Arabic and Islamic Philosophy of Language and Logic

First published Wed Jul 23, 2008; substantive revision Mon Nov 11, 2013

Arabic logic is a philosophical tradition which has lasted from the mid-eighth century down to today. For many years, western study of Arabic logic tended to concentrate on the early parts of its history, especially on the Greek antecedents of Arabic logic, and on the writings of the foundational philosophers, Alfarabi (d. 950), Avicenna (d. 1037) and Averroes (d. 1198). Recently, however, there have been notable excursions beyond these areas of traditional concentration, and I make a special effort in this entry to mention the contributions of post-twelfth-century logicians to the philosophical resolution of disputed points.[1]

Section 1 of this entry gives some historical context for a vast array of logical works, and section 2 provides a number of texts as samples of the philosophical arguments they contain. The philosophical assessment of the arguments is a task that is now underway in the secondary literature, and I refer to some of these assessments in the notes. My primary interest, however, is in presenting a set of texts which illustrate the trajectory of arguments carried on through a formative period of the discipline.

My own preferred term for the material I cover is “Arabic logic.” The term as I use it refers to a tradition of logic rooted in the texts translated from Greek into Arabic in a movement beginning in the eighth century CE. The tradition gradually settled on a set of technical terms with which to translate and discuss the Aristotelian corpus and its associated late antique commentaries; it also came to agree on what were the major problems in the corpus which demanded resolution. Focussed at first on these problems, a continuous line of discussions has evolved and carried forward in one form or another down to today.

Arabic logic can be said to be Islamic in two senses, both—in my opinion—of limited significance. First, it is as a result of the Muslim conquests from the seventh century on that Arabic came to be the primary language of learning. Beyond determining the language into which the founding texts of the movement were translated, however, the religion of the conquerors played no significant role in the development of the subject. Secondly, the tradition of Arabic logic after the thirteenth century was to find a place in the madrasa education and, as a result, had to jostle with various Islamic disciplines treating grammar, rhetoric and forensic argument; in the process, Arabic logic gave up its claims to deal with dialectical, rhetorical and poetical discourse. But by the time Arabic logic was established in the curriculum of the institutions of learning, most of the formal aspects of what was forever after to be called “logic” (mantiq) had already crystallised.

Being conducted in Arabic is—on my understanding—neither necessary nor sufficient for a logic to be considered Arabic logic. The problematic of Arabic logic has been adopted and its register of technical terms calqued or translated into other languages such as Persian, Turkish, Hebrew and Urdu. To take one of many possible examples, Nasîr al-Dîn al-Tûsî's Asâs al-Iqtibâs, though written in Persian, was apt for exact rendition in Arabic in the fifteenth century precisely because it was Arabic logic written in another language. By the same token, other traditions of logic have been conducted in Arabic but are not, on my usage, Arabic logic. The modern logic in the tradition inaugurated by Frege taught in most modern Arab universities, often in Arabic, is not Arabic logic. So too, if it is true that eighteenth-century Maronites wrote logical treatises in Arabic based solely on the logic they had studied in Rome, they were writing Latin logic in Arabic, not Arabic logic.

1. Historical Outline

1.1 The Early Translations

The Syriac Christians adopted a teaching tradition which included a truncated version of the Alexandrian Organon (Porphyry's Eisagoge followed by the Categories, On Interpretation, and the first seven chapters of the Prior Analytics). This teaching tradition continued without disruption through the Arab conquests and under the Umayyad Caliphate (661–750). During this period, however, it evoked little if any interest on the part of the Muslim conquerors.

It was the advent of the Abbasid Caliphate (750–1258) that signalled the beginnings of an interest in philosophy on the part of the ruling elite. This was to usher in a translation movement which in the first place translated the Syriac decoctions of philosophy into Arabic, but which later turned to the Aristotelian texts themselves and the commentaries written on them in late antiquity.[2] An example of an Arabic translation produced before the Aristotelian turn is the translation by Ibn al-Muqaffa‘ (ex. 756) of a logic treatise that probably came to him from the Syriac via the Pahlavi (probably from a late antique introduction to philosophy; see Gutas 1993: 44 fn. 68). The treatise gestures towards the Eisagoge, then turns to the Categories, On Interpretation, and the introductory parts of the Prior Analytics on assertoric syllogisms (Danishpazhuh 1978). As Pines pointed out long ago, this material corresponds to the Old Logic (logica vetus) of the Latin West (Pines 1996). One must bear in mind, however, that there are important differences between eighth-century Arabic logic and the Old Logic of the Latin tradition. First, there were Syriac translations of other Aristotelian logical texts available throughout this period (e.g., the Posterior Analytics; Elamrani-Jamal and Hugonnard-Roche 1989), so there were scholars about who had a good idea of what later texts in the Organon had to offer. Secondly, soon after Ibn al-Muqaffa‘ had produced his treatise, other scholars were translating complete Aristotelian works into Arabic. We know, for example, that the Caliph al-Mahdî (reg. 775–785) had commissioned translations of the Topics and the Sophistical Fallacies (Gutas 1993: 43).

The translation movement continued to pick up momentum through the ninth century, and by the 830s a circle of translators were loosely coordinated around Abû Yûsuf Ya‘qûb b. Ishâq al-Kindî (d. c. 870). Kindî produced a short overview of the whole of the Organon (translated in Rescher 1963a), and members of his circle produced: an epitome of and commentary on the Categories; an epitome of On Interpretation; a version of the Sophistical Fallacies; and probably an early translation of the Rhetoric.[3]

Somewhat later, perhaps from the 850s, the great Syriac Christian translators Hunayn ibn Ishâq (d. 873) and his son Ishâq ibn Hunayn (d. 910) began to produce integral translations of complete works from the Organon, generally by way of Syriac translations, some of which dated back to before the Arab conquests. One or the other (it is uncertain from the sources) translated the Categories, Ishâq translated On Interpretation, Hunayn seems to have collaborated with the otherwise unknown Theodorus to translate the Prior Analytics, father and son both seem to have had a hand in producing a new Syriac translation of the Posterior Analytics, and Ishâq provided revised translations of the Topics and the Rhetoric. Perhaps it was someone in this circle who translated the Poetics into Syriac.[4]

In spite of these achievements, Hunayn's circle is not unequivocally Aristotelian. Hunayn himself was interested above all in Galen, and what we know of Galen's greatest logical work we know from citations in Hunayn's reverential listing (Boudon 2000: 458 On Demonstration).

1.2 Farabian Aristotelianism

Soon after, however, Baghdad philosophy was dominated by self-styled Peripatetics who presented themselves as reestablishing Aristotle's true teachings after a period of rupture. The leading lights of this movement were the Syriac Christian Abû Bishr Mattâ ibn Yûnus (d. 940) and his younger Muslim colleague, Abû Nasr Alfarabi (d. 950). In the early 900s, Abû Bishr added translations from the Syriac of the Poetics and the Posterior Analytics to the growing Arabic Organon. He and his colleagues also contributed to a commentary tradition on each component of the Organon.

Abû Bishr lumbers into every piece that has been written on the history of Arabic logic as the clumsy advocate of the view that speakers of Arabic need to learn Greek logic. In a disputation on the relative merits of grammar and logic convened for the amusement of the Vizier, he confronts a dashing young opponent, Sîrâfî, who confounds him with a series of grammatical subtleties. To these, Abû Bishr responds:

This is grammar, and I have not studied grammar. The logician has no need of grammar, whereas the grammarian does need logic. For logic enquires into the meaning, whereas grammar enquires into the expression. If, therefore, the logician deals with the expression, it is accidental, and it is likewise accidental if the grammarian deals with the meaning. Now, the meaning is more exalted than the expression, and the expression humbler than the meaning.[5]

Whatever the merits of Abû Bishr's view of the relation of logic to language, it weathered Sîrâfî's storm of criticism badly. Assessments differ as to what we should learn from this discussion,[6] but it serves at least to show that some were sceptical of the utility of Aristotelian logic. Other Muslim scholars went further than Sîrâfî and considered the study of logic impious, mainly because of its association with metaphysics. As one fideist scholar put it many years later, “the access to something bad is also bad” (Ibn as-Salâh (d. 1245), quoted in Goldziher 1981: 205–206).

It was Abû Bishr's younger colleague, Alfarabi, who was the outstanding contributor to the Aristotelian project, though not as a translator (see now Rudolph 2012). On the question of the relation of logic to language, Alfarabi offers a view somewhat more nuanced than Abû Bishr's (see 2.1.1 below). He also claimed that logic was indispensable for analysing the argument-forms used in jurisprudence and theology, a claim that was to be taken up a century later by Abû Hamid al-Ghazâlî (d. 1111), thereby preparing the way to introduce logic into the madrasa (see 1.4.1 below). To support his claim, Alfarabi wrote The Short Treatise on Reasoning in the Way of the Theologians.

…in which he interpreted the arguments of the theologians and the analogies (qiyâsât) of the jurists as logical syllogisms in accordance with the doctrines of the ancients.[7]

But Alfarabi's main contribution to the Aristotelian project was a series of commentaries on the books of the Organon—many of them sadly lost—which represent the finest achievement in the study of Aristotelian logic in Arabic. His work in this area aims at the Lesser Harmony, the “project of forging a single, consistent doctrine out of the sometimes incongruent theories found in Aristotle's many treatises;” and this marks him out as clinging to a major hermeneutical commitment of late antiquity (see Wisnovsky 2003: 15, 266). The quality of Alfarabi's arguments is clear from his remaining long commentaries on Aristotle.[8] He is the first truly independent thinker in Arabic logic, a fact commemorated by the honorific bestowed upon him by Avicenna: the Second Teacher (after Aristotle). When Avicenna laid out his own syllogistic, he noted each point on which he differed from Alfarabi (Street 2001).

The tradition with which Alfarabi was associated, a tradition centred on exegetical problems in the Organon, reached its crowning achievement—a superb and heavily glossed translation of the Organon[9]—at the same time that Avicenna was setting about his work in the East, work which was to make the Organon irrelevant for the vast majority of subsequent Arabic logicians.

