Frederick Douglass

First published Wed Jun 13, 2012; substantive revision Thu Jan 13, 2022

Frederick Douglass (c. 1817–1895) is a central figure in United States and African American history.[1] He was born a slave, circa 1817;[2] his mother was a Negro slave and his father was reputed to be his white master. Douglass escaped from slavery in 1838 and rose to become a principal leader and spokesperson for the U.S. Abolition movement. He would eventually develop into a towering figure for the U.S. Civil Rights Movement, and his legacy would be claimed by a diverse span of groups, from liberals and integrationists to conservatives to nationalists, within and without black America.

He wrote three autobiographies, each one expanding on the details of his life. The first was Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, Written By Himself (in 1845);[3] the second was My Bondage and My Freedom (in 1852a; FDAB: 103–452);[4] and the third was Life and Times of Frederick Douglass (in 1881; FDAB: 453–1045). They are now foremost examples of the American slave narrative. In addition to being autobiographical, they are also, as is standard, explicitly works of political and social criticism and moral suasion; they were aimed at the hearts and minds of the readers, and their greater purpose was to attack and to contribute to the abolition of slavery in the United States, and to argue for the full inclusion of black Americans into the nation.

Shortly after escaping from slavery, Douglass began operating as a spokesperson, giving numerous speeches about his life and experiences, for William Lloyd Garrison’s American Anti-Slavery Society. To spread his story and assist the abolitionist cause, as well as to counter early charges that someone so eloquent as he could not have been a slave, Douglass wrote and published his first autobiography, the Narrative. The Narrative brought Douglass fame in the United States and the United Kingdom, and it provided the funds to purchase his freedom.

After breaking with Garrison, Douglass founded and edited his first paper, the North Star, and authored a considerable body of letters, editorials, and speeches. These writings have been collected in Philip Foner’s multivolume, The Life and Writings of Frederick Douglass (1950–1975, hereafter FDLW),[5] and in John W. Blassingame and John R. McKivigan’s multivolume, The Frederick Douglass Papers (1979–, hereafter FDP).

Douglass’s life, from slavery to statesman, his writings and speeches, and his national and international work have inspired many lines of discussion in debate within the fields of American and African American history, political science and theory, sociology, and in philosophy. His legacy is claimed, despite his links to ideas of cultural and racial assimilationism, by black Nationalists as well as by black liberals and black conservatives.

Douglass can be linked to the history of American philosophy, through his participation in national discussions about the nature of and future of the American Republic and its institutions. In that light he is linked to his contemporaries who had academic philosophic connections, in particular Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803–1882), and by the uptake of his political and social legacy and writings by later African American philosophers, such as W.E.B. Du Bois (1868–1963) and Alain Locke (1884–1954; see Harris 1989). Frederick Douglass: A Critical Reader, edited by Bill E. Lawson and Frank M. Kirkland (1999), is a valuable guide to lines of inquiry about Douglass, and the debates he inspired, within philosophy in the United States. In contemporary philosophy in the United States, Douglass’s work is usually taken up within American philosophy, African American philosophy, and moral, social, and political philosophy; in particular, the debates in those areas focus on his views concerning slavery and (later in his career at the dawn of Jim Crow segregation) racial exploitation and segregation, natural law, the U.S. constitution, violence and self-respect in the resistance against slavery, racial integration versus emigration or separation, cultural assimilation, racial amalgamation, and women’s suffrage.

1. Slavery

In his three narratives, and his numerous articles, speeches, and letters, Douglass vigorously argued against slavery. He sought to demonstrate that it was cruel, unnatural, ungodly, immoral, and unjust. He laid out his arguments first in his speeches while he was with Garrison’s American Anti-Slavery Society, and then in his first autobiography, the Narrative. As the U.S. Civil War drew closer, he expanded his arguments in many speeches, editorials, and in his second autobiography, My Bondage and My Freedom.

In his own words he worked to pour out a “scorching irony” to expose the evil of slavery (1852b, FDLW v.2: 192). His rebellion against slavery began, as he recounted, while he was a slave. In his narratives, this depiction of early recognition, and general recognition among blacks and some whites, of the injustice, unnaturalness, and cruelty of slavery is a major element of his argument.

It marks his first argument against slavery. Some of the apologists for slavery claimed that blacks were beasts, subhuman, or at least a degenerated form of the human species. These arguments go back to at least Sepulveda’s arguments in the fifteenth century, which Bartolomé de las Casas famously countered (1552; see also, Frederickson’s review of the early history of racism [2002]), and were common in the American British Colonies and then the United States; for example, Thomas Jefferson famously intimates this point in his Notes on the State of Virginia (1785: Query 14). Douglass argued that blacks were fully rational humans, and mocked slavery’s apologists for its hypocrisies and contradictions when it claimed otherwise. In his Fourth of July Address, he derides the very idea that he would even need to argue this point (1852b).

Against the claim that blacks were beasts, he argued that rather slavery had brutalized them. He pointed to the obviousness of the humanity of blacks, and to the hypocrisy of the apologists for slavery in America on this question: why should there be special laws prohibiting the free actions of blacks, such as rebelling against the master or any other white person, if slaves were bestial and incapable of independent, responsible behavior? Why, indeed, had slave masters encouraged their slaves’ Christianization, and then forbade their religious gatherings? Along with this hypocrisy, American slaveholders feared and banned the education of blacks, while demanding and profiting from their learning and development in the skilled trades. Thus, Douglass argued the accusation that blacks were beasts was predicated on the guilty knowledge that they were humans. Additionally, it subverted not only the natural goodness of blacks by brutalizing them, but it also did so to white slaveholders and those otherwise innocent whites affected by this wicked institution. Slavery, Douglass pointed out, making reference to Jefferson’s anxieties in Query 18 of the Notes on the State of Virginia (1785), that slavery was a poison in the body of the republic.

