Frederick Douglass

First published Wed Jun 13, 2012; substantive revision Thu Jan 12, 2023

Frederick Douglass (c. 1817–1895) is a central figure in U.S. and African American history.[1] He was born into slavery circa 1817; his mother was an enslaved black woman, while his father was reputed to be his white master. Douglass escaped from slavery in 1838 and rose to become a principal leader and spokesperson for the U.S. Abolition movement.[2] He would eventually develop into a towering figure for the U.S. Civil Rights Movement and American politics, and his legacy would be claimed by a diverse span of groups, from liberals and integrationists to conservatives to nationalists, within and without black America.

He wrote three autobiographies, each one expanding on the details of his life. The first was Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, Written By Himself (1845); the second was My Bondage and My Freedom (1855); and the third was Life and Times of Frederick Douglass (1881/1893).[3] They are now foremost examples of the American slave narrative. In addition to being autobiographical, they are also, as is standard, explicitly works of political and social criticism and moral suasion; they aim at the hearts and minds of the readers. Their greater purpose was to attack slavery, contribute to its abolition in the United States, and argue for black Americans’ full inclusion into the nation.

Shortly after escaping from slavery, Douglass began operating as a spokesperson, giving numerous speeches about his life and experiences for William Lloyd Garrison’s American Anti-Slavery Society. To spread his story and assist the abolitionist cause and counter early charges that someone so eloquent as he could not have been a slave, Douglass wrote and published his first autobiography, The Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, Written By Himself. It brought Douglass fame throughout the United States and the United Kingdom, and it provided the funds to purchase his freedom. Douglass eventually broke with Garrison and founded his first paper, the North Star. He served as its chief editor and authored a considerable body of letters, editorials, and speeches from then on. These writings are collected in Philip Foner’s multi-volume, The Life and Writings of Frederick Douglass (1950–1975), and John W. Blassingame and John R. McKivigan’s multi-volume, The Frederick Douglass Papers (1979–1992).[4]

Douglass’s advocacy in the abolition movement and his continued work after the U.S. Civil War, and his writings and participation in national discussions about the nature and future of the American Republic, made him a significant figure in American history and the history of American political ideas. His writings, speeches, and his national and international work have inspired many lines of discussion in debate within the fields of American and African American history and political science. Moreover, political thinkers representing different ideological positions, including liberals, libertarians, and economic and social conservatives, claim his legacy.

But what does anything about this have to do with philosophy? The connections between Douglass’s legacy and social and political philosophy are numerous and ongoing. His ideas about humanity, liberty, equality, property, democracy, and individual and social development addressed immediately pressing concerns, but they were also theoretical—he self-consciously addressed their moral and theological foundations. Furthermore, his work is connected to academic philosophy through the uptake of his political and social legacy and writings by later African American philosophers such as W.E.B. Du Bois (1868–1963) and Alain Locke (1884–1954).[5] In contemporary philosophy, Douglass’s work is usually taken up within American philosophy, Africana philosophy, black political philosophy, and moral, social, and political philosophy more broadly. In particular, the discussions that involve Douglass focus on his views concerning some of the topics reviewed in this entry: slavery and racial segregation; natural law and the U.S. constitution; liberalism and republicanism; violence, self-respect, and dignity; racial integration versus emigration or separation; cultural assimilation and racial amalgamation; democratic action; and women’s suffrage. Additionally, just as there is a rich discussion about Douglass in philosophy and political theory, there is a related discussion about Douglass’s rhetoric, particularly the structure and meaning of his political rhetoric as displayed in his speeches, autobiographies, and other writings.[6]

For students and teachers first learning about Douglass, there is no better place to start than his first autobiography, The Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass (1845). Next, read some of his speeches and writings referenced in this entry, especially “What To the Slave Is The Fourth of July?” (1852 [SFD: 55–92]). Then dive into the historical, political, literary, and philosophical literature about Douglass.

1. Slavery

In his narratives, speeches, and articles leading up to the U.S. Civil War, Douglass vigorously argued against slavery. He sought to demonstrate that it was cruel, unnatural, ungodly, immoral, and unjust. Douglass laid out his arguments, first in his speeches while allied with William Lloyd Garrison’s American Anti-Slavery Society, and then in his first autobiography, the Narrative. As the U.S. Civil War drew closer, he expanded his arguments in many speeches, editorials, and his second autobiography, My Bondage and My Freedom.[7]

His definition of slavery identified its immorality and injustice by pinpointing its core wrong in the brutalization and the literal commodification of another human being and the stripping of them of their natural rights:

Slavery in the United States is the granting of that power by which on man exercises and enforces a right of property in the body and soul of another. The condition of a slave is simply that of the brute beast. He is a piece of property—a marketable commodity in the language of the law, to be bought and sold at the will and caprice of the master who claims him to be his property; he is spoken of, thought of, and treated as property. His own good, his conscience, his intellect, his affections are all set aside by the master. The will and the wishes of the master are the law of the slave. He is as much a piece of property as a horse. (1846 [SFD: 23]; my emphasis)[8]

In his own words, he worked to pour out “scorching irony” to expose the evil of slavery (1852 [SFD: 71]). His rebellion against slavery began, as he recounted, while he was enslaved. In his narratives, the depiction of his early recognition and general recognition among blacks and some whites of the injustice, unnaturalness, and cruelty of slavery was a significant element of his argument. It marks his first argument against slavery. Some of the apologists for slavery claimed that blacks were beasts, subhuman, or at least a degenerated form of the human species, drawing on a racial ideology that went back to at least the fifteenth century and that was common in the British American Colonies and then the United States.[9] Thomas Jefferson, for example, infamously intimates this racist view in his Notes on the State of Virginia (1785: Query 14). Against such racist ideology, Douglass argued that blacks were human, rational, and capable of the full range of human emotions and sensitivity. He mocked slavery’s apologists for their hypocrisies and contradictions when they claimed otherwise. In “The Meaning of July Fourth for the Negro”, he is derisive of the idea that he would even need to argue this point (1852 [SFD: 55–92]).[10]

Against the claim that blacks were beasts, he argued that instead, slavery had brutalized them. He pointed to the obviousness of blacks’ humanity and mocked the hypocrisy of slavery’s apologists. He rhetorically asked: Why should there be special laws prohibiting the free actions of blacks, such as rebelling against slave masters, or any other white person, if slaves were merely bestial and incapable of independent, responsible behavior? Indeed, why had slave masters encouraged their slaves’ Christianization and then forbade their religious gatherings? Along with this hypocrisy, American slaveholders feared and banned the education of blacks while demanding and profiting from their learning and development in the skilled trades. Thus, Douglass argued the accusation that blacks were beasts was predicated on the guilty knowledge that they were humans. Additionally, it subverted not only the natural goodness of blacks by brutalizing them, but it also did so to white slaveholders and those otherwise innocent whites affected by this wicked institution. Slavery, Douglass pointed out, consistent with Jefferson’s anxieties in Query 18 of the Notes on the State of Virginia (1785), was a poison in the body of the republic.

Second, since blacks were humans, Douglass argued they were entitled to the natural rights that natural law mandated (§2 and §3) and that the United States recognized in the Declaration of Independence and Constitution (§4). Slavery subverted the natural rights of blacks by subjugating and brutalizing them: taking men and turning them, against God’s will and nature, into beasts. Third, as an affront to natural law, slavery contradicted God’s laws and corresponding moral duties to others. As a witness and participant of the second Great Awakening, he took the politicized rhetoric of Christian redemption—personal and social liberation from sin—seriously. Douglass viewed redemption as intrinsically wrapped up with freedom from slavery and national liberation like other abolitionists. Fourth, he argued that slavery was inconsistent with the idea of America, with its national narrative and highest ideals, and not just with its founding documents. Fifth, drawing on theories of providential historical development (echoing common American views of manifest destiny), he argued that slavery was inconsistent with moral, political, economic, and social progress. Insofar as it propagated and protected slave power, America was on the wrong side of history on the question of slavery.

