Aristotle on Causality
Each Aristotelian science consists in the causal investigation of a specific department of reality. If successful, such an investigation results in causal knowledge; that is, knowledge of the relevant or appropriate causes. The emphasis on the concept of cause explains why Aristotle developed a theory of causality which is commonly known as the doctrine of the four causes. For Aristotle, a firm grasp of what a cause is, and how many kinds of causes there are, is essential for a successful investigation of the world around us.
As will become clear in due course, Aristotle is committed to a form of causal pluralism (Stein 2011: 121–147). For Aristotle, there are four distinct and irreducible kinds of causes. The focus of this entry is on the systematic interrelations among these four kinds of causes.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Four Causes
- 3. The Four Causes and the Science of Nature
- 4. Final Causes Defended
- 5. The Explanatory Priority of Final Causes
- 6. The Explanation of a Lunar Eclipse
- 7. Conclusion
- 8. Glossary of Aristotelian Terminology
- Academic Tools
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Aristotle was not the first thinker to engage in a causal investigation of the world around us. From the very beginning, and independently of Aristotle, the investigation of the natural world consisted in the search for the relevant causes of a variety of natural phenomena. From the Phaedo, for example, we learn that the so-called “inquiry into nature” consisted in a search for “the causes of each thing; why each thing comes into existence, why it goes out of existence, why it exists” (96 a 6–10). In this tradition of investigation, the search for causes was a search for answers to the question “why?”. Both in the Physics and in the Metaphysics Aristotle places himself in direct continuity with this tradition. At the beginning of the Metaphysics, Aristotle offers a concise review of the results reached by his predecessors (Metaph. I 3–7). From this review we learn that all his predecessors were engaged in an investigation that eventuated in knowledge of one or more of the following causes: material, formal, efficient and final cause. However, Aristotle makes it very clear that all his predecessors merely touched upon these causes (Metaph. 988 a 22–23; but see also 985 a 10–14 and 993 a 13–15). That is to say, they did not engage in their causal investigation with a firm grasp of these four causes. They lacked a complete understanding of the range of possible causes and their systematic interrelations. Put differently, and more boldly, their use of causality was not supported by an adequate theory of causality. According to Aristotle, this explains why their investigation, even when it resulted in important insights, was not entirely successful.
This insistence on the doctrine of the four causes as an indispensable tool for a successful investigation of the world around us explains why Aristotle provides his reader with a general account of the four causes. This account is found, in almost the same words, in Physics II 3 and Metaphysics V 2.
In the Posterior Analytics, Aristotle places the following crucial condition on proper knowledge: we think we have knowledge of a thing only when we have grasped its cause (APost. 71 b 9–11. Cf. APost. 94 a 20). That proper knowledge is knowledge of the cause is repeated in the Physics: we think we do not have knowledge of a thing until we have grasped its why, that is to say, its cause (Phys. 194 b 17–20). Since Aristotle obviously conceives of a causal investigation as the search for an answer to the question “why?”, and a why-question is a request for an explanation, it can be useful to think of a cause as a certain type of explanation.
Needless to say, not all why-questions are requests for an explanation that identifies a cause, let alone a cause in the particular sense envisioned by Aristotle. Still, Aristotle is clearly committed to the view that giving the relevant cause (or causes) is necessary and sufficient for offering a scientific explanation. His conception of a cause has both a metaphysical and an epistemological component. Part of the challenge for us is to do justice to both components. Following a recent suggestion, we may say that “causes are not ways in which we explain things, except derivatively, in virtue of the fact that they are ways in which some elements of the natural world explain others” (Stein 2012a: 705).
In Physics II 3 and Metaphysics V 2, Aristotle offers his general account of the four causes. This account is general in the sense that it applies to everything that requires an explanation, including artistic production and human action. Here Aristotle recognizes four kinds of things that can be given in answer to a why-question:
- The material cause: “that out of which”, e.g., the bronze of a statue.
- The formal cause: “the form”, “the account of what-it-is-to-be”, e.g., the shape of a statue.
- The efficient cause: “the primary source of the change or rest”, e.g., the artisan, the art of bronze-casting the statue, the man who gives advice, the father of the child.