Second, since blacks were humans, Douglass argued they were entitled to the natural rights that natural law mandated and that the United States recognized in its Declaration of Independence and Constitution. Slavery subverted the natural rights of blacks by subjugating and brutalizing them: taking men and turning them, against God’s will and nature, into beasts. Third, as an affront to natural law, slavery contradicted God’s law. Douglass cited biblical passages and interpretations popular with abolitionists. As a witness and participant of the second Great Awakening, he took seriously the politicized rhetoric of Christian liberation from sin, and, as with other abolitionists, saw it intrinsically wrapped up with liberation from slavery, and indeed national liberation. Fourth, he argued that slavery was inconsistent with the idea of America, with its national narrative and highest ideals, and not just with its founding documents. Fifth, drawing on the ideas of manifest destiny, as well as the idea of natural law realized in historical progress, he argued that slavery was inconsistent with development: moral, political, economic, social, and ultimately historical. America was on the wrong side of history on the question of slavery.

To defend slavery, some of its apologists drew on the idea of historical progress to offer the defense that slavery was a benevolent and paternal system for the mutual benefit of whites and blacks. Douglass countered by drawing on his experiences, and the experiences of other slaves, that American slavery was in no way benevolent. It brutalized blacks, subjecting them to debilitating, murderous violence; to rape; to the splitting up of families (another crime against nature); to denying them education and self-improvement; and to the exploitation of their labor and denying them access to their natural right to property. Black slaves were not happy Sambos benefiting from the largesse of kind, gentile white masters—they were brutalized against all justice and reason. Neither were they lacking in agency or self-respect, nor were they, for all intents and purposes socially and morally dead, subjected to natal alienation.[6] They were moral beings, fully aware of the rights and capabilities they were unjustly deprived of, and most of all they wanted freedom, independence, the recognition of their full personhood, and their rights as U.S. citizens (McGary and Lawson 1992).

Howard McGary and Bill E. Lawson’s Between Slavery and Freedom: Philosophy and American Slavery (1992), is an indispensable source for philosophical analyses of these arguments, and the engagement of normative philosophy with historical and sociological theories of U.S. slavery, and Nicholas Buccola’s The Political Thought of Frederick Douglass: In Pursuit of American Liberty (2012), provides an excellent analysis of how Douglass’s critical examination of slavery fits into his liberalism and dominant conceptions of liberty of his time. An early, key contributor to the philosophical literature on Douglass, and to American philosophical literature on Douglass was Angela Davis, who of course is a key figure in the U.S. Civil Rights Movement and the emergence of both the black power movement and black feminism since the 1960s. Her groundbreaking essay on Douglass, “Unfinished Lecture on Liberation-II”, argued for an active rather than static conception of liberty, drew on and criticized Rousseau’s conception of slavery, and applied her analysis to the Civil Rights struggles she was involved in during the late 1960s and early 1970s ([1971] 1983).[7]

2. Natural Law

As was mentioned in the above section, Douglass drew on the idea of natural rights and the natural law tradition in his argument against slavery. Douglass was an Enlightenment thinker and a nineteenth century modernist (Moses 1978; Martin 1984; Myers 2008). As such, he had a firm faith in the progress of man, civilization, and Western Christendom; hence, he saw American slavery as a brutal backwardness that ran counter to the progress of history. God and the forward march of history, Douglass believed, would bring the realization of truth, justice, and the brotherhood of man.

His sources for his belief were many. The obvious sources include sources such as the American founding documents, popular intellectuals, such as Ralph Waldo Emerson, and his colleagues and acquaintances in the American Abolition movement, and the allies he encountered abroad; a particular source of his conception of natural law theory was George Combe’s The Constitution of Man, from 1834 (in Van Wyhe 2004). However, given the numerous religious references in his speeches and writings, and his drawing on the language of the King James Bible, and the rhetoric of manifest destiny, a primary source for his employment of the idea of natural law seems to be his adoption of the American Protestantism of the Second Great Awakening, with its democratic, republican, and generally independent spirit.

He believed that there were forces in operation, which must inevitably work the downfall of slavery:

“The arm of the Lord is not shortened,” and the doom of slavery is certain. I, therefore, leave off where I began, with hope. While drawing encouragement from the Declaration of Independence, the great principles it contains, and the genius of American Institutions, my spirit is also cheered by the obvious tendencies of the age. (1852b, FDLW v.2: 203)

Relying on the deus ex machina, however, was not enough for Douglass. His vision of human rights involved action (Myers 2008). Here he echoes the civic republican tradition by stressing the need for active participation to claim, or earn one’s rights and status as a citoyen (Pettit 1997; Gooding-Williams 2009; Rousseau [SC]). Humans resist providential justice; this could be seen in the resistance of the slave-holding states of America to the abolition of slavery and the apathy of many other Americans about slavery; thus, the end of slavery requires action: agitation, protest, and if needed military intervention. Douglass longed for God to cast his thunderbolts at the United States, but he knew that to achieve the abolition of slavery in America, action was needed. His view of providence is on full display at the end of his famous Fourth of July oration of 1852. Douglass uses Psalm 68:31 and pairs the idea of God’s fiat with the image of Africa and Asia rising:

The far off and almost fabulous Pacific rolls in grandeur at our feet. The Celestial Empire, the mystery of ages, is being solved. The fiat of the Almighty, “Let there be Light,” has not yet spent its force. No abuse, no outrage whether in taste, sport or avarice, can now hide itself from the all-pervading light. The iron shoe, and crippled foot of China must be seen, in contrast with nature. Africa must rise and put on her yet unwoven garment. “Ethiopia shall stretch out her hand unto God”. (1852b, FDLW v.2: 203)[8]

There are many concerns about Douglass’s view of natural law, manifest destiny and providence—these concerns are on display in the last quotation, and it is not merely the supernaturalism, the belief in a historical teleology, driven by cosmological ontological-theological determination; it is also the costs of the assumptions of such a conception of historical development (McCarthy 2009); namely, his adoption of nineteenth century conceptions of the backwardness (or in kinder terms, underdevelopment) of non-Western European groups; thus his relative silence about the United States’s destructive actions against and policies toward Native American groups. Douglass’s views have lead Wilson Jeremiah Moses to characterize him, along with other early black political figures, as a Moses figure: he is an exodus leader, recipient of the natural law for chosen peoples—African Americans in their travail for freedom as well as the American Republic as a whole—and he (paired eternally with Abraham Lincoln) is a law giver (Moses 1978).

