Robert Alyngton

First published Wed Jul 25, 2001; substantive revision Wed May 24, 2017

Robert Alyngton was one of the most important authors of the generation after John Wyclif. He was deeply influenced by Walter Burley’s logico-ontological system and Wyclif’s metaphysics. His major extant work, a commentary on the Categories, heavily depends on Burley’s last commentary on the Categories and Wyclif’s De ente praedicamentali. Yet he was able to develop new logical and semantic theories as well as the general strategy adopted by the Oxford Realists, as he methodically substituted reference to external objective realities for reference to linguistic and/or mental activities.

1. Life and Works

Not a great deal is known of Robert Alyngton’s life. Most of the information about him comes from Emden 1957–59. From 1379 until 1386, he was fellow of Queens College (the same Oxonian college where Wyclif started his theological studies in 1363 and Johannes Sharpe taught in the 1390s); he became Magister Artium and, by 1393, doctor of theology. He was chancellor of the University in 1393 and 1395. In 1382 he preached Wyclif’s religious and political ideas in Hampshire (McHardy 1987). He was rector of Long Whatton, Leicestershire, where he died by September 1398.

According to Emden 1957–59 and Ashworth & Spade 1992, Alyngton was of considerable repute as a logician. Among his extant works, the following can be mentioned (the most complete list of his writings is found in Bale 1557–59 [pp. 519–20]):

  • A commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis [henceforward In Cat.]), partially edited in Conti 1993 (pp. 242–306). (All references are to the pages of this edition or, for the unedited portions, to the ms. London, Lambeth Palace 393.)
  • A treatise on the supposition of terms (Tractatus de suppositionibus terminorum).
  • A commentary on the Liber sex principiorum.
  • A treatise on the genera of being (Tractatus generum).

2. Being and Categories

The point of departure of every realist interpretation of the Categories is the notion of being (ens) in its relationship to the ten categories, as Realists considered the categorial table to be a division of beings. Like Burley, Alyngton affirms that (i) the division into categories is first of all a division of things existing outside the mind, and only secondarily of the mental concepts and spoken or written terms which signify them, and (ii) things belonging to one categorial field are really distinct from those belonging to another—for instance, substances are really distinct from quantities, qualities, and relations, quantities are really distinct from substances, qualities, and relations, and so on (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, Conti pp. 251, 252–53).

Unfortunately Alyngton does not define being; yet, what he says about (1) the subject of the Categories (the real categorial being which can be signified by simple expressions, namely terms (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum , p. 252), and (2) analogy (In Cat., cap. de aequivocis, ms. London, Lambeth Palace 393, fol. 70r–v) seems to entail that, like Wyclif, he also thinks of being as a sort of an extramental reality proper to everything (God and creatures; substances and accidents; universal and individual items; things, collections of things, and states of affairs) according to different modes and degrees.

In the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, all the realist authors, with the only notable exception of Duns Scotus, regarded categorial items as composed of two main aspects: the inner nature or essence, and their peculiar mode of being or of being predicated (modi essendi vel praedicandi). They maintained that the categorial table divides categorial items according to their modes of being (or of being predicated) and not according to their inner natures (or essences). In particular, Thomas Aquinas (Sententia super Metaphysicam, liber V, lectio 9) based his method of finding the ten Aristotelian categories on the differences of modes of being predicated, and recognized three fundamental modes of being predicated: essentially, proper to substances, when the predication indicates what a given thing is; accidentally, proper to quantities, qualities, and relatives, when the predication indicates that something inheres in a subject; and externally, proper to the remaining six categories, when the predication indicates that something which does not inhere in the subject nevertheless affects it. On the contrary Albert the Great (Liber de praedicamentis, tr. I, cap. 7) and Simon of Faversham (Quaestiones super librum Praedicamentorum, q. 12) based their method of finding the categories on the differences of modes of being. They admitted two fundamental modes of being: being by itself, proper to substance; and being in something else, proper to the nine genera of accidents. The latter was subdivided into being in something else absolutely, proper to quantities and qualities, and being in something else in virtue of a relation to a third thing (esse ad aliud), proper to the remaining seven categories. Walter Burley, whose last commentary on the Categories is, along with Wyclif’s De ente praedicamentali, the main source of Alyngton’s commentary on the Categories, recalled two ways of deducing the ten Aristotelian categories, both based on the various levels of similarity among their own modes of being. Alyngton follows very closely Burley’s first way of deriving the ten categories. In his opinion, there are two fundamental modes of being proper to things: being by itself, which characterizes substances, and being or inhering in something else, which characterizes accidents. The latter is subdivided into three less general modes: being in something else in virtue of its matter; being in something else in virtue of its form; and being in something else in virtue of the whole composite. Something can inhere in something else in virtue of its matter, form, and composite according to three different ways: from inside (ab intrinseco), from outside (ab extrinseco), and partially from inside and partially from outside (partim ab intrinseco et partim ab extrinseco). If something is in something else in virtue of its matter and from inside, then it is a quantity; if from outside, it is a where; if partially from inside and partially from outside, it is an affection. If something is in something else in virtue of its form and from inside, then it is a quality; if from outside, it is when (quando vel quandalitas); if partially from inside and partially from outside, it is an action. If something is in something else in virtue of the whole composite and from inside, then it is a relation; if from outside, it is a possession (habitus); if partially from inside and partially from outside, it is a position (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, pp. 252–53).

