William Penbygull

First published Wed Jul 25, 2001; substantive revision Tue Oct 4, 2016

Wyclif's logico-metaphysical works were very influential at Oxford at the end of the 14th century and the beginning of the 15th. Among the authors who followed his doctrines (the so called Oxford Realists), William Penbygull (+1420) was almost certainly the most faithful to the master, since his extant writings appear to be essentially devoted to a defence and/or explanation of Wyclif's main philosophical theses. Notwithstanding such an attitude, Penbygull made an original contribution to logic by developing a new theory of identity, which solved the problems that Wyclif's analysis of predication had raised, and by refining Wyclif's theory of predication itself.

1. Life and Works

The information on the life and works of William Penbygull (or Penbegyll) is scanty. He was from Exeter diocese; he studied at Oxford, where he was fellow of Exeter College in 1399, and rector in 1406–07. He was licensed to preach in the diocese of Bath and Wells on 28 February 1410. He probably died at Oxford in 1420. According to Emden 1957–59, he wrote the following treatises on logic: De universalibus (On Universals), Divisio entis (The Division of Being), and Super Porphyrii Isagogen (On Porphyry's Isagoge).

2. The Oxford Realists on Universals and Predication

The starting point of Penbygull’s theories on universals and predication are those worked out by Wyclif and one of his Oxford followers of the generation leading up to Penbygull: Robert Alyngton.

As is well known, Wyclif presents his opinion on universals as intermediate between those of Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome, on the one side, and Walter Burley, on the other (see the entry on Wyclif). Like Giles Wyclif recognizes three main kinds of universals: (1) ideal universals, which are the ideas in God and archetypes of all that is; (2) formal universals, which are the common natures shared by individual things; and (3) intentional universals, which are the mental signs by which we refer to the formal universals, or universals in re. On the other hand, like Burley, Wyclif holds that formal universals exist outside our minds in actu and not in potentia, even if, unlike Burley, he maintains that they are really identical with their own individuals (De enti in communi, ch. 5. p. 58). More precisely, universals and individuals are really the same but formally distinct, since they share the same empirical reality, which is that of individuals, but if considered as universals and individuals, they have opposite constituent principles: the generality or natural-tendency-to-be-common for universals, and the thisness or impossibility-of-being-common for individuals (see Tractatus de universalibus, ch. 2, pp. 62-63, ch. 4, pp. 86-87; ch. 10, pp. 208-13).

This description of the logical relationship between universals and individuals entailed the possibility of an indirect inherence of an accidental form in a substantial universal and of a second intention in any other. Therefore in the Tractatus de universalibus Wyclif distinguished three main types of real predication in order to guarantee such possibilities: formal predication (praedicatio formalis), predication by essence (praedicatio secundum essentiam), and habitudinal predication (praedicatio secundum habitudinem). These three kinds of predication are described by him as three non-mutually exclusive ways of predicating, each more general than the preceding (Tractatus de universalibus, ch. 1, p. 35), but it is evident that habitudinal predication does not require any kind of identity between the entities signified by the subject and predicate terms in the same way as formal predication and essential predication do. Formal predication is that in which the form designated by the predicate-term is directly present in the entity signified by the subject- term. Predication by essence (note that in this expression the term ‘essence’ has Wyclif’s technical meaning of real entity with a given nature—see the entry on Wyclif) is that in which the same empirical reality is both the real subject and predicate, even though the formal principle connoted by the predicate-term differs from that connoted by the subject-term. ‘God is man’ and ‘The universal is particular’ are instances of this kind of predication. Finally, habitudinal predication is that in which the form connoted by the predicate-term does not inhere, directly or indirectly (namely, not by itself but by means of something that is directly present in the thing signified by the subject-term), in the essence designated by the subject but simply implies a relation to it, so that the same predicate may be at different times said truly or falsely of its subject without any change in the subject itself (Tractatus de universalibus, ch. 1, p. 34). According to Wyclif, we use such predication mainly to express theological truths, such as God is known and loved by many creatures or brings about, as efficient, exemplar, and final cause many good effects.