His monumental, world-historical vita aside, Douglass’s faith, much abused as it was, resulted in his inability to understand the extent to which the United States was a racial republic (Frederickson 2002). He did not prognosticate, before or after the U.S. Civil War, that the progress he believed in would move at a glacial pace, and that for many of his black country men there would be no justice all. Nevertheless, Douglass had no time for this shortsightedness; which comes only with the luxury of the liberty he fought for, and, of course, time. Douglass was not looking behind him; he was fully engaged at every moment since his emancipation working to bring and end to slavery. Moreover, his view of natural law led to his critique of American slavery, and undergirded his arguments for active resistance to slavery and his interpretation of the U.S. Constitution. It is also worth noting, that natural law theorists have not ceded the field; thus Douglass is an important American historical figure in the intellectual history of natural law.

3. The U.S. Constitution

In 1851 Douglass broke from Garrison’s position that the U.S. Constitution was a pro-slavery document, and that the free states should peacefully secede from the union. In a letter to Smith he reported that he was “sick and tired of arguing on the slaveholder’s side…” (Douglass 1851). Douglass sided with Gerrit Smith and the Liberty party’s position that the United States’ founding documents were anti-slavery.

In his most famous speech, “What To the Slave Is The Fourth of July?”, he detailed what would come to be regarded as his signature positions, such as the view that slavery was unconstitutional and contrary to natural law, that blacks were self-evidently human and entitled to natural rights, and that slavery was contrary to the U.S. Constitution, American Republicanism, and Christian doctrine. He also began to defend violent resistance to slavery. Douglass’s second autobiography, My Bondage and My Freedom, reflected these changes, and his expanding intellectual independence (FDAB; for a stand-alone edition, see the 1987 version edited by Andrews).

Although he initially acknowledges that the intentions of the framers was to allow slavery to continue in the states where it was established, he reported that he was convinced by Smith’s argument that the meaning of the document was not set by the intention of the framers but by rules of legal interpretation that focused on natural law. By the following year he even altered his position on the framers’s intentions: they meant the U.S. Constitution to be an anti-slavery document.

Douglass depended heavily on the U.S. Declaration of Independence, as well as the documented disagreements and cross-purposes, of the founders. He was guided by his view of natural law, and argued that the general ideas of America’s founding documents, as part of the history of Western democracy and republicanism, pointed toward an interpretation of the U.S. Constitution as an evolving document that could potentially be in tune with civilizational development.

Douglass’s position on original intent, as it evolved through his life, is part of the critical discussion about the assimilationist tradition, and whether that tradition, and Douglass, squarely recognized the racialized character of the nation, how deeply embedded race and racism were in its institutions, and that it was in many respects a racial state.[9] This key critique of Douglass was given by Charles W. Mills, in his “Whose Fourth of July? Frederick Douglass and ‘Original Intent’” (Mills 1999). In short, Mills argues that Douglass fails to apprehend America’s racial contract. The practical problems of Douglass’s view aside, which U.S. history revealed in the Great Compromise and the end of Reconstruction after the Civil War, Douglass’s interpretation of the U.S. Constitution is reasonable and not blind to the facts; that Americans did not live up to the ideals of their founding documents is another matter.

4. Violence and Self-Respect

As already noted above, Douglass was active in the years leading up to the U.S. Civil War, vigorously protesting the Dred Scott decision, agitating against laws that protected the property rights of slaveholders over their slaves in the Free States and the spread of slavery into new U.S. territory. He lobbied the newly formed Republican Party (the party of Abraham Lincoln) to support abolitionism, and met the militant abolitionist, John Brown. Although Douglass declined to join Brown’s militia—he sensed the deadly potential of Brown’s zealotry and the likelihood of its failure—he defended Brown’s ideals and denounced claims that Brown was merely mad. Douglass quickly appropriated Brown’s ideals, while distancing himself from the particular of Brown’s fatal actions, and used the raid at Harper’s Ferry to launch further criticisms against President Lincoln for his reluctance to support abolitionism.

Douglass’s rejection of pacifism and his support for Federal military intervention—Civil War—to end slavery was a major turning point in his thought, and part of his developing ideas about natural law, divine providence and manifest destiny, and constitutional interpretation. Douglass’s defense of jus ad bellum had a tremendous effect, not just on his contemporaries, but also on the resulting debate on slavery, struggle, and self-respect. The modern debate in African American philosophy, critical race theory, and black political theory begins with Douglass’s narratives, and in particular his famous fight with the “Negro breaker”, Edward Covey. This incident plays a major role in all of Douglass’s narratives: Covey represents the brutalizing institution of American slavery and Douglass’s fight and victory represents the assertion of manhood,[10] self-respect, dignity and freedom. Douglass’s time with Covey and the suffering he endured by Covey’s hand is given a lengthier description in My Bondage and My Freedom than in the Narrative; moreover, Douglass adds his own political and theological interpretation to the later account. In My Bondage and My Freedom the fight stresses how Douglass’s struggles reflect the struggles of the slaves around him, and that it is an instance of a general phenomenon; lest someone think that Douglass narrative is too particular and peculiar to represent the attitudes of other black Americans. Additionally, his fight is given explicit national political connotations (Gooding-Williams 2009; Myers 2008). The scene as Douglass writes it in each version is powerful, and is indicative of the narrative (literary, rhetorical, and philosophical) brilliance of Douglass’s narratives, and so deserves to be quoted at length.