This is a watershed moment: the Farabian tradition continued its work on the Aristotelian texts, though ever more defensively and reactively to challenges posed by Avicenna. The Avicennan tradition by contrast simply ignored the Aristotelian texts. The Farabian tradition shrank away so quickly that even by the late twelfth century, to study Farabian logic meant traveling to North Africa.[10] Spain and North Africa were its last strongholds, and the work of Averroes (see 1.4.2 below) is best understood as a commentary on Aristotle determined in its focus and direction by the criticisms of Avicenna.

1.3 Avicennan Aristotelianism

At the same time that the Baghdad philosophers were finalizing the translation of the Organon and furnishing it with extensive glosses, Avicenna (d. 1037) was beginning his career far away in the east, in Khurasan. His style of philosophy was to make the Aristotelian texts irrelevant for the dominant tradition of Arabic logic after him. Led by his Intuition,[11] he presented himself as an autodidact able to assess and repair the Aristotelian tradition. In other words, Avicenna's doctrine of Intuition delivered him an Aristotelianism unfettered by the hermeneutic commitments of the Lesser Harmony.

In the modal logic, for example (a subject voluminously contested in the Arabic tradition; see 2.3 below), he cut through the problems in the Aristotelian account by taking them either as tests of the student's acuity, or mistakes by Aristotle in implementing principles. Here is what he says in the Syllogism of the Cure, written about midway through his career:

You should realize that most of what Aristotle's writings have to say about the modal mixes are tests, and are not genuine opinions—this will become clear to you in a number of places… (Avicenna Qiyâs [1964] 204.10–12)

In his later writings, Avicenna is less solicitous in explaining away what he regards as inconsistencies in Aristotle's syllogistic, and writes of problems in the Prior Analytics as arising through negligence; an example of such a text is Twenty Questions, which I think is written on the eve of Avicenna's Eastern period (Street 2010: 100–103; see periodization in Gutas 1988: 144). It consists of answers to questions on syllogistic sent by the learned men of Shiraz (and thus shows how odd Avicenna's system must have seemed to his contemporaries). Why, they ask, has Avicenna produced a syllogistic system that differs so radically from Aristotle's? At various points, we find Avicenna presenting Aristotle's decisions (about mixes with possibility propositions as minor premises) as failures to implement general principles (Avicenna al-Masâ‘il al-Gharîba: [1974] 94.14, 94.20, 94.22, 95.5, 95.11).

Avicenna's Intuition not only set aside important parts of Aristotle's logic, it also differed from Alfarabi's interpretation of that logic. Avicenna has, however, more consistently courteous ways of declining to follow Alfarabi. He refers to Alfarabi as the “eminent later scholar to whom we are most concerned to direct our remarks” as he constructs his different system (see Street 2001).

For a general overview of Avicenna's logic, there is now an English translation of the logic of Avicenna's Salvation (see Avicenna 2011a). But of all his many works,[12] it is Avicenna's Pointers and Reminders that had most impact on subsequent generations of logicians. It became, as Ibn Taymiyya declared, the Koran of the philosophers (Michot 2000: 599). From it we may note a few broad but typical differences from the Prior Analytics in the syllogistic. First, the “absolute” (mutlaqa, often translated “assertoric”) propositions have truth-conditions stipulated such that they are temporally modalised (by an elided “at least once”, so that, for example, the contradictory of an absolute is not an absolute, absolute e-propositions do not convert, second-figure syllogisms with absolute premises are sterile; see also 2.3.1 below). Secondly, Avicenna begins to explore the logical properties of propositions of the form every J is B while J. Thirdly, Avicenna divides syllogistic into connective (iqtirânî) and repetitive (istithnâ‘î) forms, a division which replaces the old one into categorical and hypothetical (Avicenna al-Ishârât [1971] 309, 314, 374).

According to what we have verified ourselves, the syllogism forms two divisions, connective and repetitive. The connective is that in which one of the two sides of the contradiction in which we find the conclusion does not appear [in the premises] explicitly, but only potentially… The repetitive is that in which [the conclusion or its contradictory] does explicitly appear. (Avicenna al-Ishârât [1971] 374)

As a rough guide, we may call a logician “Avicennan” if he adopts these doctrines. Pointers was not the only important Avicennan text in later Arabic logic: post-Avicennan logicians mined the Cure's volume on the Prior Analytics for the syllogistic with conditional premises, a syllogistic which they modified perhaps even more than they modified Avicenna's modal syllogistic (see Khûnajî 2010: section 10; see also El-Rouayheb's Introduction, xlv–xlviii).

1.4 Logic in the Twelfth Century

The twelfth century is one of the most complex periods of transformation in Muslim intellectual history. The century before had seen the advent of the madrasa as the prime institution of learning in the Islamic world (Makdisi 1981: 27–32, especially 31), and Abû Hâmid al-Ghazâlî (d. 1111) had been appointed to the most prestigious of these new institutions. One of the most revered Muslim thinkers of all time, he took up Alfarabi's arguments in support of the utility of logic for theology and law, especially in his last juridical summa, Distillation of the Principles of Jurisprudence, a text which soon became a mainstay of the madrasa. The late twelfth century also saw Averroes produce what was effectively the last of the work in the Farabian tradition of logic, work which was to be translated into Hebrew and Latin but which was, with minor exceptions, neglected by Arabic logicians. Finally, through the course of the twelfth century, the modified Avicennan logic that would be adopted by the logic texts of the madrasa began to emerge.

1.4.1 Ghazâlî and Logic

Before, and especially through, the tenth and eleventh centuries, a deal of effort was expended in defining which sciences constitute the proper focus of a scholar's education and how these sciences relate to each other. A fourteenth-century polymath divided the sciences of civilization into those “natural to man and to which he is guided by his own ability to think, and a traditional kind that he learns from those who invented it.” (Ibn-Khaldûn Muqaddima [1858] 2:385). Earlier scholars had made a parallel distinction between the Foreign Sciences and the Islamic Sciences. Philosophy was the preeminent science of the first kind, and theology and jurisprudence sciences of the second. Although logic was originally part of philosophy, and due to this association despised by many theologians and jurists (noted above in 1.2), a change in attitude came about in the twelfth century:

It should be known that the early Muslims and the early speculative theologians greatly disapproved of the study of this discipline. They vehemently attacked it and warned against it. They forbade the study and teaching of it. Later on, ever since Ghazâlî (d. 1111) and Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî (d. 1210), scholars have been somewhat more lenient in this respect. Since that time, they have gone on studying logic, except for a few who have recourse to the opinion of the ancients concerning it and shun it and vehemently disapprove of it (Ibn-Khaldûn Muqaddima [1858] 113.13-u; cf. Ibn-Khaldûn 1967: 3:143–144).

Ghazâlî had most impact in this regard (see Rudolph 2005). I deal with Râzî's contribution below (see 1.5.1).

Ghazâlî argued that, properly understood, logic was entirely free of metaphysical presuppositions injurious to the faith. This meant that logic could be used in forensic reasoning:

We shall make known to you that speculation in juristic matters (al-fiqhiyyât) is not distinct from speculation in philosophical matters (al-‘aqliyyât) in terms of its composition, conditions, or measures, but only in terms of where it takes its premises from (Ghazâlî Mi‘yâr [1961] 28.2–4).

Ghazâlî tended to an even stronger position towards the end of his life: more than being merely harmless, logic was necessary for true knowledge. Here is what Ghazâlî has to say at the beginning of his famous Distillation of the Principles of Jurisprudence (referring back to two of his earlier works on logic):

In this introduction we mention… the condition of true definition and true demonstration and their divisions in a program more concise than what we set out in our Touchstone for Speculation and Yardstick of Knowledge [respectively, Ghazâlî 1966 and Ghazâlî 1961]. This introduction is not part of the sum of the science of [juristic] principles, nor among the preliminaries particular to it; rather it is an introduction to all the sciences, and he who does not comprehend [logic] is not to be trusted at all in his sciences. (Ghazâlî Mustasfâ [1322 AH] 10.15–17)

For all his historical importance in the process of introducing logic into the madrasa, the logic that Ghazâlî defended was too dilute to be recognizably Farabian or Avicennan.

1.4.2 Averroes and the End of Textual Aristotelianism

Averroes was one of the last representatives of a dying Aristotelianism that bent all its efforts to the task of the Lesser Harmony, reconciling all of Aristotle's texts with each other. A student of the Baghdad philosophy that had been transplanted to al-Andalus (Dunlop 1955), Averroes was trained in the logic of Alfarabi, many specifics of which he later came to discard:

One of the worst things a later scholar can do is to deviate from Aristotle's teaching and follow a path other than Aristotle's—this is what happened to Alfarabi in his logical texts… (Averroes Maqâlât [1983] 175.6–8)

For Averroes, Alfarabi's attempts to make sense of the difficulties in Aristotle's texts were too weak to anticipate and answer Avicenna's criticisms. In one such area, the modal logic, Averroes was to return to the problems four times through his career (see Elamrani-Jamal 1995), and near the end of his life, having assessed the problems in his colleagues' interpretations, he wrote:

These are all the doubts in this matter. They kept occurring to us even when we used to go along in this matter with our colleagues, in interpretations by virtue of which no solution to these doubts is clear. This has led me now (given my high opinion of Aristotle, and my belief that his theorization is better than that of all other people) to scrutinize this question seriously and with great effort. (Averroes Maqâlât [1983] 181.6–10)

Averroes' project in its full flowering is driven by the demands of this rigorously construed Lesser Harmony and—in spite of everything—by Avicenna's increasingly popular reformulation of Aristotelian doctrine. Both aspects of the Averroist project are in full evidence in his Philosophical Essays, a number of which are on logical matters. So, for example, Averroes defends and refines Alfarabi's account of the conversion of modal propositions against Avicenna's attack, and then uses that account as the basis of a new interpretation of the modal syllogistic (see Thom 2003: chapter 5, working with fourth system described in Elamrani-Jamal 1995). A second example of the way Averroes works is his reappraisal and vindication of Aristotle's doctrines of the hypothetical syllogistic against Avicenna's alternative division into connective and repetitive syllogisms (see Averroes Maqâlât [1983] essay 9, 187–207). Those Arabic logicians who make use of Averroes tend to come from North Africa, or from Persia at certain moments of nostalgia for a time before the coming of the great logicians of the thirteenth century (see section 1.6 below). Further, Averroes' deep concern with the Aristotelian texts made his work transportable to both Hebrew and Latin philosophical traditions.

