Anomalous Monism

First published Tue Nov 8, 2005; substantive revision Fri Sep 6, 2019

Anomalous Monism is a theory about the scientific status of psychology, the physical status of mental events, and the relation between these issues developed by Donald Davidson. It claims that psychology cannot be a science like basic physics, in that it cannot in principle yield exceptionless laws for predicting or explaining human thoughts and actions (mental anomalism). It also holds that thoughts and actions must be physical (monism, or token-identity). Thus, according to Anomalous Monism, psychology cannot be reduced to physics, but must nonetheless share a physical ontology.

While neither of these claims, on its own, is novel, their relation, according to Anomalous Monism, is. It is precisely because there can be no such strict laws governing mental events that those events must be identical to physical events. Previous identity theories of mind had held that claims concerning the identity of particular mental and physical events (tokens) depended upon the discovery of lawlike relations between mental and physical properties (types). Empirical evidence for psychophysical laws was thus held to be required for particular token-identity claims. Token-identity claims thus depended upon type-identity. Davidson’s position is dramatically different—it requires no empirical evidence and depends on there being no lawlike relations between mental and physical properties. It in effect justifies the token-identity of mental and physical events through arguing for the impossibility of type-identities between mental and physical properties. (For discussion of philosophical positions related to Anomalous Monism, see the supplement on Related Views.)

The appeal of Anomalous Monism is due to these enigmatic features, a fairly straightforward argumentative structure, and its attempt to bring together an intuitively acceptable metaphysics (monism) with a sophisticated understanding of the relation between psychological and physical explanatory schemes (anomalism). Its explicit assumptions are each intended, on their own, to be acceptable to positions opposing monism, but, when taken together, to show that monism is in fact required.

This entry also includes the following supplementary documents that are linked into the text:

1. The Argument for Anomalous Monism

The basic structure of the argument for Anomalous Monism is as follows. We start with the plausible assumption that some mental events, such as believing that it is raining, are caused by certain physical events, in this case the rain. Similarly, it is assumed that some physical events, such as one’s arm rising, are caused by certain mental events, such as deciding to scratch one’s head. Davidson calls this the Principle of Causal Interaction; we shall call it the interaction principle:

The Interaction Principle: Some mental events causally interact with some physical events

Davidson presents this assumption as obvious and not in need of justification, but we shall see that motivations for it can be found in parts of his writings (2.2). To this interaction principle is added the requirement that all singular causal interactions are covered by strict laws—laws with fully articulated antecedents which guarantee some fully articulated consequence (for caveats and details, see 3.1). Davidson calls this the Principle of the Nomological Character of Causality; we shall call it the cause-law principle:

The Cause-Law Principle: Events related as cause and effect are covered by strict laws

This cause-law principle was also initially assumed without argument by Davidson, though we shall see below (3.2) how he later came to try to justify it. Now, the assumptions so far seem to point directly to the existence of strict psychophysical laws—if some particular mental event m1 is caused by some particular physical event p1, then, given the cause-law principle, it seems to follow that there must be a strict law of the form ‘P1 → M1’. That is, whenever events of kind P1 occur, events of kind M1 must follow. However, Davidson then claims that there can be no such laws. He calls this the Principle of the Anomalism of the Mental, and it holds that mental properties are not suitable for inclusion in strict laws of any kind; we shall call it the anomalism principle:

The Anomalism Principle: There are no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can predict, explain, or be predicted or explained by other events

Davidson offered loose ruminations concerning rationality and rationalizing explanations, which purportedly constitute the very nature of mental properties, in support of the anomalism principle (4.2). All of this will be discussed in detail below.

With the interaction principle, the cause-law principle, and the anomalism principle now in place, we can see that there is a tension in need of resolution. From the interaction and cause-law principles it follows that there must be strict laws covering the interaction between mental and physical events. But the anomalism principle entails that there are no strict psychophysical laws. How can all three principles be held simultaneously?

To resolve the tension, Davidson noted that while the cause-law principle requires that there be strict covering laws, it doesn’t specify the vocabulary in which those laws must be formulated. If particular physical event p1 causes particular mental event m1, and there must be some strict law covering this interaction, but there is no strict law of the form ‘P1 → M1’, then there must be some other law, ‘?1 → ?2’, which covers the causal relation between p1 and m1. That is, m1 and p1 must instantiate properties suitable for inclusion in strict laws; but since we know that M1 is not a property of this kind, m1 must instantiate some other property. Davidson’s ingenious deduction at this point was that this property must be physical, since only the physical sciences hold out the promise of a closed system of strict laws (Davidson 1970, 223–24; on the notion of a closed system, see 5.1 and the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Monism). Therefore, every causally interacting mental event must be token-identical to some physical event—hence, monism (5.1):

Monism: Every causally interacting mental event is token-identical to some physical event

In arguing in this way, Davidson relies upon a key distinction between explanation and causation. While explanation is, intuitively, an intensional notion—one sensitive to how events are described—causation is extensional, obtaining between pairs of events independently of how they are described. For example, a bridge’s collapse is explained by the explosion of a bomb. That explosion, let us suppose, was the most newsworthy event of the day. While the most newsworthy event of the day caused the bridge’s collapse, ‘the most newsworthy event of the day’ does not explain that collapse. Telling someone that it was the most newsworthy event of the day that explained the bridge’s collapse wouldn’t provide an explanation—it wouldn’t make the bridge’s collapse intelligible to the audience—though it would pick out its actual cause. How the cause is described is relevant to whether an explanation occurs. Causes and effects can be accurately picked out using a variety of expressions, many of which are not explanatory. As we shall see, the distinction between causation and explanation is crucial to Anomalous Monism (6.1–6.3; see also related discussion of the intensionality of deterministic relations in Related Issues: 3.1 Anomalous Monism and Kant’s Theory of Freedom).

Finally, to alleviate certain concerns about the adequacy of the form of physicalism he was endorsing, Davidson endorsed a dependency relation of supervenience of the mental on the physical, and claimed that it was consistent with Anomalous Monism (5.1, 5.3) (Davidson 1970, 214; 1993; 1995a, 266):

Supervenience of the Mental on the Physical: if two events share all of their physical properties, they will share all of their mental properties

In what follows (2–5), each step of this argument will be analyzed and discussed separately, but always with an eye to the overall argument. In 6, a central objection to Anomalous Monism—that it appears unable to account for the causal/explanatory power of mental events and properties—will be explained and discussed. (For discussion of the relationship between Anomalous Monism and two other pillars of Davidson’s philosophy—his rejection of conceptual relativism and commitment to semantic externalism—see the supplement on Related Issues.)

2. Premise I: The Interaction Principle

The interaction principle states that some mental events causally interact with some physical events. In this section we will look briefly at a number of issues related to this principle: how mental and physical events are demarcated, the nature of events themselves, the scope of the interaction principle, the relationship between mental events and causation, and the use of the interaction principle in establishing one component of mental anomalism—psychological anomalism, according to which there can be no strict, purely psychological laws. Psychological anomalism is to be distinguished from psychophysical anomalism, which holds that there can be no strict psychophysical laws. This latter thesis will be explored in detail in our discussion of the anomalism principle (4).

2.1 Mental and Physical Events

Davidson restricts the class of mental events with which Anomalous Monism is concerned to that of the propositional attitudes—states and events with psychological verbs such as ‘believes’, ‘desires’, ‘intends’ and others that subtend ‘that-’ clauses, which relate subjects to propositional contents such as ‘it is raining outside’. Anomalous Monism thus does not address the status of mental events such as pains, tickles and the like—‘conscious’ or sentient mental events. It is concerned exclusively with sapient mental events—thoughts with propositional content that appear to lack any distinctive ‘feel’.

Though traditional and intuitive, this way of dividing up the domain of the mental isn’t without controversy. Generally, Davidson expresses some skepticism about the possibility of formulating a clear and general definition of the class of mental phenomena (Davidson 1970, 211). And he is suspicious about the idea of mental states given to, but uninterpreted by, concepts (Davidson 1974a), which is how philosophers have often thought of conscious phenomena. But for current purposes the class of propositional attitudes will suffice as a criterion for the mental. One key reason for so limiting the reach of Anomalous Monism, as we shall see (4.2), is that it is the rational status of the relevant mental events that Davidson usually cites as responsible for mental anomalism. Conscious events have traditionally been thought to occur in non-rational animals, a position with which Davidson shows some sympathy (Davidson 1985a). Such events thus appear to fall outside of the domain of the rational, and thus outside of the purview of Davidson’s argument.

Davidson is even less helpful about offering a criterion for the ‘physical’ (Davidson 1970, 211). One half-hearted attempt comes in the statement that

[p]hysical theory promises to provide a comprehensive closed system guaranteed to yield a standardized, unique description of every physical event couched in a vocabulary amenable to law. (Davidson 1970, 224)

This is at best a promissory note about some future language of ‘physics’—the ‘true’ physics—and it incorporates a requirement of the causal closure of the physical domain that creates problems for certain aspects of Anomalous Monism (see the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Anomalous Monism). It is probably best to take a ‘physical’ description simply to be one that occurs in the language of a future science that is similar to what we call ‘physics’ today but with none of its inadequacies. One important component of such descriptions is their capacity to figure in strict laws of nature (see 3.1). While this is non-negotiable for physical terms, it is an open question for mental terms, and Davidson will be arguing (4) for a negative answer.

When Davidson first argued for Anomalous Monism he subscribed to a causal criterion of event-individuation, according to which two events (event-descriptions) are identical (co-refer) if they share all the same causes and effects (Davidson 1969). He much later came to reject that criterion in favor of one according to which events are identical if and only if they occupy the same spatiotemporal region (Davidson 1985b). The difference between these views will not, however, be reflected in our discussion. It does not appear to affect either the derivation or the essential nature of Anomalous Monism. For our purposes, Davidson’s central claims are that what makes an event mental (or physical) is that it has a mental (or physical) description, and the extensionalist thesis that events are concrete entities that can be described in many different ways (‘the flipping of the light switch’, ‘the illuminating of the room’ and ‘the alerting of the burglar that someone is home’ can all pick out the same one event in different terms). (For controversies concerning extensionalism, see 5.2 and the supplement on Related Issues (Anomalous Monism and Scheme-Content Dualism).)

The interaction principle states that at least some mental events cause and are caused by physical events (Davidson 1970, 208). This leaves open the possibility of mental events that do not causally interact with physical events. However, given Davidson’s early views about event-individuation (the causal criterion) it is unclear that this possibility can be realized. His later views on event-individuation appear to leave this possibility open, but his general claims about the causal individuation of mental contents and attitudes (see 4.3 and 6.3 below) also stand in some tension with this possibility. In any case, Davidson goes on to say that he in fact believes that all mental events causally interact with physical events (Davidson 1970, 208), but he restricts his argument only to those that actually do. Given the pressures just noted in favor of the inclusive reading of the interaction principle, we shall assume it in what follows.