As we have seen, the ontological presuppositions of the most general type of predication differ completely from those of the other two types by which it is implied. The final result of Wyclif’s choices was therefore an incompletely developed system of intensional logic that he superimposed on the traditional system. Because the ontological basis of the most general type of predication, namely habitudinal predication, is completely different from those of the other two types of predication that should imply it, Alyngton and other Oxford authors of the subsequent generation tried to improve Wyclif’s theory by excluding habitudinal predication and redefining the other two kinds in a slightly different way.

According to Alyngton, who depends on Avicenna and Wyclif on this topic, the formal universals are common natures in virtue of which the individuals that share them are exactly what they are, just as humanity is the form by which every man formally is a man. Unlike Wyclif, however, he does not think that universals exist in actu in the external world (see Alyngton, Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis., ch. de substantia, in A.D. Conti, "Linguaggio e realtà nel commento alle Categorie di Robert Alyngton," Appendix (provisional edition of part of Alyngton's commentary on the Categories), Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 4 (1993): 179-306, at p. 279). As natures, they are prior and indifferent to any division into universals and individuals. Although universality is not a constitutive mark of the nature itself, it is its unique, inseparable property. Also for Alyngton, universals are really identical-to and formally distinct-from their individuals. In fact, universals are formal causes in relation to their own individuals, while individuals are material causes in relation to their universals (see Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis., ch. de substantia, pp. 275-76). On this basis, Alyngton stated that (1) a universal in the category of substance can directly receive only the predications of substantial forms more common than it. So, for instance, only corporeity and animality can be directly predicated of humanity. And (2) the accidental forms inhering in individual substances can be predicated of the universal substantial form that those individuals instantiate only indirectly (or essentialiter according to his terminology) through and in virtue of the individuals themselves of that substantial form (see Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis., ch. de substantia, pp. 288-89). For instance, the general form of whiteness can be indirectly predicated of the general form of humanity in virtue of the individual forms of whiteness which inhere in individual men.

For this reason, Alyngton’s description of the logical structure of the relationship between universals and individuals demanded a redefinition of predication. Indeed, he was the first one to ameliorate Wyclif ’s theory by dividing predication into (1)formal predication (praedicatio formalis) and (2) remote inherence (inhaerentia remota)—or, in other words, predication by essence (praedicatio secundum essentiam). Remote inherence is grounded on a partial identity between subject and predicate, which share some, but not all, metaphysical constituents, and does not demand that the form signified by the predicate-term be directly present in the entity signified by the subject-term. On the contrary, such a direct presence is required by formal predication. ‘Man is an animal’ and ‘Socrates is white’ are instances of formal predication; ‘(What is) singular is (what is) common’ (‘singulare est commune’) and ‘Humanity is (something) running’ (‘humanitas est currens’) are instances of remote inherence, since, according to Alyngton, the property of running is imputable to the form of humanity, if at least one man is running. He is careful, however, to use a substantival adjective in its neuter form as a predicate-term, because only in this way can it appear that the form signified by the predicate-term is not directly present in the subject, but is indirectly attributed to it through its individuals (see Litteralis sententia super Praedicamenta Aristotelis., ch. de substantia, p. 289—see the entry on Alyngton).

3. Penbygull on Universals and Predication

Like many other Oxford Realists, Penbygull lists three main kinds of universals: (i) the metaphysical causes of everything, like God and the angelic intelligences; (ii) the general concepts abstracted by our mind, or mental universals; and (iii) the common natures existing in the singulars, or real universals (De universalibus, p. 178). Such common natures are type-forms naturally apt to be present-in and predicated-of a set of individuals, which therefore instantiate them. Real universals are the main metaphysical components of the individuals, but they have no being outside the being of their individuals, as universals and their individuals are really (realiter) the same and only formally (formaliter) distinct (De universalibus, p. 189). In fact, real universals are identical with their own individuals when considered as natures of a certain kind (for instance, man is the same thing as Socrates), but different from them when considered qua universals and qua individuals respectively, because of the opposite constitutive principles: generality for universals and thisness for individuals (De universalibus, p. 181).

