Alexander Crummell

First published Mon Jun 6, 2011

Alexander Crummell (1819–1898) was the most prominent rationalist of the black American enlightenment thinkers in the nineteenth-century. He stands out among his contemporaries—Frederick Douglass, Anna Julia Cooper, Booker T. Washington, most notably—for his robust defense of the central place of reason in moral agency. His attempts to work out the consequences of that view for the nature of language and history lends his philosophy a breadth and depth not matched by other enlightenment thinkers. The prominence of his protégé, W. E. B. Du Bois, helped ensure Crummell's continuing influence during the rise of pragmatism, but he eventually fell out of favor as such relativistic thinkers as Alain LeRoy Locke and Zora Neale Hurston emerged.

1. Biographical Sketch

Alexander Crummell was born free in New York City on March 3, 1819. His mother, Charity Hicks of Long Island, New York, was also born free, while his father, Boston Crummell of the Temne people of West Africa, though originally sold into slavery, eventually became free in adulthood.

Coinciding with his marriage in 1841 to Sarah Mabitt Elston, Crummell's career as a public thinker began in earnest. His prominence as a young intellectual earned him a spot as keynote speaker at the anti-slavery New York State Convention of Negroes when it met in Albany in 1840. Despite race-based resistance, he successfully trained for the priesthood, becoming an Episcopal priest later that same decade. He studied moral philosophy at Cambridge University under William Whewell, whose view of moral reasoning as an intuition of necessary moral truths clearly influenced Crummell's own thought. After taking his bachelor's degree at Queen's College at Cambridge he resumed his avid participation in the anti-slavery movement. He subsequently went to Liberia taking a position as a professor of English and moral philosophy at Liberia College. His time there was difficult, owing to personal challenges and political opposition, leading him to return to the States after the Civil War. His first book was published in New York, entitled The Future of Africa (1862); in it he solidified much of his early thinking on morality and language. Two subsequent books, The Greatness of Christ (1882) and Africa and America (1891), reflected his more mature thought on agency and moral change.

His first marriage ended when Elston died in 1878, after which he married Jennie Simpson in 1880. Late in his life he held a lectureship at Howard University, though his most enduring contribution to black American letters was his co-founding of the American Negro Academy in Washington, DC, in 1897. He helped assemble a number of leading black intellectuals—including Du Bois and, much later, Locke—to publish research on problems facing blacks. During its three decades of existence twenty-two papers appeared. Its disbanding in the 1920s coincided with the Negro Renaissance in Harlem, the rise of Marcus Garvey, and the turn to pragmatism and relativism in American thought.

Crummell died in Red Bank, New Jersey, on September 10, 1898.

2. The Problem of Civil Rights

It is obvious that black thinkers during the slavery era would take rights seriously. American slavery created a class of forced laborers who possessed few legal rights. And while exceptions existed, the general path to slavery was through the trans-Atlantic slave trade, virtually ensuring that slaves were blacks. But rights in any of their senses—legal, political, or even moral—are far subtler than a casual observer might grasp. Let us call this the Problem of Civil Rights.

The Problem of Civil Rights concerns the question whether blacks (ought to) enjoy legally established guarantees, together with corresponding obligations on the State. In the American federal legal system, this bifurcates—importantly, it turns out—into legal guarantees by and obligations on the federal government, and those by and on the several states.

The Civil Rights Problem arises directly for blacks who are slaves. Given that they are explicitly referred to in the U.S. Constitution in terms of their status as forced laborers rather than in terms of membership as citizens in civil society (see Article IV, for instance), the courts have tended to interpret their legal rights in extremely narrow terms. It will not be sufficient to merely argue, as some might be tempted, that the curtailment of legal rights for blacks is arbitrary and hence unfair. The Constitutional language (and corresponding intent) is important and not easily dismissed. Moreover, common law approaches to labor and slave property in international contexts is complex and sometimes conflicting, so clarity will be difficult to achieve.

One hope may be to exploit the dualistic character of American citizenship: inhabitants of individual states are regarded as legal citizens of that state by the rules and customs of that state, and (separately) are regarded as citizens of the Union. If a free state wanted to confer citizenship and the legal rights that accrue to that status on blacks, it may do so without the interference of federal statute. (Of course, the same goes for slave states.) As a theoretical matter Crummell could take the approach that some freedom, if achievable, could provide a prima facie justification for broad expansion later, leaving to the political strategists the actual implementation of that expansion.

However, a dizzying series of Supreme Court opinions—the Antelope (1825), the Amistad (1841), Groves v. Slaughter (1841), Prigg v. Pennsylvania (1842), and Strader v. Graham (1850)—culminating in the Dred Scott opinion (1856) helped undermine that theoretical approach. These cases each helped clarify the legal scope of black civil rights, in a way generally unfavorable to blacks. The rebellion on the Amistad would have led to restoring kidnapped black Africans to their purported Spanish owners if narrow questions of international treaty obligations had been read differently. The slave status of blacks was not affected by their transient residence in a free state, as was held in Strader. Fugitive slaves were presumed to be subject to return, as the Court held in Prigg, despite the somewhat weaker obligation of states to carry out the requisite extraditions. The difficulty presented by this series of opinions is well captured by the Court's interpretation of fugitive slave laws, and shows the headwind against Crummell.

It is historically well known that the object in the clause in the Constitution of the United States relating to persons owing service and labor in one state escaping into other states was to secure to the citizens of the slaveholding States the complete right and title of ownership in their slaves as property in every State in the Union into which they might escape from the State where they were held in servitude. The full recognition of this right and title was indispensable to the security of this species of property in all the slaveholding States, and indeed was so vital to the preservation of their domestic interests and institutions that it cannot be doubted that it constituted a fundamental article without the adoption of which the Union could not have been formed. Its true design was to guard against the doctrines and principles prevailing in the non-slaveholding States by preventing them from intermeddling with or obstructing or abolishing the rights of the owners of slaves. (Prigg v. Pennsylvania, 41 U.S. (16 Pet.) 539 (1842), at 540)

It is clear that, on this legal interpretation of the Constitution, the civil rights of blacks are fundamentally incompatible with the property rights of citizens, as long as slavery is legal anywhere. Written by Chief Justice Taney on the eve of the Civil War, the opinion in Scott v. Sandford (1856)—the Dred Scott case—provides a most dramatic version of the narrow constitutional reading of black legal rights. The Negro has no rights a white man is bound to respect, Taney famously concluded, and thus Dred and Harriet Scott, two slaves suing for their freedom, were ruled ineligible to bring that suit before the Court. Moreover, the problem was not confined to enslaved blacks. Not only did Taney conclude that blacks were not citizens, he held that they would not be citizens even if freed. And no individual state could by extending legal rights to blacks make them citizens of the Union proper. These holdings helped shut down several promising argument strategies available to Crummell.