The interaction claim itself should be understood as follows: some events that have a mental description or instantiate a mental property cause and are caused by events that have a physical description or instantiate a physical property. Formulating the interaction principle in this way both clears the way for an extensional reading of the causal relation (events are causally related no matter how they are described), and also leaves open the possibility, which Davidson will subsequently argue for, that mental events in particular must have some non-mental description/instantiate some non-mental property. At this stage that possibility is left as an open question, but it is important to notice that for it to be an open question we need to at least allow for a distinction between events and the ways in which they are picked out in language.

2.2 Mental Causation

Though this will be focused on separately below (6), it is also important to recognize that we are beginning with the assumption that mental events cause and are caused by physical events. Many critics of Anomalous Monism have claimed that it is difficult to see how the position avoids epiphenomenalism—the view that mental events are causally/explanatorily impotent—and that Anomalous Monism is therefore unacceptable as an account of the place of the mental in the physical world. However, since Anomalous Monism is based upon the interaction principle, Davidson can claim in response that if Anomalous Monism is true, then mental events are already known to have a kind of causal efficacy. As we shall see, this point is not by itself sufficient to ward off all epiphenomenalist concerns about Anomalous Monism. But it does serve to remind us of the full framework within which challenges to Anomalous Monism must be assessed, and in particular brings out the reliance of that framework on specific assumptions about causality (see Sections 4.3, 6, and Yalowitz 1998a).

What needs to be noted at this point is that Davidson argued early on for the claim that mental events have causal efficacy, through noting a problem for non-causal accounts of action explanation (Davidson 1963). Mental events and states explain action by making it intelligible—rational—in light of the agent’s beliefs and purposes. The challenge that Davidson raised for non-causal theories of action explanation was to account for the fact that, for any action performed, there may well be a large number of mental events and states true of the agent, and capable of rationalizing the action, but that don’t thereby explain that action. The agent acted because of some specific beliefs and purposes, but other beliefs and purposes of his could just as easily rationalize that action, and thus be cited in its explanation. Was the agent moving his hand as he did because he wanted to swat the fly, relieve a cramp, or wave in greeting? He may well have wanted to achieve all three of these aims, but still only in fact performed the action because of one of these reasons. How do we understand ‘because’ so as to rule out the pretenders? Davidson’s claim was that it is only if we understand ‘because’ as ‘was caused by’ that we can justifiably pick out the genuine explanans—thereby imputing causal potency to mental events.

What exactly does this argument show? It is intended to tell against non-causal theories of action, which deny that reasons explain actions by causing them. There have been sophisticated attempts, on the behalf of non-causal theories of action explanation, to respond to this challenge (von Wright 1971; Wilson 1985; Ginet 1995; for a good overview, see Stoutland 1976; and see related discussion in 6.3.) However, assuming the argument is successful, while it does establish mental efficacy of a kind, it does not by itself establish the interaction principle. Establishing that reasons explain actions by causing them, and that therefore reasons causally interact with actions, does not establish that reasons causally interact with physical events. Dualists who reject the identity of mental and physical events will surely object.

A key point to grasp in many of the issues raised by Anomalous Monism is that there is an important distinction between action and behavior. According to Davidson, action is intentionally described behavior—the moving of a hand through space in a certain way may, but need not, be an action of waving or swatting or any action at all. It may simply be mere bodily behavior—as happens as the result of a muscle twitch or a strong gust of wind. The behavior must be caused by an agent’s beliefs and desires in order to be action. However, while this is necessary for action, it is not, according to Davidson, sufficient. The behavior must be caused in the right way by the beliefs and desires. Davidson notes the possibility of cases where an agent’s beliefs and desires cause behavior which is not rationalized by those states, and thus not action. A mountain climber might become so unnerved by his desire to rid himself of an annoying second climber sharing his rope and belief that jiggling the rope is a means for doing so that he unintentionally jiggles the rope, leading to the loss of the second climber. This is not an action—it is mere behavior that happens to him, no different than if caused by a muscle twitch or gust of wind. It is caused in the wrong way—a “deviant causal chain”—by the belief and desire, and so is not an action. Davidson is skeptical about the possibility of cashing out what it means to be caused in the right way (Davidson 1973b, 78–9), for reasons relating to mental anomalism (Davidson 1973b, 80; see 4 for explicit discussion). The key point for now is that because Davidson rejects the possibility of analyzing action in terms of behavior caused in a particular way by reasons, the point made by the ‘because’ argument cannot be used to establish that mental events cause physical events. It does not follow from the fact that reasons must cause actions in order to explain them that reasons must cause behavior or (the interaction principle) that reasons do cause behavior. It does not entail that actions are physical behavior.

This point is important when one considers the wider framework to which the interaction principle contributes. Since Davidson is attempting to derive monism from it and other principles that are themselves neutral about the metaphysics of mind, he cannot assume that action is (identical with) behavior on pain of circularity. Once monism has been established, Davidson will be in a position to deploy the ‘because’ point in order to argue for the claim that mental events are causally efficacious with respect to physical events. How this relates to the wave of epiphenomenalist criticism about Anomalous Monism will be explored in detail below (6, and see the supplement on Mental Properties and Causal Relevance). To summarize, the interaction principle is an unargued assumption in the Davidsonian framework, one that does not assume monism, and the ‘because’ argument, while important for ruling out non-causal theories of action, does not itself establish the interaction principle.

2.3 Psychological Anomalism

Davidson uses the interaction principle to establish directly one part of mental anomalism—psychological anomalism, which denies the possibility of strict, purely psychological laws of the form ‘M1 & M2 → M3’ (Davidson 1970, 224; 1974b, 243). For if physical events causally impact on mental events, then the mental domain is ‘open’, and any laws in which mental predicates figure will have to take this into account (for related discussion, see the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Anomalous Monism). More generally, physical conditions will always play some role in any plausible psychological generalizations, because physical intervention (e.g., injury) is always a possibility and can prevent the occurrence of the consequent ‘M3’. Thus, the only potentially true and strict laws in which psychological predicates can figure are variants of the psychophysical form ‘P1 & M1 & M2 → M3’. Psychophysical anomalism, the other component of mental anomalism and the one that denies the possibility of such strict laws, is thus the view that Davidson focuses on establishing.

3. Premise II: The Cause-Law Principle

The cause-law principle states that events related as cause and effect are covered by strict laws. In the earliest formulations of Anomalous Monism, Davidson assumed but did not argue for this principle. His later argument in support of it will be considered below (3.2), along with objections to the principle (3.3). But we need to consider the nature of the requirement contained in this claim, and how it relates to the framework out of which Anomalous Monism is deduced.

3.1 Strict Laws

The nature of the strict laws required by the cause-law principle is as follows. For any causal relationship between particular events e1 and e2, there must be a law of the form ‘(C1 & D1) → D2’, where ‘C1’ states a set of standing conditions, and ‘D1’ is a description of e1 that is sufficient, given C1, for the occurrence of an event of the kind ‘D2’, which is a description of e2. Traditionally, a strict law has been thought of as one where the condition and event-types specified in the antecedent are such as to guarantee that the condition or event-types specified in the consequent occur—the latter must occur if the former in fact obtain. But indeterministic or probabilistic versions of strict laws are possible as well (Davidson 1970, 219). The point that distinguishes strict laws is not so much the guaranteeing of the effect by satisfaction of the antecedent as the inclusion, in the antecedent, of all conditions and events that can be stated that could possibly prevent the occurrence of the effect. A strict indeterministic law would be one that specified everything required in order for some effect to occur. If the effect does not occur when those conditions obtain, there is nothing else that could be cited in explanation of this failure (other than the brute fact of an indeterministic universe). For reasons of simplicity, we will assume determinism in this discussion, though what is said about strict laws could be carried over without remainder to strict indeterministic laws.

The cause-law principle is aimed, in the first instance, at laws of succession, which cover singular causal relationships between events at distinct times. However, as will become clearer below, mental anomalism also takes in bridge laws that would correlate simultaneous instantiations of mental and physical predicates as well—such as ‘P1 → M1’, ‘M1 → P1’, or ‘P1 ↔ M1’. Indeed, mental anomalism rejects the possibility of any strict law in which mental predicates figure (where those predicates figure essentially, and are not redundant)—including (as we have seen (2.3)) laws formulated with purely mental predicates (‘(M1 & M2) → M3’), as well as laws with mental predicates in either the antecedent or consequent, such as ‘(M1 & M2) → P1’ and ‘(P1 & P2) → M1’ and mixed variants of these (see 4).

The denial of strict laws of these forms is consistent with allowing hedged versions of them which are qualified by a ceteris paribus clause. ‘All things being equal’ or ‘under normal conditions’, such psychological and psychophysical generalizations can, according to Davidson, be justifiably asserted (Davidson 1993, 9). As will be discussed below (4), denying the strict version of these generalizations amounts to denying that the qualifying clause ‘ceteris paribus’ can be fully explicated. That is, ‘ceteris paribus, ((M1 &  M2) → P1)’ cannot be transformed into something like ‘(P2 & P3 &  M1 & M2 & M3) →  P1’ (for a related discussion of this particular issue, see the debate between Schiffer 1991 and Fodor 1991).

(Davidson organizes his discussion of this transformation process, and Anomalous Monism more generally, around a distinction between ‘homonomic’ and ‘heteronomic’ generalizations (Davidson 1970, 219). That distinction is extremely problematic for the purposes of establishing Anomalous Monism, and is set aside here in favor of the related (but by no means identical) distinction between strict and ceteris paribus generalizations. For discussion of the former distinction, see the supplement on Homonomic and Heteronomic Generalizations.)

3.2 Justifying the Cause-Law Principle

Davidson argues for the cause-law principle—that singular causal relations require strict covering laws—on the basis of a conceptual interconnection between the concepts of physical object, event and law. As he says, “our concept of a physical object is the concept of an object whose changes are governed by laws” (Davidson 1995a, 274). The interconnections are established partly in response to C.J. Ducasse’s attempt, in reaction to Hume’s regularity theory of causation, to define singular causal relations without appeal to covering laws (Ducasse 1926).

Simply put, Ducasse defined some particular event c as the cause of some effect e if and only if c was the only change occurring in the immediate environment of e just prior to e. The striking of the match is the cause of the flaming match just insofar as the striking is the only change occurring in the immediate vicinity of the flaming match just prior to the flaming of the match. Ducasse intended this definition to rebut Hume’s claim that singular causal relations between particular events must be analyzed in terms of regularities between types of events (and thus laws). Indeed, Ducasse claimed that Hume was wrong to deny that we have the ability to perceive singular causal relations—this denial being the basis for Hume’s subsequent regularity account (see 3.3). For, according to Ducasse, we can perceive that some event is the only change in the immediate environment of some subsequent event just prior to that event’s occurrence. (We can, of course, be wrong in thinking that this is what we have in fact perceived. But as Ducasse points out, the same problem plagues Hume’s own account—we can be wrong that what we have perceived are instances of types which bear a regular relation to each other. But this does not lead Hume to hold that since we can’t infallibly perceive that some succession is an instance of a regularity, we cannot form the concept of causality in terms of regularity. The same thus applies to Ducasse’s own account.)