Like Walter Burley and Wyclif, Penbygull holds that such formal universals exist in act (in actu) outside our minds, and not in potency (in potentia) only, as moderate realists (like St. Thomas Aquinas) thought, since for Penbygull the necessary and sufficient condition that a thing must meet for being a universal is the existence of at least one individual in which it is present (De universalibus, p. 178). So the actual existence of universals depends entirely on that of their individuals; without them, common natures could not be really universals.

On the logical side, this description of the relationship between universals and individuals in terms of real identity and formal distinction, entails that not all that is predicated of individuals can be directly (formaliter) attributed to their universals and vice versa. In particular, the accidental forms inhering in substantial individuals (for instance, the whiteness inhering in Socrates) can be predicated of the universal forms proper to these individuals (for instance, the form of humanity or that of animality) only indirectly (essentialiter), through and in virtue of the individuals themselves. As a consequence, a redefinition of the standard kinds predication and the introduction of a new type, unknown to Aristotle, was required, in order to cover the cases of indirect inherence of an accidental form in a substantial universal, admitted by this theory.

Penbygull, like other Oxford logicians of his generation, tried to improve Wyclif's theory by excluding habitudinal predication and redefining the other two kinds in a slightly different way. Penbygull therefore divides predication (which he conceives as a real relation which holds between metaphysical objects [De universalibus, p. 188]) into formal predication (praedicatio formalis), predication by essence (secundum essentiam), and causal predication. Predication by essence shows a partial identity between subject and predicate, which share some, but not all, metaphysical component parts, and does not require that the form connotated by the predicate-term be directly present in the essence denotated by the subject-term. Formal predication, on the contrary, requires such a direct presence. If the form connotated by the predicate-term is intrinsic to the nature of the subject, then the predication is a case of formal essential predication, while if it is extrinsic, the predication is a case of formal accidental predication. “Man is an animal” is an instance of formal essential predication; “Socrates is white” is an instance of formal accidental predication. Unlike Wyclif, who applied predication by essence to second intentions only—since he admitted sentences like “(What is) universal is (what is) singular” (that is, universale est singulare) as well-formed and true—Penbygull thinks that it holds also when applied to first intentions. So he claims that it is possible to predicate of the universal-man (homo in communi) the property of being white, if at least one of its individuals is white. However he makes sure to use as a predicate-term a substantival adjective in its neuter form, because only in this way can it appear that the form connoted by the predicate-term is not directly present in the subject, but is indirectly attributed to it, through its individuals. Therefore he acknowledges the proposition “The universal-man is (something) white” (homo in communi est album) as a true one, if at least one of the existing men is white (De universalibus, pp. 186–87). Finally, there is causal predication when the item signified by the predicate-term is not present in any way in the item signified by the subject-term, but the real subject has been caused by the real predicate (De universalibus, p. 188).

According to him formal essential predication and formal accidental predication would correspond to Aristotle's essential and accidental predication. But, as a matter of fact, he agrees with Wyclif in regarding predication by essence as more general than formal predication. As a consequence, in his theory formal predication is a particular type of predication by essence. This means that he implicitly recognizes a single ontological pattern, founded on a sort of partial identity, as the basis of every kind of standard philosophical statement (subject, copula, predicate). But in this way, formal essential predication and formal accidental predication are very different from their Aristotelian models, as they express degrees of identity as well as predication by essence.

Formal accidental predication is then further divided into secundum motum and secundum habitudinem (De universalibus, pp. 187–88). The basic idea of this last division seems to be that modes of being and natures of the accidental forms determine the set of substantial items which can play the role of their substrate. Penbygull distinguishes between those accidental forms that require a substance capable of undergoing change (per se mobile) as their own direct substrate of inherence, and those which do not need a substrate with such a characteristic. Forms like quantity, whiteness, alteration, diminution and so on belong to the first group, while relations of reason and respectus, like causation, difference, and so on, fall under the second one. The forms of the first group bring about formal accidental predication secundum motum, and the forms of the second group formal accidental predication secundum habitudinem. The former necessarily entail singular substances as their substrates, since individuals alone can undergo change, while the latter can directly inhere in both individual and universal substances (insunt denominative tam communibus quam singularibusDe universalibus, p. 188).