1.4.3 The Avicennan Tradition of the Twelfth Century

But the work on logic which was both technically advanced (and therefore unlike Ghazâlî's) and influential on later Arabic logicians (and therefore unlike Averroes') was done by Avicennan logicians who had begun to repair and reformulate Avicenna's work. Just as Avicenna had declared himself free to rework Aristotle as Intuition dictated, so too these logicians working on Avicenna's logic regarded themselves as free to repair the Avicennan system as need arose, whether from internal inconsistencies, or from intellectual requirements extrinsic to the system. A major early representative of this trend is ‘Umar ibn Sahlân as-Sâwî (d. 1148) who began, in his Logical Insights for Nasîraddîn, to rework Avicenna's modal syllogistic.[13] It was to be his students and their students, however, who would go on to make the final changes to Avicennan logic that characterized the subject that came to be taught in the madrasa.

1.5 The Avicennan Tradition in the Madrasa and Beyond

Ghazâlî had successfully introduced logic into the madrasa (though it was studied in other venues as well (Endress 2006)). What happened to it after this time was the result of the activities of logicians much more gifted than Ghazâlî. This period has tentatively been called the Golden Age of Arabic philosophy (Gutas 2002). It is in this period, and especially in the thirteenth century, that the major changes in the coverage and structure of Avicennan logic were introduced; these changes were mainly introduced in free-standing treatises on logic. It has been observed that the thirteenth century was the time that “doing logic in Arabic was thoroughly disconnected from textual exegesis, perhaps more so than at any time before or since” (El-Rouayheb 2010b: 48–49). Many of the major textbooks for teaching logic in later centuries come from this period.

1.5.1 Râzî and Khûnajî

In the fourteenth century, Ibn Khaldûn (d. 1406) noted the ways that Arabic logic had changed from the late twelfth century on (he mentions a growing restriction of the subject to the syllogistic, and a concentration on the formal aspects of logic; see Text 14, 2.2.3 below), and names the scholars he thinks are responsible for the change.

Treatment of [the subject as newly conceived] has become lengthy and wide-ranging—the first to do this was Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî (d. 1210) and, after him, Afdaladdîn al-Khûnajî (d. 1248), on whom Eastern scholars rely even now… The books and ways of the ancients have been abandoned, as though they had never been (Ibn-Khaldûn Muqaddima [1858] 113; cf. Ibn-Khaldûn 1967: 3:143).

Let us consider the nature of the work of the first logician named, Fakhraddîn ar-Râzî. Recent scholarly efforts have seen a number of Râzî's important works published, but there has been relatively little analysis of his logic, with the exception of the commentary on his Compendium by A. Karamaleki & A. Asgharinizhad (see the second half of Râzî 2002). His teacher in logic was Majdaddîn al-Jîlî, who may have been Sâwî's student.[14] In spite of this pedigree, the polite manner of correcting Avicenna's system that we find in Sâwî's work is missing from Râzî's. In Gist of Pointers, Râzî sets out his own remarkably compact account of the modals, and then says of Avicenna's exposition:

When you have understood what we have mentioned, you will come to realise that [my book], in spite of its brevity, is more explanatory and better verified than what is found in [Pointers], in spite of its length. (Râzî Lubâb [1355AH] 22.14–15)

For all his dismissive comments, Râzî's logic is above all a development of the logic of Pointers, presented in ways that derive from Avicenna's methods of exposition. One way to understand thirteenth-century Arabic logic, at least the logic developed in Persia and surrounding territories, is as attempts to solve the dialectical aporia set up by Râzî; an example of this dynamic will be given in section 2.3 below. And this is Avicennan logic: Râzî, like Sâwî, never refers to an Aristotelian text, and refers to Alfarabi in such a fashion as to suggest that he is simply paraphrasing Avicenna's references.

It is the second logician Ibn Khaldûn mentions who, it would seem, made more, and more substantive, changes to Avicennan logic: Afdaladdîn al-Khûnajî (d. 1249). His major work on logic, the Disclosure of Secrets about the Obscurities of Thoughts, has recently been edited (Khûnajî Kashf [2010], with a long introduction including a biography of this important logician, and an overview of some of his more important innovations). He was described, probably pretty loosely, as one of Râzî's students; Bar Hebraeus writes of a group who were famed as “authors of major works on logic and philosophy… [among them] Khûnajî in Cairo” (translated in Pococke 1663: 485.7–13 (Arabic)). The sense in which he could have been Râzî's student is presumably that he studied under someone who had studied under Râzî. It will be some time before we are able to assess Khûnajî's importance accurately; he seems to have exercised extraordinary influence, often taking a strong stand against both Râzî's position and Avicenna's. In their different ways, both the North African and the Eastern traditions of logic are strongly influenced by Khûnajî (see section 1.6 below).

1.5.2 Tûsî and the Maragha School

Khûnajî's Disclosure inspired work by other great Eastern logicians not mentioned by Ibn Khaldûn, namely, Athîraddîn al-Abharî (d. 1265) and Najmaddîn al-Kâtibî (d. 1276). Bar Hebraeus claims that Abharî was also one of Râzî's students, though as in the case with Khûnajî, opportunity for direct contact must have been virtually non-existent. Kâtibî was Abharî's student. So too, perhaps, was the great Shî‘î scholar Nasiraddîn at-Tûsî (d. 1274); at any rate, he had read Râzî's commentary on Avicenna's Pointers under Abharî (Endress 2006: 411). These three men are among the greatest logicians working anywhere in the thirteenth century. Two of them, Kâtibî and Abharî, produced the two texts which became mainstays of the madrasa teaching of logic, studied from the late thirteenth century down to the present day: the Îsâghûjî and the Shamsiyya (see Calverley 1933 and Kâtibî 1948).

All three were also involved in a major intellectual project established by the îl-Khânid rulers in 1259: the Maragha Observatory. Tûsî had been given the task by the Mongols of setting up an astronomical observatory, and he asked Kâtibî (among others) to help him. At some stage in the early years of the observatory, Abharî joined them. We know that Kâtibî was teaching both Râzî's Compendium and Khûnajî's Disclosure to students during this period, and that Abharî and Tûsî were debating how best to deal with the challenges raised by Khûnajî to Avicenna's logic. Kâtibî's major works on logic (a long treatise, Summa of Subtle Points, and the textbook, the Shamsiyya) were written after these discussions, and used many of the arguments raised in them. Kâtibî's Shamsiyya was commented on by Qutbaddîn at-Tahtânî (d. 1365), among many others (for details about these other commentaries, see Schmidtke 1991, 2013; Wisnovsky 2004). Tahtânî's commentary records a great many of the technical debates going on among the scholars at the Maragha observatory. Kâtibî's textbook and Tahtânî's commentary together constitute the impressive preparation most Muslim scholars underwent in logic.

Tûsî is a particularly interesting logician in terms of his historical affiliations. He had come to Avicenna's Pointers by way of Râzî's students, but he developed a deeper respect for Avicenna's formulations than any of his contemporaries. Râzî's hostility in characterizing the Avicennan exposition in Pointers is confronted by Tûsî in Solution to the Difficulties of Pointers. The nature of Tûsî's response to Râzî is generally taken to be entirely negative—he relayed a description of Râzî's work as being “a butchery, not a commentary”—but in fact Tûsî acknowledged the value of Râzî's work. The rhetorical engagement with Râzî is really part of a broader campaign to defend not only Avicenna's logic but also his exposition of that logic. To take one example: Avicenna's account of different kinds of absolute proposition had long raised questions among post-Avicennan logicians. Tûsî explains why Avicenna explores it the way he does:

What spurred him to this was that in the assertoric syllogistic Aristotle and others sometimes used contradictories of absolute propositions on the assumption that they are absolute; and that was why so many decided that absolutes did contradict absolutes. When Avicenna had shown this to be wrong, he wanted to give a way of construing those examples from Aristotle. (Tûsî Sharh al-Ishârât [1971] 312.5–7)

It is in his other works that Tûsî took a more solid stand against substantive changes proposed for Avicennan logic, especially in his Setting the Scale for an Evaluation of “Revealing Thoughts”, an extended assessment of Abharî's Revealing Thoughts (Tûsî 1974b), in which Abharî adopted a number of Khûnajî's positions. Here we find not merely a sympathetic exposition of Avicennan logic as Avicenna would have wanted it to be understood, but a reasoned attack on the thinking behind alternative proposals. Tûsî went on with this project in a series of exchanges with Kâtibî (Tûsî 1974a).

Among his other works, Tûsî wrote the Book of Abstraction as a non-polemical exposition of logic. His famous and influential student, al-‘Allâma al-Hillî (d. 1325), who had also studied under Kâtibî, wrote a commentary on it, the Facetted Jewel on the Book of Abstraction (Hillî 1363 SH). It is only relatively recently (the late nineteenth century) that the text and commentary were printed and came to be used in Shî‘î seminaries to introduce logic (El-Rouayheb 2010b: 108 n77). On the face of it, the text is quite conservatively Aristotelian, its rubrics following the traditional course of topics covered in the Organon, and in the same order; for all that, the substantive doctrine seems on the whole to be pristine Avicennan, precisely the doctrine Tûsî defended against Râzî, Khûnajî, Abharî and Kâtibî.