Davidson notes the heavy dependence, in Ducasse’s account, on the notion of a ‘change’. And he asks whether we really have a purchase on this concept absent appeal to laws. There are two aspects of this concern. First, the notion of ‘change’ is short for ‘change of predicate’—a change occurs when a predicate true of some object (or not true of that object) ceases to be true (or comes to be true) of that object. And this leads directly to questions about how predicates are individuated and their relationship to laws (see below). Second, and at a more general level, the notion of ‘change’ has itself changed over time—for instance, Newtonian mechanics defines a change differently than Aristotelian physics, so that continuous motion counts as a change, and thus requires an explanation, according to the latter but not the former. Thus, the very notion of ‘change’ is theory dependent, and therefore (Davidson holds) presupposes the notion of ‘law’, in the sense that something counts as a change, and thus as having a cause, only against a background of theoretical principles.

This second point does not appear to deliver the result Davidson is after—establishing that each causal interaction must be covered by a particular strict law. The claim that something is a change, and thus has a cause, only if certain theoretical assumptions are in place is consistent with the claim that those assumptions (for instance, that uniform rectilinear motion does not count as a change) cannot play the explanatory role for specific causal interactions that strict laws are supposed to play. They are simply of too general a nature—they don’t enable predictions or explanations of any particular events. And in any case, there appears to be nothing in Davidson’s considerations here that forces the requirement that the covering laws be strict as opposed to irreducibly ceteris paribus. (As we have already seen (3.1), Davidson himself has insisted upon the legitimacy and ubiquity of such laws in scientific explanation.)

Returning to the first point about predicate-individuation, Davidson claims that “it is just the predicates which are projectible, the predicates that enter into valid inductions, that determine what counts as a change” (Davidson 1995a, 272). We know from Nelson Goodman’s ‘new riddle of induction’ (Goodman 1983) that we can invent predicates, such as ‘grue’ and ‘bleen’ (where an object is grue if it is green and examined before 2020 or otherwise blue, and an object is bleen if it is blue and examined before 2020 or otherwise green) so that a green object goes from being grue to bleen over the course of time without having changed in any intuitive sense. It will continue to be green, though it will also be true that it ceases to be grue and comes to be bleen. Contrary to much discussion of Goodman’s riddle, Davidson holds that such unusual predicates can be projectible, and figure in laws, but only when appropriately paired with other such predicates ( “All emeralds are grue” is not lawlike, but “All emerires are grue” is (where “emerire” is true of emeralds examined before 2020 or otherwise sapphires ). What is crucial for Davidson is that to understand the notion of change, which is so closely tied to the notion of causation, one must understand the notion of a projectible predicate—one appropriate for use in science—and this notion inevitably brings in the notion of law. Changes are described by predicates suitable for inclusion within laws. But how does this relate to the cause-law principle? Once again, it is unclear why Davidson would think that it is the notion of a strict law in particular that this line of argument motivates.

A related line of argument that Davidson offers (see 4.3) appears to suggest that dispositional predicates—those defined in terms of the effects they tend to bring about—are not suitable for inclusion in strict laws (generalizations in which they figure are always qualified by a ceteris paribus clause), but there must be strict laws at the bottom, so to speak, of the dispositional vocabulary. Davidson’s discussion of this issue refers back to an older debate about the status of dispositional terms—specifically, whether they are ‘place-holders’ for predicates that are non-dispositional (‘intrinsic’ or ‘manifest’) (see Goodman 1983, 41ff). Whatever one’s view about that issue, it again does not appear that Davidson has provided adequate argument for establishing that strict laws (as opposed to ceteris paribus laws) are required for our dispositional vocabulary to operate as it does. So Davidson does not appear to have provided the cause-law principle with a plausible rationale (for skepticism about the principle, see Anscombe 1971, Cartwright 1983, McDowell 1985, Hornsby 1985 and 1993, and 3.3 below). This is not to say that it is false, or even that it is implausible to assume it in his argument for Anomalous Monism. Many find the principle highly intuitive, and it is worthwhile to explore its relation to the other central claims in Davidson’s framework.

3.3 Objections to the Cause-Law Principle

The cause-law principle has come in for a lot of criticism since it received its canonical formulation in Hume’s regularity theory of causation, and it is worth briefly reviewing some of the central objections relevant to Davidson’s own discussions. This will make clear how important it is, for an argument such as Davidson’s for Anomalous Monism, that some justification for the thesis ultimately be provided.

An initial objection is that Hume’s analysis of singular causal statements (‘a caused b’ is true if and only if ‘whenever an A occurs, it is followed by an occurrence of a B’), which articulates his own version of the cause-law principle, is not an accurate rendering of the way in which we typically use the term ‘cause’. We are confident in judgments such as ‘Harry’s smoking caused his lung cancer’ while knowing that in fact not all smokers are stricken by lung cancer. This point is entirely general—we make singular causal judgments all the time without believing in (indeed, while knowing the falsity of) the associated universal generalization (see Anscombe 1971). However, Davidson’s extensionalism about causality provides a straightforward response to this concern. His view is that while we may not believe in the associated universal generalization, that is consistent with there being some universal generalization, stated in a different vocabulary than the singular causal statement, which ‘covers’ that statement. (It is worth noting that Davidson rejects Hume’s analysis of singular causal statements in terms of universal generalizations—he holds that the requirement of such a covering generalization is necessary but not sufficient for the truth of such a statement (Davidson 1967).)

While this response does appear to meet the objection, it raises the following concern, which is behind a related objection to the cause-law principle: no one in fact seems to know any true predictive ‘strict’ laws (in the literal sense of that term). Now, while it is certainly consistent with this point that there are or even must be such laws, it becomes more pressing to know why we should think this if we cannot even offer any examples. It is well and good for Davidson to point to the possibility of strict covering laws that transcend our current knowledge, but we need to know why we should believe in such things. Science seems to have done well for itself without any apparent use of them.

Another objection to the cause-law principle comes from the state of contemporary physics. According to quantum mechanics, it is not simply difficult or impossible for us to state such laws for quantum phenomena. Rather, quantum theory appears to entail that determinism fails to obtain at the level of microparticles. What the theory and the behavior of such particles tells us is that causation, at least at the level of micro phenomena, is indeterministic. And this indeterminism is claimed to be inconsistent with the requirement of strict laws. This objection to the cause-law principle, then, is that philosophy should never dictate to science on empirical matters. Observation of the world tells us that strict laws are impossible in this domain even while causation is present, in direct contradiction of the cause-law principle.

Now, we have already seen Davidson’s own response to this sort of objection (3.1). As traditionally construed, strict laws are supposed to guarantee the consequent condition on the basis of the antecedent condition. But they do not need to provide such a guarantee. What strict laws require is that the antecedent include all conditions and events that could possibly prevent the occurrence of the consequent. If the consequent does not occur when all these conditions have been accounted for, there is nothing else to be cited in explanation of the non-occurrence other than the sheer brute fact of an indeterministic universe. So indeterministic causation is entirely consistent with the cause-law principle (Davidson 1970, 219). The determinist/indeterminist and strict/nonstrict law distinctions do not map neatly onto each other. An indeterministic law can be universal, exceptionless and true. This point does not appear to be recognized by central proponents of the indeterministic objection to strict laws (see Cartwright 1983).

A final objection to the cause-law principle which is more internal to the wider framework of Anomalous Monism has been put forth in McDowell 1985. McDowell sees a tension between Davidson’s allegiance to the cause-law principle and his rejection of ‘the dualism of scheme and content’ (Davidson 1974a). Briefly, the dualism Davidson opposes is the idea that, for instance, a perceptual judgment is the rational upshot of an interaction between a concept and an nonconceptualized experiential element—the sensory input. Given Davidson’s systematic rejection of this idea, McDowell believes he ought to disavow the cause-law principle. McDowell doesn’t think the principle is required for a minimal version of materialism (see the supplement on Related Views (Bare Materialism), and without the need to justify materialism McDowell sees the principle as lacking any motivation in Davidson’s framework. For discussion of this issue and others related to scheme-content dualism and Anomalous Monism, see the supplement on Related Issues (Anomalous Monism and Scheme-Content Dualism).

4. Premise III: The Anomalism Principle

The anomalism principle states that there are no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can predict, explain, or be predicted or explained by other events. In this section we look at different interpretations of the argument for this principle. Davidson’s own formulations, while suggestive, are notoriously vague and often appeal to very different sorts of considerations, including aspects of language and interpretation, questions about psychological explanation, and the nature of causality and dispositions. We shall be looking at specific interpretations as well as the problems they face in providing a compelling rationale for both the anomalism principle and Anomalous Monism.

While differing in important ways, the various formulations of the argument, as well as the objections to them, exhibit a discernible pattern: proponents of mental anomalism highlight some feature of mental properties that is claimed to (1) sharply individuate them from physical properties and (2) create a conceptual tension with physical properties that precludes the possibility of strict lawful relations between these properties. According to the objections, however, the highlighted feature of mental properties either does not serve to distinguish it from physical properties or does not actually stand in any conceptual tension with physical properties that rules out lawlike relations. We will consider each interpretation, and its problems, in turn. In a later section (5.3) we will look at another objection related to the anomalism principle—that it is inconsistent with Davidson’s invocation of the doctrine that mental properties stand in a relation of supervenience to physical properties. For discussion of the relation between the anomalism principle and Davidson’s views about scheme-content dualism and semantic externalism, see the supplement on Related Issues.

Mental anomalism, as initially formulated by Davidson, holds that there can be no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained (Davidson 1970, 208). It is thus restricted to ruling out strict laws of succession with mental predicates occurring in the consequent—laws such as ‘P1 → M1’, ‘(M1 & P1) → M2’, or ‘M1 → M2’. It thus denies that the occurrence of particular mental events such as coming to believe or intend something, or intentionally acting in some way, can be explained by appeal to strict covering laws. But as becomes clear, Davidson’s considered position rejects the possibility of any strict laws in which mental predicates figure—and this includes, in particular, bridge laws of the form ‘P1 ↔ M1’, which form the basis of type-identity theories of mind, as well as any strict laws with mental antecedents. We have already seen how strict purely psychological laws are ruled out by the interaction principle (2.3). And, at a more general level, it rules out purported solutions to the problem of deviant causal chains noted in 2.2, which would spell out, in terms of some required physical and also, perhaps, mental conditions, how behavior must be caused by reasons (“caused in the right way”) in order to be action. (That some physical conditions are necessary in such an analysis is guaranteed, as we have seen (2.3), by the open nature of the mental and subsequent psychological anomalism.) Any such adequate analysis of action would entail particular psychophysical laws of the form ‘(M1 & M2 & M3 & P1) → P2’. For such an analysis would state that whatever behavior (P2) which in fact is caused in the right way (M3 & P1) by reasons (M1 & M2) would be the action that is rationalized by those reasons. This provides a schema for generating strict psychophysical laws: by plugging in particular reasons and the causal conditions P1 and M3 proffered by the analysis, we get a strict predictive psychophysical law simply by noting what effect is produced by these causes. (In the course of an extended discussion of the problem of deviant causal chains, Bishop 1989, 125–75, fails to see this connection between it and mental anomalism—see 164.) With strict purely psychological laws thus already ruled out, the focus now is on strict psychophysical laws.