Alyngton’s choice implies an anti-reductionist approach to the matter, which is confirmed by the solution of the problem of what properly falls into the categorial fields. According to the standard realist conception, not only the accidental forms, such as whiteness, but also the compounds they cause when inhering in substances, such as a white-thing (album), fall into the categories. Burley thought that whilst the accidental forms properly fall into the categories, the aggregates made up from a substance and an accidental form do not, since they are beings per accidens, wanting in real unity. In his opinion, such an aggregate may be said to fall into a certain category, the category into which its accidental form falls, only by reduction, in virtue of the accidental form itself. On the contrary, Wyclif maintained that the aggregates built up by a substance and an accidental form fall per accidens into both the category of substance and the category which the accidental form at issue belongs to (cf. Wyclif, De ente praedicamentali, cap. 1, pp. 3–4). Alyngton combines in an original way the two slightly different opinions of Burley and Wyclif. He affirms that a thing can be said to belong to a category in a threefold way: by itself, by accident (per accidens), and by reduction (per reductionem). Something is in a category by itself if and only if the highest genus of that category is predicated by itself and and directly (in recto) of it (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, p. 259). In other words, if and only if the highest genus of that category is one of the constitutive elements of the essence of the thing at issue. Accidental forms belong per se to the nine categories of accidents (In Cat., cap. de relativis, p. 300). Something is in a category by accident if and only if it is an aggregate from a substance and an accidental form. Such aggregates belong per accidens both to the category of substance and to the category in which its accidental form is by itself (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, p. 259; and cap. de relativis, p. 300). Something can be in a category by reduction in two different ways: in a broad sense (large) and in a strict sense (stricte). Something is in a category by reduction large if and only if it is an aggregate, and the highest genus of a certain category is predicated only indirectly of it. Something is in a category by reduction stricte if and only if it is not an aggregate, and, (a) like differences, it is a component of the reality of a thing which is in a category by itself, but the highest genus of that category is not predicated of it; or (b) it is the privation correlated to a certain property which, in turn, is in a category by itself; or (c), like extra-categorial principle such as God, the unity, and the point, it somehow instantiates the mode of being proper to a certain categorial field, but the highest genus of that category is not one of the constitutive elements of the essence of that thing (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, pp. 259–60).

Fundamental to Alyngton’s deduction of the categories and solution of the problem of what falls into the categorial fields (and how) is a close isomorphism between language (mental, written, and spoken) and the world. Like Burley and Wyclif, he was firmly convinced that our thought is modelled on reality itself, so that it reproduces reality in all its elements, levels, and inner relations. Therefore, one of the best ways of understanding the world lay for him in an accurate investigation of our notions and conceptual schemes, as they show the structure of the world. A logical consequence of this conviction was his strong propensity towards reification: he hypostatises the notion of being and considers equivocity, analogy, and univocity not only as semantic relations between terms and things, but also as real relations between extra-mental items (In Cat., cap. de aequivocis, ms. London, Lambeth Palace 393, fols. 69v–70r).

According to the common interpretation of the opening passage of the Categories, equivocal terms are correlated with more than one concept and refer to a multiplicity of things sharing different natures, whereas univocal terms are correlated with only one concept and refer to a multiplicity of things sharing one and the same nature. In his last commentary on the Physics (after 1324), Burley had maintained that the term ‘being’ is at the same time univocal and equivocal with respect to the categories, as a single concept corresponds to it (broadly speaking univocity), but the categorial items share it in different ways, according to a hierarchy of value (broadly speaking equivocity)—see his Expositio in libros octo Physicorum, lib. I, tr. 2, cap. 1, ed. Venice 1501, fols. 12vb-13ra. In turn, Wyclif had admitted three main types of equivocity: by chance (a casu), analogical, and generic, the second of which applies to the relationship between being and categories (De ente praedicamentali, cap. 2). Alyngton recognises four main kinds of equivocity: by chance; deliberate (a consilio); analogical; and generic. Equivocals by chance are those things that just happen to have the same name, but with different meanings and/or reasons for imposing the name. Those things are deliberate equivocals which have distinct natures but the same name, and are subordinated to different but correlated concepts. Those things are analogical which share the nature signified by their common name in various degrees and/or ways. Generic equivocals are those things which share the same generic nature in the same way, but have distinct specific natures of different absolute value (In Cat., cap. de aequivocis, fol. 70r-v). So, within Alyngton’s system, what differentiates analogy from univocity is the way in which a certain nature (or property) is shared by a set of things: analogous things share it according to different degrees (secundum magis et minus, or secundum prius et posterius), univocal things share it all in the same manner and to the same degree (In Cat., cap. de univocis, fol. 71v). Alyngton argues that being is not a sort of genus in relation to the ten categories, since it does not manifest their essence, nor is it predicated univocally of them; being is analogous in relation to the ten categories. It is the basic stuff of the metaphysical structure of each reality, which possesses it in accordance with its own nature and level in the hierarchy of essences (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, pp. 255–56).

