Notes to Arabic and Islamic Philosophy of Language and Logic

1. There are other overviews of the subject. Highly recommended are: Arnaldez 1991, good for the interrelation of logic with the Islamic sciences; Black 1998, good for an overview of philosophical issues specific to Arabic logic; Gutas 1993, excellent on genres, basic bibliography and outline history; Rescher 1964, indispensable, with an outline history and biobibliograhical details of major logicians throughout the tradition; El-Rouayheb 2010a for an overview of important thirteenth-century developments in the tradition.

2. The translation movement is a complex phenomenon, and no attempt to deal with its motivations or changing emphases will be made here. For a preliminary account, see Gutas 2000 for a much more detailed account, see Gutas 1998.

3. For background to this and the following three paragraphs, see Peters 1968: 7–30 and Hugonnard-Roche 1989d and subsequent articles in Goulet 1989–.

4. For an idea of the translation-complexes that resulted from these translation practices, see (specifically on the Prior-Analytics complex) Lameer 1994: chapter 1.

5. Translation from Abed 1991: xvi (minor changes made). A translation of the entire debate is given in Margoliouth 1905.

6. Those who consider it important include Elamrani-Jamal (1983) (with French translation); Endress (1986) (with German translation); Mahdi (1970) (an idiosyncratic appraisal). Those who take it to be relatively insignificant include Frank; see his review of Endress in Frank 1990 (I agree with Frank).

7. Alfarabi Kitâb al-Qiyâs as-saghîr [1986] 68.11–12; cf. Sabra 1965: 242a. For an analysis of the juristic arguments that were reduced to syllogisms, see Lameer 1994: chapters 6, 7 & 8.

8. Cf. Zimmermann 1981; Dânishpazhûh 1989. For a philosophical appraisal of one short passage, see Thom 2008a.

9. There are two editions of the Arabic Organon: Badawî (1948/52) and Jabre (1999). For remarks on the nature of the glosses, see Hugonnard-Roche (1993); see also the review of this article: Lameer (1996).

10. See the account of the attempts of ‘Abdallatif al-Baghdâdî (d. 1231) to learn Alfarabi's logic in Stern 1962.

11. “Intuition” (hads) is a technical term in Avicenna's philosophy; for an extended treatment, see Gutas 1988 especially 197–198.

12. See Gutas 1988 for an account and chronology of Avicenna's major works, especially 101ff. (Cure) and 140ff. (Pointers).

13. See Sâwî 1898; he politely corrects “the most eminent of the later scholars” (afdal al-muta'akhkhirîn) on matters of syllogistic: correcting aspects of Avicenna's account of contradiction 68.14f.; of conversion 76.3f.; of mixed modals 91.10f.

14. For a preliminary analysis, see Street 2005. Important publications not consulted for that study include Râzî 1996 and 1381 A.H..

15. Translated in El-Rouayheb 2004: 227 (I have changed the spelling slightly to fit in with the rest of this entry).

16. El-Rouayheb (2005) makes a promising beginning in the ocean of material. See also Walbridge 2000, 2003.

17. Toulawy (2001) is part of a larger project which will hopefully bring these texts to scholarly light:
Max van Berchem Foundation/Articles.

18. Alfarabi Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm [1931] 12.5–8; translated in Black 1998 (minor changes made).

19. Alfarabi Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm [1931] 17.5–7, 18.4–7; first paragraph translated in Black 1998.

20. Translated and analysed in Sabra 1980: 752; translating Avicenna Kitâb as-Shifâ‘: al-Madkhal [1952] 15.9–17 (minor differences from Sabra's translation).

21. Avicenna Metaphysics [2005] 7; translated in Sabra 1980: 753, and in Bertolacci 2006: 273.

22. From Avicenna Kitâb as-Shifâ‘: al-Madkhal [1952] 23.5–6, 24.3–4, translated in Black 1991: 54; see also Sabra 1980: 762.

23. Avicenna Kitâb as-Shifâ‘: al-Madkhal [1952] 22:14–23:8; partly translated in Sabra 1980: 763; partly in Black 1991: 54–55 (minor changes made).

24. Lameer 2006 is the major study on this doublet, ; Lameer would use “belief” in place of “assent”. See now Gutas 2012, which uses “acknowledge as true.”

25. Avicenna Kitâb as-Shifâ‘: al-Madkhal [1952] 17.7–17, translated in Sabra 1980: 760 (minor changes).

26. El-Rouayheb 2012: 73, quoting Kâtibî from Summa of Subtle Points f. 12b; British Library codex Or. 11201.

27. Black 1990: 247–258 (on whom I draw) for an assessment of the philosophical implications of the context theory.

28. Translated in Miller 1984: 200 (minor changes made; my manuscript differs slightly from his); see Berlin ms. Ldbg. 1035, f.141 right column lines 40–45.

Copyright © 2013 by
Tony Street
Nadja Germann <>

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