It is useful to view Davidson’s attack against psychophysical laws in light of an argument, in vogue in the 1950s and 1960s, against the claim that reasons are causes of the actions they explain. This argument was referred to as the “Logical Connection Argument” (see Stoutland 1970). According to this argument, reasons cannot be held to explain actions by causing them because (1) causes and effects must be logically distinct from each other (one of Hume’s requirements on causality) but (2) reasons and the actions they explain bear a quasi-logical connection to each other, by virtue of the rationalizing relation between them. That relationship is quasi-logical because not just any reason can explain any action—only those reasons which actually rationalize (make intelligible) an action can explain it. Davidson’s own influential response to this argument was to distinguish between causal relations, which obtain between events no matter how they are described, and logical relations, which obtain between particular descriptions of events. The Logical Connection Argument fails to recognize this simple distinction. The distinction allowed Davidson to merge two key ideas in his theory of action—that reasons explain by causing, and that they explain by rationalizing (Davidson 1963, 13–17). As we shall see below, however, Davidson appears to accept a basic distinction at the heart of the Logical Connection Argument—that the rationalizing relationship bears a certain key property (quasi-logical status) that is at odds with the relationship between physically described, causally related events.

4.1 The Holism/Indeterminacy Arguments

Davidson’s explicit considerations in favor of mental anomalism appeal to factors about the interpretation of action (linguistic as well as non-linguistic) and the ascription of mental states and events to persons. Several distinguishable features are noted—holism with respect to particular ascriptions, indeterminacy with respect to systematic interpretative frameworks, and the responsiveness of mental ascription to an ideal of rationality. According to holism, particular mental states can be cited in explanation of behavior only in the context of other mental states, which in turn depend upon others. Davidson claims that this dependency and holistic interrelatedness is “without limit” (Davidson 1970, 217). This echoes a related point he makes about the impossibility of definitional reduction of mental states in purely behavioristic terms, because of the ineliminable need for mental caveats (e.g., that the person understands, or notices or cares….) qualifying any attempt to state non-mental conditions for mental states.

Davidson presents these claims about definitional reduction as facts which “provide at best hints of why we should not expect nomological connections between the mental the physical” (Davidson 1970, 217). If definitional reduction of this kind were in fact impossible, it would rule out the possibility of a subclass of strict psychophysical laws—those relating mental states with non-intentionally described behavior—but the basis for this impossibility would not have been explained. In fact, however, without knowing what that basis is supposed to be, we have no reason to accept Davidson’s claim that definitional reduction is indeed impossible. What prevents us from articulating all the required caveats? Without a rationale in hand, nothing prevents a reductionist from simply offering us detailed definitions and challenging us to come up with counterexamples. Something both principled and convincing is clearly needed. Davidson’s concerns about definitional reduction are ‘hints’ concerning nomological reduction only in the sense that they draw out our intuitions about something standing in the way of formulating such laws. What that obstacle is needs clear formulation.

At times, Davidson appeared to flirt with the idea that the missing link was provided by the thesis of the indeterminacy of translation, developed by W.V Quine (1960) and endorsed by Davidson (1970, 222; 1979). This thesis claims that there are empirically adequate but non-equivalent complete frameworks for assigning linguistic meanings and mental states to a person on the basis of his behavior, and that there is no fact of the matter that determines that one but not other such frameworks is correct. In particular, there are no physical facts, inside a person’s body or head or outside in the external world, that could settle whether a person’s words refer to some determinate range of objects rather than some other range, or whether one rather than another systematically interdependent set of mental states, with distinct distributions of truth values, is true of that person (see Davidson 1979). If the indeterminacy thesis is true, then on the face of it there would be some rationale for rejecting the possibility of psychophysical laws. For if all physical facts are consistent with different psychological/semantic assignments, then it seems that knowing all the physical facts could not tell us whether some mental states were true of some person, or some meaning true of her words—neither could be exceptionlessly predicted or explained, just as mental anomalism maintains.

There are two problems with this, however. First, this would do nothing to rule out certain psychophysical laws, such as those of the form ‘M1 → P1’. And so it couldn’t ground the completely general thesis of mental anomalism. But more importantly, Davidson himself holds that the least controversial versions of indeterminacy, having to do with diverging reference schemes, amount to mere notational variance—as he puts it, meaning is what is invariant between empirically adequate translation schemes (Davidson 1977, 225; 1999a, 81). And given that such schemes are generated through a purely mechanical permutation function (Davidson 1979, 229–30) it is a relatively simple technical trick to take these different schemes into account when formulating psychophysical laws. The laws, for instance, could be formulated with disjunctive predicates (‘P1 → (M1 ∨ M2 ∨ M3’). Or, if such predicates are considered problematic, the laws could be of the form ‘P1 → M*’, where ‘M*’ picks out the invariant element between the empirically equivalent theories. So it is not at all clear that indeterminacy in and of itself is capable of supporting an across-the-board rejection of strict psychological or psychophysical laws. And Davidson ultimately acknowledges this, in stating that anomalism would hold even if indeterminacy didn’t (Davidson 1970, 222).

4.2 The Rationality Arguments

What is responsible for the possibility of indeterminacy, however, is the role of the principle of charity in formulating a theory of another person’s behavior (Davidson 1970, 222–23). And this principle is closely aligned for Davidson with mental anomalism. According to this principle, we must “try for a theory that finds him consistent, a believer of truths, and a lover of the good (all by our own lights, it goes without saying)” (Davidson 1970, 222). In the process of coming to understand another, by ascribing mental states and events to him and meanings to his words, we must, Davidson claims, stand ready to adjust previous assignments of meanings and mental states and events based upon new evidence about the person and how it relates to the overall project of finding him and his behavior intelligible. There are two key points here that for Davidson suggest mental anomalism. First, we never have all possible evidence—we must maintain an openness to better interpretations of previous behavior as new evidence becomes available. Interpretation is always ongoing. And second, ‘better’ interpretations are those made in light of the constitutive ideal of rationality. Consequently, Davidson claims,

there cannot be tight connections between the realms [of the mental and the physical] if each is to retain allegiance to its proper source of evidence. (Davidson 1970, 222)

Rationality is claimed by Davidson to be constitutive of the mental in the sense that something only counts as being a mind—and thus an appropriate object of psychological attributions—if it meets up to certain rational standards. This constitutive idea is open to weaker and stronger interpretations. The weaker interpretation sees only very basic logical, semantic or conceptual constraints on understanding others—and thus what is constitutive of minds—which allows for significant variation as one moves further out from these to more substantive principles of practical reasoning and theoretical reasoning, and even more when extending out further to desires and values. The stronger interpretation appears to be suggested in the quote from Davidson immediately above. In requiring consistency, true beliefs and appropriate desires, it appears to require maximizing agreement between interpreter and interpreted, and thus a maximal conception of what is constitutive of minds. The weaker interpretation instead requires merely minimizing inexplicable error on the part of the creature being interpreted, thus allowing for significant deviations from psychological assignments that might be required by the stronger interpretation. On this view, the interpreter puts himself into the shoes of the interpreted, acknowledging evidential and cognitive limitations that might prevent her from achieving maximal rationality (Grandy 1973). As we will see in this section, how one interprets the notion of rationality as constitutive directly affects how the argument for mental anomalism is interpreted to work.

While Davidson never offers any substantive account of what the proper source of evidence is for the physical, he often invokes the notion of rationality as constraining mental ascription, and it is clear that whatever constrains physical ascription is supposed to pull in a different and potentially conflicting direction. One suggestive way of getting at Davidson’s idea here is through the traditional distinction between ‘normative’ and ‘descriptive’ concepts. When we look to uncover generalizations in the physically described world, what we find to follow from a certain set of physical conditions is a brute fact; our world is constituted in certain ways (in its governing laws) that we could imagine to be different. We may come to an empirical investigation with certain theoretical commitments that inevitably lead us to read the data in some ways rather than others; and there may indeed, as Davidson himself suggests, be constitutive a priori principles that govern very basic physical concepts such as ‘object’ and ‘event’ (Davidson 1970, 220; 1974b, 239; 1973a, 254; see 3.2 above). However, the constraints are far looser and allow for a wide variation in terms of empirical content—of what physical events and states can follow from others. This is contrasted with mental ascription, where the normative notion of rationality rules out the possibility of certain mental states following from others. This line of thinking is suggestive, but it is in need of considerable tightening.

4.2.1 Normative vs. Descriptive Principles (Kim)

Jaegwon Kim’s account of Davidson’s position (Kim 1985) attempts to do just this. Kim argues that if there were strict lawlike relations between mental and physical predicates, the ‘brute factness’ and contingency of the physical would ‘infect’ the mental. For instance, rationality considerations will typically lead us to attribute a belief that q to a person if we attribute a belief that p and also attribute a belief that p entails q. According to Kim’s account, beliefs involving very basic logical, semantic or conceptual relations like this hold of necessity—we cannot make sense of possible worlds where beliefs of the first two kinds are attributed but not the third.

Now, this may appear to be too strong a claim, in light of Davidson’s rejection of strict, purely psychological laws—mental anomalism rejects the possibility of any strict laws in which mental predicates figure, but Kim here appears to be deploying laws of the form ‘M1 & M2 → M3’. Kim would reply that Davidson is only interested in rejecting strict descriptive (i.e., explanatory, predictive) laws, not strict normative laws (see below).

If physical predicates stood in strict lawful relations to mental predicates, this contingency would ‘infect’ the mental in the following sense. Suppose that there were strict bridge laws correlating the instantiation of mental and physical properties, ‘P1 ↔ M1’ and ‘P2 ↔ M2’. Then, Kim argues, rational principles of the form ‘M1 →  M2’ would enable the logical derivation of physical laws like ‘P1 → P2’. Indeed, the reverse would be true as well; starting with the physical law ‘P1 → P2’, and assuming the psychophysical bridge laws, one could derive the rational principle ‘M1 → M2’. However, the metaphysical status of the rational principle and the physical law are importantly different—rational principles are necessary, true in all possible worlds, while physical laws, being contingent, are not. In particular, with the bridge laws in place, a contingent physical law could explain (through derivation) the rational principle, undermining its status as necessary. Since it is the bridge laws that enable these troublemaking derivations, they—and thus strict psychophysical laws—are to be rejected. This is how Kim makes sense of Davidson’s suggestive claim that mental anomalism is grounded in the fact that mental and physical explanation owe their allegiance to different sources of evidence. (For related discussion, see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism.)