Crummell's early thought in the 1840s began to respond to these gathering philosophical pressures on the notion of black civil rights. He reasoned that if arguments in favor of rights were partial to blacks or otherwise based on the local conditions of black Americans, then those civil rights would be subject to future retraction on similarly partial or consequentialist grounds. And in any case, public sympathy can be volatile and unreliable, setting up backlashes. Such shaky ground for legal rights for blacks would be disastrous. In particular, though black service to the country created “favorable considerations” for the wider acceptance of their demands for justice, it remained an insufficient and “untenable” justification (Crummell, “New York Convention Address,” 202). “We object to others placing our rights upon complexion,” he explained, so “[w]e ourselves [should] not lay our claims to consideration on this or any similar ground.” Only a general, rational solution can provide a “just and impartial guarantee” of such civil rights as those protecting voting (201). Notice that Crummell is not making the merely political point that rights ought not be based on the partiality that the public (and its duly elected representatives in legislatures) might extend to blacks. He's making the stronger logical case that it's the nature of rights to be non-partial.

This is the driving force of his positive solution to the Problem of Civil Rights—call it the Natural Rights Argument—which begins by asserting that rights exist, and not merely in the conventional or partial sense of public sympathy. They have a “higher origin” and a “purer birth,” as much in the sense of logical priority as in the sense of metaphysical independence. That is, Crummell takes the Problem of Civil Rights to require for its solution an appeal to rights as existing prior to and independent of the legal environment in which such rights are contested and adjudicated.

To take the Amistad as an example, we might give a conventional, partial view of rights as taking them to be supported by the sympathies of reasonable and empathetic onlookers. On that reading, Cinque and the other Africans who rose up and killed many of their captors had a right of self-defense, as well as a right to have their case heard in court, given the appalling circumstance of their kidnapping. Surely, any American would protest in just the same way if captured, and no one would think it too extreme to use whatever force was required to resist kidnapping. But a reading based on a natural view of rights, the sort Crummell is urging, would make much of the fact that the right to self-defense, especially by non-Americans in American waters, is one that attaches to persons, and not merely citizens, and so is a right that pre-exists rights granted by law. Indeed, it is the obligation of law to properly capture any such pre-existing rights from what a number of philosophers regard as our “natural state.” The decision might have turned out the same, but the reasoning would be different.

The second step in Crummell's Natural Rights Argument holds that rights may be inferred from the “settled and primary sentiments” of human nature as well as from the “original grounds of high dignities” and “exalted tendencies” of our common humanity (“New York Convention Address,” 201). This is an important part of his reasoning, in that rights are not merely abstract principles applied to human affairs, but are derivable from our passionate and emotional natures. In the previous century Hume made much of the textured moral personality in his discussion of the nature of action in society. Though he would certainly not endorse Crummell's advocacy of natural rights in this discussion, he would surely admire his appeal to the sentiments of human nature as a ground for legal and political action. Hume was a great champion of emotion and passion—“sentiments,” in that era's idiom—as part of the rationalizing of what we do. It is not that we can subordinate our actions to reason; it is that our reason can grasp what we do from our emotional nature and come to understand and make sense of it. Crummell sees this as an important part of his account.

In that way the Amistad supports a fuller interpretation than might otherwise be available. Recall that on the conventional, partial reading, the justification for African self-defense is from public sympathy for their actions. Crummell's natural rights reading not only corrects that idea so that the law ought to bend to pre-existing self-defense rights, but that those rights are inferable from our sentimental nature provides a corollary explanation of precisely why public sympathy arises at all. There is little that nineteenth-century Americans would understand about newly arrived Africans on a slave ship; they do not share language, religion, or much of anything else. But the deeply human response to an absurd, dangerous—and so clearly wrong—circumstance arouses in each of us the passion that was stirred in Cinque. Our sympathy arises, not as a condition of right, but as a consequence of it.

The third step in the Natural Rights Argument holds that any being endowed with the “light of reason” that exercises the various “exalted attributes” of reason possesses certain peculiar rights on the “ground of their nature.” This explicit confidence in the powers of reason that drives the argument is important to Crummell, and is the main reason he and Hume do not travel far together in this discussion. But Crummell needs this sort of rationalistic account, given that reason is our faculty for discovering such logical connections as that between circumstantial fact and abstract right, making it essential to the inferences that justify that right in human affairs. It is one thing to observe that such-and-such is the case, as one might in reviewing the facts of the Amistad case. But it is quite another to articulate a pre-existing right, abstract at least in the sense that it requires calling up, even if (as Crummell claims) it has a basis in our sentimental nature. Presumably one needs the ability to reflect on general principles of action, surely a subtle rational power, as well as the reasoning required to apply such reflection to the facts observed. Such coordinated thinking and observing could then be brought to cases such as the Amistad, where one could argue that the general principle that holds that self-defense is permissible applies to these very facts.

Crummell's concept of reason is thus both natural (in that it's derived from our natural state, pre-existing the law) and categorical (in that it is to be applied to those facts and circumstances that come under it, independent of political contingencies), and so ought not be jeopardized by the kind of contingent appeals made by adherents of conventional and partial views.

His first line of defense of the Natural Rights Argument is positive, while his second is negative. The argument only succeeds if blacks in fact count as an instance of its third step, the generalization about beings who are endowed with the light of reason. His positive defense begins by asserting that blacks “are men,” an obvious claim that is certainly necessary yet insufficient to ground the argument. One can easily see this by noticing that a racist might presume that some men are unequal for being less rational, due to their race; hence more reasons are needed. Crummell thus offers what may be called a Common Sympathies Premise, asserting that black political sympathies “have the same being and nature” as those in any other group (“New York Convention Address,” 202). His thinking is that blacks have the same kinds of beliefs about political circumstances and desires about political interests and outcomes as any group would. The inference is clear, and blacks are not only men (and women), but are men (and women) endowed with reason. Hence, blacks do indeed count as an instance of step one.

The argument is negatively supported by black disfranchisement, that political circumstance in which blacks were denied the right to vote. Disfranchisement shows that both the rights-are-inferable and the rights-are-real-and-impartial premises to be violated in the case of black Americans. The First Disfranchisement Premise states that the disfranchised condition of blacks creates the “yearnings and longings for the exercise of political prerogatives, that are the product of the adaptedness of man's social nature to political arrangements, striv[ing] with irrepressible potency within us” (“New York Convention Address,” 202). Black reactions to political power “not proceeding from, yet operating upon” them play out as they would for any population in a subordinated state, implying their common humanity. The idea behind this claim is that the negative reaction blacks have to the curtailment of their legal rights is similar to how any group in that circumstance would feel and react; hence we have another (admittedly negative) reason to take them as rational beings.

The Second Disfranchisement Premise argues from disfranchisement to the “indignities and wrongs” resulting therefrom; the “accumulated potency” of these wrongs generates “an increase and intenseness of proscription,” illustrating how human nature's “legitimate exercises” are “hindered” (“New York Convention Address,” 203). In making this point Crummell shows, again, that blacks are reacting to their difficult legal and political circumstance. But this time theirs is a kind of moral discomfort, an intense sense that a wrong is being perpetrated against them. If he is right, he has once again supported the Natural Rights Argument's third premise by showing that blacks are reasonable and hence full members of civil society.