1.5.3 Logic and the Madrasa

The texts of Abharî and Kâtibî were used in the madrasa by Sunnis and Shî‘îs (though the Shî‘îs turned to the texts of Tûsî and Hillî in the nineteenth century). But the tradition was much more dynamic than the entrenchment of these texts in the syllabus would suggest. First, whatever introductory texts were used in teaching the discipline, it is clear that students who were attracted to logic studied well beyond these texts with teachers at the madrasa who were often engaged to teach other subjects. Secondly, other places such as hospitals and observatories provided less formal venues for the advanced study of logic (see Endress 2006).

But it was the madrasa that provided the backbone of the tradition, and a number of jurists came time and again to stress that the study of logic was so important to religion as to be a fard kifâya, that is, a religious duty such that it is incumbent on the community to ensure at least some scholars are able to pursue its study.

As for the logic that is not mixed with philosophy, as in … the treatise of Athîraddîn al-Abharî called îsâghûjî and the works of al-Kâtibî [i.e., ash-Shamsiyya] and al-Khûnajî [Afdaladdîn (d. 1249), i.e., al-Jumal] and Sa‘daddîn [at-Taftâzânî, i.e., Tahdhîb al-Mantiq], there is no disagreement concerning the permissibility of engaging in it, and it is rejected only by he who has no inkling of the rational sciences. Indeed, it is a fard kifâya because the ability to reply to heretical views in rational theology (kalâm), which is a fard kifâya, depends on mastering this science, and that which is necessary for a religious duty is itself a religious duty.[15]

Of course, a fatwâ like this invites us to consider what logic mixed with philosophy might look like; one scholar mentioned in the study just quoted offers Baydâwî's Ascending Lights as such a logic (Baydâwî 2001). Baydâwî's logic itself seems harmless—a generalized Avicennan logic—, but it is placed directly before an exposition of a speculative theology strongly influenced by Avicennan philosophy. Different scholars would have held different positions, but for the fatwâ quoted, perhaps the context surrounding a logic text is all that matters in making it acceptable or not.

1.6 The Delineation of Logical Traditions

After 1350 or so, logical traditions began to crystallise, often on a regional basis. Recent studies by El-Rouayheb (2010b) and Ahmed (2012) have provided preliminary sketches of the seven or so centuries of logical activity. Especially El-Rouayheb (2010b) makes it clear that we cannot assume that there is a point at which original work stops and the tradition begins simply to restate ancient results. It is true that much of the later material is, unlike the bulk of the thirteenth-century material, presented as commentary. There is a temptation to conclude from this that there was a decline in logical studies in the realms under Muslim control that corresponds with the sixteenth-century decline of the subject in early modern Europe; such a conclusion is seemingly supported by a tradition of scholarship devoted to a luxuriation of layered commentary on a five hundred year old primary text. But genre by no means dictates content, and we often find original work presented in this way.[16]

Regionalism had been a significant factor especially in the tradition of logic studied in al-Andalus; more generally, the crystallisation of traditions after Khûnajî also tended to be regional. Although Khûnajî was read in North Africa, it would seem that the Maragha logicians were not read there, at least not systematically. By contrast, Averroes was still read and taught in North Africa up to the end of the fourteenth century, and so Ibn Khaldûn would have been taught Averroes as well as a decoction of Khûnajî's logic; his teacher, Muhammad al-Sharîf al-Tilimsânî (d. 1370), had written a substantial commentary on a short work by Khûnajî, the Sentences (El-Rouayheb 2010b: 71–79).

At this stage of research, early modern logic traditions may best be divided along the fault-lines of the great empires: Ottoman, Persian, and Indian. All of these traditions produced massive amounts of work. With respect to the Persian tradition, I would note merely that by the advent of the Safavids (1501), the philosophical tradition was galvanized by a dispute between two leading scholars that had ground on for the last quarter of the preceding century, and this marked a point at which it became philosophically respectable to prefer the ancient scholars to the more recent, and Averroes enjoyed a revival of interest from time to time as a result (see El-Rouayheb 2010b: 92–104 for one aspect covered in the dispute, and Pourjavady 2011: “Introduction” for the background). In the Ottoman tradition, we find a flurry of impressive activity after 1600 among logicians dealing with relational syllogisms (presented in El-Rouayheb 2010b: chapters 5, 6 & 7). Finally, with respect to the India, recent research shows the complexities of the formation of teaching traditions of logic there (sketched in Ahmed 2012).

The coming of the metropolitan powers signals a convenient point at which we may speculate that important new possibilities opened up in Arabic logic. At least some members of the Christian communities in the capitulated territories in Syria and Lebanon trained in Europe. If the books on logic they wrote in Arabic were simply Western logic, then their works fall outside the purview of this entry; but I note that Butrus al-Tûlâwî (d. 1745) in his 1688 Introduction gives a definition of the syllogism which comes from Khûnajî (see Khûnajî 2010: 238.13–14), which is presumably the result of a syncretic process of great interest for the history of Arabic logic (pace El-Rouayheb 2010b: 114ff). Again, the relevant texts must be edited and studied.[17]

2. Logical Doctrines under Dispute

Of many possible candidates for consideration, the discussions around three logical doctrines seem to me to be particularly instructive. The first has to do with the subject matter of logic, something which needs to be identified if there is any prospect of presenting logic as a science (something most parties to the debate at least claim to want). The doctrine associated with Avicenna as to the subject matter of logic came to have decisive impact in the Latin logical tradition, though it was not the only doctrine in play through the later Arabic texts. The second and related set of doctrines has to do with offering an account of how the various logical disciplines—demonstration, dialectic, rhetoric and poetics—fit together. Inherited expectations of what disciplines a logical treatise should cover came under pressure from new disciplines derived from grammar and law; ultimately, the disciplines of dialectic, rhetoric and poetics were no longer treated in the ways they had been in the Aristotelian tradition. Finally, modal syllogistic was perhaps the most keenly disputed topic in logic through the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, and I offer an overview of one line of discussion which took place. I look in particular at arguments coming from eastern Iran in the thirteenth century—a tradition I call Maragha logic (see 1.5.2 above)—because this was a period of particularly intense logical activity culminating in textbooks overwhelmingly important in the subsequent teaching of the discipline.

Let me go on immediately to acknowledge that these may not be the most philosophically sophisticated or historically representative discussions which took place in the Arabic tradition (see e.g., Hodges 2011a (in Other Internet Resources) on the subject matter of logic). They do however all have the advantage of having been discussed by a number of Arabic logicians through the centuries, and of having been the subject of at least some academic study. Other candidate topics illustrate what I seek to avoid. Consider the impressive work by Avicenna on proof theory which has been translated and analysed by Hodges (2009, Other Internet Resources); to the extent that I can follow this work, it exhibits a truly extraordinary level of logical acumen. At the same time I have never—in my admittedly narrow reading in the tradition—seen another logician develop or even use Avicenna's results in this area. In short, the topic illustrates Avicenna's logical genius rather than a common theme running through Arabic logic.

Consider next the work in the Avicennan tradition on syllogisms with conditional and disjunctive premises (see 1.3 above). This important material is original to Avicenna, used among other things in the analysis of the reductio argument. If we consult Khûnajî's Disclosure, we find one quarter of the work's four hundred pages given over to syllogisms with conditional or disjunctive premises, developing the subject far beyond Avicenna's original insights in the Cure (and often in a manner fairly dismissive of Avicenna's work). Khûnajî clearly looked on his modifications to this part of Avicenna's logic as central to his project, and his modifications were adopted by later logicians like Kâtibî. If anything, this would be a better topic than the modals to illustrate the distinctive characteristics of the discussions that went on in Arabic logic. In the present state of the field, however, although there have been major studies of Avicenna's syllogistic with hypothetical premises (e.g., Rescher 1963c; Shehaby 1973; Gätje 1985), there is none at all—to the best of my knowledge—on its reception and modification in the subsequent tradition. One or both of these reasons (that is, neglect by the subsequent tradition and neglect in the secondary literature) rule out other major topics such as the theory of demonstration and what might be called meta-syllogistic (but see, on the first, Hasnawi 2008; Strobino 2010, 2012; and on the second, El-Rouayheb 2009; Hodges 2011c (in Other Internet Resources)).

2.1 The Subject Matter of Logic

It is common doctrine among medieval Latin logicians that logic is a linguistic science. An associated doctrine is that logic makes up, with grammar and rhetoric, the trivium, or the three arts of language. There never was a trivium in the Arabic-speaking philosophical world, and when scholars spoke of the “three arts” (as-sinâ‘ât ath-thalâth), they were referring to demonstration, dialectic and rhetoric. Clashes between scholars working on Greek texts and scholars working on the Arabic language first served to pose the question of how logic related to language, and specifically to the Arabic language. This in turn forced the discussion of what the subject matter of logic is, and how its subject matter differed from that of grammar.

2.1.1 Expressions, Meanings and Intelligibles

The unpromising proposal made by Abû Bishr Mattâ in response to Sîrâfî's attack on logic (see 1.2 above) prompted Alfarabi to make a second attempt at explaining how logic, grammar and language relate to each other.

Text 1. This art [of logic] is similar to the art of grammar, in that the relation of the art of logic to the intellect and the intelligibles is like the relation of the art of grammar to language and expressions (al-alfâz). That is, to every rule for expressions which the science of grammar provides us, there is an analogous [rule] for intelligibles which the science of logic provides us.[18]

This allows Alfarabi to go on to characterize the subject matter of logic as follows:

Text 2. The subject matters (mawdû‘ât) of logic are the things for which [logic] provides the rules, namely, intelligibles in so far as they are signified by expressions, and expressions in so far as they signify intelligibles.

[Logic] shares something with grammar in that it provides rules for expressions, yet it differs in that grammar only provides rules specific to the expressions of a given community, whereas the science of logic provides common rules that are general for the expressions of every community.[19]

This is to say—and here I follow Black's characterization of the doctrine—logic is something of a universal grammar or, more strictly, providing a universal grammar is one of the tasks of logic. Other philosophers of the Baghdad school like Yahyâ ibn ‘Adî (d. 974) by and large adopt Alfarabi's doctrine (see Endress 1977, 1978; cf. Black 1991: 48ff). (I think Alfarabi was being impelled towards holding that the subject matter of logic is secondary intelligibles, and perhaps ultimately came to hold such a doctrine (see Menn 2012: 68; Alfarabi Kitâb al-Hurûf [1970] 64, 66–67), but the position described above represents the doctrine Avicenna was to react against.)