Kim’s argument rests upon two central assumptions. First, it assumes that no distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws need play any role in reconstructions of Davidson’s argument. It is, purportedly, not the scope of a psychological law which accounts for an asymmetry with physical laws, but rather the point of each type of law (Kim 1985, 381). Second, it assumes that there is a firm distinction between descriptive laws and relations, on the one hand, and normative laws and relations, on the other, that can bear the weight of mental anomalism (Kim 1985, 383) The first assumption is clearly mistaken; as already noted, Davidson heavily emphasizes the focus on strict laws in his own discussions of Anomalous Monism, and explicitly allows for the possibility of hedged laws incorporating mental predicates. Kim’s reductio strategy, then, would fail to uniquely identify the culprit responsible for producing the trouble as the bridge laws rather than the rational principle, all of which are strict. And while Davidson does emphasize the normative status of mental predicates, he also recognizes, as we have already noted (3.2 and 4.2), a normative component to the physical realm, in constitutive a priori principles. There does not appear to be a significant distinction between descriptive and normative principles in Davidson’s framework that can bear the burden of mental anomalism, as required on Kim’s interpretation. (For further discussion of Kim’s interpretative strategy, see the supplement on Kim’s Reductio Strategy for Establishing Mental Anomalism.)

4.2.2 Uncodifiability and Strong Rationality as An Ideal (McDowell)

John McDowell also focuses on the normative nature of rationality, but emphasizes a very strong conception of rationality as an ideal constitutive of the mental, taking in more than merely the familiar deductive relations—logical, semantic or conceptual—deployed in Kim’s reading (McDowell 1985, 391–4). McDowell appears to be guided by some of Davidson’s broader formulations and discussions of the principle of charity (4.2), which extend to more general principles governing action and belief formation, highlighted in Davidson’s discussions of irrationality (see Davidson 1982). For example, the principle of continence requires one to act on the basis of all available considerations, and the principle of total evidence requires one to believe the hypothesis supported by all of one’s evidence. And the broad formulations entail that our conception of rationality includes conceptions of the Good, and so the formation of rationally appropriate desires, thus extending beyond constraints on belief and action. According to McDowell, those inclined to think that mere deductive relations can be captured in physical terms (see Loar 1981) will find mental anomalism much more difficult to deny when taking into account this stronger conception of rationality.

This stronger conception of rationality puts McDowell in a position to exploit a crucial gap between rational norms and actual explanations of behavior:

Finding an action or propositional attitude intelligible, after initial difficulty, may not only involve managing to articulate for oneself some hitherto merely implicit aspect of one’s conception of rationality, but actually involve becoming convinced that one’s conception of rationality needed correcting, so as to make room for this novel way of being intelligible. (McDowell 1985, 392)

Just as our beliefs about empirical matters can be mistaken in any given case, and we can make genuine discoveries about empirical reality, just so with rationality. Clearly this claim is much more plausible with the stronger conception of rationality that McDowell is urging than the weaker conception limited to mere deductive relations. McDowell goes on to argue that because of this feature, we must be open to the possible reinterpretation of a person’s behavior and psychological states in light of our changing conception of rationality, and how it changes cannot be anticipated in advance so that rationality could be captured in a permanent set of principles from which strict laws could be fashioned. For this reason, rationality is uncodifiable. According to McDowell, this is what underlies mental anomalism.

One might understand the reasoning here in the following way: because it is built into our conception of rationality that our own particular grasp of rationality may be mistaken on any given occasion and is also inherently limited, no statement of psychological or psychophysical generalizations could exhaust, and therefore explain, our conception of rationality. If the concept of rationality does not simply consist in one’s conception, at any given time, of rationality, then it cannot be captured in terms of the actual goings on in one’s brain (the same point applies if we substitute “everyone’s” for “one’s”). Therefore, strict lawlike relations between the mental and the physical are impossible. This contrasts interestingly with Kim’s strategy: on McDowell’s reading, it is partly because no detailed statement of a rational principle could be claimed to be necessarily true that there can be no psychophysical laws.

A number of questions arise in considering McDowell’s argument. It appears to be heavily influenced by Davidson’s remarks about the ongoing nature of interpretation (Davidson 1970, 223; see 4.2). However, Davidson appeals to the fact that new evidence—in the form of behavior and environmental context—is always coming in that can force us to revise existing interpretations of an agent. There is no mention of shifting standards, or unarticulated or inarticulable conceptions of rationality. Indeed, the implication is that a stable standard, when taking into account new evidence, can lead to revised interpretations of prior behavior. So McDowell appears to be going beyond Davidson’s own views about the concept of rationality. Indeed, the idea that one is not able to fully articulate a concept in the way suggested by McDowell—that it is in effect ineffable –does not clearly sit comfortably with Davidson’s views about conceptual relativism and rejection of the idea of untranslatable languages (see further the supplement on Related Issues (Anomalous Monism and Scheme-Content Dualism).

Further, and more importantly, McDowell’s distinctive uncodifiability claim, which rests on this view of rationality, looks to be too general to underwrite a specific thesis like mental anomalism. This becomes apparent when one asks why the very same features that he is insisting are true of our conception of rationality aren’t also true of the key concepts that figure in explanations of the physical world. Surely our concepts of physical reality outstrip any particular conception we have at any given time, and the possibility of mistaken application is built into them. And scientists are in the same position as interpreters in terms of the possibility of new evidence and its bearing on how previous evidence was understood. So far this looks to be nothing more than a combination of a completely general point about concepts together with the familiar problem of induction, which plagues all empirical enquiry. McDowell’s assertion that “someone who aims at explanations of the ideal-involving kind must be alive to the thought that there is sure to be a gap between actual current conception and ideal structure in his own case as well as others” (McDowell 1985, 392) doesn’t appear to uniquely pick out any particular explanatory framework. It therefore cannot tell us anything distinctive about the metaphysical status of psychology.

If, however, the emphasis here falls on constitutive principles in particular—as surely it must—then two other problems arise. First, McDowell’s reasoning doesn’t tell us what exactly it is about such principles that makes them resistant to reduction, since, as we’ve just seen, that reasoning has failed to distinguish them from empirical concepts in the physical sciences. And second, as noted in 4.2, Davidson holds that there are constitutive a priori principles underlying the physical sciences which play a similar role there that rationality plays in psychological explanation. So we are still in need of an explanation of why psychology and physics cannot stand in strict lawlike relations. Now, we did note there that such physical constitutive principles are far more lenient than rationality, allowing for a greater variety of empirical content—of what can follow from what. This indeed accounts for an important asymmetry between mental and physical explanation. And McDowell heavily emphasizes this point in his discussion: that it is not merely a brute fact that rationality marks the limits of intelligibility, while physical explanations do bottom out in brute facts (McDowell 1985, 394). However, this point appears to be entirely separable from the distinctive feature of McDowell’s reading of the argument for mental anomalism—it has nothing especially to do with the idea of rationality as uncodifiable in McDowell’s specific sense. In fact, it is the key point behind Kim’s strategy, and it appears to have no essential connection to McDowell’s stronger views about rationality. One can think of rationality as constitutive, as normative and as asymmetrical to the physical in the way just noted—as Kim does—without buying into McDowell’s distinctive picture of it. So it looks like the salvageable part of McDowell’s actual argument for mental anomalism ultimately reduces to Kim’s. Uncodifiability appears to be a red herring.

Therefore, despite McDowell’s extremely subtle and interesting views about the nature of the ideal of rationality, in the end those views do not appear to provide a secure foundation for mental anomalism. It is only what is shared in common with Kim’s strategy—the modal asymmetry between rational and physical explanation—that bears directly on mental anomalism. And that leaves McDowell’s reading facing the sorts of concerns raised in 4.2.1.

4.2.3 The Context/Complexity Argument (McDowell and Child)

As we have seen above, Kim thinks that mental anomalism is susceptible of a kind of proof. This seems to be something stronger than Davidson himself claims (Davidson 1970, 215). In light of Davidson’s modesty about provability, and lack of explicit argumentation, some commentators (Child 1992; see also McDowell 1979) have suggested that mere reflection on the kinds of generalizations that we draw upon in coming to understand each other supports (but cannot prove) mental anomalism. Such generalizations are rules of thumb that hold only for the most part, and require, for their application to a given case, detailed contextual supplementation that cannot, by its nature, be included in anything like a universal generalization. The suggestion is that the sheer amount of contextual detail that would need to be accounted for in any statement with even a hope of being true is inappropriate for inclusion in strict lawful statements. A related strategy is to point to a lack of fixed, predetermined ends that all humans (or even any particular human over the course of her life) aim for in situations of choice, or values to maximize when deciding what to believe (such as simplicity, scope, and consistency in the case of theory choice) (Child 1992). The thought here is that if there are no such fixed ends or values, then no psychological generalization could be complete—since in particular contexts such ends or values play a crucial explanatory role in determining what to do or believe.

It would seem, however, that reflection on the level of detail required for strict laws in the physical sciences fails to provide for an interesting asymmetry here. If one considers the number of factors that would have to be taken in to account in order to state conditions that guarantee that when a match is struck it will produce a flame, the resulting strict law would be quite complex, and in a way not obviously different from any putative strict laws in which mental predicates figure, with contextual features included. And if there are indeed no fixed ends or values in the realm of choice and a decision, this can be accommodated in the same way—the contextual ends or values could themselves be included in the putative strict laws. This would complicate and expand the set of such laws, but as already noted this is not something that would set mental generalizations apart from physical ones. (For further discussion of rationality and the argument for Anomalous Monism see Yalowitz 1997 and Latham 1999.)

4.3 The Causal Definition Argument

We have been looking at different ways of making sense of and justifying Davidson’s claim that mental anomalism stems from the constitutive role of rationality in mental ascription. In Davidson’s writings, however, another line of argument often surfaces which focuses less on the rational nature of mental events and more on their causal nature. As we have already seen, in his earliest work on action Davidson argued that reasons explain actions by causing them, and he later came to emphasize that what makes mental states and events what they are is determined in part by their causes and effects. Particular psychological explanations are causal (they invoke causes—Davidson 1963), and are formulated in terms of causally defined concepts (for propositional attitudes, see Davidson 1987b, 41; for mental contents, see Davidson 1987a, 44). In later work he frequently notes the anomic nature of causal concepts and causal explanations, and how mental properties and reasons explanations are anomic because of this—“reason-explanations…are in some sense low-grade; they explain less than the best explanations in the hard sciences because of their heavy dependence on causal propensities” (Davidson 1987b, 42; see also Davidson 1991, 162). If mental concepts are causally defined, and strict laws do not employ causally defined concepts, then mental anomalism appears to follow straight away, without need of any detour through issues concerning the rationality of mental concepts.