On a first read the Disfranchisement Premises appear to presuppose the conclusion they aim to show. They appeal to the effects of wrongs to make the case that blacks are fully human, and hence ought to have their civil rights protected. But whether the treatment of blacks counts as a wrong is the very question at issue. Of course, in contemporary legal contexts the issue doesn't even get started, since the fourteenth and fifteenth amendments (ratified after the Civil War) prohibit the denial of civil rights to blacks. During the slavery era, though, that point faced a stiff legal headwind, especially in slavery-related cases argued before the Supreme Court, and so positive arguments needed to be produced.

One less-than-satisfying way to avoid this fallacy is to read the two Premises conditionally: if blacks enjoy full moral status, then disfranchisement counts as a wrong, particularly given the psychological evidence of the First Disfranchisement Premise. This kind of reading simply takes the wrongness of disfranchisement as a consequence of the condition that blacks are rational beings in the sense required for membership in society. That gives the argument a bit more nuance, since technically Crummell is not asserting that blacks have that status; he would simply be supposing, as if for the sake of argument, that they do, but then showing that, if they do, then the psychological state of blacks counts as a harm. The problem with this reading is that it offers no more than what any conditional logical proof can offer—support for the conditional in question—when what one really seeks is support for the antecedent as well. It may be that the connection between condition and consequence is made, but what we really want is some reason to think that the condition has indeed been satisfied in the case of blacks. It is easy to construct, for instance, a paternalistic counter-argument on which black discomfort with their disfranchisement results from exposure to abolitionist opinions. On that reasoning, the obvious solution is to limit the exposure rather than grant blacks the right to vote—an obviously dissatisfying conclusion, to say the least.

A better gloss is to take the Second Disfranchisement Premise as an analysis of the First: it is not merely that blacks are psychologically harmed by their disfranchised status, but that they understand their psychological response to political marginality as a moral wrong. Hence they respond not merely to the fact of their political weakness, but also to the denial it represents of their moral character and efficacy qua moral. This route is more robust, since it recognizes in blacks a complex moral interpretation of the harm they are suffering, which presupposes the condition the earlier rendering could only stipulate. That presupposition is virtuous, though, since the psychological facts in question are verifiable, and if they hold, they directly establish the moral status in question. Moreover, paternalism is forestalled, since a moral judgment by blacks of their own condition counts as prima facie evidence that they are moral agents capable of such judgments.

Crummell's conclusion follows directly, and black Americans are justified in claiming “equal and entire rights” with other citizens “on the ground of our common humanity” (“New York Convention Address,” 203).

The Natural Rights Argument is bold and brisk in the way a young thinker's first serious foray into moral argument is apt to be. While somewhat programmatic, it nevertheless provides the logical framework he needs to address moral questions about blacks. Surely they are owed a remedy for civil-rights violations if they are the proper bearers of such rights, for instance. And they would presumably forfeit any such remedy if they expatriated to Africa, Canada, or Europe, places many activists were urging them to resettle to. Hence the value of his reasoning for practical responses to problems in black life. However, the argument runs up several philosophical debts. First, is the moral reasoning by which rights are justified some special precinct of a more general kind of reasoning? What does this show about the metaphysical basis of normative concepts? Second, the Crummellian moral philosopher owes the reader an account of human nature, since rights are inferred from it. Moreover, both the Common Sympathies Premise and the Disfranchisement Premises turn on some broader psychology of agency. What does that look like? And third, how can the timeless character of moral concepts like rights be reconciled with the evolving character of the human condition—the progress from slavery to freedom, for instance? Much of Crummell's more mature moral philosophy attempts to pay these debts; they are discussed in turn below.

3. The Problem of Moral Reason

The central issue running through all of these concerns of Crummell's derives from the nature of moral reason itself. He describes the structure of the human psyche as consisting of instinct, passion, and reason, with reason taking priority over the other two. Reason is a “universal and native sentiment,” a “deep-felt knowledge,” and “reflexive recognition of truth,” all of which are “spontaneous” abilities, contrasted with the externally conditioned instinct and passion (“Eulogy for Thomas Sidney” (July 1840) [AC], 3). Spontaneous reason is opposed to reason that comes from efforts to exert “intellectual and moral powers.” Hence the need for educational and religious training, he thought, the aim of which was to allow the individual agent “to perceive intuitively ‘those awful truths, those eternal principles.’ ” His view of moral reason takes as morally exemplary the well-honed natural intuition of timeless moral principles.

Plato is an easy antecedent to identify in his thinking, as Crummell biographers Gregory Rigsby and Wilson Jeremiah Moses both attest. But Crummell's emphasis on spontaneous, unconflicted reason also evokes Aristotelian themes. That makes it a challenge to situate him in the history of philosophy.

Plato held a view about moral thinking that depended on seeing the objects of moral thought as abstract, pre-existing entities. One can already see in Crummell's Natural Rights Argument (discussed above) a strong Platonic streak. It clearly continues here in his idea that moral agents intuit timeless principles. Plato pursued this idea far enough to conclude that such principles, as unchanging, were precisely the sorts of entities that could underwrite moral conversation and reflection. In fact, without them moral action and thinking would be unstable and constantly shifting—as he would put it, becoming what it might finally be, but not actually being that thing. Fortunately on the Platonic approach, timeless abstract moral principles always are, and so never need to be further stabilized or justified.

But Crummell's approach evokes Aristotle as well. The Aristotelian elements are especially distinctive, given that Aristotle's thinking about morality was so strongly driven by his attempts to repair (what he regarded as) flaws in Plato's thinking. Aristotle thought that morality could not be theorized about since it is, by its nature, practical. That is, we work out what we need to do in our moral lives, and even though we think about what that involves, our goal is not merely to gain understanding of some abstract moral principle, but to do some action.

Aristotle thus took the habits of moral character very seriously—much more so than the theoretical deliberations of the Platonist—an emphasis Crummell seems to share in his admiration of his friend Sidney. He admires him for his naturalness at moral life, requiring no effort to intuit the morally relevant features of a situation. After all, if effort is required, then one does not yet have the habits of virtue, thus coming up short on the Aristotelian metric. If Sidney is thus admirable for lacking any weakness of will, it is easy to suppose that effort-driven reason is a mark of such weakness, and hence something to be avoided (or at best tolerated) until moral excellence is achieved. Crummell's view thus seems less a Platonic ideal of moral excellence than an Aristotelian tolerance of moral failure. This is apt given the compromised agency that any observer would discern in the moral condition of enslaved blacks. What Crummell admired in Sidney is his working out of the two, a kind of excellence in the face of compromised agency.

Crummell's notion depends on the existence of a set of fundamental principles. Deeply unsettled moral situations, in which competing considerations press on the choices actual individuals make, demand that the principled individual discern the moral signal in all the noise. His central idea is that reason cuts through to the principles themselves, even if moral and mental effort is required to get clarity about those principles. He takes providence to make that clarity and progress possible. Hence his view is less dependent on the unsettled nature of situations in producing the moral dialectic, and instead derives from the tracking of a fundamental principle.