The apologists of slavery drew on the same ideological vein of historical progress to offer the defense that slavery was a benevolent and paternal system for the mutual benefit of whites and blacks. Douglass countered that calumny by drawing on his experiences, and the experiences of other enslaved black Americans, that American slavery was in no way benevolent. It brutalized black people. Slavery subjected them to debilitating, murderous violence, sexual violence and exploitation, split up families, denied them education, exploited their labor, and denied their natural property rights. Slavery, as Douglass’s relentlessly argued, was a deep and enduring injustice and evil. Enslaved black people were not happy slaves benefiting from the largess of kind, gentile white masters. Neither were they lacking in agency, self-esteem, self-respect, or a sense of dignity. They were moral beings, fully aware of the rights and capabilities they were unjustly deprived of. As Douglass proclaimed to the nation and world, black Americans wanted freedom, independence, the recognition of their full personhood, moral equality, and their rights as U.S. citizens (McGary and Lawson, 1992).[11]

2. Natural Law

The ideas that Douglass drew on in his arguments against slavery originate from natural law theory and Christian theology. Douglass was an Enlightenment thinker, a nineteenth-century modernist, and a Protestant, so natural law in his view was a combination of the prescriptions of reason and revelation evident in the historical and civilizational progress of humanity. One of his clearest articulations of this combined view is from a 1853 speech, “The Present Condition And Future Prospects of the Negro People” (1853b [FDSW: 250–259]), where condemns declares,

Slavery has no means within itself of perpetuation or permanence. It is a huge lie. It is of the Devil, and it will go to its place. It is against nature, against progress, against improvement, and against the Government of God. It cannot stand. It has an enemy in every bar of railroad iron, in every electric wire, in every improvement in navigation, in the growing intercourse of nations, in cheap postage, in the relaxation of tariffs, in common schools, in the progress of education, the spread of knowledge, in the steam engine, and in the World’s Fair…and in everything that will be exhibited there. (1853b [FDSW: 259])[12]

The sources for his driving belief in natural law and its moral implications were many: the founding documents of the United States; popular intellectuals, such as Ralph Waldo Emerson and his colleagues and acquaintances in the American Abolition movement; the allies he encountered abroad; and his appreciation of George Combe’s The Constitution of Man, from 1834 (Van Wyhe 2004). However, given the numerous religious references in his speeches and writings, a primary source for his employment of the idea of natural law was his adaptation of the American Protestantism of the Second Great Awakening, with its democratic and republican values and generally independent spirit. All of this is on prominent display at the conclusion of his famous speech, “The Meaning of July Fourth for the Negro”:

The arm of the Lord is not shortened“, and the doom of slavery is certain. I, therefore, leave off where I began, with hope. While drawing encouragement from the Declaration of Independence, the great principles it contains, and the genius of American Institutions, my spirit is also cheered by the obvious tendencies of the age. (1852 [SFD: 90])

Relying on the deus ex machina was not enough for Douglass. His vision of natural rights involved action; his image of civic republicanism emphasized the need for active participation to claim or earn one’s rights and status as a citizen (Davis 1971; Pettit 1997; Myers 2008; Gooding-Williams 2009). As Douglass scathingly pointed out, the slave-holding states resisted the abolition of slavery, and many Americans were apathetic about its cruel injustices—humans resist providential justice. Therefore, he argued, the end of slavery required agitation, protest, and, if needed, military intervention.

Douglass longed for God to cast his thunderbolts of judgment at American slave power, but he knew that human action was needed to abolish slavery in America (Blight 1989: 26–58). His view of, if you will, enacted providence is on full display at the end of his famous Fourth of July speech of 1852, where he cited Psalm 68:31 and paired the idea of God’s fiat with the image of Africa and Asia rising:

The far off and almost fabulous Pacific rolls in grandeur at our feet. The Celestial Empire, the mystery of ages, is being solved. The fiat of the Almighty, ”Let there be Light“, has not yet spent its force. No abuse, no outrage whether in taste, sport or avarice, can now hide itself from the all-pervading light. The iron shoe, and crippled foot of China must be seen, in contrast with nature. Africa must rise and put on her yet unwoven garment. ”Ethiopia shall stretch out her hand unto God“. (1852 [SFD: 91])[13]

There are many possible concerns about Douglass’s view of natural law, manifest destiny, and providence, which we can discern from a careful reading of the passage above; they involve a belief in historical teleological development and the human costs of that assumption. These costs include affirming nineteenth-century conceptions of civilizational backwardness of non-European societies or peoples. Thus, he is relatively silent about the United States’ destructive actions against indigenous peoples.

This aspect of Douglass’s views led Wilson Jeremiah Moses to characterize him and other early black political figures as ”Moses“ figures: exodus leaders, recipients of natural law for a chosen people. The chosen people, in this case, are African Americans in their travail for freedom, as well as the American Republic as a whole. Douglass—twinned eternally with Abraham Lincoln—is a lawgiver in the American civil religion (Moses 1978). This monumental, world-historical vita aside, Douglass’s faith in progress, although tested to its breaking point, resulted in his putting too much belief in the inevitability of progress. Nonetheless, his faith had a moral, social, and political purpose. He had no time for political pessimism, which is either a narcotizing sentiment for those who have surrendered to despair or a performative luxury whose decadence only those secure in their liberty can afford.

3. On Liberty

Instead of surrendering to despair, he joined the abolition movement after escaping slavery. And for that grand purpose, natural law and rights were ideas he believed in and used to significant effect. Thus, in his writings, his writings he repeatedly makes clear and direct references to concepts that flow from liberalism: liberty; moral and social equality; individuality; property rights, self-defense, and speech; the moral and instrumental value of labor; democracy; and composite (what we would call multiethnic or multiracial) nationality. This is why he is rightly associated with liberalism (Myers 2008; Buccola 2012). The relation between Douglass’s works and those ideas is apparent; however, three merit highlighting because they are not typically emphasized in the theoretical literature about Douglass: free speech, property, and composite nationality.

Douglass’s life after abolition speaks to the importance of the freedoms of speech, thought, and opinion and the great value he placed on them. From his efforts to learn how to read and write to his desire to start his own newspaper, his attitude and actions aggressively asserted the indivisible links between equal liberty and the right to think and speak one’s mind. Like the name of his first newspaper, this value was his North Star. So, on 9 December 1860, in response to the violent disruption of a meeting he was participating in, Douglass directly addressed the matter in his speech, ”A Plea for Freedom of Speech in Boston“, wherein he delivered a classic liberal defense of it that still resonates:

There can be no right where any man however, lifted up or humble, however young or however old, is overawed by force, and compelled to suppress his honest sentiments. (1860c [FDP1 v.3: 423])

The silencing of speech squashes thought, opinion, and discussion, and doing so, as Douglass pointed out—consistent with other philosophers on liberty—commits a ”double wrong. It violates the right of the hearer as well as those of the speaker (Ibid.).[14]

On property, Douglass argues, as expected, against human bondage. That, however, was not the only thing he had to say about it. The positive right to property, the right of black Americans to their bodies, the labor of their bodies, and the wealth generated from their productivity are ideas that feature prominently throughout the narratives. Douglass wrote movingly about the productivity of his labor, the exploitation of it by his enslavers and those in their employ, the theft of his rightfully earned wages, and the anger of some white laborers who resented having to work and compete with free black workers. The right to self-ownership, labor, and property were not just mere things denied to him—they were expressions, products, and symbols of his liberty and liberty in general. In the Narrative, for example, on the theft of his wages by Hugh Auld, his master’s brother, Douglass wrote,

I was now getting, as I have said, one dollar and fifty cents per day. I contracted for it; I earned it; it was paid to me; it was rightfully my own; yet, upon each returning Saturday night, I was compelled to deliver every cent of that money to Master Hugh. And why? Not because he earned it,—not because he had any hand in earning it,—not because I owed it to him, nor because he possessed the slightest shadow of a right to it; but solely because he had the power to compel me to give it up. The right of the grim-visaged pirate upon the high seas is exactly the same. (FDAB: 84)

From the Civil War through Reconstruction and its betrayal, Douglass continued to see the right to property as a necessary part of genuine emancipation. He wrote and frequently spoke about the ennobling, moral, and economic power of labor, private property, and individual productivity in articles before emancipation like, “What Shall be Done with the Slave if Emancipated” from 1862 (FDSW: 470–473) to speeches like “Self-Made Men” from 1893 (SFD: 414–453).

On composite nationality, or what we would call multiethnic democracy, Douglass’s “Our Composite Nationality” from 1869a (SFD: 278–303) is a ringing endorsement of a robust vision of civic belonging and national identification. It is an outlook that reflects his support for organic processes of assimilation and amalgamation and social reform. More on that below (§§6–8 and §12).

Just as he drew on liberal ideas, he repeatedly invoked ideas of American civic republicanism and advocated for democratic reform, action, and, eventually, universal suffrage (§11). This democratic advocacy has led some philosophers to view Douglass as a civic republican as much as he was a liberal (Gooding-Williams 2009). The evidence for that connection naturally arises from the wide variety of his democratic associational activity. It is modeled in his narratives, particularly in My Bondage and My Freedom, in its depictions of social organization, action, solidarity, friendship, and affection among black men and women (FDAB: 305–306).

Whether we understand Douglass as a liberal or civic republican (or even as a type of black nationalist or black radical liberal), the values and ideas he drew on were the foundation of his fierce denunciations of and active resistance to American slavery and his interpretation of the U.S. Constitution.

4. The U.S. Constitution

In 1851 Douglass broke from William Lloyd Garrison’s position that the U.S. Constitution was a pro-slavery document and that the free states should peacefully secede from the Union. In a letter to Gerrit Smith, he reported that he was “sick and tired of arguing on the slaveholder’s side…” (21 January 1851 [FDSW: 171–173]). So, he decided to break with Garrison and side with Smith and the Liberty party’s position that the United States’ founding documents were anti-slavery (Blight 1989: 26–58; Root 2020).

In his famous speech on the topic, “What To the Slave Is The Fourth of July?” (1852 [SFD: 55–92]), he detailed his signature positions on the U.S. Constitution: that slavery is contrary to natural law, that blacks are self-evidently human and entitled to natural rights, and that slavery is inconsistent with the Constitution, American Republicanism, and Christian doctrine, and that it should be forcefully—violently—resisted.[15] A principal example of this shift is the changes in his second autobiography, My Bondage and My Freedom (1855, FDAB); particularly relevant is the extra and weighty meaning he imparts to the famous scene of his fight with the slave breaker Covey (§5).