Extending this reasoning, Davidson writes that

[m]ental concepts…appeal to causality because they are designed, like the concept of causality itself, to single out from the totality of circumstances which conspire to cause a given event just those factors that satisfy some particular explanatory interest. (Davidson 1991, 163)

This appears to ground the causal definition of anomic properties (whether mental or otherwise) in the fact that they answer to particular explanatory interests. This is contrasted with the case of ‘ultimate physical’ properties: “Explanation in terms of the ultimate physics, though it answers to various interests, is not interest relative” (Davidson 1987b, 45). This seems to collapse the distinction between psychology and all the other special sciences with respect to the question of anomalism. All of the latter answer to particular explanatory interests, and are thus selective with respect to the total sufficient condition for an effect-type (see Davidson 1987b, 45); the causal definition, and thus anomalism, of their vocabularies is owed to this interest-relativity and selectivity. ‘Ultimate physics’, on the other hand, “treats everything without exception as a cause of an event if it lies within physical reach (falls within the light cone leading to the effect)” (Davidson 1987b, 45).

Davidson repeats these sorts of claims about the anomic nature of causally defined properties in a number of places in later writings, but at no point does he clearly bring them into contact with his early remarks concerning the constitutive role of rationality in psychological ascription. And he never provides argument in support of this general thesis concerning causality. It is natural to wonder why, given this general thesis about causally defined concepts, rationality should be thought to underwrite mental anomalism. And it becomes imperative to know why that general thesis is plausible (for discussion, see Yalowitz 1998a).

With regard to the first issue, there is some evidence that Davidson is confusing two distinct questions: why mental concepts cannot stand in lawlike relation to physical concepts, and why mental concepts cannot be eliminated in favor of physical concepts in the explanation of human behavior. Given the general thesis about causally defined properties, we have an understanding of why mental concepts are anomic. But this leaves open the question whether we ought to continue to traffic in anomic concepts generally, and mental concepts in particular. Why not eliminate them in favor of the nomic physical concepts? Here, the rationality of mental concepts may be thought to provide an answer. If we wish to understand why an agent performed the action that she did, as opposed to having a full sufficient causal explanation of why her body moved as it did, we are interested in a selective explanation—that part of the total sufficient condition that satisfies the particular explanatory interests behind reasons-explanations (Davidson 1991, 163). Those interests highlight the normative nature of reason and action—their responsiveness to the principle of charity and ideal of rationality. Rationality, on this line of thinking, does not account for mental anomalism; but it does speak to the question of mental realism (see further 6.2). (For further discussion of the anomic nature of causally defined concepts and its bearing on Anomalous Monism, see Yalowitz 1998a. For more on the relation between rational explanation and mental realism, see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism. For discussion of issues closely related to the causal definition argument, see 6.3 and the supplement on Related Issues (Mental Anomalism and Semantic Externalism).

5. Monism

So far we have looked at Davidson’s three premises in support of Anomalous Monism—the interaction, cause-law and anomalism principles. In this section, we examine the conclusion that Davidson draws on the basis of these principles—the token-identity theory of mental events, according to which every causally interacting mental event is token-identical to some physical event. We will look at the derivation and nature of this theory, some questions about its adequacy, as well as the additional thesis that mental properties supervene on physical properties. As we shall see, both the token-identity and supervenience claims turn out to be controversial, in their motivation as well as in their consistency with mental anomalism. One key point to keep in mind at this point is that monism is supposed to be derived from the principles and other assumptions that, taken individually, could be acceptable to positions opposing monism.

To begin with, it is worth pointing out that Davidson is concerned only with the ontological status of events, and not substances. Descartes, for instance, argued for the claim that mind and body are distinct entities. While Descartes’ position has implications for accounts of mental events, the issues concerning event and substance identity are distinct (see Latham 2001). Davidson clearly takes himself to be establishing something that is inconsistent with Cartesian dualism, however, and it is useful briefly to look at how Anomalous Monism bears upon substance dualism.

According to Descartes, mind and body are distinct substances in part because they do not share essential properties in common. In particular, minds do not occupy a spatial location, while bodies necessarily do. Since mental events thus constitute changes occurring in a nonspatially-located entity, they also do not occupy a spatial region. Bodily events, on the other hand, do occupy spatial locations by virtue of being changes in material substances, which themselves are spatially located. On Descartes’ view, then, particular mental and physical events cannot be token-identical, since they fail to share a crucial property in common without which identity is unintelligible. While Anomalous Monism is not officially concerned with the ontological status of substances, it thus appears to have consequences that are inconsistent with Descartes’ substance dualism—though it doesn’t by itself establish substance monism, it does rule out the Cartesian thought that mental and physical events fail to be identical, and so conflicts with one of the bases for Cartesian substance dualism.

5.1 Token Identity

The structure of Davidson’s derivation of the token-identity of causally interacting mental events with physical events appears to be straightforward: causally interacting mental events (the interaction principle) must instantiate some strict law property (the cause-law principle) but mental properties are not suitable for inclusion in strict laws (the anomalism principle). So mental events must instantiate some other property, which is suitable for such inclusion. Given Davidson’s invocation of the causal closure of the physical domain, according to which every physical event has a physical explanation, he moves rather quickly to the conclusion that this other property must be physical, since closure entails that physical properties have a privileged status, which suggests that they hold out the promise of strict laws. (Davidson also has a tendency simply to identify as ‘physical’ those properties that figure in strict laws (Davidson 1970, 224; 1995a, 266), but this would of course beg the question of mental anomalism.) Consequently, causally interacting mental events must be token-identical with physical events, ruling out Cartesian as well as other forms of dualism.

There are serious problems with the assumption of causal closure of the physical in Davidson’s framework (for discussion, see the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical in the Argument for Anomalous Monism). It is difficult, however, to see how Davidson can move from the claim that mental events must instantiate non-mental, strict law properties to the claim that these properties must be physical without assuming closure. Why assume that only ‘physical’ properties are nomic? This raises interesting issues about the nomic status of other special sciences—the relevant ones here being biology and chemistry—but there do not appear to be explicit, conclusive resources in Davidson’s own thinking for addressing this. Yalowitz 1998a has, however, provided an interpretation of Anomalous Monism stressing Davidson’s views on causality and the nomic status of dispositions (see 4.3) in which causal closure is derived from the cause-law principle, token-identity and the anomalism of causally defined properties. On this interpretation, the strict law properties that mental events must instantiate turn out to be physical because only physical properties are non-causally individuated—all special science properties are causally individuated, and all such properties are anomic.

Davidson’s token-identity theory is dramatically different than previous identity theories of mind, in both it’s a priori status as well as its stance towards the role of laws in justifying monism. Previous theories had argued that claims concerning the identity of particular mental and physical events depended upon the discovery of lawlike relations between mental and physical properties. These theories thus held that empirical evidence supporting such laws was required for particular identity claims. According to Anomalous Monism, however, it is precisely because there can be no such strict laws that causally interacting mental events must be identical to some physical event. The token-identity thesis thus requires no empirical evidence and depends on there being no lawlike relations. It in effect justifies the token-identity of mental and physical events through arguing for the impossibility of type-identities between mental and physical properties or kinds (Davidson 1970, 209, 212–13; see Johnston 1985).

An important point to recognize in Davidson’s version of token-identity is that he is not simply deriving the conclusion that mental events bear some property that we would intuitively acknowledge as ‘physical’ (such as spatial location). As pointed out in 2.1, the relevant ‘physical’ properties would more likely have to resemble the sorts of properties currently invoked in physics, our most mature science and the one closest to issuing in strict laws. This point has generated numerous objections to Davidson’s token-identity theory, but it also has been overlooked by some objectors (see below). Davidson’s central claim is that what makes a mental event identical to a physical event is that the mental event has a physical description. In Davidson’s original formulation, monism entailed that every mental event can be uniquely singled out using only physical concepts (1970, 215). It is this position that became the target of some Davidson’s critics (5.2). However, Davidson eventually came to explicitly deny that his monism commits him to the possibility of providing descriptions of mental events or actions in physical terms suitable for strict laws (Davidson 1999d, 639; 1999b, 653–4). He noted that strict laws will say something to the effect that “whenever there is a certain distribution of forces and matter in a field of a certain size at time t, it will be followed by a certain distribution of forces and matter in a field of a certain size at time t′” (Davidson 1999d, 639). And he claimed that both the antecedents and consequents of such laws, when covering particular mental events and actions, will cover much larger regions of space than merely the agent or her action. Why? Because while singular causal statements are singular, and therefore select from a complete set of causal factors those that are salient or in line with our particular explanatory interests, strict laws don’t themselves select—“that’s what makes them strict” (Davidson 1999d, 640; see Yalowitz 1998a for an extended discussion of this issue and its bearing on the argument for both mental anomalism as well as monism). Davidson soft-pedals how this view bears on the uniqueness claim in the official statement of Anomalous Monism, parsing away that claim in favor of the blander idea that “some physical description applies to each mental event” (Davidson 1999b, 654). As subtle as it seems, this appears to be a fundamental shift in Davidson’s thinking about monism, though it goes unexplored in his later work and has failed to attract the attention of his critics.

In any case, Anomalous Monism thus does not inherit the problem of how to justify specific identifications between mental and physical events, because the claim that there is a physical description for each mental event is established purely a priori. And the physical descriptions are not (indeed, cannot be) specifiable in precise and uniquely identifying spatial and temporal terms. As we are about to see (5.2), each of these points is overlooked by many of Davidson’s critics. That the latter is overlooked is understandable, given its late appearance. However, the former point has always been fundamental, and critics’ failure to appreciate it is curious.

Davidson additionally claims that the relation between the mental and physical properties is not merely haphazard or coincidental. A relationship of supervenience obtains between the two (Davidson 1970, 214; 1973a, 253; 1993; 1995a, 266). (Davidson never argues for supervenience. For discussion, see the supplement on Supervenience and the Explanatory Primacy of the Physical.) A working statement of this relationship is that if two events fail to share a mental property, they will fail to share at least one physical property (Davidson 1995a, 266)—or, equivalently, if two events share all of their physical properties, they will share all of their mental properties. It is meant to articulate a kind of dependency of the mental on the physical, and correlatively a kind of explanatory primacy to the physical, but without claiming any kind of reductive relation between the mental and the physical. The working statement’s truth depends, it seems, on the thought that the distribution of physical properties somehow explains the distribution of mental properties—failure to share a mental property depends upon/is explained by failure to share at least one physical property. The supervenience relation is usually understood to issue in generalizations of the following kind: ‘P1 → M1’, ‘P2 → M1’, etc. (where antecedent and consequent occur at the same time). This allows for the empirical possibility that a number of different physical state kinds underlie the same mental state kind (for more on this, see the supplement on Related Issues (Mental Anomalism and Semantic Externalism)). However, it also appears to suggest the existence of lawlike relations between physical and mental properties, and so to be in tension with mental anomalism. This issue will be explored in 5.3.