Crummell is acutely aware that the linguistic resources of a moral agent help determine how fully they can reason morally and thus be capable of the agency that draws on the principles he describes. Though he is grossly unfair to the West African language Grebo, his argument that it is logically inadequate to serve the rational needs of blacks in Liberia who speak it offers an instructive account of the interplay between language and thought. There is little he likes about Grebo: it is “harsh, abrupt, energetic, and indistinct in enunciation,” he says, “meagre in point of words” and “abound[ing] with inarticulate nasal and guttural sounds” (“The English Language in Liberia” [FA], 19). It “possess[es] few inflections and grammatical forms” and hence is “exceedingly difficult of acquisition.” He feels he cannot urge Liberians to continue to speak Grebo instead of English, given his conclusions that it is plagued by “lowness of ideas, with brutal and vindictive sentiments” and with “principles” that show a predominance of “animal propensities.” This is a disaster, he writes, since (on this description) it can support few moral concepts or distinctions, let alone concepts germane to justice and politics, or even “truths of a personal, present deity” and “God's moral government.” His theoretical worries concern what the “principles” of a natural-language variety are that account for its various logical capacities, such as expressibility and generativity.

Crummell does not think he is being prejudicial here, despite the extreme linguistic bias any modern-day reader would take him to be displaying. He relies on John L. Wilson's description of Grebo—something of a standard ethnography of his day—and so to a great extent is engaging in a positivistic rather than impressionistic account of Grebo. Of course, any present-day language study would rely on descriptions systematically developed from the judgments of native speakers rather than non-native observations. And his positivism has its theoretical basis in arguments familiar from John Locke's philosophy of language. Words are the names of thoughts, and so articulations in language are in effect mnemonic devices for thinking. His regard for reason would certainly lead him to emphasize a priori concepts, but the theoretical assumptions are largely due to Locke.

Locke's philosophy of language—which he shared in its broad outlines with predecessors Hobbes and Descartes—holds that thoughts in the mind, whether they are innate (he thought they mostly were not) or caused by the sensations we have, are the primary support for the words in our language. When we utter a word, we do so because that word means the idea we have in mind when we utter it. The Grebo analysis that Crummell offers takes Lockean philosophy seriously, in that if Grebo has “defects,” it is because it is not able to preserve the word-idea relationship in moral contexts. Though this prejudice about Grebo is unfounded, the theory driving the prejudice enjoyed wide acceptance.

It is tempting to see Crummell's philosophy of language in terms of Humboldt's work in the decades prior on comparative grammars rather than Locke's empiricist semantics. Humboldt compared linguistic varieties in order to discover patterns across those variations, the idea being that linguistic universals occur throughout human experience, if only we can capture the common patterns. Crummell can thus be read as Humboldtian, albeit an illiberal and intolerant one. That may turn out to be a productive reading, but little historical evidence has yet been uncovered to show that Crummell knew of Humboldt.

In any case, his theoretical commitments led him to be suspicious of Grebo's ability to support moral discourse, since he thinks it is unreliable. The situation is especially urgent for the kinds of pre-existing principles that form the (abstract, unchanging) objects of moral conversation. For those are a priori by nature—they exist independently of the experiences about which we might converse. As such, there is that much greater a burden on moral language for a Lockean like Crummell, since a speaker could not rely on their sensations to support the language they are using. They need to have strong powers of memory as part of their faculty of reason, recalling the timeless a priori principles to be applied to these current facts. (Plato makes a similar point in The Republic, observing the importance of memory in moral reasoning and philosophy, especially in the training of the guardian class.) This helps inform his view that blacks ought to adopt English as a remedy for the linguistic “defects” he thinks plagues Grebo. The ability of English to preserve the complex logical structure of abstract moral reasoning (given its syntactic and semantic structure) recommends it, as well as its infinite productivity.

A broader question arises here. By concentrating on purported deficits of rationality of Africans in particular, and blacks in general, as opposed to examining its causes (say, slavery and race discrimination), isn't the analysis misplaced? After all, if the causes of diminished cognitive resources are political and historical, then any proposed remedy would presumably have to offset (if not remove) those causes. One could go even further (as Crummell easily could) and argue that if cognitive resources are diminished due to morally pernicious causes, then moral progress will be stymied unless and until a just accounting of those causes has been made, and remedies are carried out.

One could read Crummell's various arguments about posterity and moral change (below), as well as his case for black civil rights (above), as a vindication of this idea. He may be interpreted as making a moral case for black progress and civilization precisely as a moral offset to the moral harm that has plagued blacks. But the sticking point in that interpretation would be his understanding of language and cognition. If his goal is to provide a moral counterweight to discrimination and its effects, it seems he hasn't pursued it through all of its effects—specifically those that concern cognition and linguistic ability. He is quite unsparing in his analysis of civil rights; why wouldn't he also articulate his case in terms of language and reasoning, if that was his real purpose? And the complaint implicit in the question stands as a criticism.

It may be that Crummell thought moral criticism of this sort was appropriate, but doubted that cognitive deficit could be due to such an oppressive history. Rarely did he ascribe any black shortcoming to lingering effects of slavery, other than in the very broadest of terms. It is likely, given how much is presently understood about environmental factors in linguistic development, and how little was known then, that it didn't seem plausible to him to think there was any causal connection between slavery and cognitive resources.

Whatever the right interpretation, his view of the nature of civilization will figure into his thinking. Crummell saw each generation as having an obligation to posterity, namely, to contribute to civilization, much the way a farmer has to work the soil to produce a harvest; failure to do so leads to the death of the land, so to speak, and the same is true for civilization. To contribute, though, requires resources (cognitive and linguistic ones included), cultivated in a public discourse that makes value and meaning, held among common people, from which intellectuals emerge and draw. (This anticipates Du Bois' “talented tenth” idea.) Crummell thought blacks, devastated by slavery, were severely incapacitated and hence couldn't produce in the general population the seeds for that intellectual emergence and civilization. One response could be to assign blame for this woeful state of affairs, as just discussed. Crummell would certainly not disagree that hindrances to blacks led to this cultural derailment and subsequent defect (as he saw it). But his concern was with the resources themselves: how could blacks regroup and make up lost ground? Hence his preoccupation with the cognitive resources rather than with accusation and protest. (The activist Douglass provides a ready contrast.)

While language-deficiency theories have since been discredited, Crummell's language analysis remains valuable for its attempt to describe the work that the deep features of the grammar of the colloquial English commanded by American blacks play in reasoning and discourse.