Douglass acknowledged that initially, he accepted the view, promoted by William Lloyd Garrison and allies aligned with him, that the framers intended to allow slavery to continue in the slave states and that the Constitution was thereby consistent with the institution of slavery. However, the Garrisonian view of the Constitution resulted in passivity in the face of the Slave-holding states’ threat of succession. That position did not sit well with Douglass because he wanted a more aggressive stance and strategy for abolishing slavery and the emancipation of the enslaved, including in the southern slave-holding states. Plus, he became convinced of the natural law reading of the U.S. Constitution that foregrounded the values outlined in the U.S. Declaration of Independence. What convinced him were the arguments of Gerrit Smith, Lysander Spooner, William Goddell, and Samuel E. Sewall that the Constitution was an anti-slavery document and that the founders were at cross-purposes on the question of slavery. Douglass argued that the general ideas of America’s founding documents supported an interpretation of the U.S. Constitution as an evolving document in tune with the development of civilization. Thus, he intoned the call, “let there be light”, to capture his hope for abolition, emancipation, and universal political and social progress (1852 [SFD: 91]).

Douglass’s view of the Constitution is one of the reasons why he is associated with the assimilationist (or what is better understood as the integrationist tradition) tradition in African American political thought. It sets him up for the criticism that he did not squarely recognize the racialized character of the nation, how deeply embedded race and racism were in its institutions, and that it was in many respects a racial state.[16] Douglass, however, was not blithe to the nation’s sins—he repeatedly and forcefully condemned them through the end of his life (§12). His reading of the Constitution was reasonable, grounded in his affirmation of natural law theory, and it was an essential part of the history of abolition (Sinha 2016; Delbanco 2018).

5. Violence and Self-Defense

Douglass remained active in the years leading up to the U.S. Civil War. He advocated for the abolition of slavery, worked against the expansion of slavery into new U.S. territories, and vigorously protested the Dred Scott decision and related laws that protected the property rights of slaveholders over slaves who escaped to the Free States in the North.

He was a member of the Liberty party, was involved in other political parties, including the Radical and Free Soil parties, and eventually became involved with the Republican party—all for the sake of abolition and the support of equal citizenship for all Americans (Blight 1989 and 2018). Douglass even met the militant abolitionist, John Brown. Although Douglass declined to join Brown’s militia—he sensed the deadly potential of Brown’s zealotry and the likelihood of its failure—he defended Brown’s ideals and denounced claims that Brown was merely mad. Although Douglass distanced himself from Brown’s plans and destructive actions, he appropriated Brown as a symbol of righteous violence against the national sin of slavery and used the raid at Harper’s Ferry to criticize President Lincoln’s reluctance to support abolitionism (1859 [FDSW: 372–376]; 1860b [FDSW: 417–421]; Myers 2008: 63–73; Blight 1989: 95–100).

Douglass’s rejection of pacifism and his support for Federal military intervention to end slavery was a significant turning point in his thought about natural law, divine providence and manifest destiny, and constitutional interpretation. Douglass’s defense of jus ad Bellum greatly affected his contemporaries and the resulting debate on slavery, struggle, and self-respect. The modern debate over violence and self-respect in African American philosophy, critical race theory, and black political theory begins with Douglass’s narratives, particularly his famous fight with the “Negro breaker”, Edward Covey. This incident plays a significant role in all of Douglass’s narratives: Covey represents the brutalizing institution of American slavery, and Douglass’s fight and victory represent the assertion of manhood, self-respect, dignity, and freedom. However, Douglass’s time with Covey and the suffering he endured by Covey’s hand is given a lengthier description in My Bondage and My Freedom than in the Narrative. In the former, the depiction of the fight explicitly draws parallels between Douglass’s battle with Covey and the struggles of black Americans against slavery and racial degradation.

Additionally, his fight has explicit national political connotations (Gooding-Williams 2009; Myers 2008). The scene’s depiction in each autobiography is powerful and indicates its narrative brilliance (literary, rhetorical, and philosophical), so it deserves to be quoted at length. In the Narrative (1845), Douglass wrote:

The battle with Mr. Covey was the turning-point in my career as a slave. It rekindled the few expiring embers of freedom, and revived within me a sense of my own manhood. It recalled the departed self-confidence, and inspired me again with a determination to be free. The gratification afforded by the triumph was a full compensation for whatever else might follow, even death itself. He only can understand the deep satisfaction which I experienced, who has himself repelled by force the bloody arm of slavery. I felt as I never felt before. It was a glorious resurrection, from the tomb of slavery, to the heaven of freedom. My long-crushed spirit rose, cowardice departed, bold defiance took its place; and I now resolved that, however long I might remain a slave in form, the day had passed forever when I could be a slave in fact. I did not hesitate to let it be known of me, that the white man who expected to succeed in whipping, must also succeed in killing me. (FDAB: 65)

In My Bondage and My Freedom (1855), he gives the following expanded interpretation:

Well, my dear reader, this battle with Mr. Covey,—undignified as it was, and as I fear my narration of it is—was the turning point in my “life as a slave”. It rekindled in my breast the smouldering embers of liberty; it brought up my Baltimore dreams, and revived a sense of my own manhood. I was a changed being after that fight. I was nothing before; I WAS A MAN NOW. It recalled to life my crushed self-respect and my self-confidence, and inspired me with a renewed determination to be a FREEMAN. A man, without force, is without the essential dignity of humanity. Human nature is so constituted, that it cannot honor a helpless man, although it can pity him; and even this it cannot do long, if the signs of power do not arise. (FDAB: 286, original emphases)

The first passage displays Douglass’s romantic and religious influences; it swells with the longing for the freedom of the soul. The second passage, written without the demands of Garrison’s pacifist politics directing his pen, screams independence and force. It recommends violence—it advocates for the coming U.S. Civil War—to throw off tyranny and claim, defend, and even fulfill one’s honor and humanity.

6. Respect and Dignity

The fight with Covey has inspired several philosophical interpretations of Douglass’s intentions and the meaning of his struggle. It is commonly read as an exemplar of the conception of the state of war within liberal political theory (Davis 1971) and the interpersonal, or generally relational, dynamics of respect and recognition.[17] In particular, Bernard Boxill (1997 and 1998) developed an exceptionally influential deontological account of Douglass’s fight as emblematic of the individual sense of self-respect of oneself as a moral being.[18] That self-recognition comes with the obligation to defend one’s self-respect and to expect respect from others, which implies that others should recognize one’s inherent dignity. For Douglass, that fight was a parable—like Jacob’s wrestling with an angel (Genesis 32:24–32 [KJV]),[19] except in this case, the antagonist was more demonic than angelic—about the American and black American fight against slavery and racism.

What is more, Douglass’s evocation of dignity in his narrative of the fight is intellectually and emotionally stunning. “A man, without force”, he intensely asserted, “is without the essential dignity of humanity”. He adds to that the claim that

[h]uman nature is so constituted, that it cannot honor a helpless man, although it can pity him; and even this it cannot do long, if the signs of power do not arise. (FDAB, 286, original emphases)

The moral weightiness of the idea of dignity and his use of it invites us to consider whether it plays a special role in his thought and its relation to his frequently repeated arguments and assertions of the humanity and equal moral personhood of black people. Most of his mentions of dignity in his speeches and writings primarily refer to it as an ordinary sense of respectful comportment and propriety. Nonetheless, everyday assertions of dignity, even passive ones, have morally serious implications for individuals, groups, and societies under conditions of absolute domination, such as faced by black Americans during slavery and Jim Crow segregation. Assertions of everyday dignity could often be met with severe and sometimes violent consequences under those conditions—a fact that Douglass highlighted and condemned throughout his life. When Douglass referred to moral personhood as such (the essential moral worth of persons), he typically used the ideas of “equality”, “perfect human equality”, “manhood”, “brotherhood”, and “universal human brotherhood”.

There are, however, moments, as noted in the passage above from My Bondage and My Freedom, where his usage of “dignity” explicitly points to the idea of equal moral personhood.

The same is true in an editorial he wrote in 1850 responding to slander, verbal assaults, and a physical one:

My crime is, that I have assumed to be a man, entitled to all the rights, privileges and dignity, which belong to human nature—that color is no crime, and that all men are brother. I have acted on this presumption. The very “head and front of my offending hath this extent—no more”. I have not merely talked of human brotherhood and human equality, but have reduced that talk to practice. This I have done in broad open day, scorning concealment. I have walked through the streets of New York, in company with white persons, not as a menial, but as an equal. (1850 [FDSW: 157]; my emphases)

As discussed in the previous sections on slavery, natural law, liberty, the U.S. Constitution, and self-defense, Douglass vigorously defended equal personhood and thus the moral equality of black people. On that basis, he condemned slavery as an affront to natural law, Christianity, and republicanism. Therefore, regardless of the frequency he referred to the term “dignity”, he does get at the idea, and it does play a central role (along with and defined through the constellation of other ideas he drew on) in his political philosophical thought. Perhaps then, a basic account of dignity, as indicative of individual moral worth, is all that is needed to understand Douglass’s view. Stopping with that, however, would impart a sense of passivity to it. Douglass’s view was not simply static.