5.2 Objections to Token Identity

The token-identity thesis has been the subject of a number of interesting criticisms. Many of them, however, are difficult to bring fully into contact with Davidson’s own particular version of the thesis, primarily because Davidson’s version is derived a priori from the other premises in his framework. So, for instance, it has been argued that mental events do not bear the burden of the spatiotemporal precision of physical events that they would need to if the former were genuinely identical to the latter (Hornsby 1981; Leder 1985). For example, it would seem arbitrary to identify the deduction of some conclusion from a chain of reasoning with some particular neural event or set of neural events occurring at a specific time and place in the brain—especially given the micro-precision of the neural framework. Compare attempting to provide physical description for the action of paying back a debt—how does one determine the spatial and temporal parameters with the precision demanded by the language of physics? Distinguishing between “the” physical event, as opposed to its causes and its effects, can seem daunting if not outright nonsensical (Leder 1985; see also di Pinedo 2006). Further, it has been argued that the only possible empirical evidence for specific token-identity claims could be type-identities between either those or other mental and physical properties, because evidence needs to be drawn from variant cases in order to sort out merely coincident from identical events (Leder 1985).

Such criticisms become difficult to evaluate given Davidson’s a priori procedure for establishing the token-identity thesis. He can respond that we already know, a priori, that any particular mental event must instantiate some physical property if it causally interacts with any mental or physical event, given the cause-law and anomalism principles. Questions about how this physical property, whatever it is, relates to properties currently invoked in neuroscience come later and are necessarily secondary to this monistic conclusion. And there is no guarantee (indeed, it is quite unlikely) that neuroscientific properties currently in vogue are candidates for strict-law properties. As we have just seen (5.1), Davidson eventually came to explicitly associate the physical properties that cover mental events with broad descriptions covering large space-time regions. Further, it would confuse epistemology with metaphysics to insist that, because we can only establish which physical property some mental token event instantiates by leaning on some type-correlations between other mental and physical properties, token-identity claims presuppose type-identity. How we discover the particular physical properties is one thing; whether there can be psychophysical laws is quite another, and not settled by the method of discovery.

We also need to keep in mind that Davidson embraces the possibility of substantive mental-physical correlations (ceteris paribus psychophysical laws), which directly address these epistemological issues. More generally, Davidson’s token-identity claim is that the predicates that come to form the vocabulary of the as-yet unknown strict-law science will be capable of being used to describe mental events. While we cannot judge this claim by appealing to features of current neuroscience, it also seems that it should be possible to adjudicate conceivability concerns. And, putting aside Davidson’s later views, while we are not currently in the business of assigning fine-grained spatiotemporal parameters to mental events, it does not seem obvious that we couldn’t come to accept such assignments on the basis of theoretical considerations without thereby committing ourselves to the existence of type-identities. However, Davidson’s official position, early and late, has always been that we do not need to be capable of making such assignments in order to assert token-identity—there must simply be such true assignments, and this is something we know on the basis of a purely a priori argument. (Davidson 1999b; for further discussion of this issue, see the supplement on Related Views (Bare Materialism); for a different criticism of token-identity, see the supplement on Related Views (Other Positions). For a criticism based upon Davidson’s own treatment of causal explanation, see Horgan and Tye 1985. For discussion of the criticism that Davidson’s monism is too weak to warrant the label ‘materialism’, see the supplement on Token-Identity and Minimal Materialism).

5.3 Is Supervenience Consistent with Mental Anomalism?

We have seen that Davidson supplements his monism with a claim of supervenience. There are many different conceptions of the supervenience relation (see Kim 1993b), and Davidson ultimately came to identify his version with what is called “weak” supervenience, in contrast to “strong” and “global” supervenience. Briefly, the basic differences between these positions are as follows. Weak supervenience links specific mental and physical properties within but not across possible worlds, while strong supervenience links those properties across worlds. Global supervenience links the class of mental properties as a whole with the class of physical properties as a whole within but not across worlds, but does not constrain relations between specific pairs of mental and physical properties. Weak supervenience comes down to the view that mental properties depend upon those physical properties they are correlated with within a particular possible world, but those very same physical properties may, in another possible world, correlate with very different (or even no) mental properties. Weak supervenience is thus stronger than global supervenience, in that it posits correlations between particular pairs of mental and physical properties, but weaker than strong supervenience in that it recognizes the possibility that these correlations can fail to obtain in other possible worlds. (It should be noted that Davidson never brought his views on supervenience into contact with his later views, noted above, about the broad nature of the physical properties that mental events must instantiate according to Anomalous Monism. It is not at all clear whether or how these views can be combined. In the following discussion of supervenience, this complication will be ignored, and it will be assumed that the physical properties in question are not of this broad nature, since this is how Davidson’s own discussions of supervenience seem to proceed, and certainly what his critics presuppose.)

The puzzling aspect of Davidson’s doctrine of supervenience arises independently of fine points of the disagreement between the competing conceptions of supervenience sketched above. Whether the dependency is between particular mental and physical properties, or sets of the two, and whether or not the dependency holds only within or also across possible worlds, it appears that it entails that there will exist strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained that were supposed to be ruled out by the anomalism principle. Davidson sometimes claims (Davidson 1995a, 266) that supervenience is actually entailed by Anomalous Monism, in which case it would appear to follow that Anomalous Monism itself is an inconsistent theory—entailing both that there cannot be any strict psychophysical laws (the anomalism principle) and that there must be such laws (supervenience). But generally his position appears to be that Anomalous Monism is simply consistent with supervenience (Davidson 1993, 7). If supervenience and Anomalous Monism are indeed inconsistent, and the former is rejected, the question of the plausibility of a materialist position with no discernible relation between mental and physical properties arises (see the supplement on Supervenience and the Explanatory Primacy of the Physical). (The caveat about the relation between Davidson’s later views about physical descriptions and supervenience noted at the end of 5.1. should be kept in mind here.)

Why does supervenience appear to generate strict laws? When Davidson first stated the supervenience claim, he articulated it in the following terms: “there cannot be two events alike in all physical respects but differing in some mental respects” (Davidson 1970, 214)). This formulation appears to entail strict psychophysical laws of the form ‘P1 →  M1’. Davidson later came to focus on the inversion of this formulation: “if two events fail to share a mental property, they will fail to share at least one physical property” (Davidson 1995a, 266). The advantage of this reformulation is that it brings out the fact that the requisite physical differences need not be the same in each case of mental difference (see Davidson 1973a, 253–4). As Davidson says,

although supervenience entails that any change in a mental property p of a particular event e will be accompanied by a change in the physical properties of e, it does not entail that a change in p in other events will be accompanied by an identical change in the physical properties of those other events. Only the latter entailment would conflict with [Anomalous Monism]. (Davidson 1993, 7)

There seem to be two problems here, however. First, the inverted reformulation actually entails the original thesis—that if two events share all physical properties they will share all mental properties—and so once again generates strict psychophysical laws. Second, even if the accompanied physical changes can be different, that simply generates more strict psychophysical laws—‘ P1 → M1’, ‘P2 → M1’, and so on. So it is hard to see why Davidson thinks that the second formulation is consistent with the anomalism principle.

Some defenders of Davidson (Child 1992, 224; see also Davidson 1973, 258) have responded to the apparent tension between supervenience and mental anomalism by emphasizing that the degree of detail that would have to go into the formulation of such laws would make them useless for prediction, since it is unlikely that the relevant initial conditions will repeat. But as we have seen (4.2.3), this seems to be true of any candidate for a strict law—it must take into account all possible interfering conditions, and doing so becomes quite unwieldy for generating predictions. And in any case, such laws would still provide strict explanations of mental events, contrary to Davidson’s own formulation of mental anomalism. So the problem that supervenience ‘laws’ seem to pose for the anomalism principle remains.

Other defenders of Davidson (see Macdonalds 1986) have responded to this problem by arguing that the existence of strict supervenience laws is compatible with mental anomalism so long as we are not actually able to state any such laws and thus be in a position to use them to predict and explain actual mental events—which is certainly the case currently and likely for the foreseeable future. This suggestion exploits a literal reading of Davidson’s official statement of the anomalism principle, which denies the possibility of strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be explained or predicted. But in doing so, it makes Anomalous Monism into a much weaker position, dependent on the cognitive limitations of human beings. It in effect becomes a contingent epistemological position rather than the necessary metaphysical doctrine it purports to be.

Davidson in one place offers a very different suggestion in response to the problem. He claims that the supervenient relations between mental and physical predicates that he envisages are of a ceteris paribus nature. He accepts the requirement that any satisfactory account of the relation between mental and physical properties must permit appeal to local correlations and dependencies between specific mental and physical properties (Davidson 1993, 9). But he blocks any entailment from this requirement to strict psychophysical laws, suggesting that such ‘correlations’ and ‘dependencies’ are of a ceteris paribus form.

Such a ceteris paribus conception of supervenience has not been discussed in the extensive literature on the topic (its possibility is recognized and endorsed by Kim 1995, 136; however, see Kim 1993, 24–25) and it is unclear whether it can deliver a suitably strong notion of dependency to satisfy materialist intuitions. But it does seem to be an attractive way of reconciling supervenience with mental anomalism so that Anomalous Monism remains a consistent theory.

6. The Epiphenomenalism Objections

It has been widely held that Anomalous Monism cannot avoid epiphenomenalism—the view that mental events lack causal/explanatory powers. At a first approximation, the concern derives from a tension between mental anomalism and the apparently privileged status assigned to physical properties in Davidson’s framework—in particular, that all events are physical, and all physical events have a strict explanation in terms of other physical events. It then becomes an important question what sort of causal/explanatory role mental properties can play when all events already have a physical explanation.

Some welcome this result, holding that mental events explain actions in a sui generis way not accountable for in the terms of typical scientific explanations (see von Wright 1971; Stoutland 1976; Wilson 1985; Ginet 1995; Campbell 1998 and 2005 and related discussion in the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism). Many, however, see this charge as devastating to the prospects of Anomalous Monism’s attempt to occupy a position between reductionist materialism and dualism. Without a distinctive causal role for mental events to play in the explanation of action, many think that they would lack the sort of robust reality needed to compete with reductionism and dualism. On this way of thinking, only causal powers can justify mental realism. So if Anomalous Monism cannot avoid epiphenomenalism, it appears to open the door to eliminativist materialism, which holds that mental vocabulary and explanations are vacuous and ought to be thrown out and replaced by neuroscience (assuming, which seems extremely doubtful, that neuroscience can itself supply strict laws—if not, then this line of thought would lead to throwing out all but ‘physical’ strict law properties and explanations).

As noted, the epiphenomenalist worry arises from two points that are absolutely basic to Anomalous Monism—first, that mental events are at the same time physical events, and, second, that while mental predicates cannot figure into strict causal laws, physical predicates must. Early critics moved quickly from these points to the epiphenomenalist conclusion that mental properties are causally irrelevant, because there are always strict law properties—physical properties—to causally explain the occurrence of an event. (For detailed discussion of this line of argument, see the supplement on Mental Properties and Causal Relevance.) Among many other problems with this line of argument, however, there is the one immediately capitalized on by Davidson: that within the extensionalist metaphysical framework in which Anomalous Monism is developed (2.1 above), properties don’t cause anything, and so can be neither causally relevant nor irrelevant. According the Davidson, only events are causal relata. He expresses general skepticism about epiphenomenalist objections to Anomalous Monism that depend on the idea that events cause ‘by virtue’ of the properties they instantiate (Davidson 1993, 6, 13). This is closely connected to his sharp distinction between causation—a metaphysical relation between particular events independently of how they are described—and explanation—which relates events only as they are described in particular ways. But as we will now see, this doesn’t end the concerns about epiphenomenalism. (For related discussion concerning epiphenomenalism and its bearing on the relationship between Anomalous Monism and human freedom, see Related Issues: 3.2 Anomalous Monism and Contemporary Compatibilism.)