3. Universals and Predication

Among the many kinds of beings (entia) that Alyngton admits, the most important set is that consisting of universal items. Universals are among the most disputed topics in Medieval philosophical literature. Like Wyclif and the other Oxford Realists, Alyngton claims that universals fully exist outside the mind and are really identical-to and formally distinct-from the individuals which instantiate them. Like Albert the Great whom he quotes by name, Alyngton recognizes three main kinds of universals:

  1. ante rem or ideal universals—that is, the ideas in God, the archetypes of all that is;
  2. in re or formal universals—that is, the common natures shared by individual things; and
  3. post rem or intentional universals—that is, mental signs of the formal universals.

The ideas in God are the causes of formal universals, and formal universals are the causes of intentional universals. Furthermore, like Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton holds that formal universals actually exist (in actu) outside our minds, and not potentially only (in potentia) as moderate realists thought (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 279)—even if, unlike Burley, he maintains they are really identical with their individuals, for otherwise it would be impossible to explain, against the Nominalists, why and how individual substances show different and more or less close kinds of similarity among themselves (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 267–68).

According to Alyngton, who depends here on Avicenna and Wyclif, formal universals are common natures in virtue of which the individuals that share them are exactly what they are—as the human species is the form by which every man formally is a man. Qua natures, they are prior, and so indifferent, to any division into universals and individuals. Universality (universalitas or communicabilitas) is as it were their inseparable property, but not a constitutive mark of the nature itself (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 101v). As a consequence, formal universals can be conceived of in two different manners: as first intentions or as second intentions. In the former case, they are natures of a certain kind and are identical with their individuals (for example, man is the same thing as Socrates). In the latter case, they are properly universals (that is, something that can exist in many things and can be shared by them), and are distinct from their individuals considered qua individuals, because of opposite constitutive principles (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 268). Therefore, universals are really (realiter) identical to, but formally (formaliter) distinct from their individuals. In fact, universals are formal causes in relation to their individuals, and individuals are material causes in relation to their universals. Thus three different kinds of entities can be qualified as formal universals:

  1. the common natures instantiated by individuals—which are things of first intention;
  2. the form itself of universality, which belongs to a certain common nature when seen in its relation to the individuals—which is a thing of second intention; and
  3. the thinkability proper to the common nature, by which it is a possible object of our mind—that is, the real principle that connects formal universals with mental universals (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 277).

Alyngton accepts the traditional realistic account of the relationship between formal universals and individuals, and, like Wyclif, improves it by defining its logical structure more accurately, in order to avoid the inconsistencies stressed by Ockham and his followers. Alyngton thought that a universal of the category of substance could directly receive only the predications of substantial forms more common than itself. On the other hand, accidental forms inhering in substantial individuals could be predicated only indirectly (essentialiter) of the substantial form itself that those individuals instantiate, predicated indirectly through and in virtue of the individuals of that substantial form. So his description of the logical structure of the relationship between universals and individuals demanded a redefinition of predication. Alyngton was probably the first to ameliorate Wyclif’s theory of predication by dividing predication into formal predication (praedicatio formalis) and remote inherence (inhaerentia remota) or predication by essence (praedicatio secundum essentiam). Remote inherence is grounded in a partial identity between subject and predicate, which share some but not all metaphysical constituents, and does not demand that the form signified by the predicate term be directly present in the entity signified by the subject term. On the other hand, such a direct presence is needed by formal predication. “Man is an animal” and “Socrates is white” are instances of formal predication; “(What is) singular is (what is) common” (singulare est commune) and “Humanity is running” (humanitas est currens) are instances of remote inherence, as according to Alyngton it is possible to attribute the property of being running to the form of humanity if at least one man is running. However, he makes sure to use as a predicate term a substantival adjective in its neuter form, because only in this way can it be made apparent that the form signified by the predicate term is not directly present in the subject, but is indirectly attributed to it, through its individuals (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 288–90).

4. The Theory of Substance

These remarks on the relations between forms and substances bring us to the core of Alyngton’s ontology: the doctrine of substance, developed in the fifth chapter of his commentary on the Categories. Alyngton’s treatment can be divided into two main parts. (i) The first attempts to clarify what characterizes substance, and therefore what falls by itself into that category; (ii) the second is concerned with the distinction between primary (or individual) and secondary (or universal) substances.