Dignity, for Douglass, is a natural and innate thing, bequeathed to all humans as humans. It is static or changeless in that limited sense. At the same time, Douglass suggests that willful action, epitomized by self-defense, was a condition of what was otherwise an inherent and essential quality of being a human person. It is something to be practiced.[20] But if dignity is innate and inherent, why must an individual practice it for it to be said that they have it? If it is an essential quality, then its practice or expression cannot be a condition of its possession. Douglass is not equivocating on this point. An individual’s equal moral status comes with the obligation to inhabit, abide by, and defend that status.[21] This is how we should understand Douglass’s view of dignity as modeled by his open-air rejection of servility and assertion of equality.

All the same, Douglass does not, nor could he, consistently hold that every enslaved black person needed to have an equivalent “fight with Covey” moment and assertion of “manhood” to secure their dignity and natural right to be treated as a moral equal. Directly related to this concern is the continuing discussion of whether the depiction of the fight with Covey and its meaning and value promote a masculinist vision of anti-slavery resistance, liberty, and autonomy (Wallace 2009 and 2014; Alfaro 2018). Douglass did not think that the attitudes and actions of the enslaved conditioned the immorality of slavery and the imperative of emancipation, so what counts as resistance to indignities of injustice requires careful and charitable consideration that is attentive to the constraints of individual circumstances and social conditions.

The bravado in Douglass’s wonderful affront to racism aside, his vision of self-respect, dignity, and the obligation to defend oneself and one’s dignity is central to his legacy. It plays a vital role in the history of African American political theory, and for that reason, given this nation’s history, it is a valuable contribution to American political philosophy about respect, dignity, and personhood. Its implications are profound, as can be seen in his view of universal human brotherhood.

7. Universal Human Brotherhood

Douglass’s conception of providence, with its American themes of individualism, anti-supernaturalism, and activism, and his view of natural law influenced his understanding of universal human brotherhood (Sundstrom 2003 and 2008: 11–35). He believed that the idea of universal human brotherhood was consistent with the high ideals of American Republicanism and Christianity. It was a doctrine dearly held by Douglass, and he offered it as a response to the rise in the United States of Samuel Morton’s (1799–1851) racial theory of polygenesis, that Josiah Nott and George Gliddon’s Types of Mankind (1854) popularized (Martin 1984; Myers 2008).

Douglass put considerable effort into countering arguments that blacks were subhuman, intellectually and morally inferior, and fit to be dominated as children, forever to be a race in nonage. To counter these claims, he turned to his natural law arguments. He argued that by the standards of Christian theology, blacks, as humans and creations of the divine, were all equally the children of God, no matter their present condition. One of his slogans, drawn directly from the title of a poem by the Scottish poet Robert Burns, got to the point: “A man’s a man for a’ that” (1795).[22] Douglass argued that the Christian Bible had to be correct on this score, that the authority of the biblical text relied on the affirmation of the unity of the human family:

What, after all, if they are able to show very good reasons for believing the Negro to have been created precisely as we find him on the Gold Coast—along the Senegal and the Niger—I say, what of all this?—“A man’s a man for a’ that”. I sincerely believe, that the weight of the argument is in favor of the unity of origin of the human race, or species—that the arguments on the other side are partial, superficial, utterly subversive of the happiness of man, and insulting to the wisdom of God. Yet, what if we grant they are not so? What, if we grant that the case, on our part, is not made out? Does it follow, that the Negro should be held in contempt? Does it follow, that to enslave and imbrue him is either just or wise? I think not. Human rights stand upon a common basis; and by all the reason that they are supported, maintained and defended, for one variety of the human family, they are supported, maintained and defended for all the human family; because all mankind have the same wants, arising out of a common nature. A diverse origin does not disprove a common nature, nor does it disprove a united destiny. (1854 [SFD: 147] [FDP1 v.2: 523])

He emphasized that not only was slavery against natural law and Christian morality but that the very arguments concerning the subhuman status of blacks that slavery’s apologists used to justify attempted slavery contradicted the Bible and were heretical. Douglass, in short, leveraged the Bible and America’s reverence for it against the rising tide of polygenesis race theory. He stated:

The unity of the human race—the brotherhood of man—the reciprocal duties of all to each, and of each to all, are too plainly taught in the Bible to admit of cavil.—The credit of the Bible is at stake—and if it be too much to say, that it must stand or fall, by the decision of this question, it is proper to say, that the value of that sacred Book—as a record of the early history of mankind—must be materially affected, by the decision of the question. (1854 [SFD: 126] [FDP1 v.2: 505])

The doctrine of universal human brotherhood for Douglass, and the abolitionists, was based on the Bible’s creation story and Acts 17:26 [KJV]: “And hath made of one blood all nations of men for to dwell on all the face of the earth”.

These words were not mere words for Douglass and the abolitionists; they were not just-so stories. The Christian doctrine of the unity of the human family or human brotherhood contained the world-historical insight of equal human dignity, which implied—unleashed, as seen in several revolutions in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries—an uncompromising demand for moral equality and equal liberty.

8. Amalgamation and Assimilation

Douglass’s affirmation of universal human brotherhood, his belief in providential human development, and his observation of the mixing of racialized groups in the United States led him to directly support racial amalgamation: race-mixing was a sign of progress for Frederick Douglass. It is important to note here that he thought there were races to amalgamate, so he affirmed the basic idea that biologically distinct races existed (1854 [SFD: 116–150]). As his view of universal human brotherhood should be clear, he did not think much followed from that admission. The existence of biological races did not, in his view, negate the theological-philosophical insight of universal human brotherhood.

Douglass understood that the sexual boundaries between the races were thin and that, indeed, the conditions of slavery led to a great deal of mixing. Recall that he maintained that his unacknowledged father was his white master, and, in no uncertain terms, he condemned the rape, sexual violence, and exploitation of black women. Yet, given his commitment to his ideals, Douglass promoted amalgamation between free peoples. He believed that blacks and white ought to be free to intermarry and that they should do so. Why should they marry? Douglass, sensing the transformation of the black and Native American population in the United States, believed this process was a natural and continual process; that a new third race, an American race, would emerge in this land. During his time, such views were highly inflammatory and served, and continued to serve, as a reason against the emancipation of enslaved black people and later as a justification for segregation (Sundstrom 2008: 11–35). Nonetheless, in the 1860s, he boldly advocated for amalgamation between the races. He remarked to a journalist, the day after his second marriage to Helen Pitts, who was white,

…there is no division of races. God Almighty made but one race. I adopt the theory that in time the varieties of races will be blended into one. Let us look back when the black and the white people were distinct in this country. In two hundred and fifty years there has grown up a million of intermediate. And this will continue. You may say that Frederick Douglass considers himself a member of the one race which exists. (1884 [FDP1 v.5: 147])

Douglass’s amalgamation is easy to confuse with his support for assimilation. Amalgamation is conceptually distinct from assimilation; one does not have to accept amalgamation to support assimilation. Assimilation concerns various degrees of acculturation. It can theoretically go in either direction, from black to white or white to black, and it can involve the subtle blending of both and many groups (Sundstrom 2008). His support for amalgamation and assimilation could not be any clearer than what he proclaimed in “On Composite Nationality”, in which he called for the molding of all in the land into a common Americanness (1869a [SFD: 278–303]; §12). In his enthusiasm for this molding, he is distinct, but he was not exceptional in his support of assimilation; several of his contemporaries and leaders who followed him supported some degree of assimilation. Even some of Douglass’s early critics, such as Edward Blyden (1832–1912), Martin Delany (1812–1885), and Alexander Crummell (1819–1898), who did not support amalgamation, still believed in the assimilation of black Americans to the standards and values Western civilization (Moses 1978).

9. Integration versus Emigration

Douglas advocated assimilation and amalgamation, so, understandably, he supported the right of black Americans to remain in the United States and thought they ought to do so. Rather than leave the country to find homes and start lives abroad in places that they imagined might provide friendlier quarters, Douglass urged black Americans to stay and support abolition efforts and then, in the postbellum years, to fight for equal rights and citizenship. He can be considered a primary example of the political ideal of racial integration as distinct from racial separatism. Douglass’s amalgamation-assimilationist views of the 1860s are not the desegregationist and integrationist ideas associated with the U.S. Civil Rights movement that began around the mid-1950s. Other thinkers and movements influenced those views, which advocated for equal rights, protection, citizenship, and equal access to schools, colleges and universities, and neighborhoods. Yet, Douglass is a fitting icon for the American integrationist impulse.

In his essay from 1848, “The Folly of Racially Exclusive Organization”, Douglass criticized the creation of separate societies, with distinct “negro pews, negro berths in steamboats, negro cars, Sabbath or week-day schools or churches”, and in other social spaces and institutions (FDP1 v.2: 110–111). Formal racial segregation and informal separatism generally served the interests of the defenders of slavery; thus, after the U.S. Civil War, Douglass regarded ongoing racial separatism as a counter to the ideals of the abolition movement. It was a message he frequently repeated (1848a [FDSW: 117–122]).

