint of first edition Brescia 1495 (with intr. by Eckard Kessler). Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca: Versiones latinae temporis resuctitatarum litterarum, (CAGL.) 13, Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog, 2008.
  • Alexander von Aphrodisias: In libros meteorologicorum, Alexander Piccolomineus (trans.), reprint of first edition Venice 1561, with introduction by Cristina Viano, Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog, 2010.

2. English translations of the commentaries (with notes):

Richard Sorabji (gen. ed.), London: Duckworth, Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Later: London: Bristol Classical Press. Presently: London: Bloomsbury Publishing.

  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Metaphysics 1, W.E. Dooley, 1989.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Metaphysics 2 & 3, W.E. Dooley & A. Madigan, 1992.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Metaphysics 4, A. Madigan, 1993.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Metaphysics 5, W. E. Dooley, 1993.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Meteorology 4, E. Lewis, 1996.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics 1.1–7, J. Barnes et al., 1991.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics I.8–13, I. Mueller with J. Gould, 1999.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics I,14–22. I. Mueller with J. Gould, 1999
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics 1.23–31, I. Mueller, 2006.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics 1.32–46, I. Mueller, 2006.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s On Sense Perception, A. Towey, 2000.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Topics 1, J. M. van Ophuisen, 2001.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Topics 2, L. Castelli, 2020.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Topics 3, L. Castelli, 2021.
  • Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Coming-to-Be and Perishing 2.2–5, E. Gannagé, 2005.

3. Other translations of the commentaries (with notes)

Lavaud, L. & Guyomarc’h, G., 2021, Alexandre d’Aphrodise. Commentaire à la Métaphysique d’Aristote. Livre petit alpha et beta, introduction, traduction et notes, Paris: Vrin.

4. Major Treatises

  • Todd, R. B., 1976, Alexander of Aphrodisias on Stoic Physics: a study of the De mixtione with preliminary essay (text, translation and commentary), Leiden: Brill.
  • Fotinis, A. P., 1980, The De anima of Alexander of Aphrodisias (translation and commentary), Washington, D.C.: University Press of America.
  • Sharples, R.W., 1983, Alexander of Aphrodisias On Fate (text, translation and commentary), London: Duckworth.
  • Sharples, R.W, 2004, Alexander of Aphrodisias: Supplement to On the Soul, London: Duckworth
  • Sharples, R.W., 2008, Alexander Aphrodisiensis De anima libri mantissa (a new edition of the Greek text with introduction and commentary), Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Caston, V., 2012, Alexander of Aphrodisias on the Soul: Part I (translation with introduction and commentary), London: Bristol Classical Press.

5. Minor works

  • Sharples, R.W., 1990, Ethical Problems (translation with notes), London: Duckworth and Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Sharples, R.W., 1992, Quaestiones 1.2–2.15 (translation with notes), London: Duckworth and Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Sharples, R.W., 1994, Quaestiones 2.16–3.15 (translation with notes), London: Duckworth and Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

6. Works extant in Arabic

  • D’Ancona C. & G. Serra, 2002 (eds.), ‘Alexander On the Principles of the Universe, On Providence, Against Galen on Motion, and On Specific Differences,’ in Aristotele et Alessandro di Afrodisia nella tradizione araba, Padova: Il Poligrafo.
  • Genequand, C., 2001, Alexander of Aphrodisias: On the Cosmos, Leiden: Brill.
  • Rescher, N. & M. Marmura, 1969, The Refutation by Alexander of Aphrodisias of Galen’s Treatise on the Theory of Motion (translation with introduction and notes), Islamabad: Islamic Research Institute.
  • Thillet, P., 2003, Alexandre d’Aphrodise: Traité de la providence (Peri pronoias, version Arabe de Abu Bissar Matthae ibn Yunus. Intr. ed. et trad.), Lagrasse: Verdier.

C. Secondary Literature: Overviews

  • D’Ancona C. & Serra, G. 2002, Aristotele et Alessandro di Afrodisia nella tradizione araba, Padova: Il Poligrafo.
  • Blumenthal, H. & H. Robinson (eds.), 1991, Aristotle and the Later Traditions, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blumenthal, H., 1996, Aristotle and Neoplatonism in Late Antiquity, London: Duckworth.
  • Gottschalk, H.B., 1987, ‘Aristotelian philosophy in the Roman world from the time of Cicero to the end of the second century A.D.,’ in W. Haase (ed.), Aufstieg und Niedergang der Römischen Welt, Berlin: De Gruyter, II.36.2, 1079–1174.
  • Lamprakis, A., 2022, “Did the Arabic Tradition Know a More Complete Version of Alexander’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Topics? The Evidence from Ps-Jābir’s Kitāb al-Nukhab / Kitāb al-Baḥth”, Methodos 22. doi:10.4000/methodos.8763
  • Lynch, J. P., 1972, Aristotle’s School. A Study of a Greek Educational Institution, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Mercken, P., 1973, The Greek Commentaries on the Nicomachean Ethics of Aristotle, Leiden: Brill.
  • Moraux, P., 1942, Alexandre d’Aphrodise: exégète de la noétique d’ Aristote, Liège: Faculté de Philosophie et Lettres de l’Université de Liège.
  • Moraux, P., 1973, Der Aristotelismus bei den Griechen, Volume 1 (Die Renaissance des Aristotelismus im 1. Jh. v. Chr.), Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Moraux, P., 1984, Der Aristotelismus bei den Griechen, Volume 2 (Der Aristotelismus im I. und II. Jahrhundert n. Chr.), Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Moraux, P., 2001, Der Aristotelismus bei den Griechen, Volume 3 (Alexander von Aphrodisias), J. Wiesner (ed.), Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Pfeiffer, R., 1968, A History of Classical Scholarship, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rashed, M., 2007, Essentialisme. Alexandre d’Aphrodise entre logique, physique et comologie, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Rashed, M. (ed.), 2008, Alexandre d’Aphrodise, Paris: Les Etudes Philologiques.
  • Rossi, R.B., Di Giovanni, M., and Robiglio, A.A (eds.), 2021, Alexander of Aphrodisias in the Middle Ages and the Renaissance (Studia Artistarum: 45), Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Schroeder, F. M.,2014,‘From Alexander to Plotinus‘, The Routledge Handbook in Philosophy, London: Routledge, 293–309
  • Sharples, R. W., 1987, ‘Alexander of Aphrodisias: Scholasticism and Innovation,’ in W. Haase (ed.), Aufstieg und Niedergang der Römischen Welt, Berlin: De Gruyter, 1987, pp. 1176–1243.
  • Sorabji, R. (ed.), 1990, Aristotle Transformed: the ancient commentators and their influence, London: Duckworth.
  • Sorabji, R., 2004, The Philosophy of the Commentators. A Source-Book, 4 volumes, London: Duckworth.
  • Sorabji, R. (ed.), 2016, Aristotle re-interpreted: New findings on seven hundred years of the ancient commentators, London: Bloomsbury Publishers.
  • Trego, K., 2015, La liberté en actes: éthique et métaphysique d’Alexandre d’Aphrodise à Jeans Duns Scotus, Paris: Vrin.
  • Tuominen, M., 2009, The ancient commentators on Platon and Aristotle, Berkeley: University of California Press.