In the Narrative (1845), Douglass wrote:

The battle with Mr. Covey was the turning-point in my career as a slave. It rekindled the few expiring embers of freedom, and revived within me a sense of my own manhood. It recalled the departed self-confidence, and inspired me again with a determination to be free. The gratification afforded by the triumph was a full compensation for whatever else might follow, even death itself. He only can understand the deep satisfaction which I experienced, who has himself repelled by force the bloody arm of slavery. I felt as I never felt before. It was a glorious resurrection, from the tomb of slavery, to the heaven of freedom. My long-crushed spirit rose, cowardice departed, bold defiance took its place; and I now resolved that, however long I might remain as slave in form, the day had passed forever when I could be a slave in fact. I did not hesitate to let it be known of me, that the white man who expected to succeed in whipping, must also succeed in killing me. (FDAB: 65)

In My Bondage and My Freedom (1855), he gives the following expanded interpretation:

Well, my dear reader, this battle with Mr. Covey,—undignified as it was, and as I fear my narration of it is—was the turning point in my “life as a slave.” It rekindled in my breast the smouldering embers of liberty; it brought up my Baltimore dreams, and revived a sense of my own manhood. I was a changed being after that fight. I was nothing before; I WAS A MAN NOW. It recalled to life my crushed self-respect and my self-confidence, and inspired me with a renewed determination to be a FREEMAN. A man, without force, is without the essential dignity of humanity. Human nature is so constituted, that it cannot honor a helpless man, although it can pity him; and even this it cannot do long, if the signs of power do not arise. (FDAB: 286, original emphases)

The first passage displays Douglass’s romantic and religious influences; it swells with the longing for the freedom of the soul. The second passage, written without demands of Garrison’s pacifist politics directing his pen, screams independence and force, it recommends violence—it advocates for the coming U.S. Civil War—to throw off tyranny and to claim, to defend, even fulfill, one’s honor and humanity. The fight with Covey has inspired a number of philosophical interpretations about Douglass’s intentions and the meaning of his struggle; some have seen it an exemplar of conceptions of the state of war within liberal political theory (Davis [1971] 1983; FDN-Davis 2010), as deontological (Boxill 1997, 1998; see also Boxill 1984 [1992]), as existentialist (Gordon 1999), or as fruitfully understand using a number of political and social theoretical positions (Buccola 2012: 14–40; McGary and Lawson 1992: 163–209; Willett 1998, 2001: 188–202). Across these approaches, Douglass’s narrative of his fight with Covey stands as a vibrant reference point in debates regarding violence, self-respect, and dignity.

5. Assimilation and Amalgamation

Douglass’s conception of providence, with its American themes of individualism, anti-supernaturalism, and activism, and his view of natural law influenced his view of universal human brotherhood.[11] This doctrine, with its religious and philosophical roots, was dearly held by Douglass. He argued that the idea of universal human brotherhood was consistent with the high ideals of American Republicanism and Christianity, and it was offered as a response to the rise in the United States of the racial theory of polygenesis, supported by the American School of ethnology, and argued for originally by Samuel Morton (1799–1851) and popularized by Josiah Nott and George Glidden’s Types of Mankind (1854; Martin 1984; Myers 2008).

Douglass put considerable effort into countering arguments that blacks were subhuman, intellectually and morally inferior, and fit to be dominated as children, forever to be a race in nonage. Although he flirted with historical developmental arguments that black civilizations had developed, he saw such arguments as too loosely related to the conditions of black Americans in his time, so he increasingly turned to his natural law arguments. He argued that by the high standard of Christian theology, blacks, as humans and creation of the divine, were all equally the children of God, no matter their present condition. One of his slogans got to the point: “A man’s a man for a’ that”. He used rhetoric that appealed to the piety of the nation that the Christian Bible had to be correct on this score, and that—just as the soul of the nation depended on emancipation—the authority of the biblical text depended on the affirmation of the unity of the human family:

What, after all, if they are able to show very good reasons for believing the Negro to have been created precisely as we find him on the Gold Coast—along the Senegal and the Niger—I say, what of all this?—“A man’s a man for a’ that”. I sincerely believe, that the weight of the argument is in favor of the unity of origin of the human race, or species—that the arguments on the other side are partial, superficial, utterly subversive of the happiness of man, and insulting to the wisdom of God. Yet, what if we grant they are not so? What, if we grant that the case, on our part, is not made out? Does it follow, that the Negro should be held in contempt? Does it follow, that to enslave and imbrue him is either just or wise? I think not. Human rights stand upon a common basis; and by all the reason that they are supported, maintained and defended, for one variety of the human family, they are supported, maintained and defended for all the human family; because all mankind have the same wants, arising out of a common nature. A diverse origin does not disprove a common nature, nor does it disprove a united destiny. (1854; FDP1 v.2: 523)

Douglass emphasized that not only was slavery against natural law and Christian morality, but that the very arguments concerning the subhuman status of blacks that slavery’s apologists used to justify attempted slavery, contradicted the Bible and was heretical. Douglass, in short, leveraged the Bible, and obviously America’s reverence for it, against the rising tide of polygenesis race theory. He stated:

The unity of the human race—the brotherhood of man—the reciprocal duties of all to each, and of each to all, are too plainly taught in the Bible to admit of cavil.—The credit of the Bible is at stake—and if it be too much to say, that it must stand or fall, by the decision of this question, it is proper to say, that the value of that sacred Book—as a record of the early history of mankind—must be materially affected, by the decision of the question. (1854, FDP1 v.2: 505)

The doctrine of universal human brotherhood for Douglass, and the abolitionists, was based on the Bible’s creation story and Acts 17:26: “And hath made of one blood all nations of men for to dwell on all the face of the earth” (King James Version).

These words were not mere words for Douglass and the abolitionists; they were not just-so stories. The Christian doctrine of the unity of the human family or human brotherhood (as the sexist language that marked the idea at least since the Enlightenment), contained the world historical insight of equal human dignity, which implied—unleashed, as was seen in several revolutions in the 18th and 19th-century—the uncompromising demand for equal rights.

Douglass’s belief in the evil of slavery, universal human brotherhood, and the inevitability of human development, as well as his observation of the mixing of the so-called races in the United States, led his to support racial amalgamation. It is important to note here that he thought that there were races to amalgamate, and he affirmed the basic idea that there were biologically distinct races (1854, FDP1 v.2: 497–525). As should be clear from his view of universal human brotherhood, he did not however think that much followed from that admission. The existence of biological race did not in his view negate the theological-philosophical insight of universal human brotherhood.