He opposed plans for black American emigration to Africa, the Caribbean, Mexico, or Latin America for similar reasons. He criticized the emigrationist visions of the American Colonization Society, founded by whites, and the African Civilization Society, founded by blacks. He had four reasons to oppose emigration schemes: First, for slavery to end, Douglass argued that black Americans needed to struggle against it in America. Second, Americans had no other home but the United States; they were uniquely American and products of American history. Third, black Americans had a right to the property their labor had produced. By abandoning the United States, they would leave the land they had built. In his 1894 speech, “Lessons of the Hour” (SFD: 454–497), he wrote,

The native land of the American Negro in America. His bones, his muscles, his sinews, are all American. His ancestors for two hundred and seventy years have lived and laboured and died, on American soil, and millions of his posterity have inherited Caucasian blood. It is competent, therefore, to ask, in view of this admixture, as well as in view of other facts, where the people of this mixed-race are to go, for their ancestors are white and black, and it will be difficult to find their native land anywhere outside of the United States. (1894 [SFD: 485]).

Fourth, according to Douglass, emigration and separation were contrary to historical development and the emergence of a composite nation comprised of a blended people. All the same, Douglass was not opposed to blacks collectively acting in self-help and self-defense. Nonetheless, his opposition to emigration displayed a downside of his commitment to his natural law and manifest destiny-inspired principles. He did not appreciate enough how immigration might be more than a reasonable act of self-preservation and self-determination—in the face of anti-black life-crushing oppression and murderous violence—much like his own escape from slavery.[23] Initially, Douglass even opposed the internal migration of black Americans from the southern states to the northern ones (Myers 2008). However, he moderated his position nearer the end of his life (1879 [FDP1 v.4: 510–533]; 357 [FDP1 v.5: 357–373]); 1894 [SFD: 454–497]).

10. Leadership

Douglass was a leader among the Americans involved in the abolition movement, and after the Civil War, although unelected into any office, he remained a leading voice for black Americans.[24] Garrison presented Douglass as a victim of and witness to slavery and as a spokesperson for Garrisonian abolitionism, but he freed himself from their restraints, just as he freed himself from slavery. To speak for himself, be his own man, and be a leader among men. That is what Douglass wanted. Thus, he shaped his own story, insisted on speaking his mind free from the control of handlers like Garrison, and strove to represent the interests of black Americans.

His example of leadership was quick to be seized and claimed by other prospective black leaders and spokespersons. The most significant example of this was the conflicting claim between W.E.B. Du Bois and Booker T. Washington (1856–1915) over Douglass’s legacy. Both men competed for the opportunity to publish a biography of Douglass with the publishers George W. Jacobs & Company in their series The American Crisis Biographies (Sundstrom 2008: 11–35). The press rejected Du Bois’s bid for this task in favor of Washington’s (1907) and granted Du Bois the project of writing a biography of John Brown instead—but he included within it an extensive discussion on Douglass (Du Bois 1909).

After the death of Douglass, Du Bois penned an unpublished elegiac poem, “The Passing of Douglass” (Du Bois 1999: ix), and he incorporated elements of Douglass’s narrative in The Souls of Black Folk (1903 [1999: xxii]), John Brown (1909), and Black Reconstruction in America (1935 [2021]). Du Bois presented Douglass as a self-assertive freedom fighter and a leader of an activist community that demanded full social and political liberty, equality, and inclusion. Du Bois’s Douglass was not an accommodationist: He was not the sort of black leader who paid obeisance to white leaders and consented to an oppressive status quo, all for a token pittance or self-aggrandizement. Du Bois made this pointed interpretation very clear in his The Souls of Black Folks. In the third chapter (“Of Mr. Booker T. Washington and Others”) of Souls, Du Bois argues against Booker T. Washington’s accommodationism in favor of his and Douglass’s demand for, and assertion of, black political and social equality and rights. Economic liberty is not enough, and any gains in the economic sphere would be hampered and vulnerable without the protections and opportunities provided by social and political liberty and rights. And, of course, economic considerations aside, the fight for equal rights and liberty is not solely about economic opportunity—it is about equal dignity and one’s full humanity.

However, it is essential to note that Du Bois took on Douglass’s mantle of leadership after he argued against Douglass’s view of assimilation and amalgamation. In “The Conservation of Races”, Du Bois rejected amalgamation, which Douglass supported, and advocated for conserving a distinct black identity and community (1897 [1992]). Here is his critical reduction of the amalgamation position:

It may, however, be objected here that the situation of our race in America renders this attitude impossible; that our sole hope of salvation lies in our being able to lose our race identity in the commingled blood of the nation; and that nay other course would merely increase the friction of races which we call race prejudice, and against which we have so long and so earnestly fought. (Du Bois 1897 [1992: 488])

Du Bois, in opposition to amalgamation, argued that black Americans ought to embrace a “stalwart originality” that follows “Negro Ideals” and not dissolve into a general American identity (Ibid.). It is a view associated with cultural pluralism that expresses an early version of black cultural nationalism. And as such, it is a historical conceptual landmark in debates in African social and political thought over racial separation versus assimilation and the conservation of race (Boxill 1992a: 173–85; 1992b; 1999; McGary 1999a; 1999b: 43–61; Pittman 1999).[25]

Because of his cultural pluralism, it is tempting to think that Du Bois rejected Douglass’s view of assimilation and integration, but that would be a mistake. He turned away from Douglass’s vision of total assimilation in favor of retaining some black ideals, which he too quickly assumed that all blacks qua blacks share. Still, his cultural pluralism has at its end the creation of a community that is a “co-worker” in the “kingdom of culture” (Du Bois 1903 [1999: 11]). What results from Du Bois’s rejection of amalgamation and acceptance of some elements of assimilation is the brilliant idea of double consciousness, especially the double consciousness brought on by the black American experience. As is evident from the rhetorical questions at the end of the following passage, Du Bois argued against Douglass’s hopes of amalgamation and presaged his view of black political, social, and cultural solidarity:

No Negro who has given earnest thought to the situation of his people in America has failed, at some time in life, to find himself at these cross-roads; has failed to ask himself at some time: What, after all, am I? Am I an American or am I a Negro? Can I be both? Or is it my duty to cease to be a Negro as soon as possible and be an American? If I strive as a Negro, am I not perpetuating the very cleft that threatens and separates Black and White America? Is not my only possible aim the subduction of all that is Negro in me to the American? Does my black blood place upon me any more obligation to assert my nationality than German, or Irish or Italian blood would? (Du Bois 1897 [1992: 488])

Du Bois’s answers to these questions directly contradict Douglass’s view about amalgamation. However, their opinions about assimilation share similarities, such as the co-production and enjoyment of a shared American culture. In the end, however, Du Bois’s image of Douglass is skewed toward his political projects of elite leadership, racial solidarity, and uplift.

Likewise, Booker T. Washington’s Douglass is equally a work of art that reflects the artist’s image. His The Life of Frederick Douglass (1907) presents a picture of Douglass contrary to Du Bois’s and is incompatible with many of Douglass’s views. It is, in part, a work of self-promotion. Although Washington accurately pointed out the similarities between Douglass and himself, he failed to mention Douglass’s assertions of equal personhood, his uncompromising demands for equal social and political rights, and that Douglass fully expected that black Americans would fully integrate into a “composite nation”. Washington’s claim over Douglass’s legacy of leadership falls short of the facts. Douglass was a radical Republican and demanded full inclusion of black Americans in the nation’s life and the opening of all opportunities for education and advancement for blacks, and Washington did not.

Du Bois’s claims over Douglass, however, also fall short. Despite Du Bois’s assumption that he had inherited the mantle of black political, social, and (he would add) cultural leadership from Douglass, Douglass’s leadership style and politics were markedly more democratic than Du Bois’s. Although Douglass likely saw himself as an instance of what Ralph Waldo Emerson called a “representative man” (Emerson 1850 [2004]) and as a self-made man to boot (1893 [SFD: 414–453]; 1860d [FDP1 v.3: 289–300]), he did not envision himself as the embodiment of the spirit or culture of his people Gooding-Williams 2009: 19–65).

Douglass’s political activities provide a model of democratic politics in action (Gooding-Williams 2009). He worked with various groups, some underground, while he was enslaved. For example, unbeknownst to his master, he participated in at least one Sabbath School and helped other slaves learn to read and write. And, of course, he worked with several other black and racially integrated advocacy groups after his escape and emancipation. These groups had cross-cutting interests that he had to navigate. He pushed them to reach a consensus on different issues, such as in his work with the American Equal Rights Association, an organization devoted to universal suffrage. So, he did not pose as a singular spokesman for movements, groups, or his race, although he never shied away from pushing or arguing his opinions and promoting democratic action (1848 [FDSW: 117–122]).