Alyngton lists seven opinions about the nature and mode of being of substance, the last of which he supports.

  1. According to the first one, proper to grammarians, substance is what the term ‘substance’ refers to when utilized in a broad sense, that is, the quiddity (quidditas) or essence (essentia) of anything. In this case, substance is not a category, since the items which fulfil this description do not share any common nature (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 263).
  2. The second opinion is that of Avicenna, who affirms that any entity which does not inhere in something else is a substance (cf. Liber de philosophia prima, tr. 8, cap. 4, S. Van Riet ed., 2 vols., Louvain-Leiden: Peeters-Brill, 1977–80, vol. 2, pp. 403–404). According to this view, God, substantial differences, and negative truths can be said to be substances, even though only in an analogical way (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 263–264).
  3. A third meaning of the term ‘substance’ can be drawn from the use (of that term) proper to common people and theologians: everything which plays the role of foundation (fundamentum) in relation to something else is a substance. In this sense, the surface is the foundation (and therefore the substance) of the whiteness (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).
  4. The fourth opinion seems to be the same as the anonymous one discussed and partially criticized by Burley in his last commentary on the Categories (C.E. 1337, cap. de substantia, ed. Venetiis 1509, fol. 22rb–va). Substance would be (i) a positive being, which (ii) does not inhere in something else, and (iii) is naturally apt to play the role of subject in relation to absolute accidents (that is, quantities and qualities). According to this view, matter, form, the composite made up of matter and form, and the angelic intelligences are substances, whereas substantial differences and negative truths are not, since the former do not satisfy the third requisite, nor the latter the first one (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).
  5. The fifth opinion is that of Boethius (cf. In Categorias Aristotelis libri quattuor, PL, vol. 64, 184A–B), according to whom substance is (i) a positive being, which (ii) does not inhere in something else, and (iii) is a compound of matter and form (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).
  6. The sixth opinion is that of Burley (cf. Expositio super Praedicamenta Aristotelis, cap. de substantia, fol. 24ra.), to whom Alyngton refers by the expression ‘moderni logici’. According to Burley, (i) not being in a subject, (ii) having an essence, (iii) autonomy and independent existence, and (iv) the capacity of underlying accidental forms are the main aspect of substances. This means that primary substances alone are substances properly speaking, while matter and form, and substantial differences are not (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 265).
  7. The last opinion is that of Wyclif (cf. De ente praedicamentali, cap. 5, pp. 36–39), quoted extensively and almost verbatim. Alyngton claims that it is superior to the preceding ones (septima est expositio metaphysica et altior ad intelligendum quam praenominatae). According to this view, the constitutive principle of the substance is not the capacity of underlying absolute accidents, but it is the capacity of underlying potency and act, which are its inner foundations—the capacity of underlying accidents being only a derivative property (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 267).

Wyclif’s position about the nature of substance implies that the distinction between potency and act is, from the point of view of metaphysics, the most fundamental distinction, of which that between form and matter is but one example. As (i) prime matter is pure potentiality, while form is act, and (ii) the distinction between potency and act is wider than that between matter and form, the latter is a particular case of the former. In fact, according to Wyclif, the distinction between potency and act runs though the whole of creation, since it applies also to any kinds of spiritual creatures, whereas the distinction between matter and form is found only in the corporeal creatures. On the contrary, Alyngton seems to interpret the distinction between potency and act as a particular case of the distinction between matter and form, since he constantly explains the meaning of the opposition potency-act in terms of the opposition between matter and form in a crucial passage that he quotes from Wyclif’s De ente praedicamentali (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 267 [= Wyclif, De ente praedicamentali, cap. 5, pp. 38–39]). The result is a sort of universal hylemorphism, since in this way matter and form serve as principles in the order of being as well as in the order of becoming. All the more so because Alyngton seems to accept the thesis that (angelic) intelligences are not pure forms existing by themselves, but formal principles necessarily joined to the matter of the heavens in such a way as to make up living beings (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).

A second consequence of this approach to the problem of the nature of substance is that, within his system, primary substances alone are substances properly speaking. This conclusion is confirmed by his analysis of the distinctive mark (proprium) of substance: while remaining numerically one and the same, being capable of admitting contrary properties, the modification taking place through a change in the subject itself of the motion at issue. Alyngton appears to think that this description is satisfied only by primary (that is, individual) substances (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 104v). Secondary substances therefore are per se in the category of substance only insofar as they are constitutive parts of primary substances. Thus, secondary substances belong to the category of substance by virtue of the individual substances that instantiate them, since they are not formally substances. In fact, unlike primary substances, secondary substances are forms, and consequently incomplete entities with an imperfect and dependent mode of existence. They require composite substances in order to properly exist. No form as such, not even the substantial ones, is formally a substance, since no form as such has (i) the capacity of underlying potency and act, and (ii) matter and form as its inner constituent. Secondary substances are related to primary substances as formal principles of the latter. It is in this way that humanity and (say) Socrates are linked together. For this reason no secondary substances as such are totally identical with primary substances (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 280; see also pp. 281 and 282–283). As a consequence, while ‘man is animal’ (‘homo est animal’) is a sentence to which a formal predication corresponds in the world, a predication by essence matches ‘humanity is animality’ (‘humanitas est animalitas’). Any (individual) man is an animal because of the form of humanity present in him qua its essential constituent, albeit the form of humanity as such is not the principle of animality. Therefore, humanity is not formally animality nor rationality, even though it is animality plus rationality (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 283–284; see also cap. de quantitate, fols. 106v–107r).