2.1.2 Secondary Intelligibles

Aspects of this attempt to identify the subject matter of logic invite clarification. First, is the intelligible corresponding to, say, “horse”, part of the subject matter of logic? Secondly, is reference to expressions essential in a definition of logic, as is suggested by the phrase “intelligibles in so far as they are signified by expressions”?

A more careful statement of what was probably much the same doctrine is provided by Avicenna. Concepts like “horse”, “animal”, “body”, correspond to entities in the real world, entities which can have various properties. In the realm of the mental, concepts too can acquire various properties, properties they acquire simply by virtue of existing and being manipulated by the mind, properties like being a subject, or a predicate, or a genus. These are the subject matter of logic, and it seems it is only mental manipulation that gives rise to these properties.

Text 3. If we wish to investigate things and gain knowledge of them we must bring them into conception (fî t-tasawwur); thus they necessarily acquire certain states (ahwâl) that come to be in conception: we must therefore consider those states which belong to them in conception, especially as we seek by thought to arrive at things unknown from those that are known. Now things can be unknown or known only in relation to a mind; and it is in conception that they acquire what they do acquire in order that we move from what is known to what is unknown regarding them, without however losing what belongs to them in themselves; we ought, therefore, to have knowledge of these states and of their quantity and quality and of how they may be examined in this new circumstance.[20]

These properties that concepts acquire are secondary intelligibles; here is an exposition of this part of Avicennan doctrine by Râzî:

Text 4. The subject matter of logic is the secondary intelligibles in so far as it is possible to pass by means of them from the known (al-ma‘lûmât) to the unknown (al-majhûlât). The explanation of “secondary intelligibles” is that man conceives the realities of things (haqâ’iq al-ashyâ’) in the first place, then qualifies some with others either restrictively or predicatively (hukman taqyîdiyyan aw khabariyyan). The quiddity's being qualified in this way is something that only attaches to the quiddity after it has become known in the first place, so it is a second-order [consideration] (fî d-darajati th-thâniya). If these considerations are investigated, not absolutely, but rather with respect to how it is possible to pass correctly by means of them from the known to the unknown, that is logic. So its subject matter is certainly the secondary intelligibles under the consideration mentioned above (Râzî Mulakhkhas [2002] 10.1–10.8; see now El-Rouayheb 2012: esp. 72–77 as to whether Râzî's clarification is ultimately compatible with Avicenna's).

Avicenna in his Metaphysics makes special mention of these secondary intelligibles.

Text 5. The subject matter of logic, as you know, is given by the secondary intelligible meanings, based on the first intelligible meanings, with regard to how it is possible to pass by means of them from the known to the unknown, not in so far as they are intelligible and possess intellectual existence ([an existence] which does not depend on matter at all, or depends on an incorporeal matter).[21]

In identifying the secondary intelligibles, Avicenna is able to place logic within the hierarchy of the sciences, because it has its own distinct stretch of being which is its proper subject matter.

So much for the first problem in Alfarabi's formulation of what the subject matter of logic is. Avicenna also has a view on the second problem, the question of whether or not expression is essential to a definition of logic and its subject matter.

Text 6. There is no merit in what some say, that the subject matter of logic is speculation concerning the expressions insofar as they signify meanings… And since the subject matter of logic is not in fact distinguished by these things, and there is no way in which they are its subject matter, [such people] are only babbling and showing themselves to be stupid.[22]

One reason for this is that in Avicenna's psychology, language as a set of discrete expressions is not essential for the intellect in its operations. Note, however, that whatever Avicenna's official doctrine is, he recognizes and attempts to deal with the close nexus between language and thought.

Text 7. Were it possible for logic to be learned through pure cogitation, so that meanings alone would be observed in it, then this would suffice. And if it were possible for the disputant to disclose what is in his soul through some other device, then he would dispense entirely with its expression. But since it is necessary to employ expressions, and especially as it is not possible for the reasoning faculty to arrange meanings without imagining the expressions corresponding to them (reasoning being rather a dialogue with oneself by means of imagined expressions), it follows that expressions have various modes (ahwâl) on account of which the modes of the meanings corresponding to them in the soul vary so as to acquire qualifications (ahkâm) which would not have existed without the expressions. It is for this reason that the art of logic must be concerned in part with investigating the modes of expressions… But there is no value in the doctrine of those who say that the subject matter of logic is to investigate expressions in so far as they indicate meanings…but rather the matter should be understood in the way we described.[23]

As Sabra says, Avicenna seems to hold that “the properties constituting the subject matter of logic would be inconceivable without the exercise of a particular function of language” (Sabra 1980: 764).

2.1.3 Conceptions and Assents

Avicenna's doctrine on the subject matter of logic was not adopted by the majority of logicians who followed him (pace Sabra 1980: 757). Quite the contrary, Khûnajî claimed in the second quarter of the thirteenth century that the subject matter of logic was conceptions and assents, a claim which was energetically resisted by remaining Avicennan purists like Tûsî. A recent study has clarified what is at issue in this debate (El-Rouayheb 2012).

To understand the background to Khûnajî's claim, it is necessary to bear two points in mind. The first is Avicenna's doctrine concerning the states of knowledge that logic aims at producing: conception and assent.[24] The second is what is means for something to be a subject of an Aristotelian science.

Text 8. […] A thing is knowable in two ways: one of them is for the thing to be merely conceived (yutasawwara) so that when the name of the thing is uttered, its meaning becomes present in the mind without there being truth or falsity, as when someone says “man” or “do this!” For when you understand the meaning of what has been said to you, you will have conceived it. The second is for the conception to be [accompanied] with assent, so that if someone says to you, for example, “every whiteness is an accident,” you do not only have a conception of the meaning of this statement, but [also] assent to it being so. If, however, you doubt whether it is so or not, then you have conceived what is said, for you cannot doubt what you do not conceive or understand… but what you have gained through conception in this [latter] case is that the form of this composition and what it is composed of, such as “whiteness” and “accident,” have been produced in the mind. Assent, however, occurs when there takes place in the mind a relating of this form to the things themselves as being in accordance with them; denial is the opposite of that.[25]

Note that an assent is not merely the production of a proposition by tying a subject and predicate together; “Assent, however, occurs when there takes place in the mind a relating of this form to the things themselves as being in accordance with them.” All knowledge, according to Avicenna, is either conception or assent. Conception is produced by definition, assent by proof. All Avicennan treatises on logic are structured in accordance with this doctrine: a first section deals with definition, which conduces to conception, a second with proof, which conduces to assent.

The subject of an Aristotelian science is investigated with a view to identifying its per se attributes, that is, its necessary but non-constitutive properties. The subject of geometry is spatial magnitude and its species (such as triangle); finding, for example, that “internal angles summing to two right angles” belongs to “triangle” is the proper task of the science of geometry. If the subject matter of logic is secondary intelligibles, then the proper task of logic will be identifying the per se attributes of secondary intelligibles. According to Khûnajî, however, some of the properties investigated by the logician are attributes of primary intelligibles; in consequence, the subject matter of logic must be something more general than secondary intelligibles. This prompted Khûnajî to declare that conceptions and assents are the subject matter of logic. Kâtibî accepted this line of reasoning:

Text 9. The logician may investigate matters that do not accrue to second intentions at all… but rather to single notions (ma’ânî) that occur in the mind. For he investigates the concept of “essential”, “accidental”, “species”, “genus”, “differentia”, “subject” and “predicate” and other things that accrue to single notions that we intellect.[26]

Another logician who followed Khûnajî in this was Abharî; here is his statement of the doctrine:

Text 10. The subject matter of logic, I mean, the thing which the logician investigates in respect of its concomitants in so far as it is what it is, are precisely conceptions and assents. [This is] because [the logician] investigates what conduces to conception and what the means [to conception] depends upon (for something to be universal and particular, essential and accidental, and such like); and he investigates what conduces to assent and what the means to assent depends upon, whether proximately (like something being a proposition or the converse of a proposition or the contradictory of a proposition and such like) or remotely (like something being a predicate or a subject). These are states which inhere in conceptions and assents in so far as they are what they are. So certainly its subject matter is conceptions and assents. (Tûsî Ta‘dîl [1974b] 144.14–20)

And here is part of Tûsî's response:

Text 11. If what he means by conceptions and assents is everything on which these two nouns fall, it is the sciences in their entirety, because knowledge is divided into these two; whereupon what is understood from [his claim] is that the subject matter of logic is all the sciences. Yet there is no doubt that they are not the subject matter of logic…


The truth is that the subject matter for logic is the secondary intelligibles in so far as reflection on them leads from the known to [understanding] the unknown (or to something similar, as do reductio arguments or persuasive arguments [146] or image-evoking arguments and the like). And if they are characterised by the rider mentioned by the masters of this craft, conceptions and assents are among the set of secondary intelligibles in just the same way as definition and syllogism and their parts, like universal and particular and subject and predicate and proposition and premise and conclusion (Tûsî Ta‘dîl [1974b] 144.21–u, 145.pu–146.3).

But as we have seen, for Tûsî's colleagues at Maragha, Avicenna's identification of secondary intelligibles as the subject matter of logic excludes things which are properly investigated in logic. (I note but do not attempt to cover the counter-arguments offered in the later tradition against Khûnajî's position; see El-Rouayheb 2012: 82 et seq.)

2.2 The Contents of the Treatise on Logic

When the full Organon was finally assembled in Arabic, it included the whole range of texts in the order given them by the Alexandrian philosophers. There was an inherited expectation that this was the full and proper stretch of logical inquiry, an expectation which was to come under pressure in the Muslim world. It had already come under revision in Avicenna's Pointers and Reminders, but more substantial change was to follow.