Douglass understood that the sexual boundaries between the races were thin, and that indeed, the conditions of slavery led to a great deal of mixing. Recall that he held that his unacknowledged father was his white master. Beyond recognizing this condition, he began to promote amalgamation, although, obviously, between free peoples. He believed that blacks and white ought to be free to intermarry and indeed they should intermarry. Why should they marry? Douglass, sensing the transformation of the black and Native American population in the United States, believed this process was natural, that it would continue, and that a new third race, an American race, would emerge in this land. During his time such views were highly inflammatory and served, and continued to serve, as one reason offered against the emancipation of black slaves, and later as a justification for segregation (Sundstrom 2008: 11–35 and 93–107). Nonetheless, in the 1860s he boldly advocated for amalgamation between the races. He remarked to a journalist, the day after his second marriage to Helen Pitts, who was white,

…there is no division of races. God Almighty made but one race. I adopt the theory that in time the varieties of races will be blended into one. Let us look back when the black and the white people were distinct in this country. In two hundred and fifty years there has grown up a million of intermediate. And this will continue. You may say that Frederick Douglass considers himself a member of the one race which exists. (1884, FDP1 v.5: 147)

Douglass’s amalgamation is sometimes conflated with his support for assimilation. Amalgamation is conceptually distinct from assimilation; one does not have to accept amalgamation to support assimilation. Assimilation concerns various degrees of social and cultural adoption, adaptation, and absorption. It can theoretically go in either direction, say from black to white or white to black, or it can involve a subtle blending. In the United States, the assumption has been that non-whites or white Ethnics would and should enter the “melting pot”, and assimilate to dominant white Protestant mores (Sundstrom 2003).[12]

Douglass was not exceptional in his support of assimilation. A number of Douglass’s contemporaries, and several black leaders that followed him all supported some degree of assimilation. Some of Douglass’s early critics, such as Edward Blyden (1832–1912), Martin Delany (1812–1885), and Alexander Crummell (1819–1898), who did not support amalgamation, and in fact were separatists and racial nationalists, supported the assimilation by black Americans of Christianity and many of the standards and values Western civilization (Moses 1978).

6. Integration versus Emigration

Douglas, as an advocate of assimilation and amalgamation, was by extension a supporter of what would be come known as integration. He is considered by some political theorists to be a primary example of the political ideal of integration as distinct from separatism. Douglass’s amalgamationist-assimilationist views of the 1860s and on are not the integrationist ideas adopted in America of 1950s and 1960s; those views were influenced by cultural nationalists, like Du Bois, who advocated for social and political integration while the group maintained its own ethnic-racial ideals and identity. Yet, Douglass is a fitting hero for the integrationist impulse in general.

Douglass criticized the creation of separate societies, with distinct “negro pews, negro berths in steamboats, negro cars, Sabbath or week-day schools,…churches”, and so on (Douglass 1848a,b). Separatism, for Douglass, was in the interest of the defenders of slavery, and after the U.S. Civil War, he regarded separatism as a counter-ideal of the abolition movement. Self-separation, according to Douglass, served the interests of whites who wanted to deny blacks their right to integrate into society, to improve and develop, and to enjoy the fruits of their labor.

For similar reasons he opposed plans for black American emigration to Africa, the Caribbean, Mexico, or Latin America. He criticized the emigrationist visions of the American Colonization Society, founded by whites, and the African Civilization Society, founded by blacks. He had four reasons to oppose emigration schemes: First, for slavery to end, Douglass argued that black Americans needed to struggle against it in America. Second, Americans had no other home but the United States; they were uniquely American, and products of American history. Third, black Americans had a right to the property their labor had produced. By abandoning the United States, they were abandoning the land they built. He wrote,

The native land of the American Negro is America. His bones, his muscles, his sinews, are all American. His ancestors for two hundred and seventy years have lived and laboured and died, on American soil, and millions of his posterity have inherited Caucasian blood. It is pertinent, therefore, to ask, in view of this admixture, as well as in view of other facts, where the people of this mixed race are to go, for their ancestors are white and black, and it will be difficult to find their native land anywhere outside of the United States. (Douglass 1894b, in Brotz 1992: 329–30)

Fourth and finally, the real solution, according to Douglass, was not emigration, and separation, for that was contrary to historical progress, providence, and the emergence of the new American race. All the same, Douglass was not opposed to efforts of blacks in collective self-help and self-defense. Nonetheless, his opposition to emigration displayed the downside of his commitment to his natural law and manifest destiny-inspired principles. He did not understand how immigration might be, in the eyes of the black Americans that wanted to flee anti-black oppression and especially life-crushing oppression and murderous anti-black violence, a more than reasonable act of self-preservation and self-determination (much like his escape from slavery).[13] His opposition to emigration was such that it extended to the internal migration of black Americans from the south to the north—the Great Migration or Black Exodus; he initially opposed the individual choice of black Americans to flee the American South after the rise of Black Codes, Jim Crow laws, and the development of agricultural peonage, which for all practical purposes reduced the lives of black Americans to slavery and certainly devastated their life chances (Wilkerson 2010; Myers 2008). Douglass moderated his position on migration only at the end of his life when his disillusionment with the United States grew (Douglass 1879, 1888, 1894a).

7. Leadership

The relation between Douglass and the topic of black political leadership is wrapped up with his life, activities, and writing. He was a leader among black Americans, and served as an unelected spokesperson for free and enslaved blacks during a monumental time for the nation.[14] He was presented as a victim of and witness to slavery by the Garrisonian abolitionists, but he freed himself from their restraints, just as he freed himself from slavery. He wanted to speak for himself, to be his own man and to be a leader among men. In his self-emancipation from slavery, his efforts to shape his own story, and to speak his mind, he stands as an exemplar of leadership and its virtues.