Indeed, his liberal and civic republican ideas influenced his thoughts about leadership and his vision of the work and role of “heroes” and so-called “representative men” (1883b [SFD: 374–400]; 1893 [SFD: 414–453]; 1860d [FDP1 v.3: 289–300]). For Douglass, they were invaluable in their stance against tyranny and defense of equal rights and liberty. On John Brown, for example, Douglass wrote, putting him into heroic terms (with overtones of Thomas Carlyle and Ralph Waldo Emerson),

He believes the Declaration of Independence to be true, and the Bible to be a guide to human conduct, and acting upon the doctrines of both, he threw himself against the serried ranks of American oppression, and translated into heroic deeds the love of liberty and hatred of tyrants, with which he was inspired from both these forces acting upon his philanthropic and heroic soul. (1859 [FDSW: 375])

Thus, in his elegies to John Brown and Abraham Lincoln, we see the value he places on Emersonian representative men and the ideal of the statesman guided by liberal and civic republican principles (1859 [FDSW: 372–376]; 1860b [FDSW: 417–421]; 1876 [FDSW: 616–624]).

11. Women’s Suffrage

After the Civil War, Douglass remained active in Republican Party. He was a staunch supporter of uncompromising Reconstruction of the Union and advocated for economic and education investment in free and newly-freed black Americans. Douglass pressed for the expansion of and guarantee of civil rights for blacks, particularly for the defense of the Civil Rights Act of 1875, which the Supreme Court declared unconstitutional in 1883 (1883a [FDSW: 685–693]). Additionally, in keeping with his civil rights efforts and his view of natural rights and the development of the United States into a just Republic, he was an advocate, although a complicated one, of women’s suffrage (Douglass 1976). He joined other prominent leaders in the abolition movement, such as Sojourner Truth, and emerging leaders in the suffrage movement, such as Susan B. Anthony and Elizabeth Cady Stanton, in these efforts.

The American Equal Rights Association was the principal national organization working on behalf of women’s right to vote. At least in rhetoric, it had a dual platform of racial and sexual equality (DuBois 1978). Middle-class and wealthy white women primarily led it, and Douglass supported its platform but clashed with its leaders over conflicting interests and its latent racism. The tensions within the American Equal Rights Association, and the suffrage movement generally, erupted over the passing of the fifteenth amendment to the U.S. Constitution. The fifteenth amendment franchised all male citizens, although, as U.S. history so brutally revealed, it did so in word but not in deed. Elizabeth Cady Stanton and Susan B. Anthony opposed the fifteenth amendment because they demanded that black men and all women (particularly white women) should be enfranchised simultaneously. Some within the suffrage movement based their arguments for women’s suffrage and against blacks’ enfranchisement on racist grounds. Although the white women who led the association were abolitionists, they also, and not inconsequentially, held that blacks, particularly black men, were inferior to white women and neither as ready for nor deserving of the vote as they were (Stanton 1868 [2000: 194–199] and 1869 [2000: 236–238]).

Douglass was sympathetic to the cause of the universal franchise; however, he condemned arguments for women’s suffrage that were predicated on the supposed racial superiority of white women. He roundly condemned Stanton’s racist claims that black and “Oriental” men, and by extension black and Asian women—i.e., Stanton’s nasty references to “Sambo” and “Yung Tung”—were not as deserving as white women (1869b [FDP1 v.4: 213–219]; Stanton 1868 [2000: 194–199]). Douglass did not want to delay the franchise for black males to resolve the question of women’s right to vote. He believed it a practical matter to quickly get some protections for black Americans while the fight for suffrage for black and white women continued. Moreover, he argued it was imperative to obtain some measure of blacks’ political, legal, and social rights to confront the rising level of horrific anti-black violence sweeping the United States. Douglass firmly made this claim in his speech at an American Equal Rights Association meeting in 1869:

I must say that I do not see how any one can pretend that there is the same urgency in giving the ballot to women as to the negro. With us, the matter is a question of life and death. It is a matter of existence, at least in fifteen states of the Union. When women, because they are women, are hunted down through the cities of New York and New Orleans; when they are dragged from their houses and hung upon lamp-posts; when their children are torn from their arms, and their brains dashed out upon the pavement; when they are objects of insult and outrage at every turn; when they are in danger of having their homes burnt down over their heads; when their children are not allowed to enter schools; then they will have an urgency to obtain the ballot equal to our own. (1869b [FDP1 v.4: 216] [SFD: 271])

When asked if this did not apply to black women, Douglass replied that it did, but because they were black and not women (Ibid.). He did not have ready answers, however, to concerns about how well black men, including elite black men, represented and protected the rights and interests of black women. Generations of black male leaders repeated his shortsightedness, which black women leaders, like Anna Julia Cooper (c. 1859–1964), criticized while also struggling against the racism of first-wave feminism (Cooper 1998).

12. At the Dawn of Jim Crow

During and after the Reconstruction, Douglass remained deeply concerned about the prospect that the U.S. would compromise on black Americans’ civil and human rights. He became increasingly worried about the denial of black civil rights and the rising waves of anti-black violence and criticized the growing practice of black peonage in agriculture. And over time, his sympathy for black individuals and families fleeing the American South grew. He did not support internal mass migration as a policy because he judged it a poor option for black labor since it did not address the institutional problems that caused the flight: peonage and exploitation, unequal justice, unrestrained violence, lack of resources and opportunities, and in particular, education. For taking that position, Douglass received a great deal of criticism for failing to support the individual choices of black Americans who sought to flee the inhospitable, degrading, and deadly conditions in the American South. It compelled him to rethink his views on the question (§9).

Related to the conditions causing the flight of black Americans from the southern states, Douglass criticized the inequitable and unfair treatment of blacks in state criminal justice systems, particularly criticizing the Convict-Lease system (Davis 1999). And he joined with Ida B. Wells-Barnett (1862–1931) in raising the alarm over the growing practice of anti-black lynching in the United States (Giddings 2008; Wells-Barnett et al. 2014). Douglass saw America’s failure to support civil rights and equal citizenship for black Americans as indicative of its moral and political failure. He even went so far as to provocatively claim that emancipation was a stupendous fraud (1888a [FDSW: 712–724]).

Douglass’s later-day activities are an essential part of his record and life; indeed, they are a part of the evolving discussions on various subjects in African American philosophy, political theory, and critical theories in several disciplines. He was part of several movements that helped to mold the nation; they took their confidence in providential historical development in hand—as he did when he first committed to seizing his liberty in his “soul’s complaint”, an “apostrophe” to ships on the Chesapeake Bay:

You are loosed from your mooring, and are free; I am fast in my chains, and am a slave! You move merrily before the gentle gale, and I sadly before the bloody whip! You are freedom’s swift-winged angels, that fly round the world; I am confined in bands of iron! O that I were free! O, that I were on one of your gallant decks, and under your protecting wing! Alas! Betwixt me and you, the turbid waters roll. Go on, go on. O that I could also go! Could I but swim! If I could fly! O, why was I born a man, of whom to make a brute! The glad ship is gone; she hides in the dim distance. I am left in the hottest hell of unending slavery. O God, save me! God, deliver me! Let me be free! Is there any God? Why am I a slave? (1845 [FDAB: 59])

The historian David Blight called Douglass a prophet of freedom, perfectly capturing Douglass’s enduring appeal (2018). His ideas, values, and rhetoric defending equal liberty continue to cry out to us in celebration and defense of equality and liberty. There is no better summation of all that he stood for than what he proclaimed in 1869 at the end of “On Composite Nationality”:

If our action shall be in accordance with the principles of justice, liberty, and perfect human equality, no eloquence can adequately portray the greatness and grandeur of the Republic. We shall spread the network of our science and our civilization over all who seek their shelter, whether from Asia, Africa, or the Isles of the Sea. We shall mould them all, each after his kind, into Americans; Indian and Celt, negro and Saxon, Latin and Teuton, Mongolian and Caucasian, Jew and gentile, all shall bow to the same law, speak the same language, support the same government, enjoy the same liberty, vibrate with the same national enthusiasm, and seek the same national ends. (1869 [SFD: 302–303])

Those inspiring and challenging words stand as an invitation to us to closely study Douglass’s works and legacy and to achieve our nation.


A. Primary Sources

A.1 Collections and Abbreviations

  • [FDAB] Autobiographies: Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave ; My Bondage and My Freedom ; Life and Times of Frederick Douglass, Henry Louis Gates (ed.), (The Library of America 68), New York: Literary Classics of the United States, 1994.
  • The Frederick Douglass Papers, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1979–
    • [FDP1] Series One, Speeches, Debates, and Interviews, John W. Blassingame and John R. McKivigan (eds.), 5 volumes, 1979–1992.
    • [FDP2] Series Two, Autobiographical Writings, John W. Blassingame (ed.), 3 volumes, 1999–2012.
    • [FDP3] Series Three, Correspondence, 2 volumes (3 more forthcoming), John R. McKivigan (ed.), 2009–.
  • [FDSW] Frederick Douglass: Selected Speeches and Writings, Philip Sheldon Foner and Yuval Taylor (eds.), (Library of Black America), Chicago: Lawrence Hill Books, 1999.
  • [SFD] The Speeches of Frederick Douglass: A Critical Edition, John R. McKivigan, Julie Husband, and Heather L. Kaufman (eds.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2018.
  • 1950–1975, The Life and Writings of Frederick Douglass, Philip Sheldon Foner (ed.), 5 volumes, New York: International Publishers.
    • 1950, Early years, 1817–1849, volume 1
    • 1950, Pre-Civil War decade, 1850–1860, volume 2
    • 1952, The Civil War, 1861–1865, volume 3
    • 1955, Reconstruction and After, volume 4
    • 1975, Supplementary volume, 1844–1860, volume 5
  • 1976, Frederick Douglass on Women’s Rights, Philip Sheldon Foner (ed.), (Contributions in Afro-American and African Studies 25), Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
  • 2016, The Essential Douglass: Selected Writings & Speeches, Nicholas Buccola (ed.), Indianapolis. IN: Hackett Publishing Company.