D. Secondary Literature: Studies on Particular Topics

  • Accattino, P., 2005, Alessandro di Afrodisia: De anima II (Mantissa), Alessandria: Edizioni dell’Orso.
  • Adamson, P., 2018, ‘Dialectical Method in Alexander of Aphrodisias’ Treatises on Fate and Providence,’ Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 54: 279–308.
  • Adler, J., 2014, ‘Mortality of the soul from Alexander of Aphrodisias to Spinoza,’ Spinoza and medieval Jewish philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 13–35.
  • Angelelli, I. & Cerezo, M. (eds.), 1996, Studies on the History of Logic, Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 107–127.
  • Benevich, F., 2019, ‘The Priority of Natures against the Identity of Indiscernibles; Alexander of Aphrodisias, Yahya bin Adi, and Avicenna on Genus as Matter,’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, 57: 205–234.
  • Bobzien, S., 1998, Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2014, ‘Alexander of Aphrodisias on Aristotle’s Theory of the Stoic Indemonstrables,’ in M. Lee (ed.), Strategies of Argument. Essays in Ancient Ethics, Epistemology, and Logic, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 199–227.
  • Bodnar, I., 1997, ‘Alexander of Aphrodisias on Celestial Motions,’ Phronesis, 42: 190–205.
  • Bonelli, M., 2001, Alessandro di Afrodisia e la metafisica come scienza dimostrativa, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Caston, V., 1999, ‘Aristotle’s Two Intellects: A Modest Proposal,’ Phronesis, 44: 199–227.
  • Chaniotis, A., 2004, ‘Epigraphic evidence for the philosopher Alexander of Aphrodisias,’ Bulletin of the Institute of Classical Studies, 47: 79–81.
  • Cheng, W., 2014, ‘Alexander of Aphrodisias on Pleasure and Pain in Aristotle,’ in W. Harris (ed.), Pleasure and Pain in Classical Times, Leiden: Brill, 174–200.
  • Chiaradonna, R. 2012, ‘Interpretazione Filosofica e Ricezione Del Corpus. Il Caso Di Aristotele (100 a.C. – 250 d.C.),’ Quaestio, 11: 83–114.
  • Chiaradonna, R. & Rashed, M., 2010, ‘Before and after the Commentators: An Exercise in Periodization. A Discussion of Richard Sorabji, The Philosophy of the Commentators,200–600 AD,’ Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 38: 251–297.
  • Coroleu, A., 1996, ‘The Fortuna of Juan Ginés de Sepúlveda’s Translations of Aristotle and of Alexander of Aphrodisias,’ Journal of the Warburg and Courtauld Institutes, 59: 325–332.
  • de Haas, F.A.J., 2020, ‘Aristotle and Alexander of Aphrodisias on active intellectual cognition,’ in V. Decaix & A. M. Mora-Márquez (eds.), Studies in the History of Philosophy of Mind, Cham: Springer, 13–36.
  • –––, 2021, ‘Deduction and Common Notions in Alexander’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics A 1–2,’ History of Philosophy & Logical Analysis, 24(1): 71–102.
  • Di Giovanni, M. & Primavesi, O., 2014, ‘Who wrote Alexander’s Commentary on Metaphysics Lambda?,’ in C. Horn (ed.), Aristotle’s Metaphysics Lambda – New Essays, Berlin: De Gruyter, 11–66.
  • Ellis, J., 1994, ‘Alexander’s Defense of Aristotle’s Categories,’ Phronesis, 39: 69–89.
  • Ebbesen, S., 1981, Commentators and Commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi, Leiden: Brill.
  • Fine, G., 1993, On Ideas: Aristotle’s Criticism of Plato’s Theory of Forms, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Flannery, K., 1995, Ways into the Logic of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Leiden: Brill.
  • Gaskin, R., 1993, ‘Alexander’s Sea Battle: a discussion of Alexander of Aphrodisias De fato 10,’ Phronesis, 38: 75–94.
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