Primary substances are the substrate of existence of any other kinds of categorial being, as nothing exists in addition to primary substances but secondary substances and accidents, which both are forms present in individual substances. Like Aristotle (Categories 5, 2b5–6), Alyngton can therefore affirm that primary substances are the necessary condition of existence for any other items of the world: nothing could exist, if primary substances stopped existing (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 286). This does not mean, however, that it would be possible to find in the world a primary substance (i) that would not belong to a certain species, and (ii) without any accident inhering in it. It means that, from the point of view of full existence, accidents and secondary substances always presuppose primary substances, as to be a primary substance is to be an autonomous singular existing item (hoc aliquid), whilst (i) to be a secondary substance is to be a quale quid, that is, an inner and essential determination (or form) of a primary substance, and (ii) to be an accident is to be an outer determination or aspect of a primary substance (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 101v).

5. The Main Categories of Accidents

Since Alyngton thinks of primary substances as the ultimate substrates of existence in relation to anything else, the only way to safeguard the reality of accidents as well as their distinction from substance and from each other, while at the same time, to affirm their dependence on substance in existence, was to conceive of them as forms of the substance itself, and therefore as something existentially incomplete. Accordingly, like Wyclif, he insists that quantity, quality, and relations, considered as abstract accidents, are forms inherent in primary substances, whereas, if considered from the point of view of their actual existence as concrete items, they are not really distinct from the substance in which they are present, but only formally, as they are modes of substances. So, the chief features of Alyngton’s treatment of accidents are his twofold consideration of them as abstract forms and as concrete properties as well as his commitment to their objective reality, since, in his opinion, they are mind-independent items of the world in both cases. Hence, the main goals of his reading of the chapters 6–8 of the Aristotelian treatise are showing the ordered internal structure of the chief categories of accidents, and reasserting their reality and real distinction from the category of substance, against those thinkers, like Ockham and his followers, who had attempted to reduce quantity and relations to mere aspects of material substances.

1. (Quantity) According to the standard realist interpretation of the Aristotelian doctrine of the categories, followed also by Alyngton among the nine genera of accidents, quantity is the most important one, as it is the basis of all further accidents, since quantity orders material substances for receiving quality and the other accidental forms (In Cat., cap. de quantitate, fol. 106r). On the contrary, Ockham had claimed that it was superfluous to posit quantitative forms really distinct from substance and quality, since quantity presupposes what it is intended to explain, that is, the extension of material substances and their having parts outside parts. As an accident, quantity needs substance as its substrate of inherence (cf. Ockham, Expositio in librum Praedicamentorum Aristotelis, cap. 10.4, in Opera philosophica, vol. 2, pp. 205–24). Like Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton denies that material substance can be actually extended without the presence of the general form of quantity in it, thereby affirming its necessity. Hence, he tries to confute Ockham’s argumentation. He thinks that the existence of quantity always implies that of substance, but he also believes that the actual existence of parts in a substance necessarily implies the presence of a general form of quantity in it, really distinct from the substance (say Socrates) in which it inheres, and formally distinct from the fact, grounded on the substance at issue, that this same substance is a quantified thing. For Alyngton, what characterizes quantity and differentiates it from the other accidental forms, and in particular from quality, are the following features: (1) being the appropriate measure of anything, and (2) being an absolute entity which makes it possible that material substances actually have parts outside parts (In Cat., cap. de quantitate, fols. 106v, 107r, 114v).

If the highest genus of the category of quantity is a form, the seven species Aristotle enumerates (line, surface, solid, time, place, number, and speech) clearly are not. Alyngton tries to meet this difficulty by reformulating the notion of quantified-thing (quantum), and by proposing a method for deducing the seven species of quantity from the highest genus (a sort of sufficientia quantitatum). He considers the seven species Aristotle lists not as quantitative forms, but as the most proper and primary bearers of the quantitative nature, revealed by the highest genus of the category. In fact, encouraged by the Aristotelian distinction between strict and derivative quantities (Categories 6, 5a38–b10), like Burley, he distinguishes two different ways of being quantified: by itself and accidentally (per accidens). Only the seven species of quantity would be quanta by themselves, while any other quantum would be such per accidens, and so indirectly, because of its connection to one (or more) of the seven quanta per se (In Cat., cap. de quantitate, fol. 116r).