4. Penbygull's Theory of Identity

This interpretative scheme of the nature and kinds of predication is ultimately grounded on a notion of identity, necessarily different from the standard one. According to the most common opinion the logical criteria for identity and (real) distinction were the following:

a is identical with b if and only if for all x, x is predicated of a iff it is predicated of b;

a differs from (is [really] distinct from) b iff there is at least one z such that a is predicated of z and b is not, or vice versa, or there is at least one w such that w is predicated of a and not of b, or vice versa.

On this basis one can easily conclude that universals and individuals can never be the same, at least because of the forms of generality (which cannot be predicated of individuals) and of thisness (which cannot be predicated of universals). So Penbygull had to put forward new criteria for identity and distinction. First of all, he distinguishes between the notion of non-identity and that of difference (or distinction) and denies that the notion of difference implies that of non-identity (De universalibus, p. 190); then he affirms that the two notions of difference and (real) identity are logically compatible (ibid.); finally he suggests the following definitions for these three notions non-identity, difference or distinction, and (absolute) identity (De universalibus, pp. 190–91):

a is non-identical with b iff there is no form F such that F is present in the same way in a and b;

a differs from b iff there is at least one form F such that F is directly present in a but not in b or vice versa;

a is (absolutely) identical with b if and only if for any form F, F is present in a iff it is present in the same way in b.

The criterion for non-identity is stronger than the common one for real distinction: two things can be qualified as non-identical iff they belong to distinct categories. On the other side, the definition of difference does not exclude the possibility that two things which differ from each other share one or more properties (or forms). Thus, there are degrees of distinction, and what is more, the degree of distinction between two things can be read as the inverse measure of their (partial) identity. For instance, if we compare the list of the forms (both substantial and accidental) which constitute Socrates and those which make up the universal-man, it is evident that Socrates and the universal-man differ from each other, since there are forms which directly inhere in Socrates and not in the universal-man and vice versa; but it is also evident that the two lists are identical for a long section, that is, that Socrates and the universal-man, considered from the point of view of their metaphysical composition, are partially the same. As a result, the copula of the propositions which Penbygull deals with cannot be extensionally interpreted, as it does not mean that a given object is a member of a certain set, nor that a given set is included in another, but it always means degrees in identity between two compound entities.

Bibliography

Edited works

  • De universalibus (On Universals), in A.D. Conti, “Teoria degli universali e teoria della predicazione nel trattato De universalibus di William Penbygull: discussione e difesa della posizione di Wyclif,” Medioevo, 8 (1982): 137–203 (see pp. 167–203).

Secondary literature

  • Amerini, F., 2005, “What is Real. A Reply to Ockham's Ontological Program,” Vivarium, 43(1): 187–212.
  • Conti, A.D., 1982, “Teoria degli universali e teoria della predicazione nel trattato De universalibus di William Penbygull,” Medioevo, 8: 137–203.
  • –––, 2005, “Johannes Sharpe's Ontology and Semantics: Oxford Realism Revisited,” Vivarium, 43(1): 156–86.
  • –––, 2008, “Categories and Universals in the Later Middle Ages,” in L. Newton (ed.), Medieval Commentaries on Aristotle's Categories, Leiden: Brill, pp. 369–409.
  • –––, 2010, “Realism,” in R. Pasnau (ed.), The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 647–60.
  • Conti, A.D. (ed.), 1990, Johannes Sharpe, Quaestio super universalia, Firenze: Olschki, 1990. See the “Studio storico-critico,” at pp. 309–15.
  • de Libera, A., 1996, La querelle des universaux. De Platon à la fin du Moyen Age, Paris: Éditions du Seuil, at pp. 403–28.
  • Emden, A.B., 1957–59, A Biographical Register of the University of Oxford to A.D. 1500, 3 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press. (See Vol. iii, p. 1455.)

Other Internet Resources

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