One factor at work in determining the structure of Avicennan logic treatises was the doctrine of secondary intelligibles, a doctrine which led to the exclusion of parts of the Organon from the realm of the strictly logical, specifically, the Categories. The arguments that excluded the Categories must also have problematized the inclusion of some other parts of the Organon, such as the Topics.

Another factor at work was the doctrine of conceptions and assents. If, as was commonly accepted, argument is designed to bring about an assent, then one might ask what kinds of assent there are, and what variables in an argument lead to different kinds of assent. This doctrine was to replace the Alexandrian doctrine of the context theory, in which logic is taken to cover different material implementations of syllogistic reasoning, whether in demonstration, dialectic, rhetoric, poetics or sophistry. According to the Alexandrian version of the theory, a stretch of discourse was to be analysed according to the context in which it was found: in poetry, one expected to find false and impossible statements, in demonstration, necessary and true statements. The Arabic logicians were to reject this version, though they ultimately lost interest in the range of disciplines coordinated by the theory.

A final factor, or range of factors, at work on the shape of the logic treatise that emerged in the thirteenth century arose out of discussions in law, especially the tradition of legal dialectic; this tradition was ultimately to crystallise as a new discipline that replaced the discussion of the Topics and Sophistical Fallacies. Similarly disciplines grew out of grammar and theology which replaced the logical study of rhetoric and poetics. I examine each of these factors in turn.

2.2.1 Logic as a Formal Science

Avicenna's doctrine of secondary intelligibles assigns logic a subject matter whose essential properties the logician studies; this makes logic a science in the Aristotelian sense of the term. But—according to the strictures applying to an Aristotelian science—no science can probe the existence of its subject matter, but rather must take it as given from a higher science (in this case, metaphysics). Yet the Categories shuttles between secondary intelligibles and the primary intelligibles which are the pre-condition for the existence of the secondary intelligibles.

Avicenna himself adverted to the problem of whether or not Categories was a properly logical book, and decided that it was not, though he treated it in the Cure out of deference to Peripatetic custom. His arguments for deeming it not to be properly logical have been gathered together in the past (see esp. Gutas 1988: 265–267), but the line of argument had already been stated neatly by later logicians. Here is Hillî dealing with why Tûsî moves from the five predicables (or “five categories”) to the ten categories:

Text 12. When Tûsî finished investigating the five categories which inhere in the ten categories, he began the investigation of [the ten], even though [such investigation] is not part of logic. [This is] because the subject matter of logic is the secondary intelligibles which inhere in the primary intelligibles. How can the primary intelligibles be investigated even though [such investigation] is a [presupposed] part of the science [of logic]? This would be circular. But rather, [the ten categories] are investigated in logic to aid in properly realizing the genera and specific differences. [Such investigation], then, will be a help in discovering (istinbât) what is defined and inferred, even though it is not part of logic (Hillî Jawhar [1410 A.H.] 23.4–8).

A study of the categories will, in short, be helpful in giving concrete examples of the logical doctrines presented. The same arguments in removing the Categories from logic should apply to texts which investigate the commonplace reasoning of the Topics, though I have not seen such an argument made by an Arabic logician. It is not clear to me that the argument to exclude the Categories from logic which, in Hillî's version, depends on taking secondary intelligibles to be the subject matter of logic, still works for those who do not accept logic's subject matter to be secondary intelligibles; none the less, the Categories were excluded from their works too.

2.2.2 Assent and the Context Theory

Arguments aim to bring about assent; more precisely (see Text 8 above), when conceptions have been gained that produce in the mind both the meaning of the terms in a given proposition, and the form of composition of these terms, assent “occurs when there takes place in the mind a relating of this form to the things themselves as being in accordance with them…” In fact, different kinds of discourse can bring about one or other kind of assent, or something enough like assent to be included in a general theory of discourse. I give Tûsî's statement of the Avicennan version of the context theory; it is the neatest statement I know of the criteria that divide kinds of discourse and the assents for which each aims.

A few preliminary words by way of introduction to this dense passage. Arabic logicians, like most Aristotelian logicians, speak of form and matter in propositions and proofs, and they have quite specific distinctions in mind when they do so. The matter in a proposition is what underwrites as true or false the modality the proposition has. When the dummy variables in a proposition are filled in with concrete terms, the resulting claim may be semantically determinate (as in “every man is an animal” and “no man is a stone”), and this will make the proposition's matter either necessary or remote and, if necessary, make the proposition true as a necessity proposition. Alternatively, the resulting claim may be semantically indeterminate (as in “every man is writing”), and this will make the proposition's matter contingent, and the proposition true as a contingency proposition. The matter in an argument, by contrast, is the epistemic status or persuasive force each of the premises has which, given a formally appropriate proof, will confer a similar or lesser epistemic status or persuasive force on the conclusion. (Note that jâzim is rendered by Black as “apophantic” (Black 1990: 53), which I give here as “truth-apt”. For the terms of art used to deal with syllogistic matter, see now Gutas (2012).)

Text 13. Since Avicenna had finished explaining the formal and quasi-formal aspects of syllogistic, he turned to its material aspects. With respect to these, syllogistic divides into five kinds, because it either conveys an assent, or an influence of another kind (I mean an evoked image or wonder). What leads to assent leads either to an assent which is truth-apt or to one which is not. And what is truth-apt is either taken [in the argument] as true (haqq), or is not so taken. And what is taken as true either is or isn't true.

That which leads to true truth-apt assent is [1] demonstration; untrue truth-apt assent is [2] sophistry. That which leads to truth-apt assent not taken as true or false but rather as [a matter of] common consent (‘umûm al-i‘tirâf) is—if it's like this—[3] dialectic (jadal), otherwise it's eristic (shaghab) which is, along with sophistry (safsata), under one kind of fallacy production (mughâlata). [And what leads] to overwhelming though not truth-apt assent is [4] rhetoric; and to evocation of images rather than assent, [5] poetry (Tûsî Sharh al-Ishârât [1971] 460.1–461.12).

Tûsî immediately goes on to lay out grounds for assent to propositions, for example, because they are primary, or because they are agreed for the purposes of discussion. Propositions to be used as premises for demonstration make the most irresistible demands for our assent; premises for lower kinds of discourse make weaker demands.

The vast majority of the later Arabic logicians no more than nod towards the context theory in a paragraph towards the end of their treatises. A logician should only be interested—in so far as he is interested in material implementation of formal reasoning at all—in demonstration because it leads him to what is true and certain, and in sophistry, because it may confuse him in the search for demonstrative truth.

Philosophically, the context theory is an attempt to account for the cognitive and communicative impact of every kind of discourse. It examines in extraordinary detail the Aristotelian claim that the syllogism lies at the heart of all human reasoning and, in an attempt to make good the claim, presents an account of syllogistic forms attenuated in accordance with the epistemic matter of their premises. It also recognizes that communication depends on more than merely objective truth and formal validity, and offers an account of what motivates the assent of the human knower to any given stretch of discourse. As a theory, its global reach may be more impressive than its analytical grasp, but it is a marked advance on a theory only partly developed in the Alexandrian school.[27]

2.2.3 An Alternative Organon?

The doctrine of secondary intelligibles cut down the number of subjects treated within the logic treatises, or at least, treated as strictly logical subjects, and the doctrine of dividing knowledge into conception and assent determined the structure of what was left in Avicennan logic treatises. Formal interests of post-Avicennan logicians further limited interest in demonstration; syllogistic, for example, became a central focus of research from the thirteenth century on. Further changes were introduced for clarity of exposition.

Text 14. The later scholars came and changed the technical terms of logic; and they appended to the investigation of the five universals its fruit, which is to say the discussion of definitions and descriptions which they moved from the Posterior Analytics; and they dropped the Categories because a logician is only accidentally and not essentially interested in that book; and they appended to On Interpretation the treatment of conversion (even if it had been in the Topics in the texts of the ancients, it is none the less in some respects among the things which follow on from the treatment of propositions). Moreover, they treated the syllogistic with respect to its productivity generally, not with respect to its matter. They dropped the investigation of [the syllogistic] with respect to matter, which is to say, these five books: Posterior Analytics, Topics, Rhetoric, Poetics, and Sophistical Fallacies (though sometimes some of them give a brief outline of them). They have ignored [these five books] as though they had never been, even though they are important and relied upon in the discipline (Ibn-Khaldûn Muqaddima [1858] 112–113; cf. Ibn-Khaldûn 1958: 3, 142–143).

It is clear that whether the structure of the Organon was appropriate for Arabic logic treatises was contested at least until the end of the thirteenth century. At the same time Hillî was setting out his logic according to the Avicennan outline of the Organon (see section 1.5.2 above), Shamsaddîn as-Samarqandî (d. c. 1310) was writing a book laid out after the fashion described by Ibn Khaldûn in the text above, with one major difference. Samarqandî concluded his Qistâs al-Afkâr with a long section covering what he called “the etiquette of debate” and fallacies. He consciously adopted the etiquette of debate from treatises on forensic argument, and he told his readers that he intended it to replace study of the Topics and the Sophistical Fallacies.

Text 15. It has been the custom of our predecessors to place a chapter on dialectics (jadal) in their logical works. But since the science of juristic dialectic (khilâf) of our times does not need it, I have brought in its stead a canon for the art of disputation and its order, the proper formulation of speech [in disputation] and its rectification. This [art] is, with respect to establishing a thesis and explaining it, just like logic with respect to deliberation and thought; for, through it we are kept on the desired path and are saved from the recalcitrance of speech. I have set it out in two sections, the first, on the ordering and etiquette of debate, the second, on error and its causes.[28]

In one sense, Samarqandî was unsuccessful: few if any later authors followed him in making the etiquette of debate a section of their logic treatises. But in another, much more significant sense, Samarqandî was entirely successful; his work by and large supplanted the Topics and Sophistical Fallacies, and gained a place in the madrasa system along side Kâtibî's Shamsiyya; treatises on the etiquette of debate are often found in codices along with the logic treatises.