His example was quick to be seized and claimed by other prospective black leaders and spokespersons. The most significant example of this was the conflicting claim between W.E.B. Du Bois and Booker T. Washington (1856–1915) over the meaning of Douglass’s legacy. Indeed both men competed for the opportunity to publish a biography of Douglass with the publishers George W. Jacobs & Company in their series The American Crisis Biographies (Sundstrom 2008: 11–35). Du Bois’s bid for this task was rejected in favor of Washington’s (Washington 1907). Du Bois was, instead, given the project of writing a biography of John Brown, which includes large sections on Douglass (Du Bois 1909).

After the death of Douglass, Du Bois published an elegiac poem, “The Passing of Douglass” (c. 1895), and incorporated his narrative in The Souls of Black Folk (1903, [1999: xxii), John Brown (1909), and Black Reconstruction in America (1935). Du Bois presented Douglass as a freedom fighter and a leader of an activist community that demanded full social and political liberty, equality, and inclusion. Du Bois’s Douglass was vigorous and fought for freedom through self-assertion. Douglass, according to Du Bois, was no accommodationist: he was not given to offering obeisance to white demands to maintain white political, social, and economic superiority over blacks. Du Bois made this pointed interpretation very clear in his The Souls of Black Folks. In the second chapter of that book Du Bois argues against Booker T. Washington’s accomodationism in favor of his and Douglass’s demand for, and assertion of, black political and social equality and rights. Economic liberty is not enough, and any gains in the economic sphere would be hampered and vulnerable without the protections and opportunities provided by social and political liberty and rights. And, of course, economic considerations aside, the fight for equal rights and liberty is not solely about economic opportunity—it is about equal dignity and one’s full humanity.

It is important to note, however, that Du Bois takes on Douglass’s mantle of leadership after he argued against Douglass’s view of assimilation and amalgamation. Du Bois, in the “The Conservation of Races”, rejects amalgamation, which Douglass supported, and argues for the conservation of a distinct black identity and community (Du Bois 1897). Here is his reduction of the amalgamationist position:

It may, however, be objected here that the situation of the our race in America renders this attitude impossible; that our sole hope of salvation lies in our being able to lose our race identity in the commingled blood of the nation; and that nay other course would merely increase the friction of races which we call race prejudice, and against which we have so long and so earnestly fought. (Du Bois 1897, in Brotz 1992: 488)

Du Bois argues that black Americans ought to embrace a “stalwart originality” that follows “Negro Ideals” and not dissolve into a general American identity (Du Bois 1897, in Brotz 1992: 488). His view is sometimes referred to as cultural pluralism, and his arguments in that early essay, are important landmarks in debates in African social and political thought over separation versus assimilation (Boxill 1992 [1997]; 1984 [1992]: 173–85; 1999; McGary 1999a; Pittman 1999; McGary 1999b: 43–61), and the conservation of race.[15] Because of his cultural pluralism, it is tempting to think that Du Bois rejects Douglass’s view of assimilation and integration; that would be a serious mistake. He rejects Douglass’s vision of total assimilation in favor of the retention of some black ideals, which he too easily assumes that all blacks qua blacks share, but his cultural pluralism has at its end the creation of a community that are “co-workers” in the “kingdom of culture” (Du Bois 1903 [1997: 39]).

In response to the amalgamationist objection quoted at length above, Du Bois offers an early version of his brilliant conception of black American double consciousness, and through his rhetorical questions at the end of the passage presages his arguments against Douglass’s hopes of amalgamation and for his view of black political, social, and cultural solidarity:

No Negro who has given earnest thought to the situation of his people in America has failed, at some time in life, to find himself at these cross-roads; has failed to ask himself at some time: What, after all, am I? Am I an American or am I a Negro? Can I be both? Or is it my duty to cease to be a Negro as soon as possible and be an American? If I strive as a Negro, am I not perpetuating the very cleft that threatens and separates Black and White America? Is not my only possible aim the subduction of all that is Negro in me to the American? Does my black blood place upon me any more obligation to assert my nationality than German, or Irish or Italian blood would? (Du Bois 1897, in Brotz 1992: 488)

Du Bois’s answers to these questions directly contradict Douglass’s view about amalgamation, though their views about assimilation share some similarities, such as the co-production and enjoyment of a common American higher culture. In the end, however, Du Bois’s image of Douglass is skewed toward his own political projects of elite leadership, racial solidarity, and uplift.

Booker T. Washington’s Douglass is equally a work of art that reflects the image of the artist. Washington’s The Life of Frederick Douglass presents an image of Douglass that is contrary to Du Bois’s, and, unfortunately, clearly contrary to many of Douglass’s views (Washington 1907). It is a work of self-promotion; although he does accurately and fruitfully point out the similarities between Douglass and himself (they both were born slaves, criticized the North’s complicity in slavery, and valued industrial education—however, Douglass did not denigrate higher education for black Americans, as Washington did), he fails to mention Douglass’s frequent and scorching demands for equal social and political rights, skews his relationship to John Brown and the Harper’s Ferry raid, and most of all he fails to mention Douglass’s view of amalgamation. Washington’s claim over Douglass’s legacy of leadership falls short of the facts. Douglass was a radical Republican, and demanded full inclusion of black Americans in the life of the nation, and the opening up of all opportunities for education and advancement for blacks, and Washington did not.

Du Bois’s claims over Douglass, however, also fall short. Despite Du Bois’s assumption that he has inherited the mantle of black political, social, and (he would add) cultural leadership from Douglass, Douglass’s leadership style and politics is markedly more democratic than Du Bois’s. Douglass did not envision himself as the embodiment of the spirit or culture of his people (Gooding-Williams 2009: 19–65). Although he probably saw himself as an instance of what Emerson called a “representative man”, (Emerson 1850: title) and certainly as a self-made man (Douglass 1860, 1893; Howe 1997: 137–56)—understood as moral rather than a commercial ideal—he did not envision himself as the embodiment of the spirit or culture of his people. He was a democratic thinker, and understood that particular individuals and especially leaders could fail to follow the guidance of the ideals natural law and civic republicanism.