4. The Problem of Motivation

The principles of moral reasoning and discourse require effective causation in order to realize agency. In a series of closely related arguments—the Mental Principle Argument, the Moral Principle Argument, and the Memory versus Recall Argument—Crummell begins to describe this relationship. According to his Mental Principle Argument, the god worshipped by a people elevates or debases them since “the abstract principle that the idea of God contains, inherently, such transforming power in a nation, that it makes or unmakes, according as it is clear, and right, and grand; or, on the other hand, is low, and rude, and sensual” (“God and the Nation” [FA], 154). “National greatness” correlates with these ideas, a point he thinks is obvious. While thought may be the spur to enterprise and organized society, the “generative principle” of the “active power and activity” of mind is the idea of God (155). It is not that God simply determines which actions and events occur, but that the idea of God causes human thought to generate the varied activities of civil society, and so “magnifies a nation's mind” leading to “development in every mode and direction” (158). Being oriented to the future in turn leads individuals to make an enduring nation that can survive them. Crummell is convinced that blacks are well suited to legacy-building because of their “plastic” nature possessing that “native mobility and adaptedness” required to withstand “elements diverse from and stronger than their own”; blacks are patient enough “to wait for the future, in calm abidance and with confident assurance” (“Hope for Africa” [FA], 321). He rejects the counter-argument that individuals are mortal, and since nations are simply aggregates of individuals they are likewise mortal. Over and above such aggregates nations are societies “in an organized state, under the influence and control of broad principles and superior ideas” (“God and the Nation,” 161). Reason's activity is civilizing, leading directly to a further progressive development of that reason.

According to Crummell's Moral Principle Argument, just as the migration of populations is a fact of human life, occurring throughout human history, so too is the moral history of meaning and action that is built up around it. He takes this to be providential, not accidental. We may “discover evidences of a large and comprehensive plan, which excludes all ideas of the accidental or adventitious” (“Emigration, an Aid to the Civilization of Africa” [AA], 412). Human events in general accord with God's “grand moral economy” in which God is an “ever-active agent” (413). Crummell acknowledges that “our finite vision” often “fail[s] the discovery” of genuine moral ends. Consistent with his deontological understanding of moral obligation, as well as his realism about the moral, the effort to discover and examine moral ends by the reasoning agent is essentially an application of our mental faculties to scrutable moral problems, a mental task assigned by God. As the active, directing force and principle, the will of God “overrules all the deeds, the counsels, and the designs of men, and tracks them from their unseen germs, …to those manifest and notable deeds which rank among historic facts” (413).

Hence a link between the Moral Principle Argument and the Mental Principle Argument: an active principle of thought causes action, is the subject of history, and has God as its source. If those deeds are good, then they are God-caused (regardless of any purported causal contribution by the agent). God supplies the suggestion, adjustment, direction, and order of the deeds “so that while men act on their own personal responsibility, they nevertheless act either consciously or unconsciously as the agents of God” (414). Thus we cannot override God's will. And if those deeds are evil, then they are God-exploited, since God distracts that which is evil and directs us to providentially approved ends. To the counter-argument that God is not concerned with secular history, Crummell argues that that would imply that there exists some non-God that governs the secular, thus dividing “the moral government of God,” an absurdity. In any case, God's hand is evident throughout history. A moral vanguard is to respond in an active way to Mental and Moral Principles and affect the course of history, thereby increasing the civilization potential of those principles for future generations. “The hand of God is on the black man, in all the lands of his distant sojourn, for the good of Africa” (“Emigration,” 421); God thus intervenes in history and uses blacks as his agents, creating an additional impetus for blacks to affect history's course. Crummell is a moral vanguardist in this way, since an advance “remnant” of the people does the work of God.

His Memory versus Recall Argument reveals the limitations of such vanguards. He recounts in his 1891 book Africa and America a sharp public exchange he has with Douglass over the effect of actively recalling how slavery degraded black life. Douglass, ever the activist, thought such recall was inspirational, motivating moral progress, while the relentlessly analytical Crummell thought it dispiriting and morally regressive. He decried what he saw as the “irresistible tendency in the Negro mind in this land to dwell morbidly and absorbingly upon the servile past” to the detriment of the needs of the future. Active recall of slavery, he argued, jeopardized black moral progress (“The Need of New Ideas and New Aims for a New Era” [AA], 18–19). Of course it “is not the memory of slavery” to be guarded against “but the constant recollection of it, as the commanding thought of a new people, who should be marching on to the broadest freedom of thought in a new and glorious present, and a still more magnificent future.” Memory is passive, as “the necessary and unavoidable entrance, storage and recurrence of facts and ideas to the understanding and the consciousness.” But recollection is a mental action, “the actual seeking of the facts, …the painstaking endeavor of the mind to bring them back again to consciousness.” By the “law of association,” then, it tends to “degradation.”

Language plays a central role in this process, echoing the point he makes about the English language in Africa. “Words are vital things,” explained Crummell, since they are “always generative of life or death” and cannot “enter the soul as passive and inoperative things” (19). Moreover, to be limited in word and thought is to undermine moral reasoning, which is the condition of the “savage.” On the other hand, the “changed circumstances” of blacks generate “an immense budget of new thoughts, new ideas, new projects, new purposes, new ambitions, of which our fathers never thought” (19–20).

5. The Problem of Moral Change

5.1 The Argument from Posterity

Like other enlightenment thinkers, Crummell takes posterity very seriously, urging his contemporaries to moral action that will create a legacy that later generations will both enjoy and emulate. His reasoning is relatively straightforward, pivoting on the idea that the main conceptual artifact of a people is their national culture.

National culture captures a complex idea for Crummell. On the one hand, he argues that each generation has a duty to the future—specifically, a duty to make the future better than the past—an obligation he often described in terms of “civilization.” Civilization thus accumulates all of the greatest symbolic achievements of the past: literature, philosophy, the arts, and so on. But that does not happen without cultivating the population whose symbolic achievements are thus collected. What we would today call culture, with little or none of his idea of progress and improvement, Crummell and his contemporaries thought of as that which is so cultivated, and hence is prepared to add to civilization. But while civilization is for everyone—it is universal, Crummell would say—culture is particular to this or that group, this or that nation. National culture is thus that set of symbolic achievements made by a particular (national) group for the good of universal (world) civilization. The Negro, in the idiom of Crummell's day, has no less obligation than any other “nation” to make a cultural contribution to civilization.

He understands moral change, in part, as a condition for such a culture to be possible, so it is not surprising that he recognizes a collective duty to satisfy that condition. His is a particularly aggressive account, in that the duties to posterity are categorical and universal, setting the price blacks have to pay to affect the course of history.

History, to Crummell's mind, is the series of events that concerns the progress of civilization. As various groups produce their symbolic institutions, and as those national cultures improve humanity's state of civilization, forward progress is being achieved, and the back-and-forth of ordinary life is getting closer to achieving the fundamental pre-existing nature of things as they really are. Crummell clearly subscribes (as did Plato) to a strong version of this view of history. On Plato's version, the ordinary events we now simply call “history”—wars, recessions, presidential elections, etc.—are part of the changing world of approximations and inexactness. As such, they are in flux, becoming one thing after another, but never actually being anything permanent. But the pre-existing principles that underwrite moral reasoning are timeless and unchanging—and hence permanent. History cannot be about what is transient, despite the passage of time it implies; rather, it is about what endures through the passage of time.