In Alyngton’s view, the seven species of quantity correspond to the seven possible ways of measuring the being (esse) of the material substance. In fact, substance has two main kinds of being: permanent and in succession. And both of them can be either discrete or continuous. In turn, the being permanent and continuous of material substance can be measured either from inside or from outside. If from inside, then in three different modes: according to one, two or all the three dimensions proper to material substances. In the first case, the measure is line, in the second surface, and in the third solid. If it is measured from outside, then it is place. The being of material substance which is permanent and discrete is measured by numbers. The being which is in succession and continuous is measured by time. And finally, the being of substance which is in succession and discrete is measured by the quantity called ‘speech’ (oratio) (In Cat., cap. de quantitate, fol. 107r–v).

Alyngton’s derivation of the seven species of quantity from a unique principle common to them is unconvincing, but extremely interesting, nonetheless, as it clearly shows that he wants to stress the unity of the category of quantity, which at first appears heterogeneous, and to trace the problem of reality and real distinction of quantities back to that of the nature and status of its distinctive mark.

2. (Relations and Relatives) Aristotle’s treatment of relations in the Categories and in the Metaphysics is opaque and incomplete. Because of this fact, in Late Antiquity and the Middle Ages many authors tried to reformulate the doctrine of relatives. Alyngton’s attempt is the most interesting among those of the Late Middle Ages, as he was the only one able to work out a concept of relation conceived of as an accidental form which is in both the relatives at once, even if in different ways (In Cat., cap. de relatione, p. 296). Consequently his notion of relation can be considered the ontological equivalent to our modern functions with two variables, or two-place predicates, whereas all other authors of the Middle Ages had thought of relations in terms of monadic functions.

According to Alyngton, whose account partially differs from those of Burley and Wyclif, in the act of relating one substance to another four distinct constitutive elements can be singled out:

  1. the relation itself—for instance, the form of paternity;
  2. the substrate of the relation, that is, the substance that denominatively receives the name of the relation—for instance, the (substance that is the) father;
  3. the object of the relation, that is, the substance the substrate of the relation is connected with—for instance, the (substance that is the) son; and
  4. the foundation (fundamentum) of the relation, that is, the absolute entity in virtue of which the relation inheres in the substrate and in the object (In Cat., cap. de relatione, p. 299).

The foundation is the main component, since it (i) joins the relation to the underlying substances, (ii) lets the relation link the substrate to the object, and (iii) transmits some of its properties to the relation. Unlike Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton affirms that not only qualities and quantities, but substances too can be the foundation of a relation (In Cat., cap. de relatione, p. 291).

On this basis, Alyngton can define relations of reason while eliminating from their description any reference to our mind and using objective criteria only, based on the framework of reality itself. In fact, he maintains that what characterizes relations of reason is the fulfillment of at least one of these conditions: (i) either the relation’s subject of inherence or its object is not a substance; (ii) the object is not an actual entity; (iii) the foundation of the relation is not an absolute being—that is. a substance, a quantity, or a quality (In Cat., cap. de relatione, pp. 291–92, and 294–95).

3. (Quality) The chapter on quality is the least complex and interesting part of the whole commentary, since Alyngton is faithful to Aristotle’s text and doctrine, and sometimes even offers rather unproblematic analyses and elucidations. The main general topic he deals with is the internal structure of the category.

In the first lines of the eighth chapter of the Categories (8a25–26) Aristotle observes that quality is among those things that are spoken of in a number of ways—an affirmation which seems to imply that quality is not a highest genus, as, according to Aristotle himself, what is spoken of in a number of ways always gathers in several different natures. Furthermore, the Stagirite speaks of four species of quality (habits and dispositions, natural capacities and incapacities, affective qualities and affections, figures and shapes), without explaining how they are related to one another and to the highest genus of the category. No Aristotelian commentator had ever thought that quality was spoken of in many ways purely equivocally. Therefore no Aristotelian commentator had ever presumed that the term ‘quality’ could have several different (but connected) meanings. On the contrary, they unanimously took for granted that it had a unique ratio, common to all the items belonging to the category. They disagreed, however, about the status and hierarchical order of the four species mentioned by Aristotle. For example, Albert the Great held that quality at once and directly splits up into the four species, which would all be equally far from the highest genus. Duns Scotus, Ockham, and Walter Burley maintained that the so called ‘species’ of the quality were not properly species (or intermediate genera), but modes of quality, since many singular qualities would belong to the first three species at the same time, as, unlike species, modes are not constituted by opposite properties. Alyngton rejected both opinions. The latter because it compromises the actual goal of a correct categorial theory, and the former because it does not fit in with the standard infracatagorial structure described by Porphyry in his Isagoge. Consequently, he inserts an intermediate level between the highest genus of the category and the four species by claiming that quality is first of all divided into perceptible (sensibilis) and non-perceptible (insensibilis) qualities. Affective qualities and affections, figures and shapes stem from the former kind of quality, while habits and dispositions, natural capacities and incapacities derive from the latter. In fact, (1) figures and shapes are those perceptible qualities which inhere in substances because of the mutual position of its quantitative parts, while affective qualities and affections inhere in substances because of the form itself of the substantial composite. (2) Natural capacities and incapacities are inborn non-perceptible qualities, while habits and dispositions are due to the activity, both physical and, if it is the case, intellectual, of the substance in which they inhere (In Cat., cap. de qualitate, fol. 130r).