Douglass’s political activities, however, do provide a model of sorts of democratic politics in action. He worked with a variety of groups, some underground while he was a slave, for example, eventually after becoming literate he, unbeknownst to his master, participated in at least one Sabbath School, and several other groups after his escape and emancipation (Douglass, 1852a, FDAB: 298). Some of these groups were all black, due to the condition of slavery, but as a free man he worked with integrated groups as well. These groups would have cross-cutting interests, such as in his work with the American Equal Rights Association, an organization devoted to universal suffrage. At no point did he think of himself as the singular spokesman for the movement or a group or his race. His politics were principled, in that his views were strongly directed by his acceptance of a liberal conception of natural law, and the related ideas of natural law, human liberty and equality, and the wrongness of slavery. He never shied away from pushing or arguing his views, but in terms of his practical politics, he supported active, participatory, and democratic action (Douglass 1848a).

His ideal of leadership was heavily influenced by his view of natural law, and his assumption that the role of heroes should be to stand up for what was mandated by that law. This did not lead him to a view of authoritarian, paternalistic liberalism. The principles of natural law and rights must be processed through a participatory democratic system. However, the role of the hero leadership, the political or social outsider, the heretic or eccentric, who stands against the tyranny of the majority or minority to defend human rights was absolutely valuable. In defense of the actions of John Brown, for example, Douglass wrote, putting him into heroic terms (with overtones of Carlyle and Emerson):

He believes the Declaration of Independence to be true, and the Bible to be a guide to human conduct, and acting upon the doctrines of both, he threw himself against the serried ranks of American oppression, and translated into heroic deeds the love of liberty and hatred of tyrants, with which he was inspired from both these forces acting upon his philanthropic and heroic soul. (Douglass 1859, FDLW v.2: 459)[16]

Thus, we see in his elegies to John Brown and Abraham Lincoln (Douglass 1876), in particular, the value he places on Emersonian representative men and the ideal of the statesman guided by the principles of American Civic Republicanism, and his belief in natural law, and the moral progress of the universe.

8. Women’s Suffrage

Throughout the duration of the Civil War, and in the years that followed, Douglass remained active in Republican Party politics. He was a staunch supporter of the full, uncompromising Reconstruction of the Union, and advocated for economic and education investment in free and newly-freed black Americans. He pressed for the expansion of and guarantee of civil rights for blacks, and in particular for the defense of the Civil Rights Act of 1875, which the Supreme Court declared unconstitutional in 1883 (Douglass 1883a).

In keeping with his civil rights efforts, and his view of natural rights and the development of the United States into a just Republic, he was was an early advocate of women’s suffrage (FDWR). The abolition and women’s suffrage movement, along with the temperance movement, were deeply intertwined. Douglass became involved with the American Equal Rights Association (E. DuBois 1978), and supported its dual platform of racial and sexual equality. He joined other prominent leaders in the abolition movement, such as Sojourner Truth, and emerging leaders in the suffrage movement, such as Susan B. Anthony and Elizabeth Cady Stanton, in these efforts.

There were simmering divisions in the American Equal Rights Association, due to cross-cutting and conflicting interests, and the latent racism within the organization, which was largely lead by middle-class and wealthy white women. The tensions with the American Equal Rights Association, and the suffrage movement generally, erupted over the passing of the fifteenth amendment to the U.S. Constitution. The 15th amendment franchised all male citizens, although, as U.S. history so brutally revealed, it did so in word but not in deed. Elizabeth Cady Stanton and Susan B. Anthony demanded that black men and all women be enfranchised simultaneously, and opposed the fifteenth amendment on that principle. Some among the suffrage movement based their arguments for women suffrage, and against the enfranchisement of blacks, on racist grounds. Although the white women who lead the association were abolitionists, they also, and not inconsequentially, held that blacks, and in particular, black men, were inferior to white women and neither as ready for nor deserving of the vote as themselves. Occasionally even Stanton lowered herself to draw on these claims (Stanton 1997a: 194–99; 1997b: 236–38).

Douglass communicated his sympathy with the cause for the universal franchise; however, he condemned the arguments for women’s suffrage, such as those offered by the likes of Stanton, that were predicated on assumptions of black inferiority and degrading claims that black or “Oriental” men, and by extension black and Asian women—i.e., Stanton’s nasty references to “Sambo” and “Yung Tung”—were not as deserving as white women (Douglass 1869; Stanton 1997a: 194–99). Douglass did not want to delay black male suffrage to resolve this question over suffrage for all women. He believed it a practical matter to quickly get some protections for black Americans while the fight for suffrage for black and white women continued. Moreover, he argued it was imperative to obtain some measure of political, legal, and social rights for blacks to confront the rising level of horrific anti-black violence that was sweeping the United States. Douglass firmly made this claim in his speech at the American Equal Rights Association in 1869:

I must say that I do not see how any one can pretend that there is the same urgency in giving the ballot to women as to the negro. With us, the matter is a question of life and death. It is a matter of existence, at least in fifteen states of the Union. When women, because they are women, are hunted down through the cities of New York and New Orleans; when they are dragged from their houses and hung upon lamp-posts; when their children are torn from their arms, and their brains dashed out upon the pavement; when they are objects of insult and outrage at every turn; when they are in danger of having their homes burnt down over their heads; when their children are not allowed to enter schools; then they will have an urgency to obtain the ballot equal to our own. (Douglass 1869, FDP1 v.4: 216)

When asked if this did not apply to black women, Douglass replied that it did but because they were black and not women (Douglass 1869, FDP1 v.4: 216). He did not, however, have ready answers to concerns about how well black men, including elite black men, represented and protected the rights and interests of black women. Nor did he fully appreciate the need for women to represent themselves and to be fully autonomous and independent moral agents and citizens. His shortsightedness was repeated by generations of black male leaders. It was Anna Julia Cooper (c. 1859–1964), along with other black women leaders, who best articulated that argument (see Lemert and Bhan 1998; for a general history of early black feminism, see Hine 1994).