This is actually not as foreign to contemporary notions as it may seem. True, we keep a historical record, which is meant to keep track of the affairs of human societies, without prejudice or interpretation. But the record we keep is updated as we begin to grasp the impact the recorded events have on the future and what we take to be our collective destiny. Consider the 9/11 terrorist attacks on the U.S. The initial event was confusing because, though devastating, it was not clear whether its impact was on foreign policy and affairs of state (that is, whether it was an act of war) or on domestic policy and criminal justice (that is, whether it was a criminal act), a question that still seems unsettled. Of course, there is no controversy about the fact that some event occurred. It is that we do not (yet) have a settled description of those facts; hence the history of that event is not yet written. Indeed, history in our day is very much an assessment of the record in light of our future, an uncertain and ongoing conversation by a nation about itself.

Crummell is more modern than Plato, in the sense that he orients the question of history from the perspective of the nation and its culture that is trying to understand its place with respect to civilization. For Plato, the orientation is that of the universal truths—we might say it is cosmic—and so our response to them is more derivative and secondary. Plato might say that the Negro is trying to engage the timeless truths of civilization in order to realize what the true nature of reality is like. Crummell would emphasize instead that it is the Negro who helps make that reality present itself to us as it does—its timeless nature is timeless, to be sure, but it is a central character in the drama of history in our moment and as we see it. It is in our time that it will act, just as it is in our time that we will bring about the progress to be achieved.

The Argument from Posterity begins with Crummell's observation that individuals have some “relation” to the “entire race”; “a nation is a collection of men…of the same make, and nature, and appetencies, and destiny, as ourselves” comprising but a “section of the great commonwealth of humanity, a phase of the common type of being, and no more” (“The Duty of a Rising Christian State” [FA], 59–60). The moral moment in our common destiny is to “go forward and upward” (63). The movement of national culture through time is thus singular (neither multiple nor diverse, even if diversely contributed to), progressive (movement leads to improvement), and ultimately unifying. It is as if “all the preceding generations of mankind, and all the various nations, have lived for every successive generation,” suggesting that there is “no absolute disseverance of individual nations” (63–64).

Kant's insistence that human history is the working out of “nature's plan” to realize the full natural capacities of humans in society anticipates Crummell's social progressivism (“Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose,” proposition 8). For Kant the ultimate goal was the perfect form of civil society; so too for Crummell, though his vision reserves a central driving role to the character of agents, moreso than to the justice of actions. This shouldn't be overstated of course. Kant clearly regarded enlightenment as a triumph of “culture” over “barbarism” as he took it to be the generalizing of principles of justice. But Crummell's understanding of the duty to posterity seems much more entangled with the fidelity of the Negro to Moral Principles than the justice of those Principles.

If Crummell is more modern than Plato, Kant's view of historical progress is more modern than Crummell's. Though both Kant and Crummell see and evaluate the sweep of historical events from the standpoint of a particular group or individual, Kant thought that the kind of significant history Crummell worried about blacks contributing to was not even possible without robust self-awareness. It is only when someone can reason about their actions by observing them logically—that is, as a rational law-giver might—that self-awareness has been minimally achieved. So for Kant the ultimate obligation of a modern society is to preserve such moral autonomy; indeed, it is an important condition for enlightenment.

Crummell's philosophy is less modern than Kant's given Crummell's insistence on the importance of one's racial nature in helping create the conditions for morality and history (cf. Kirkland 1992–1993). The duty Crummell has in mind is to the Mental and Moral Principles that comprise progressive reason. It has little to do with whatever group one belongs to, though one's contribution is at least partly determined by the national character of their people or race. In any case the progress of reason is the moral determiner; “our life, our culture, and our civilization are but the result of the ceaseless energy of mind and body of all past nations” (“Rising Christian State,” 64). This all furthers the effort to “cultivate men,” nurturing “that largeness of soul—that quick, glad recognition of noble principles—that love of and reverence for fixed and eternal truth—that eager desire for the work of life” (74). This is a prerequisite for a national culture, since nations need “citizens with large, expanded minds, a fine culture, with natural or acquired manners, and a constant delicate honor” (74). There is a collective duty to enhance the civilizing potential of civilizing rational principles because of its potential to further civilize in the future, something that is intrinsically valuable. The associated duty to the land of one's fathers is implied by a duty of self-respect, given the common “negro blood flowing in his veins” (“The Relations and Duty of Free Colored Men” [FA], 219). This duty is all the more urgent because of Africa's “benightedness,” and it is all the more binding because of the Kantian focus on nature's plan, understood in social context. Crummell appeals here to the self-regard of black Americans—“in its normal state and in its due degree… ‘is as just and morally good as any affection whatever’ ” (221, Crummell quoting Butler)—to motivate their sense of duty to black Africans.

It is hard to read Crummell and not recall the problem of evil that haunts providential philosophies of history. If history unfolds as God sees fit, then why do such devastating historical wrongs as American slavery occur? It seems that either God is unable to prevent such wrongs (but isn't God all-powerful?), God is unaware that they are occurring (but isn't God all-knowing?), or that God is unwilling to stop such wrongs (but isn't God all-good?). None of those options is available to the providential philosopher of history, since if God lacked any one of those traits then he cannot be the God that drives history. Instead, he would be as we are, characters trying to impact the course of history.

Crummell has a few responses to this problem. One is the classic reply of theists, that God allows evil passively, and does so with character-building and moral instruction in mind. And of course Crummell is acutely aware that humans are capable of great moral evil. It is not so much that God is unable to stop evil as that humanity is so able at propagating it.

But there's another kind of response that can be teased out of Crummell. His is a Platonic metaphysics, so for him reality is that unchanging pre-existing world of fundamental principles and concepts. That which is good is so due to the unchanging (and unrealized in the everyday world) nature of that which is good in itself. A sophisticated Platonist with a theistic overlay like Crummell sees evil only when the good in itself has been corrupted, which is impossible since the good is an abstract timeless object. Of course there is suffering in our shadowy transient realm; that is regrettable in the strongest terms possible. But that is due to our imperfect grasp of the timeless nature of the good. It is the good itself which persists, accounting for our achievement of a better future. The problem of evil is thus a kind of misdirection; the real issue is the problem of our ignorance of the good, which indicts us, not God.