Other language sciences also went into the codices with the logic manuals. Of the cluster of disciplines that make up the grammatical sciences, especially ‘ilm al-wad‘ (roughly, semantics) and ‘ilm al-balâgha (roughly, rhetoric) compete to cover material covered by parts of Aristotelian logic. Like the logic textbooks, the textbooks for both ‘ilm al-wad‘ and ‘ilm al-balâgha that were incorporated into a typical madrasa education were achieved fairly late.

‘Ilm al-wad‘ was named and consecrated as a separate discipline by the work of the great Ash‘arite theologian, ‘Adudaddin al-Îjî (d. 1355). In his Epistle on Imposition Îjî drew together the views of his predecessors on the way language came about. All agreed that language was the result of a conscious assignation—imposition—of units of vocal sound (or expressions, alfâz) to units of thought (or meanings, ma‘ânî). It made no difference what position one adopted on the origin of language, because either God or the community could function as the one imposing language. Note that the units of thought are at least logically prior to language, so language is not considered a pre-condition of thought. Language is the totality of expressions together with the totality of their meanings. Once expressions have been assigned their meanings by the impositor, this is irrevocable. Having stated these common assumptions about language, Îjî turned to set out a typology of imposition. Îjî noted that—in what he took to be unproblematic cases—the meaning in the mind of the one imposing the expression is identical to the meaning it has in actual speech situations. But what about the pronoun, “he”, which will have a different meaning in different speech situations? This is the problem on which Îjî dwelt in his epistle. Its solution turned out to be, as Tashköprüzade was later to say, only a drop in the ocean of problems in ‘ilm al-wad‘; once one took the notion of imposition seriously, implementing it as a general explanation for the relation between expression and meaning turned out to be an immense project which carried on into the twentieth century (Weiss 1987: especially 341–345).

‘Ilm al-balâgha was standardly presented in a textbook by Khatîb Dimashq al-Qazwînî (d. 1325), The Abridgement of the Key. ‘Ilm al-balâgha was a science that includes a deal of material deriving from the work of the great eleventh-century grammarian and Ash‘arite theologian, ‘Abdalqâhir al-Jurjânî (d. 1078). Spurred by debate about how to judge the inimitability of the Koran, Jurjânî had tried to develop a method for evaluating rhetorical excellence.

The basic tenet he wishes to emphasize from the outset is that stylistic superiority resides in the meanings or ideas (ma‘ânî) of words and how they are associated with each other in a given composition (nazm), and not in the utterances or words (alfâz) themselves. (Larkin 1982: 77)

2.3 Modal Propositions and Modal Syllogisms

There were a number of modal systems developed and debated among the Arabic logicians. The material devoted to the topic is too voluminous for anything more than a sketchy account of one line of development and debate. I follow a few aspects of Avicenna's syllogistic through its treatment in the thirteenth century, and its transformation into a compact body of doctrine taught in the madrasa. With regret, in this redaction of the entry I omit mention of Alfarabi and Averroes, not because they are not important, but because, first, Alfarabi's most important treatment of the syllogistic is lost and, secondly, Averroes stands outside the Avicennan tradition of logic.

It will become clear that Avicenna's syllogistic puzzled those who came after him, and still puzzles those today who try to work out what Avicenna was doing. There is some ground to think that Avicenna's syllogistic is, from a systematic point of view, something of a failure; that was a fairly common assessment among thirteenth-century logicians. This in turn gives rise to the thought that perhaps Avicenna wasn't trying to produce a systematic syllogistic, that he had other goals in mind as he dealt with material descended ultimately from Aristotle's Prior Analytics (some of it, from the commentators, seemingly in conflict with what Aristotle is doing). If I understand correctly, this is broadly speaking how Hodges approaches Avicenna (see Hodges 2011b, 2012a, and 2012b in Other Internet Resources). On the other hand, it may be that Avicenna has a complex system that repays close analysis; Thom's studies of Avicenna's syllogistic proceed on that assumption. I tend to think the Thom approach is the more promising. In any event, thirteenth-century logicians took Avicenna to have tried and failed to present a coherent system.

In this brief overview, I describe one aspect of Avicenna's truth-conditions for modal propositions which became common doctrine among later Arabic logicians. I go on to examine some of what Avicenna said about the subject term of a proposition, and some of the inferences he defended. Avicenna's doctrines on both subject term and modal inferences became much-debated issues in thirteenth-century logic; I follow one line of the debate.

2.3.1 Avicenna

In a famous and much-quoted passage, Avicenna lays out six conditions under which a proposition may be said to have a given modalization (all his examples are of necessity propositions, but the same conditions apply to propositions under all modalizations); the first two conditions are the most important:

Text 16. Necessity may be absolute (‘alâ l-itlâq), as in God exists; [265] or it may be connected (mu‘allaqa) to a condition (shart). The condition is either [1] perpetual [relative] to the existence of the substance [of the subject] (dhât), as in man is necessarily a rational body; by which we do not mean to say that man is and always will be a rational body, because this is false taken for each human individual. Rather we mean that while he exists as a substance (mâ dâma mawjûda dh-dhât) as a human, he is a rational body. Likewise for every negative which resembles this affirmative statement.

Or [the condition may be] [2] the duration (dawâm) of the subject's being described with what is set down with it, as in all mobile things are changing; this is not to be taken to mean [this is so] absolutely, nor while the subject exists as a substance, but rather while the substance of the moving thing is moving. [266]

Distinguish between this condition and the first condition, because the first condition has set down [as the condition] the principle of the substance, man, whereas here the substance is set down with a description which attaches to the substance, moving thing; the moving thing has a substance and an essence (jawhar) to which movement and non-movement attach; but man and black are not like that (Avicenna Ishârât [1971] 264–266).

Avicenna takes a proposition under condition [1]—later termed, for obvious reasons, the dhâtî—to be the right proposition to use while laying out the system Aristotle should have laid out in the Prior Analytics, and for laying out the central claims of his own metaphysics. Avicenna focussed most of his attention on the dhâtî, and when he looked for the strongest converse of a dhâtî proposition, he ignored wasfî converses. Later logicians approached the issue of wasfî/dhâtî conditions differently, and often found wasfî converses for dhâtî propositions; they had integrated the two readings in a way Avicenna had not.

Avicenna stipulated for the subject term of all his propositions, whether explicitly modalized or not:

Text 17. Know that when we say every J is B, we do not mean the totality (kulliyya) of J is the totality of B. Rather, we mean that every single thing described as J, be it in mental supposition or extramental existence, be it described as J always, or sometimes, or whatever; that thing is described as B without further adding that it is so described at such and such a time (waqt), or in such and such circumstances (hâl), or perpetually. All of these [modalizations would make for a proposition] stronger than one being described as absolute (mutlaq). So this is what is understood from every J is B, with no addition of modal operators attached. On this understanding it is called a general absolute… (Avicenna Ishârât [1971] 280 & 282).

The phrase “be it in mental supposition” might be taken to mean that the subject term is ampliated to the possible, so that “every J is B” is to be taken as “every possible J is B.” This is how Fakhraddiin al-Râzî understood Avicenna (and two recent models for Avicenna's syllogistic ampliate the subject term; Thom 2003, 2008b).

Avicenna gave a number of accounts of modal propositions and syllogisms. Here, I follow a few points made in the one given in Pointers and Reminders, the cynosure of thirteenth-century logicians (though I also refer to Salvation which, like Pointers, is available in English translation). Avicenna's syllogistic includes propositions without explicit modalization (an absolute proposition, taken by Avicenna to contain an elided temporal modality “at least once”, so the a-proposition is understood as “every J is at least once B”, the e-proposition as “no J is always B”) both one- and two-sided, possibility propositions both one-sided (“every J is possibly B”) and two-sided, and necessity propositions (“every J is necessarily B”,  e-proposition “no J is possibly B”).

Early in his presentation, Avicenna considered whether the absolute e-proposition, “no J is B”, converts to “no B is J” (a conversion accepted by his predecessors and contemporaries). Avicenna rejected absolute e-conversion and offered a counter-example found in Aristotle, “no horse is sleeping” (Avicenna Najât [1985] 39), and one of his own, “no man is laughing” (Avicenna Ishârât [1971] 322). He accepted that absolute a- and i-propositions convert:

(1) “Every J is B” and “some J is B” convert to “some B is J.”

He offered an ecthetic proof for the conversion (Avicenna Ishârât [1971] 330; Avicenna Najât [1985] 44). And he proved the conversion of the necessity e-proposition:

(2) “No J is possibly B” converts to “no B is possibly J.”

Text 18. The universal negative necessity proposition converts as itself, that is, as a universal negative necessity. If necessarily no B is A, then necessarily no A is B; were that not the case, then possibly a given A is B—let that be J, such that at a given moment what has become A will have become B, so that it will be B and A, so that that B is an A; this is impossible. (Avicenna Najât [1985] 44–45)

Avicenna shifted on whether the necessity a- and i-propositions convert to absolute i-propositions (Avicenna Najât [1985] 45), or to possibility i-propositions; his later position is that they convert as possibility i-propositions (Avicenna Ishârât [1971] 335–336).

(3) “Every J is necessarily B” and “some J is necessarily B” convert to “some B is possibly J.”

Avicenna rejected the conversion of the possibility e-proposition (“no J is necessarily B”) with the same counter-example used to reject absolute e-conversion (“no man is necessarily laughing”). And he argued for the conversion of the possibility a- and i-propositions as i-propositions:

(4) “Every J is possibly B” and “some J is possibly B” convert to “some B is possibly J.”

Text 19. If “every J is possibly B” or “some J is possibly B”, then “some B is possibly J” (as a one-sided possibility proposition); were that not the case, then no B is possibly J, which as you know amounts to “necessarily no B is J”, which converts to “necessarily no J is B”; this is absurd. (Avicenna Ishârât [1971] 339ff.)