The controversies around the passage of the fifteenth amendment, and the divisions and the eventual splitting of the American Equal Rights Association, lead to the famous criticisms of “first wave feminism” by black women leaders such as Mary Church Terrell and Anna Julia Cooper, and has continued relevance today in debates about race in feminist and black feminist philosophy (Guy-Sheftall 1995; Hine 1994).

9. At the Dawn of Jim Crow

During and after the Reconstruction, Douglass remained deeply concerned about the prospect that the U.S. would compromise on the civil and human rights of black Americans. He became increasingly concerned about the denial of black civil rights and the rising waves of anti-black violence. He, thus, criticized the growing practice of black peonage in agriculture, and over time he expressed sympathy with blacks who were fleeing the American South, although he did not support the black Exodus (see Section 6). He did not support the Exodus as a policy because he judged it bad for black labor, and that it did not address the institutional problems that caused the Exodus: peonage and exploitation, unequal justice, unrestrained violence, lack of resources and opportunities, and in particular, education. He received a great deal of criticism for his position for failing to support the individual choices of black Americans who sought to flee the inhospitable, degrading, and deadly conditions in the American South. He also criticized inequitable and unfair treatment of blacks in state criminal justice systems, in particular criticizing the Convict-Lease system (Davis 1999). And he joined with Ida B. Wells (1862–1931) in raising alarm over the growing practice of anti-black lynching in the United States (Wells-Barnett 2002; see also Lott’s “Frederick Douglass on the Myth of the Black Rapist”, in Lott 1999) He saw America’s failure to support the civil rights, and the very lives, of black Americans as indicative of its moral and political failure, and as evidence as he provocatively claimed that the Emancipation was a stupendous fraud. Douglass’s later-day activities are an important and impressive part of his record and life, and indeed a part of the evolving debates in African American philosophy and critical theory about the carceral society (Davis 1999). Notably, Angela Davis, who was a pioneer of Douglass research in philosophy in the United States, has lead the inquiry in this area; her scholarship continues to be ground-breaking, not only in relation to Douglass’s early role in this debate, but also on the issue of criminal justice, punishment, and incarceration in philosophy.


Primary Sources

Works by Douglass

  • 1845, Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, Written By Himself. Two modern editions are
    • Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, 2nd edition, David W. Blight (ed.), Boston, MA: Bedford Books of St. Martin’s Press, 2003.
    • [FDN-Davis], Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, Written by Himself: A New Critical Edition, Angela Y. Davis (ed.), San Francisco: City Lights Books, 2010.
  • 1848a, “Address to the Colored People of the United States”, in FDLW v.1: 331–36.
  • 1848b, “The Folly of Racially Exclusive Organization”, in FDP1 v.2: 109–11.
  • 1851, “To Gerrit Smith, Esq.”, January 21, in FDSW: 171–172.
  • 1852a, My Bondage and My Freedom, in FDAB: 103–452); also the standalone edition:
    • My Bondage and My Freedom, William L. Andrews (ed.), Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1987.
  • 1852b, “The Meaning of July Fourth for the Negro”, in FDLW v.2: 181–204.
  • 1854, “The Claims of the Negro Ethnologically Considered: An Address Before the Literary Societies, Western Reserve College”, July 12, Rochester, NY: Lee, Mann & co. Reprinted in FDP1 v.2: 497–525.
  • 1859, “Capt. John Brown Not Insane”, in FDLW v.2: 458–60.
  • 1860, “The Trials and Triumphs of Self-Made Men”, in FDP1 v.3: 289–300.
  • 1869, “We Welcome the Fifteenth Amendment: Addresses Delivered in New York, on 12–13 May 1869”, in FDP1 v.4: 213–19.
  • 1876, “Oration in Memory of Abraham Lincoln”, in FDLW v.4: 309–20.
  • 1879, “The Negro Exodus from the Gulf States”, in FDP1 v.4: 510–33.
  • 1881 Life and Times of Frederick Douglass, in FDAB 453–1045.
  • 1883a, “The Civil Rights Case”, in FDLW v.4: 392–403.
  • 1883b, “Address to the People of the United States”, delivered at a Convention of Colored Men, Louisville, Kentucky, September 25, in FDSW: 669–85.
  • 1884, “God Almighty Made but One Race”, in FDP1 v.5: 145–47.
  • 1888, “In Law Free; in Fact, Slave”, in FDP1 v.5: 357–73.
  • 1893, “Self-Made Men”, in FDP1 v.5: 545–75.
  • 1894a, “Lessons of the Hour”, in FDP1 v.5: 575–607.
  • 1894b, “The Folly of Colonization”, in Brotz 1992: 328–31.


  • [FDAB] Douglass: Autobiographies: Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass | My Bondage and My Freedom | Life and Times of Frederick Douglass, 1994, Henry Louis Gates, Jr. (ed.), New York, NY: Library of America.
  • [FDLW] The Life and Writings of Frederick Douglass, 1950–1975, 5 volumes (annotated v.1 – v.5 above), Philip Sheldon Foner (ed.), New York, NY: International Publishers.
  • [FDP] The Frederick Douglass Papers, New Haven, CN: Yale University Press.
    • [FDP1] Series One, Speeches, Debates, and Interviews, 5 volumes (annotated v.1 – v.5 above), John W. Blassingame (ed.), 1979.
    • [FDP2] Series Two, Autobiographical Writings, John W. Blassingame (ed.), 1979–1999.
    • [FDP3] Series Three, Correspondence, John R. McKivigan (ed.), 2009.
  • [FDSW] Frederick Douglass: Selected Speeches and Writings, 1999, 1st edition, The Library of Black America, Philip Sheldon Foner and Yuval Taylor (eds.), Chicago, IL: Lawrence Hill Books.
  • [FDWR] Frederick Douglass on Women’s Rights, 1976, Philip Sheldon Foner (ed.), Contributions in Afro-American and African Studies. Westport, CN: Greenwood Press.

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  • –––, 2018, Frederick Douglass: Prophet of Freedom, New York: Simon & Schuster.
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