6. The Semantics of Second Intentions

Not until the end of the fourteenth century did anyone claim extramental reality for second intentions, not even Walter Burley. According to him, second intentions are concepts that have a foundation in the extramental world, but are not “things” in the proper sense of the term. This account implied that the keystone of medieval realism, the principle of one-to-one correspondence between language and the world, has to suffer an exception, since no common nature matches second intention terms. It was just in order to do away with this exception that Alyngton (then followed by William Penbygull, Roger Whelpdale, and John Tarteys) hypostatized second intentions, heavily modifying the standard theory of the status of second intentions. In fact, Alyngton not only considers second intentions as objective, but clearly hypostatizes them, speaking of them in terms of real determinations joined to the modes of being of extramental things and directly inhering in them (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 268–69). As a consequence, he conceives of logic as an analysis of the general framework of reality, since according to him logic turns on structural forms (aimed at building up semantic contents), which are, as forms, independent of both such contents and of the mental acts by which they are learned. It is through these forms that the network connecting the basic constituents of the world (individuals and universals, substances and accidents) is disclosed to us (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 278–79). The strategy that supports this choice is evident: as in the case of relations of reason, Alyngton is trying to substitute references to external reality for references to mental activity. In other words, he seeks to reduce epistemology to ontology. From a logical point of view, this means that the same interpretative pattern is employed in order to account for both the semantic power of proper names and common terms (that is, those expressions that refer to a class of individuals), and first and second intentions. Like proper names, common terms also primarily signify and label a unique object—that is, a common nature. But unlike the object signified by a proper name, the reality of the common nature is distributed among many individuals as their main metaphysical constituent, since it determines the typical features of the individuals themselves. By associating common terms with such objects as their main referent, Alyngton thinks he can explain the fact that a common term can stand for and label many individuals at once. Only in this way does he believe we can grant the value of our knowledge, which otherwise lacks an adequate foundation (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fols. 101v–102v).

Still, this procedure, so strong and powerful, leads to a paradox when applied to terms of second intention by which we speak of singular objects considered as such—that is, terms (or expressions) like ‘first substance’ (substantia prima), ‘individual’ (individuum), and so on. In fact, according to Alyngton (and many other Realists of that period), a common term is always matched by a common nature really existing in the world. Therefore, as the term ‘individual’ appears to be common, since it can stand for a multiplicity of things, it should signify an extramental common nature shared by them. As a consequence, we would have to admit the existence of an individual common nature, that is a (self-contradictory) entity present in all the individuals as the cause of their being individuals. Alyngton, who would not give up the principle of the one-to-one relation between philosophical language and the world, could remove this paradox only by classifying this kind of term among atomic (discreti) terms—that is, terms or nominal syntagms, like ‘Socrates’ or ‘this man’ (hic homo), that refer to individuals and not to sets of individuals. According to Alyngton, there are three main kinds of atomic terms:

  1. personal pronouns, which identify a singular definite referent by means of an ostensive definition (a demonstratione);
  2. proper names; and
  3. range-narrowed expressions (a limitatione intellectus)—that is, expressions, like ‘this man’, that identify a singular referent as a member of a given (manifested) set of individuals. Also expressions like ‘first substance’ and ‘individual’ belong to this third type, since they presuppose a general concept (substance and being, in the example), the range of which is narrowed to a unique object among substances and beings by an act of our intellect—to one object that is not common (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 270–71).

The rule that terms can be listed as common ones if and only if they signify a common nature is safe, but at the cost of a counterintuitive categorization of their semantic power. In fact, according to Alyngton’s account, saying that Socrates and Plato are first substances simply means that (i) each one is what he is, and that (ii) what each one is is a non-universal substance. This is a solution that entails that to be an individual is not a positive state of affairs, but a negative one, and therefore connects Alyngton’s ontology with Henry of Ghent’s theory of individuation.