Crummell's Kantian point helps make his larger argument clearer in another way as well. The progressivism that both thinkers urged is rooted in a common view about nature's endowing humans with various capacities. While for Kant that positions the argument for the progress of reason, Crummell sees it widening the ensemble of factors toward progress. For instance, commerce is praised for the civilizing role it plays, and yet, as he observes, the slave trade (clearly a destructive force) was the main commercial activity in Africa. Given the natural resources of West Africa, that could easily be changed. The “acquisitive principle” combined with productive labor can lead to civilization, “uplift[ing] and enlighten[ing] the heathen!” (“Duty of Free Colored Men,” 229–30). This is an opportunity that should not be squandered. “If the black man…civilized and enlightened” enjoys “a golden heritage, and fails to seize upon and to appropriate it, Providence none the less intends it to be seized upon and wills it to be used,” implying that whites who capitalize on the opportunity to create wealth would be justified (231). The heart of the argument is commerce's ability to create conditions for order and comfort from disorder and wildness. Moral consequences follow, including the desire for industry, the need for planning, and the creation of future chances for increased wealth. Self-reliance thus occupies a central place as a primary virtue of the civilized; the principle of acquisition and the efforts it generates at self-support and self-reliance lead to profitable commerce and investment, ultimately generating moral improvement, all in keeping with providence. “[B]lack men in Africa must do what enterprising men do in all other new lands: they must BEND NATURE TO THEIR WANTS AND WISHES” (253). Of course this confidence in the moral improvement conferred by labor and industry was widely held—by Kant too—but in Crummell's thinking it is inextricably rooted in Africa as well as the agrarian American South, and so the civilizing that he thought blacks needed required an investment in lands they found themselves in, or had an original bond to.

Liberia crystallizes these strands of argument; its founders sought to establish a “civilized nationality” there, as Crummell describes it (“The Responsibility of the First Fathers of a Country” [AA], 132). That was their “tremendous responsibility” and “great obligation,” namely, “to act as worthy trustees of distant generations and of future times.” They exemplified what he thinks is required to fulfill the duty to future progress. What remains is the need to link “sentiment” and “outward forms and symbols” (134); such is the substance of national cultures. Civil government is not the main site of this experiment in making a national culture, but its structure matters since “man's opportunities for personal freedom, for intellectual advancement, for social comfort, for domestic bliss, and for religious growth, depend very measurably upon his civil status” (135). The nature of this dependence runs deep, and may even be organic: “an ennobled manhood and the masculine virtues are generally the fruits of distinct national systems”; “the spirit of a people and their form of government are mostly reciprocal; …for the higher kind of human character, you are forced to seek an analogy of rule and system as its parent.” This underwrites a sorting of national cultures. “All the art, the refinement, the magnificence of Paris [will] fail to realize that ideal of human government which is the aspiration of every free soul,” he writes, “and which is an essential element in the growth of free and manly character” (136). But we are political agents, and this culture is something we need to take an active role in making. We are creators in the sense that we can act in an unconstrained way. But the range of choices of government is limited to free or repressive; one or the other must come to be. He argues that that is a matter of necessity since, “according to the constitution of things, no other political systems than these can exist” (137). It is our choosing that determines which comes to be. He obviously endorses a free civil government, and his posing of a choice to his audience in keeping with his set-up of the question is meant to make the point that free government is preferable because it leads to human flourishing. It is less a political philosophy than a social and moral philosophy; the institutions that make our collective social efforts effective ought to be free in order to enable us to become civilized, noble, and enlightened, leading to “a system which will enlarge the souls of men” and “give them manhood and superiority” (139). A free system thus “distinguishes calm Republicanism from wild and lawless Democracy.” The institutional framework of action thus creates the space for the individual moral life, that “good” life one tries to make for oneself. Such a system “starts men in the race for improvement…seeks their moral elevation, and aims to strengthen their souls” (140).

It is clear that Crummell thinks races ought to make nations as their instrument of civilizing uplift, but it is nowhere evident that he thinks races are the objects of that uplift. Instead, civilization is a good in itself, and ought to frame the political goals of a free nation. The principle that makes this go is “that organic principle of being which binds the present to the future, under a sense of duty and responsibility” (“First Fathers,” 141). He isn't shy at any point in his analysis. The problem of moral flourishing is one that has a political-institution component, but it is just as obvious to him that it has a metaphysical component, namely the linkage through time of human actions and how they bear on future effects. “According to the organization of our being,” he observes, “we are unable to confine ourselves to the mere brief period of life allotted us in this world. No man can thus make his life a disconnected, isolated unit” (141). This part of the argument proceeds in several stages. First, since human action is diachronic, so too is human agency. And second, since human kinds (races) have a cultural and moral component, agency is not without contextualizing factors, as “one generation is, of necessity, the framer and shaper of both the character and the destiny of another” (145–46). This obligates present agents since “the character of a people is a continuous and integral quality” shared by ancestor and descendant alike. Hence Crummell lays the groundwork for his moral progressivism, especially as it applies to blacks. The remaining difficulty is to explain how moral change is possible.

5.2 The Moral Change Argument

Crummell's Moral Change Argument begins with a tension. He claims that moral enlightenment cannot be caused by non-enlightenment. No “rude, heathen people” have ever “raised themselves by their own spontaneous energy” to a “morally elevated” state, he argues (“The Regeneration of Africa” [AA], 435); the efforts of those “superior” in “letters or grace” are generally required. This implies that moral enlightenment cannot be indigenous. Against this restriction on the cause of enlightenment is his concern that, to be effective, the enlightening influence has to become indigenous. The heathen cannot enlighten themselves, yet, since no one can become enlightened by non-indigenous agents, enlightened agents have to become indigenous—that is, some heathen have to be enlightened—as a condition for the enlightenment of the heathen. So how can any heathen be enlightened, unless they are already enlightened?

Crummell is not pessimistic though, since religious conversion faces similar obstacles, and often succeeds despite them. The “employment of all indigenous agency,” he announces, is that “great principle which lies at the basis of all successful propagation of the Gospel” (437). The solution to the dilemma is for the enlightened to be racially and psychologically similar to the would-be enlightened. “[M]en of like sentiments, feelings, blood and ancestry” are required for moral enlightenment, and hence are necessary for moral change. It is intriguing that his analysis does not demand affinity of thought between the enlightened and the target for moral improvement, a condition it seems reasonable to insist on. Sentiments and feelings go to sympathy, whereas blood and ancestry go to racial similarity; neither is mental. Interestingly, the collision between restricted cause and restricted effect amplifies the importance of moral reason's indifference to this or that race's particular nature, even as it is put to use in precisely those situations where such differences are definitive (racial contact most notably).

Raising the stakes for moral change is Crummell's belief that no single individual ever accomplished anything epochal; “everywhere we find that the great things of history have been accomplished by the combination of men” (“The Social Principle Among a People” [DR], 31). This is also the case for such moral achievements as abolishing slavery. It took “the masses of the godly” to be “marshaled to earnest warfare” to create moral change on a grand scale (32). Thus, significant moral change occurs only in the context of social efforts. This is natural given the Social Principle, as Crummell calls it: that “disposition which leads men to associate and join together for specific purposes; the principle which makes families and societies, and which binds men in unity and brotherhood, in races and churches and nations” (31). We are social by nature, since our native “sympathies and affections” are the source of our “desire for companionship.” And this can't be opted out of: we were “formed” with “a fitness and proclivity for association, …a nature that demanded society.”