A.2 Works by Douglass

  • 1845, Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave. Written by Himself, Boston: Anti-Slavery Office. Two modern editions are
    • Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, David W. Blight (ed.), second edition, (Bedford Books in American History), Boston: Bedford Books of St. Martin’s Press, 2003.
    • Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass, an American Slave, Written by Himself: A New Critical Edition, (Open Media Series), Angela Y. Davis (ed.), San Francisco, CA: City Lights Books, 2010; includes Angela Y. Davis, “Lectures on Liberation”.
  • 1846, “American Slavery, American Religion, and the Free Church of Scotland”, London, England, 22 May; in SFD: 17–54
  • 1848a “An Address to the Colored People of the United States”, The North Star, 29 September; in FDSW: 117–122
  • 1848b, “The Folly of Racially Exclusive Organization”, Rochester, New York, 6 March; in FDP1: v.2: 109–112.
  • 1850, “At Home Again”, The North Star, 30 May; in FDSW: 156–157
  • 1852, “What To the Slave Is The Fourth of July?”, Rochester, NY, 5 July; in SFD: 55–92
  • 1853a [2015], “The Heroic Slave”, in Autographs for Freedom, Julia Griffiths (ed.), Boston: John P. Jewett and Company, 174–239. Reprinted, 2015, as The Heroic Slave: A Cultural and Critical Edition, Robert S. Levine, John Stauffer, and John R. McKivigan (eds.), New Haven, CT/London: Yale University Press.
  • 1853b, “The Present Condition And Future Prospects of the Negro People”, annual meeting of the American and Foreign Anti-Slavery Society, New York City, 11 May; FDSW: 250–259.
  • 1854, “The Claims of the Negro Ethnologically Considered”, Hudson, Ohio, 12 July; in SFD: 116–150
  • 1855, My Bondage and My Freedom, New York: Miller, Orton & Mulligan. Reprinted David W. Blight (ed.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2014. Also in FDAB: 103–452.
  • 1857, “The Significance of Emancipation in the West Indies”, Canandaigua, New York, 3 August.
  • 1859, “Capt. John Brown Not Insane”, Douglass’ Monthly, November; FDSW: 374–375/6.
  • 1860a, “The American Constitution and the Slaves”, Glasgow, Scotland, 26 March; in SFD: 151–185.
  • 1860b, “Speech on John Brown”, Tremont Temple, Boston, 3 December; FDSW: 417–421.
  • 1860c, “A Plea for Freedom of Speech in Boston”, Boston, Massachusetts, 9 December; in FDP1 v.3: 420–424.
  • 1860d, “The Trials and Triumphs of Self-Made Men”, Halifax, England: in FDP1 v.3: 289–300.
  • 1862, “What Shall be Done with the Slave if Emancipated”, Douglass’ Monthly, January; FDSW: 470–473.
  • 1869a, “Our Composite Nationality”, Boston, Massachusetts, 7 December; in SFD: 278–303.
  • 1869b, “We Welcome the Fifteenth Amendment”, Addresses delivered to the American Equal Rights Association, New York, 12–13 May; in SFD: 267–277; in FDP1 v.4: 213–219.
  • 1876, “Oration in Memory of Abraham Lincoln”, unveiling of Freedmen’s Monument in Memory of Abraham Lincoln, Lincoln Park, Washington, DC, 14 April; FDSW: 616–624.
  • 1879, “The Negro Exodus From the Gulf States”, New York, September: in FDP1 v.4: 510–533.
  • 1881/1893, Life and Times of Frederick Douglass, new revised edition, Boston: De Wolfe & Fiske; earlier shorter version, 1881. Reprinted in FDP2: volume 3, John R. McKivigan (ed.), 2012.
  • 1883a, “The Civil Rights Case”, Civil Rights Mass-Meeting, Lincoln Hall, Washington, DC, 22 October; FDSW: 685–693.
  • 1883b, “‘It Moves’, Or the Philosophy of Reform”, Washington, DC, 20 November; in SFD: 374–400.
  • 1884, “Mr. Douglass Interviewed”, Washington Post, 26 January, page 1; in FDP1 v.5: 147.
  • 1888a, “Denounce the So-Called Emancipation as a Stupendous Fraud”, speech on the occasion of the Twenty-Sixth Anniversary of Emancipation in the District of Columbia, Washington, DC, 16 April; FDSW: 712–724.
  • 1888b, “In Law Free: In Fact, A Slave”, Washington, DC, 16 May: FDP1 v.5: 357–373.
  • 1893, “Self-Made Men”, Carlisle, Pennsylvania, March; in SFD: 414–453.
  • 1894, “Lessons of the Hour”, Washington, DC, 9 January; in SFD: 454–497.