6.1 Mental Properties and Explanatory Relevance

Critics of this extensionalist line of defense insisted that related questions remained about Anomalous Monism even taking into account the distinction between causation and explanation. In particular, they questioned whether mental properties could play any genuine explanatory role—whether they had explanatory relevance—given the priority assigned to physical properties in Davidson’s framework. Why think that mental properties explain anything given that the events which instantiate them always also instantiate physical properties that figure in causal laws? One thought here is that genuine explanations require laws, and mental anomalism, in ruling out psychological and psychophysical laws, cannot account for any explanatory role for mental properties vis a vis physical or mental events.

In response, Davidson notes that while Anomalous Monism rejects the possibility of strict laws in which mental predicates can figure, it allows for ceteris paribus psychological and psychophysical laws (Davidson 1993, 9–12). His point appears to be that if backing by law is sufficient for explanatory relevance, then mental properties are explanatorily relevant. (Davidson and his critics often slide between the issues of causal and explanatory relevance, but the latter issue is clearly what is at stake given Davidson’s views about causal efficacy and properties.) Second, Davidson appeals to the supervenience of mental properties on physical properties in order to ground the explanatory role of mental properties. Davidson says that

properties are causally efficacious if they make a difference to what individual events cause, and supervenience ensures that mental properties do make a difference to what mental events cause. (Davidson 1993, 15)

The first point does not get developed by Davidson in any systematic way, though it has been explored by others interested in defending nonreductive monism from epiphenomenalist concerns. Some have focused on exploiting ceteris paribus covering laws for psychophysical causal relations, claiming that this allows mental properties to be sufficient for their effects, thus providing the needed type of explanatory role (McLaughlin 1989; Fodor 1989, 1991). Others have attempted to sidestep the issue of covering laws entirely by appealing directly to the truth of psychological and psychophysical counterfactuals in grounding the explanatory role of mental properties (LePore and Loewer 1987, 1989; Horgan 1989). Davidson himself instead focused on supervenience (although as we are about to see, the possibility of ceteris paribus laws enters into his account).

Supervenience implies that

if two events differ in their psychological properties, they differ in their physical properties (which we assume to be causally efficacious). If supervenience holds, psychological properties make a difference to the causal relations of an event, for they matter to the physical properties, and the physical properties matter to causal relations. (Davidson 1993, 14)

The point here is not simply that mental properties inherit or piggyback on the causal powers of the physical properties on which they supervene. Rather, Davidson appears to be claiming that mental properties influence the causal powers of their subvenient physical properties.

One problem with Davidson’s response here is its reversal of the dependency relationship between mental and physical properties typically claimed in supervenience relationships. A central rationale for positing supervenience is to mark a kind of explanatory primacy to the subvenient properties (see the supplement on Supervenience and the Explanatory Primacy of the Physical). And this is reflected in the first part of Davidson’s formulation above—surely a difference in psychological properties entails (requires) a difference in physical properties because the difference in physical properties is needed in order to explain the difference in psychological properties. So the sense in which psychological properties ‘matter’ to physical properties is that changing the former amounts to a change in the latter because a change in the latter explains a change in the former. This does not appear to be helpful in establishing the explanatory relevance of mental properties. Another problem, discussed above (5.3), is that it is difficult to see how a supervenience relation of sufficient power to make mental properties explanatory of an event’s physical properties in the way Davidson seems to suggest does not issue in strict laws. So it is unclear how supervenience is consistent with the anomalism principle, and thus how it can help block epiphenomenalist concerns, although we did previously note one potentially worthwhile but unexplored possibility—a ceteris paribus supervenience relation—which Davidson endorses.

6.2 Interest-Relativity and the Dual Explananda Strategy

Kim has explored a related but different route from Anomalous Monism to mental epiphenomenalism—the problem of explanatory exclusion (Kim 1989, 44). A causal explanation of an event cites a sufficient condition for that event’s occurrence. This seems to exclude the possibility of other independent causes or explanations of that event. So if, as Anomalous Monism entails, physics can provide a sufficient explanation of any particular event, there appears to be no room for an independent and irreducible mental explanation of an event (Davidson 1993, 15). It is because the cause instantiated some particular physical property that the effect (which happens to instantiate a mental property) came about. Any mental properties that the cause instantiates seem superfluous in explaining why the effect occurred—unless those properties are identical or related in some strict lawlike way to the physical properties, something ruled out by the anomalism principle.

Davidson responds by arguing that citing only the physical properties of the cause to provide a sufficient explanation of an action does not address the particular interests that psychological explanations of actions serve—providing the reasons of the agent in light of which she performed the action that she did. Serving these explanatory interests compensates for the fact that such explanations cannot be sharpened into strict laws or folded neatly into physical laws (Davidson 1991, 163). We only understand why the agent waved her hand—why the effect is of the mental kind ‘waving one’s hand’ (as opposed to merely ‘one’s hand going up and down’)—by citing mental properties of the causing event, such as her wanting to greet her friend. The citation of physical properties of the causing event and the associated mere bodily movement will not bring about such understanding, assuming mental anomalism, because of the lack of any reductive relationship between either the physical properties of the cause and the agent’s reasons or the physical properties of the effect and the agent’s action.

Here we see the interest-relativity of explanation and its bearing on explanatory relevance (see the supplement on Mental Properties and Causal Relevance) playing an important role for Davidson. Mental properties must be cited if we want a rational explanation of mental effects. Davidson’s response to epiphenomenalist concerns can thus be described as a kind of ‘dual explananda’ theory of the explanatory role of mental properties. According to this theory, for every (causally interacting) mental event there are two distinct explananda in need of explanation: an event of a certain physical type and an event of a certain mental type. Mental properties are accorded an ineliminable and (given Anomalous Monism) irreducible explanatory role by virtue of their singular capacity to make intelligible the occurrence of other mental properties through the sui generis relation of rationalization. This reflects the point made at the end of 4.3 by the causal definition interpretation of the argument for mental anomalism: that rationality underlies, not mental anomalism, but rather mental realism. (For related discussion of the dual explananda approach, see Macdonalds 1995 and Gibbons 2006.)

It should be noted, however, that it is not the case that only mental properties can explain and be explained by the occurrence of mental properties. That would lead to an “outlet” problem, with mental properties being explanatorily insulated from physical properties—something inconsistent with the way in which we ordinarily think of mental-physical interaction. A blow to the head can, for instance, explain the occurrence of a thought. And a thought can explain the movement of an object, as when my decision to quench my thirst leads to the movement of a glass of water to my lips. However, the blow cannot rationalize the thought, and the decision cannot rationalize the movement of the glass (though it can rationalize the action of moving the glass). Davidson’s dual explananda strategy provides no account of such phenomena (for discussion of the outlet problem, see Gibbons 2006). Nonetheless, so long as there are occurrences of mental properties in need of the distinctive kind of explanation provided by rationalization, mental properties occupy an ineliminable explanatory role. And given Anomalous Monism, that role is irreducible. It is worth noting that this dual explananda strategy is consistent with Davidson’s commitment to the causal closure of the physical domain (Crane 1995 seems to miss this point)—every physical event can have a physical explanation, even if the mental component of some physical events can be rationally explained only through appeal to mental components of the causing event. Therefore, however causal closure ultimately enters into Anomalous Monism (see the supplement on Causal Closure of the Physical and Anomalous Monism), it does not appear to create any further problems for Anomalous Monism’s ability to account for the ineliminable, irreducible explanatory role of mental properties.

The interest-relativity of causal explanation is thus crucial in Davidson’s grounding of the ineliminable explanatory role of mental properties within the framework of Anomalous Monism. If, as Anomalous Monism contends, mental event-types such as actions are not reducible to physical-event types, then the only way to explain actions (as opposed to mere bodily movements) so as to make them intelligible is by appeal to the mental properties of the cause—reasons. (For discussion of whether, in light of this, reason explanations can still be maintained to be causal explanations within the framework of Anomalous Monism, see the supplement on Explanatory Epiphenomenalism.)

6.3 The Causal Constitution of Reasons

A final point to consider in evaluating the epiphenomenalist objections to Anomalous Monism is the way in which causality enters into the constitution of reasons and reasons-explanations according to Davidson. Before we have established the anomalism principle, or go on to derive monism, we already know that reasons explain actions by causing them (the ‘because’ problem discussed in 2.2). And, as we have seen (4.3), we know that propositional attitudes and mental contents are individuated, and thus defined, partially in terms of what they are caused by and cause (for attitudes, see Davidson 1987b, 41; for contents, see Davidson 1987a, 444, and extended discussion in the supplement on Related Issues (Mental Anomalism and Semantic Externalism)). But if something cannot even be recognized as a reason unless it is a cause, then the charge that mental properties are causally impotent appears to have difficulty getting any traction. And since these claims are prior to the argument for monism, they are neutral about whatever else reasons must be in order to be causes. So reasons must be recognized as causes prior to any discovery that they are also physical events. This appears to secure the causal potency of reasons in a way entirely independent of the claim of token-identity. Within Davidson’s framework, reasons can only play the rationalizing and explanatory role that they do by virtue of their causal nature.

Many of Anomalous Monism’s epiphenomenalist critics do not address this rich causal background. As we have seen, the background is not sufficient by itself to silence all epiphenomenalist concerns. But it does significantly affect how those concerns can be formulated and addressed. Anomalous Monism is clearly deeply committed, at a number of levels, to the causal explanatory relevance of the mental, and so charity suggests that we try to understood it in a way such that these commitments are respected. The dual explananda strategy discussed above (6.2) provides one promising framework for doing this, while at the same time displaying sensitivity to the sorts of concerns driving the epiphenomenalist objections.

7. Conclusion

Despite the initial appearance of simplicity in its assumptions, structure and argumentation, we have turned up several important problems and lacunae that stand in the way of any overall final assessment of the plausibility of Anomalous Monism. While the central objections it has faced have derived from epiphenomenalist concerns, the force of these objections is not clear. Arguably, the most serious difficulties for Anomalous Monism are not with its adequacy but with its justification. We still stand in need of a clear argument for how rationality leads to the anomalism principle; there are the substantial problems surrounding the status of the causal closure of the physical and its bearing on monism; and the cause-law principle’s strictness requirement is still in need of a compelling rationale. Even with these problems, Anomalous Monism continues to provide an extremely useful framework for exploring fundamental issues and problems in the philosophy of mind, and has earned a central place on the rather short list of important positions on the relation between mental and physical events and properties.


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