Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Monism

Davidson’s argument for monism is supposed to be based upon assumptions—the interaction, cause-law and anomalism principles—each of which, on its own, is consistent with some version of dualism. Otherwise, the question of monism or dualism will have been begged at the outset. And the respective version of dualism must be one the ruling out of which would be a substantive philosophical achievement. Otherwise, the interest of Anomalous Monism will have been compromised. As we shall now see, these two constraints appear to be violated by Davidson’s rather innocuous-appearing invocation of a thesis of the causal closure of the physical:

Causal Closure of the Physical: every physical event has a physical explanation

In this section we look at this thesis and its bearing both on the argument for monism and, more broadly, the structure of Anomalous Monism.

Davidson assumes a version of this thesis when he writes “It is a feature of physical reality that physical change can be explained by laws that connect it with other changes and conditions physically described.” (Davidson 1970, 222). Davidson is claiming that it is part of the very nature of the physical realm that every physical event has a purely physical explanation—this is constitutive of the physical domain, a synthetic a priori principle (Davidson 1970, 221). (Given Davidson’s openness to the possibility of strict indeterministic laws (4.1), a more refined formulation of the closure principle would read ‘every physical event that has an explanation has a physical explanation’. For simplicity, we will work with the deterministic version stated above.) With this assumption in place, Davidson’s subsequent denial of strict laws incorporating mental predicates amounts to denying that there can be more than one fully adequate and complete (i.e., strict) explanation of any physical event. Only physical explanations can constitute such explanations of physical phenomena. This assumption, however, is quite problematic given Davidson’s wider aims of establishing monism. (This has been pointed out in different ways by McLaughlin 1985, Yalowitz 1998a, Hancock 2001, Antony 2003.)

This can be seen by considering the following dilemma: assuming the interaction principle, to hold that all causally explainable events have a physical causal explanation entails either that those mental events which cause physical events are also physical—token-identity—or else that these physical effects are overdetermined by both physical and mental events. Only these two mutually exclusive options would square the interaction principle with causal closure (Antony (2003, 5), arguing in a similar vein, fails to notice the second option). Davidson cannot directly embrace the first horn of this dilemma, since this would eliminate the need for independent argument, appealing to mental anomalism, to establish the token-identity of those mental events with physical events. He must, then, acknowledge the ‘overdetermining’ dualism of the second horn as an open question. However, this is the only position available that neither begs the question about monism nor conflicts with the assumptions of closure and the interaction principle. It is therefore the only position that the subsequent argument for monism, appealing to mental anomalism (and assuming causal closure), would actually rule out. There would thus be no argument against other forms of dualism (such as Descartes’ classic formulation) which denied causal closure of the physical domain.

Now, perhaps such dualistic conceptions of mind and nature have lost some credibility in the present philosophical and scientific climates (however, are they really any less credible than ‘overdetermining’ dualism, which on this view would be Davidson’s central opponent?). However, it would be both self-defeating and wasteful to give up a general argument for monism that would ground their rejection by simply assuming closure, which then rules them out by stipulation. It is also very difficult to believe that Davidson’s only opponent is ‘overdetermining’ dualism. It is far more ambitious and interesting to limit oneself to premises that many forms of dualism might share (such as the cause-law, interaction and anomalism principles) and then show that they inexorably lead to monism without reliance on the more controversial assumption of closure. That is true of Davidson’s argument for monism shorn of any commitment to causal closure: someone who espouses dualism along with the cause-law, interaction, and anomalism principles but eschews causal closure is nevertheless shown by that argument that dualism is inconsistent with her other commitments.

It would seem, then, that causal closure should not simply be assumed in Davidson’s setup. Is it entailed by anything necessary to that setup—the interaction, cause-law or anomalism principles? Davidson’s talk of the ‘open’ nature of the mental domain (2.3)—the fact, expressed in the interaction principle, that some mental events have physical causes—may have led him to think that the ‘closed’ nature of the physical domain followed directly, especially given the cause-law principle. But this is false. Notice first that to hold, as Davidson does, that the mental is an ‘open’ system—that mental events causally interact with physical events—does not by itself entail that the physical is ‘closed’ in the sense that every causally explainable physical event has a physical cause. More importantly, even with the cause-law principle in place, the openness of the mental does not entail that the physical domain (or any other domain, for that matter) is closed. Closure also depends partly upon whether mental anomalism is true. The latter’s falsity—the existence of strict psychophysical laws of succession—together with the cause-law and interaction principles is compatible with there not being a physical cause for every causally explainable physical event.

Furthermore, even if the interaction, cause-law and anomalism principles are all true, that still does not entail physical causal closure. There are events other than mental ones that are picked out in a non-physical vocabulary (e.g., biological events) and that cause physical events. Mental anomalism and monism do not entail anything about biology’s nomic or ontological status, and so it is consistent with Anomalous Monism that not all physical events have physical causes (Crane 1995 fails to see this point). Therefore, neither the interaction nor the cause-law principles (even together with the anomalism principle) entails causal closure. If causal closure is to figure in the arguments for anomalism or monism, it can do so only as a primitive assumption relative to these other premises.

We now need to ask about the motivation for assuming causal closure. What work does it do that might be worth the price of letting go of the more general argument against dualism? Now, the clearest appearance of the causal closure thesis comes when Davidson is offering the official argument for the anomalism principle (Davidson 1970, 222). Rationality is there cited as the constitutive feature of the mental, while closure is cited as the constitutive feature of the physical. And it is then claimed that these disparate commitments ground the anomalism principle (see 4.2). Clearly the structure of this sort of argument requires some characterization of the essence of the physical, in contrast to the mental, and Davidson’s strong commitment to causal closure may have led to its invocation here, due to a lack of alternatives. (He nonetheless insists that it does not provide a criterion of the physical (Davidson 1970, 211)). But in any case, since an assumption of closure conflicts with the aims of establishing monism, and otherwise would appear question begging, it is probably best left as a conclusion to be derived rather than as playing any supporting role in establishing Anomalous Monism.

Without the assumption, however, the question arises as to how to demarcate the mental and physical vocabularies. Without such a demarcation in hand, it can appear difficult to state what exactly is at issue when it is asked whether there can be strict psychophysical laws in particular. How can we recognize such a purported law without knowing what makes something a physical (or mental) predicate? As noted above (2.1), Davidson despairs of the possibility of an intuitively adequate definition of the mental. However, he allows, for his purposes of establishing monism, a criterion in terms of intentionality—having a propositional content. And this criterion of the mental then allows us to pick out the ‘physical’ by exclusion, without need of a positive criterion like causal closure (Davidson 1970, 211). So the vocabulary-individuation problem does not appear significant enough, even by Davidson’s own lights, to motivate the assumption of physical causal closure.

The assumption of causal closure thus conflicts with many of Davidson’s aims and procedures in arguing for Anomalous Monism. And, as we have seen, the assumption is not required in order to establish mental anomalism (4). However, we have also seen that causal closure does appear to play a role in Davidson’s actual derivation of token-identity—it allows him to identify the further property that causally interacting mental events must instantiate as ‘physical’ (5.1). On some readings of the anomalism principle, however, this role can be eliminated (see 4.3, and Yalowitz 1998a). Thus, although there is ample reason for setting the causal closure thesis aside from the general framework within which the argument for Anomalous Monism takes place, its ultimate status is unclear. (For discussion of how causal closure may itself be deduced from Davidson’s framework once Anomalous Monism is in place, see Yalowitz 1998a, 225.)

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

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