B. Secondary Literature

  • Alfaro, Ange-Marie Hancock, 2018, “Black Masculinity Achieves Nothing without Restorative Care: An Intersectional Rearticulation of Frederick Douglass”, in Roberts 2018: 236–251 (ch. 7).
  • Appiah, Anthony, 1985 [1986], “The Uncompleted Argument: Du Bois and the Illusion of Race”, Critical Inquiry, 12(1): 21–37. Reprinted in “Race”, Writing and Difference, Henry Louis Gates Jr. (ed.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 21–37.
  • Bernasconi, Robert, 1991, “The Constitution Of The People: Frederick Douglass And The Dred Scott Decision”, Cardozo Law Review, 13(4): 1281–1296.
  • Blight, David W., 1989, Frederick Douglass’ Civil War: Keeping Faith in Jubilee, Baton Rouge, LA: Louisiana State University Press.
  • –––, 2018, Frederick Douglass: Prophet of Freedom, New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • Boxill, Bernard R., 1976, “Self-Respect and Protest”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 6(1): 58–69.
  • –––, 1992a, Blacks and Social Justice, revised edition, Savage, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • –––, 1992b, “Two Traditions in African American Political Philosophy”, Philosophical Forum, 24: 119–135.
  • –––, 1997, “The Fight with Covey”, in Existence in Black: An Anthology of Black Existential Philosophy, Lewis R. Gordon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 273–290.
  • –––, 1998, “Radical Implications of Locke’s Moral Theory: The Views of Frederick Douglass”, in Lott 1998: 29–48.
  • –––, 1999, “Douglass against the Emigrationists”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 21–49 (ch. 1).
  • Bromell, Nicholas Knowles, 2021, The Powers of Dignity: The Black Political Philosophy of Frederick Douglass, Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
  • Brotz, Howard, 1992, African-American Social and Political Thought, 1850–1920, New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers.
  • Buccola, Nicholas, 2012, The Political Thought of Frederick Douglass: In Pursuit of American Liberty, New York: New York University Press.
  • Burns, Robert, 1795, “A Man’s a Man for a’ That”. Collected in multiple places including in Burns: Poems, Gerard Carruthers (ed.), New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 2007, 131–132.[Burn 1795 available online]
  • Combe, George, 1828, The Constitution of Man Considered in Relation to External Objects, Edinburgh.
  • Cooper, Anna J., 1998, The Voice of Anna Julia Cooper: Including A Voice from the South and Other Important Essays, Papers, and Letters, Charles C. Lemert and Esme Bhan (eds.), Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield.
  • Cruse, Harold, 1967 [2005], The Crisis of the Negro Intellectual, New York: Morrow. Reprinted as The Crisis of the Negro Intellectual: A Historical Analysis of the Failure of Black Leadership, (New York Review Books Classics), New York: New York Review Books, 2005.
  • Davis, Angela Y., 1971, Lectures on Liberation, New York: New York Committee to Free Angela Davis. Reprinted in the 2010 edition of Douglass 1845 which she edited.
  • –––, 1971 [1983], “Unfinished Lecture on Liberation-II”, in Philosophy Born of Struggle: Anthology of Afro-American Philosophy from 1917, Leonard Harris (ed.), Dubuque: Kendall/Hunt Publishing, 130–136.
  • –––, 1999, “From the Prison of Slavery to the Slavery of Prison: Frederick Douglass and the Convict Lease System”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 339–362 (ch. 12).
  • –––, 2005, Abolition Democracy: Beyond Empire, Prisons, and Torture, New York: Seven Stories Press.
  • Delany, Martin Robison, 1852 [1968], The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States. Politically Considered, Philadelphia. Reprinted, 1968, (American Negro, His History and Literature), New York: Arno Press.
  • Delbanco, Andrew, 2018, The War before the War: Fugitive Slaves and the Struggle for America’s Soul from the Revolution to the Civil War, New York: Penguin Press.
  • Du Bois, W.E.B. 1897 [1992], “The Conservation of Races”, speech to the American Negro Academy, March 1897. Reprinted in Brotz 1992: 483–492.
  • –––, 1903 [1999], The Souls of Black Folk, Chicago: A.C. McClurg & Co. Reprinted, 1999, Henry Louis Gates and Terri Hume Oliver (eds), (A Norton Critical Edition) New York: W.W. Norton.
  • –––, 1909, John Brown, (American Crisis Biographies), Philadelphia: G. W. Jacobs & company.
  • –––, 1935 [2021], Black Reconstruction: An Essay toward a History of the Part Which Black Folk Played in the Attempt to Reconstruct Democracy in America, 1860–1880, New York: Harcourt, Brace and Co. Reprinted, 2021, Eric Foner and Henry Louis Gates, Jr., (eds.), (Library of America 350), New York, NY: The Library of America.
  • DuBois, Ellen Carol, 1978, Feminism and Suffrage: The Emergence of an Independent Women’s Movement in America, 1848–1869, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Dworkin, Ronald, 2006, Is Democracy Possible Here? Principles for a New Political Debate, Princeton, N.J: Princeton University Press.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo, 1850 [2004], Representative Men: Seven Lectures, Boston: Phillips, Sampson & Co. Reprinted, 2004, Brenda Wineapple (ed.), New York: Modern Library.
  • Foner, Philip Sheldon, 1964, Frederick Douglass: A Biography, New York: Citadel Press.
  • Fredrickson, George M., 2002, Racism: A Short History, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Giddings, Paula, 2008, Ida: A Sword among Lions: Ida B. Wells and the Campaign against Lynching, New York: Amistad.
  • Gooding-Williams, Robert, 2009, In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-Modern Political Thought in America, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Gordon, Ann D. (ed.), 2000, The Selected Papers of Elizabeth Cady Stanton and Susan B. Anthony, Volume 2: Against an Aristocracy of Sex, 1866 to 1873, New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press.
  • Gordon, Lewis R. 1999. “Douglass as an Existentialist”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 207–226 (ch. 8).
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1651/1668 [1994], Leviathan, London; revised Latin edition, 1668. Reprinted as Leviathan: With Selected Variants from the Latin Edition of 1668, E. M. Curley (ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • Jefferson, Thomas, 1785 [1999], Notes on the State of Virginia, Paris; reprinted, 1999, Frank Shuffelton (ed.), New York: Penguin Books.
  • Lawson, Bill E. and Frank M. Kirkland (eds.), 1999, Frederick Douglass: A Critical Reader (Blackwell Critical Readers), Malden, MA/Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Lee, Maurice S. (ed.), 2009, The Cambridge Companion to Frederick Douglass (Cambridge Companions to American Studies), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521889230
  • Levine, Robert S., 1997, Martin Delany, Frederick Douglass, and the Politics of Representative Identity, Chapel Hill, NC: The University of North Carolina Press.
  • –––, 2016, The Lives of Frederick Douglass, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Lott, Tommy Lee (ed.), 1998, Subjugation and Bondage: Critical Essays on Slavery and Social Philosophy, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.
  • Martin, Waldo E., Jr., 1984, The Mind of Frederick Douglass, Chapel Hill, NC: The University of North Carolina Press.
  • Mazzini, Giuseppe [Joseph], 1860 [1862], Doveri dell’uomo, London; translated as The Duties of Man, London: Chapman & Hall, 1862; re-translated by Ella Noyes in The Duties of Man And Other Essays, introduced by Thomas Jones, London: J.M. Dent & Sons, 1907.
  • McFeely, William S., 1991, Frederick Douglass, New York: Norton.
  • McGary, Howard, 1999a, “Douglass on Racial Assimilation and Racial Institutions”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 50–63 (ch. 2).
  • –––, 1999b, Race and Social Justice, Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • McGary, Howard and Bill E. Lawson, 1992, Between Slavery and Freedom: Philosophy and American Slavery, (Blacks in the Diaspora), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Mills, Charles W., 1997, The Racial Contract, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1999, “Whose Fourth of July? Frederick Douglass and ‘Original Intent’”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 100–142 (ch. 5).
  • Moses, Wilson Jeremiah, 1978, The Golden Age of Black Nationalism, 1850–1925, Hamden, CT: Archon Books.
  • Myers, Peter C., 2008, Frederick Douglass: Race and the Rebirth of American Liberalism, (American Political Thought), Lawrence, KS: University Press of Kansas.
  • Nott, Josiah C. and George R. Gliddon, 1854, Types of Mankind or, Ethnological Researches: Based upon the Ancient Monuments, Paintings, Sculptures, and Crania of Races, and upon Their Natural, Geographical, Philological and Biblical History, Illustrated by Selections from the Inedited Papers of Samuel George Morton and by Additional Contributions from L. Agassiz; W. Usher; and H. S. Patterson, Philadelphia, PA: J.B. Lippincott, Grambo & co.
  • Outlaw, Lucius, 1992 [1996], “Against the Grain of Modernity: The Politics of Difference and the Conservation of ‘Race’”, Man and World, 25(3–4): 443–468. Reprinted in his On Race and Philosophy, New York: Routledge, 1996, 135–157. doi:10.1007/BF01252429
  • Patterson, Orlando, 1982, Slavery and Social Death: A Comparative Study, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Pettit, Philip, 1997, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0198296428.001.0001
  • Pittman, John, 1999, “Douglass’s Assimilationism and Antislavery”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 64–81 (ch. 3).
  • Preston, Dickson J., 1980, Young Frederick Douglass: The Maryland Years, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Roberts, Neil (ed.), 2018, A Political Companion to Frederick Douglass, (Political Companions to Great American Authors), Lexington, KY: University Press of Kentucky.
  • Root, Damon, 2020, A Glorious Liberty: Frederick Douglass and the Fight for an Antislavery Constitution, Lincoln, NE: Potomac Books, an imprint of the University of Nebraska Press.
  • Schrader, David E., 1999, “Natural Law in the Constitutional Thought of Frederick Douglass”, in Lawson and Kirkland 1999: 85–99 (ch. 4).
  • Stanton, Elizabeth Cady, 1868 [2000], “Manhood Suffrage”, 24 December 1868. Collected in A. Gordon 2000: 194–199 (§71).
  • –––, 1869 [2000], “Sixteenth Amendment”, 29 April 1869. Collected in A. Gordon 2000: 236–238 (§84).
  • Sinha, Manisha, 2016, The Slave’s Cause: A History of Abolition, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Sundquist, Eric J. (ed.), 1990, Frederick Douglass: New Literary and Historical Essays (Cambridge Studies in American Literature and Culture), Cambridge, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sundstrom, Ronald Robles, 2003, “Douglass & Du Bois’s Der Schwarze Volksgeist”, in Race and Racism in Continental Philosophy, Robert Bernasconi (ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Indiana University Press, 32–53 (ch. 3).
  • –––, 2008, The Browning of America and the Evasion of Social Justice, (SUNY Series, Philosophy and Race), Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Taylor, Paul C., 2022, Race: A Philosophical Introduction, third revised edition, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Van Wyhe, John, 2004, Combe’s “Constitution of Man”, and Nineteenth-Century Responses, Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum.
  • Wallace, Maurice O., 2009, “Violence, Manhood, and War in Douglass”, in Lee 2009: 73–88. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521889230.006
  • –––, 2014, “‘I Rose a Freeman’: Power, Property, and the Performance of Manhood in Slave Narratives”, in The Oxford Handbook of the African American Slave Narrative, John Ernest (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 260–276.
  • Washington, Booker T., 1907, Frederick Douglass, (American Crisis Biographies), Philadelphia/London: G.W. Jacobs & Company.
  • Waldron, Jeremy, 2012, Dignity, Rank, and Rights, Meir Dan-Cohen (ed.), (Berkeley Tanner Lectures), New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199915439.001.0001
  • –––, 2017, One Another’s Equals: The Basis of Human Equality, Cambridge, MA: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.
  • Wells-Barnett, Ida B., 2014, The Light of Truth: Writings of an Anti-Lynching Crusader, Mia Bay and Henry Louis Jr. Gates (eds.), (Penguin Classics), New York: Penguin Books.
  • Willett, Cynthia, 1998, “The Master-Slave Dialectic: Hegel vs. Douglass”, in Lott 1998: 151–170.
  • –––, 2001, “The Genealogy of Freedom in Slave America: Frederick Douglass”, in her The Soul of Justice: Social Bonds and Racial Hubris, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 188–202 (ch. 8).
  • Yancy, George, 2008, “Exploring the Serious World of Whiteness through Frederick Douglass’s Autobiographical Reflections”, in his Black Bodies, White Gazes: The Continuing Significance of Race, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 141–181.
  • Yaure, Philip, 2018, “Deliberation and Emancipation: Some Critical Remarks”, Ethics, 129(1): 8–38. doi:10.1086/698731

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