Notice that the proof for necessity e-conversion depends on possibility i-conversion, and the proof for possibility i-conversion on necessity e-conversion. Alternative proofs could be proposed; for e-conversion, for example, one could argue that “no J is possibly B” converts to “no B is possibly J”, if not, then “some B is possibly J”, but this with the first proposition produces by Ferio “some J is not possibly J”, which is absurd. This proof is open to Avicenna, given that he took first-figure syllogisms with a possibility proposition as its minor premise to be perfect, or nearly so; this syllogistic mix was rejected by most later logicians, along with the other proofs.

2.3.2 Post-Avicennan Logicians

By and large, logicians who came after Avicenna adopted many of his assumptions and distinctions: his understanding of the absolute proposition (at least with respect to the modalization of its predicate), the wasfî/dhâtî distinction, the division of the syllogistic into repetitive and connective. They worried, however, about a number of his claims concerning modal propositions and the productive syllogisms that can be built from them. By the middle of the thirteenth century, a primary concern was about finding truth-conditions for propositions that could be useful for the sciences (see Text 24 below), though everyone started from Avicenna's formulations. A central distinction in these later discussions was between externalist and essentialist readings of the propositions. This is what the terms “externalist” and “essentialist” mean:

Text 20. “Every J is B” is considered at times according to the essence (whereupon it's called “essentialist”, as though [the subject] is an essence in a proposition used in the sciences), and at other times according to external reality (whereupon it's called “externalist”, and what is meant by “external” is what is external to the senses). (Tahtânî 1948: Tahrîr 94.6–8)

Fakhraddîn al-Râzî was the first to introduce the distinction between externalist and essentialist readings (see notes to Râzî 2002: at 400). When we say “every J is B”,

Text 21. …we don't mean by it what is described as J externally, but rather something more general, which is: were it to exist externally it would be true of it that it is J, whether it exists externally or not. For we can say “every triangle is a figure” even if there are no triangles existent externally. The meaning is rather that everything which would be a triangle were it to exist would be—in so far as it existed—a figure. (Râzî Mulakhkhas [2002] 141.6–10)


By the second reading, we mean by “every J” every single thing which exists externally among the individual Js… On this hypothesis, were there no septagons existent externally, it wouldn't be correct to say “every septagon is a figure”; if the only figures existent externally were triangles, it would be correct to say “every figure is a triangle.” On the first reading, both of these would be false. (Râzî Mulakhkhas [2002] 142.13–143.1)

Râzî went on to investigate inferences in both readings, and found the inferences from propositions with essentialist readings lined up closely with Avicenna's. The readings gave Râzî all the conversions mentioned in section 2.3.1 above except 1 (he took the absolute affirmative to convert as a possibility proposition). He also accepted syllogisms with possibility propositions as minor premises to be productive. Interpretive considerations may have been at play in his clear preference for the essentialist reading, but what explicitly motivated the distinction is the need to have propositions refer to things which do not exist “externally”; the examples are always of non-instantiated geometric figures.

Râzî was clear that he did not intend the essentialist reading to amount to an ampliation of the subject term to the possible such as he attributed to Alfarabi (“Alfarabi claimed that with respect to ‘every J’ one shouldn't [only] take account of actually occurring Js, but everything whose description as J is possible”; Râzî Mulakhkhas [2002] 142.4–5). But with the phrase “were it to exist externally it would be true of it that it is J”, Râzî posited a domain of discourse including non-instantiated Js, and he seemed to take his propositions thereby to refer to possible-Js.

That at least is how Khûnajî understood Râzî's solution; he took it to amount to no more than an ampliation of the subject term to the possible. Unlike Râzî, Khûnajî understood the phrase “were it to exist as a J” to include reference to impossible Js, and modified or rejected the conversions 1, 2, 3 and 4. Before turning to how Khûnajî used the essentialist reading, consider his assessment of Râzî's reading at the end of the chapter on conversion in Disclosure.

Text 22. Know that these valuations relating to conversion which we have mentioned don't differ much from the claims of the ancients, even though they may differ from what some recent logicians have said. Were we to be satisfied, as Alfarabi was, that for something to be a subject the possibility [of its coming under the subject term would be enough], and not consider [the subject term's] affirmation of it in actuality, it would follow that the [universal] negative necessity proposition would convert as a necessity proposition, affirmative possibility propositions would convert as a possibility proposition, the conversion of absolute propositions wouldn't result in more than possibility, and the syllogism in the first figure with a minor possibility proposition would be productive, as will be clear to you after coming to know what has gone before, and having given due consideration to the propositions under this technical usage. Since the later scholars have changed the technical usage without changing the valuations they arrive at—such that the valuation differs accordingly to the difference in technical usage—, they have been mired in nonsense. Perhaps Avicenna hesitated over the conversion of absolute propositions as either possibility or absolute propositions just because of his hesitation over technical usage. When he says that they convert as possibility propositions, he doesn't consider affirmation in actuality with respect to the subject; when he says they convert as absolute propositions, he does (because the fact the absolute follows on this technical usage is just about patently evident, such that it wouldn't be appropriate for Avicenna to deny it). (Khûnajî Kashf [2010] 145.3-u)

Having rejected Râzî's understanding of the essentialist reading, Khûnajî deployed his own modified essentialist reading to come to different inferences. Take absolute e-conversion, which Avicenna and Râzî agreed fails (according to Râzî, it fails on either externalist or essentialist reading). Khûnajî agreed that it fails on the externalist reading (which he took in the same way Râzî did). Taken in Khûnajî's essentialist reading, however, “no J is always B” converts as a perpetuity o-proposition, “some B is never J.” To show this is so, Khûnajî had to offer a proof for the conversion, then resist counter-examples to it. I skip the proof, and go straight to how Khûnajî dealt with the counter-examples.

Text 23. They argue conversion fails for these propositions because it is true, “no moon is eclipsed”…and “no animal is breathing”… yet [130] their converses are not true, namely, “some eclipsed is not a moon”, and “some breathing is not animal”…

The answer to this is that we reject that “some eclipsed is not a moon” and similar statements are false if the subject is taken according to the essentialist reading. This is because, in this case, its meaning is some of what would be eclipsed, were it to come to exist, would not be a moon, insofar as it had come to exist. [The claim this is false] is to be rejected; the most that can be said in this matter is that every eclipsed that has come to exist is a moon, but from this is does not follow that it is true that everything that is eclipsed, were it to come to exist, would be a moon insofar as it comes to exist. This is because [the proposition with an essentialist subject] deals with actual, possible and impossible items [that come under the subject term]. Were we to stipulate the possibility [of these items] along with [the other stipulations], their status would be that of externally existent things. So the eclipsed-which-is-not-a-moon, even though it is impossible, is among those individuals which would be eclipsed, were they to come to exist, even though it is not necessary that any would be a moon if they came to exist.

Overall, if these propositions are taken in the essentialist reading, the proof we have given for their conversion works, the counter-arguments are not compelling, and the proper view must be that the conversion is correct. (Khûnajî Kashf [2010] 129.14–130.12)

What this means for the counter-example considered before, “no man is always laughing”, is that it converts on this account to “some laughing is not ever a man.” This is because we may, under Khûnajî's essentialist reading, posit the impossible “laughing-which-is-not-a-man.” With this modified essentialist reading, Khûnajî ended up with the following conversions:

“Every J is at least once B” converts as “some B is necessarily J” (Khûnajî Kashf [2010] 143);
“No J is possibly B” converts as “no B is ever J” (Khûnajî Kashf [2010] 135);
“Every J is necessarily B” converts as “some B is necessarily J” (Khûnajî Kashf [2010] 143);
“Every J is possibly B” has no provable converse (Khûnajî Kashf [2010] 144).

The Maragha logicians—whose work included the compositions on logic most frequently taught in the Islamic world—reflected critically on Avicenna, Râzî and Khûnajî. Everyone accepted that there were problems with Avicenna's inferences, but also that Khûnajî's critique of Râzî's essentialist reading (which had saved most of Avicenna's inferences) was correct. Khûnajî's alternative development of the essentialist reading led to its own problems, however; first Abarî proved that an e-proposition couldn't be true on Khûnajî's version of this reading, then Tûsî proved, nor could an a-proposition. By the time Kâtibî came to deal with the problem, he took Khûnajî's comment in Text 23 above seriously:

…the proposition with an essentialist subject] deals with actual, possible and impossible items [that come under the subject term]. Were we to stipulate the possibility [of these items] along with [the other stipulations], their status would be that of externally existent things.

Kâtibî further modified Khûnajî's reading to limit propositions with essentialist subjects to those with self-consistent subjects. In the Shamsiyya, in consequence, the externalist and essentialist readings are taken to be of the same status, which is to say, all and only the inferences provable in one reading are provable in the other. On the conversions in question, Kâtibî held:

(1) “Every J is at least once B” converts as “some B is at least once J”;
(2*) “No J is possibly B” converts as “no B is ever J”;
(3**) “Every J is necessarily B” converts as “some B is at least once J while B”;
(4*) “Every J is possibly B” has no provable converse.

Tahtânî, writing in the early fourteenth century, looked back over the efforts of his thirteenth-century predecessors and summed up the nature of their inquiries. If his account is correct, the thirteenth-century logicians limited their investigations to scientifically useful propositions, acknowledging at the same time that there are many other propositions with different truth-conditions they could be investigating.

Text 24. It is not to be leveled as a criticism that, because the craft should have general rules, there are propositions that cannot be taken under either of these two considerations (namely, those whose subjects are impossible, as in “the co-creator is impossible”, and “every impossible is non-existent”). Because we say: No one claims to limit all propositions to the essentialist and the externalist. They do however claim that propositions used in the sciences are used for the most part under one of these two considerations, so they therefore set these readings down and extract their qualifications so they may thereby benefit in the sciences. The qualifications of the propositions that cannot be taken under either of these two considerations are not yet known; the generalization of rules is only to the extent of human capacity. (Tahtânî 1948: Tahrîr 95.pu–96.11)


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