The Social Principle's transcendental role in moral change can be problematic though. For instance, it is easy to sense in Crummell's description Du Bois' famous dialectic between two forms of black consciousness, decades before he stated it. Here is how Crummell puts it:

We are living in this country, a part of its population, and yet, in divers respects, we are as foreign to its inhabitants as though we were living in the Sandwich Islands. It is this our actual separation from the real life of the nation, which constitutes us “a nation within a nation”: thrown very considerably upon ourselves for many of the largest interests of life, and for nearly all our social and religious advantages. (“Social Principle,” 32)

Like the Du Boisian struggle—and echoing Kant's description of the antagonism inherent in “unsociable sociability” (“Idea for a Universal History”)—it is one of a consciousness “foreign to” the American consciousness native to the population of “this country.” This foreign-ness creates the “actual separation” that throws blacks “upon ourselves.” It is not a contest between equal and opposite forces, but a kind of resultant force produced by a stronger active force and a weaker passive force. Crummell's is thus a sort of Hegelian stand-off: a conflict between blacks and the needs and “interests” and social advantages they seek, a contest set up by their natural form.

Du Bois and Hegel both saw the effort to be a self-conscious free individual as something that was enacted in historical time. Hegel, for instance, took masters and slaves to coordinate each other's achievement of self-consciousness, each seeing themselves in terms of what the other is capable of doing. Du Bois identifies a similar coordination between the “inner selves” of blacks, one African, the other American, both native and alien at the same time. Crummell sees blacks opposing themselves in a conflict that cannot be opted out of, since it is a constitutive part of the struggle for self-awareness that every people goes through. He thus moves the focus from where a casual observer might look—the action between blacks and whites, slaves and masters—to an internal struggle—between blacks and their own conflicted nature.

As a consequence on this state of things, all the stimulants of ambition and self-love should lead this people to united effort for personal superiority and the uplifting of the race; but, instead thereof, overshadowed by a more powerful race of people; wanting in the cohesion which comes from racial enthusiasm; lacking in the confidence which is the root of a people's stability; disintegration, doubt, and distrust almost universally prevail, and distract all their business and policies. (“Social Principle,” 32)

It is easy to discern the main threads of Crummell's influence on Du Bois' later thought.

Crummell remains encouraged about African enlightenment through all of this, though. Principles of Mutuality and Dependence follow from the Social Principle, facilitating moral change. The Principle of Mutuality determines those “reciprocal tendencies and desires which interact between large bodies of men, aiming at single and definite ends,” while the Principle of Dependence has “[n]o man stand[ing] up entirely alone, self-sufficient in the entire circle of human needs” (“Social Principle,” 33). He observes that “it has taken ten centuries to change [the Englishman] from the rudeness of his brutalized forefathers into an enlightened and civilized human being” (34); so too, he thought, for African moral change.

It thus becomes easier to discern Crummell's larger view about how a people can impact the course of history. The active Mental and Moral Principles of reason start a cycle, causing a people so stirred to satisfy conditions of intellectual and moral enlightenment. Once they are enlightened, reason itself—considered as an abstract, global resource, the main active force in history—increases in its civilizing potential. Thus the history of reason moves forward as a vital, active principle, completing a feedback loop. For blacks to affect history, they must become civilized, and propagate civilizing reason to push history forward. (As I describe above, this process is part of each generation's obligations to posterity within the course of history.) Fortunately the Social Principle and its corollaries optimize the chances of that happening.

But for the cycle to get its start, the “native” must be trusted with the possibility of civilization—in Matthew Arnold's phrase (quoted approvingly by Crummell), the “possibility of right.” Until they achieve that state, they are to be treated with the necessity of tutelage, the “necessity of force and authority.” “Mere theories of democracy” cannot be applied to “a rude people, incapable of perceiving their own place in the moral scale, nor of understanding the social and political obligations” of civilized peoples (“Our National Mistakes” [AA], 185). “Force and right,” Crummell writes, quoting Arnold, “are the governors of this world; force till right is ready….And till right is ready, force, the existing order of things, is justified, is the legitimate rule.” He agrees with Arnold that right “implies inward recognition” that we must be capable of both “seeing” and “willing.” Until that is attained, until the “native” outgrows their “childhood,” the enlightened have the “responsibility of guardianship over them.”

This awkward paternalism is difficult for the contemporary reader to accept. It must be read, though, in the context of the respect he has for the native intelligence in all groups, his fellow blacks included. Agreeing with Mill's caution that force over the native should be that which fits them to become a nation Crummell insists that force should be the force of restoration and progress (“Our National Mistakes,” 185n). In the “native man's moral constitution” is a “great felt need, and a great object of desire [for] peace, order, and protection”; and they are motivated by an acquisitive principle, “the impelling motive power in all [their] endurance and weariness” (191). He understood that there simply was no project without a native African capacity for civilization.


Primary Literature

  • Crummell, A., [AC], Papers, Schomburg Center for Research in Black Culture, The New York Public Library.
  • –––, [1840] 1979, “New York State Convention of Negroes, 1840,” in A Documentary History of the Negro People in the United States, volume 1: From the Colonial Times through the Civil War, edited by H. Aptheker. New York: Citadel, 198–205.
  • –––, [FA] 1862, The Future of Africa: Being Addresses, Sermons, etc., etc., Delivered in the Republic of Liberia, second edition, New York: Charles Scribner.
  • –––, [GC] 1882, The Greatness of Christ, and Other Sermons, New York: Thomas Whittaker.
  • –––, [AA] 1891, Africa and America: Addresses and Discourses, Springfield, Mass.: Willey & Co.
  • –––, [DR] 1992, Destiny and Race: Selected Writings, 1840–1898, edited by W. J. Moses, Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • –––, [CBP] 1995, Civilization & Black Progress: Selected Writings of Alexander Crummell on the South, edited by J. R. Oldfield, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Wahle, K. O., 1968, “Alexander Crummell: Black Evangelist and Pan-Negro Nationalist.” Phylon 29: 388–395.
  • Appiah, K. A., 1992, In My Father's House: Africa in the Philosophy of Culture, New York: Oxford University Press, chapter 1.
  • Kirkland, F., 1992–1993, “Modernity and Intellectual Life in Black.” The Philosophical Forum 24.1–3: 136–165.
  • Moses, W. J., 2004, Creative Conflict in African American Thought: Frederick Douglass, Alexander Crummell, Booker T. Washington, W. E. B. Du Bois, and Marcus Garvey, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, chapters 5–7.
  • Thompson, S. L., 2007, “Crummell on the Metalogic of Non-Standard Languages,” Philosophia Africana 10.2: 77–106.
  • Gooding-Williams, R., 2009, In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-Modern Political Thought in America, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, chapter 3.


  • Rigsby, G. U., 1987, Alexander Crummell: Pioneer in Nineteenth-Century Pan-African Thought, New York: Greenwood Press.
  • Moses, W. J., 1989, Alexander Crummell: A Study of Civilization and Discontent, Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Oldfield, J. R., 1990, Alexander Crummell (1819–1898) and the Creation of an African-American Church in Liberia, Wales: Edwin Mellen Press.

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