7. Alyngton in the History of Medieval Thought

Alyngton’s metaphysics is an interesting example of that partial dissolution of the traditional doctrine which took place in between the end of the fourteenth and the beginning of the fifteenth centuries. Within Alyngton’s ontology, the relationships between primary (or individual) substances and secondary (or universal) substances, and between substances and accidents (both abstract and concrete) as well as the inner natures of essential and accidental predications are so different from their Aristotelian originals that the general meaning of the categorial doctrine is deeply modified. According to Alyngton, formal-and-essential predication and formal-and-accidental predication would correspond to Aristotle’s essential and accidental predications respectively. But he regards remote inherence as more general than formal predication. Therefore, in his system formal predication is a sort of sub-type of remote inherence. This means that he recognises a single ontological pattern, founded on a partial identity, as the basis of every kind of predicative relation. Thus, formal-and-essential predication and formal-and-accidental predication are very different from their Aristotelian models, as they express degrees in identity as well as remote inherence. As a consequence, the relationships between substance and accidents and between individuals and universals (and hence the ontological status of universal substances and that of accidents) are completely changed. In Alyngton’s view, both concrete accidents, qua modes of individual substances, and universal substances, qua the main components of the natures of individual substances, are really identical-to and formally distinct-from primary substances. Moreover, in the Categories Aristotle characterizes primary substances as those beings which are neither present in a subject nor predicable of a subject, and considers the capacity of underlying accidents as the constitutive principle of substance, while Alyngton defines primary substance as what (i) is apt to underlie potency and act, and (ii) has matter and form as its inner foundations, and explicitly affirms that underlying accidents is only a derivative property of substance. Finally, because of his strong propensity towards hypostatization, he interprets Aristotle’s theory of homonymy, synonymy, and paronymy as an ontological theory about real items and not as a semantic one about the relations between terms and things. Alyngton conflates the real and logical levels into one: like Burley and Wyclif, he considers logic as the theory of the discourse on being (ens), turning on structural forms and relations that exist in the world and are totally independent of the mental acts by which they are grasped. It is through these structural forms and relations that the network connecting the basic items of reality (individuals and universals, substances and accidents) is clearly disclosed. Yet, because of his peculiar ideas on substance and predication, his world is different from those of Burley and of Wyclif.


Edited works

  • Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis, in A.D. Conti, “Linguaggio e realtà nel commento alle Categorie di Robert Alyngton,” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale 4 (1993), pp. 179–306, at pp. 242–306. Partial edition: only chaps. 2, 3, 4, and 7, and the first section of chap. 5.

Secondary literature

  • Ashworth, E.J & P.V. Spade, 1992, “Logic in Late Medieval Oxford,” in The History of the University of Oxford, J.I. Catto & R. Evans eds., vol. 2, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 50–62.
  • Bale, J., 1557–59, Scriptorum illustrium Maioris Britanniae …, 2 vols. in 1, Basel: Joannes Oporinus.
  • Conti, A.D., 1993, “Linguaggio e realtà nel commento alle Categorie di Robert Alyngton,” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 4: 179–306.
  • –––, 2006, “Wyclif’s Logic and Metaphysics,” in I.C. Levy (ed.), A Companion to John Wyclif, Leiden: Brill, 2006, pp. 67–125, at pp. 118–124.
  • –––, 2008, “A Realist Interpretation of the Categories in the Fourteenth Century: the Litteralis Sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis of Robert Alyngton,” in L. Newton (ed.), Medieval Commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories, Leiden: Brill, pp. 317–46.
  • –––, 2010, “Realism,” in R. Pasnau (ed.), The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 647–60.
  • Conti, A.D. (ed.), 1990, Johannes Sharpe, Quaestio super universalia, Firenze: Olschki. See the “Studio storico-critico,” pp. 309–15.
  • de Libera, A., 1996, La querelle des universaux. De Platon à la fin du Moyen Age, Paris: Éditions du Seuil. See pp. 403–28.
  • de Rijk, L.M., 1977, “Logica oxoniensis: an Attempt to Reconstruct a 15th Century Manual of Logic,” Medioevo, 3: 125–55.
  • Emden, A.B., 1957–59, A Biographical Register of the University of Oxford to AD 1500, 3 vols., Oxford: Clarendon Press. (See vol. 1, pp. 30–31.)
  • Lohr, Ch.H., 1973, “Medieval Latin Aristotle Commentaries. Authors: Robertus-Wilgelmus,” Traditio, 29: 96–97.
  • McHardy, A.K., 1987, “The Dissemination of Wyclif’s Ideas,” in A. Hudson & M. Wilks (eds.), From Ockham to Wyclif, Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 361–62.
  • Spade, P.V. & G.A. Wilson (eds.), 1986, Johannis Wyclif Summa insolubilium, Binghamton, N.Y.: Medieval & Renaissance Texts & Studies. See the “Introduction,” especially pp. xxii–xlvii.

Other Internet Resources

  • Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis (in PDF), by Robert Alyngton. Maintained by Alessandro D. Conti, Università degli Studi di L’Aquila. It is a transcription from the ms. London, Lambeth Palace 393 of Alyngton’s commentary of the first nine chapters of Aristotle’s Categories.

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