- The final cause: “the end, that for the sake of which a thing is done”, e.g., health is the end of walking, losing weight, purging, drugs, and surgical tools.
All the four (kinds of) causes may enter in the explanation of something. Consider the production of an artifact like a bronze statue. The bronze enters in the explanation of the production of the statue as the material cause. Note that the bronze is not only the material out of which the statue is made; it is also the subject of change, that is, the thing that undergoes the change and results in a statue. The bronze is melted and poured in order to acquire a new shape, the shape of the statue. This shape enters in the explanation of the production of the statue as the formal cause. However, an adequate explanation of the production of a statue requires also a reference to the efficient cause or the principle that produces the statue. For Aristotle, this principle is the art of bronze-casting the statue (Phys. 195 a 6–8. Cf. Metaph. 1013 b 6–9).
This result is mildly surprising and requires a few words of elaboration. There is no doubt that the art of bronze-casting resides in an individual artisan who is responsible for the production of the statue. According to Aristotle, however, all the artisan does in the production of the statue is the manifestation of specific knowledge. This knowledge, not the artisan who has mastered it, is the salient explanatory factor that one should pick as the most accurate specification of the efficient cause (Phys. 195 b 21–25). By picking the art, not the artisan, Aristotle is not just trying to provide an explanation of the production of the statue that is not dependent upon the desires, beliefs and intentions of the individual artisan; he is trying to offer an entirely different type of explanation–namely, an explanation that does not make a reference (implicit or explicit) to these desires, beliefs and intentions. More directly, the art of bronze-casting the statue enters in the explanation as the efficient cause because it helps us to understand what it takes to produce the statue; that is to say, what steps are required to produce the statue. But can an explanation of this type be given without a reference to the final outcome of the production, the statue? The answer is emphatically “no”. A model is made for producing the statue. A mold is prepared for producing the statue. The bronze is melted and poured for producing the statue. Both the prior and the subsequent stage are for the sake of a certain end, the production of the statue. Clearly, the statue enters in the explanation of each step of the artistic production as the final cause or that for the sake of which everything in the production process is done.
In thinking about the four causes, we have come to understand that Aristotle offers a teleological explanation of the production of a bronze statue; that is to say, an explanation that makes a reference to the telos or end of the process. Moreover, a teleological explanation of the type sketched above does not crucially depend upon the application of psychological concepts such as desires, beliefs and intentions. This is important because artistic production provides Aristotle with a teleological model for the study of natural processes, whose explanation does not involve beliefs, desires, intentions or anything of this sort. Some have objected that Aristotle explains natural process on the basis of an inappropriately psychological teleological model; that is to say, a teleological model that involves a purposive agent who is somehow sensitive to the end. This objection can be met if the artistic model is understood in non-psychological terms. In other words, Aristotle does not psychologize nature because his study of the natural world is based on a teleological model that is consciously free from psychological factors. (For further information on the role that artistic production plays in developing an explanatory model for the study of nature, see Broadie 1987, pp. 35–50.)
One final clarification is in order. By insisting on the art of bronze-casting as the most accurate efficient cause of the production of the statue, Aristotle does not mean to preclude an appeal to the beliefs and desires of the individual artisan. On the contrary, there are cases where the individual realization of the art obviously enters in the explanation of the bronze statue. For example, one may be interested in a particular bronze statue because that statue is the great achievement of an artisan who has not only mastered the art but has also applied it with a distinctive style. In this case it is perfectly appropriate to make reference to the beliefs and desires of the artisan. Aristotle seems to make room for this case when he says that we should look “for general causes of general things and for particular causes of particular things” (Phys. 195 a 25–26). Note, however, that the idiosyncrasies that may be important in studying a particular bronze statue as the great achievement of an individual artisan may be extraneous to a more central (and more interesting) case. To understand why let us focus on the study of nature. When the student of nature is concerned with the explanation of a natural phenomenon like the formation of sharp teeth in the front and broad molars in the back of the mouth, the student of nature is concerned with what is typical about that phenomenon. In other words, the student of nature is expected to provide an explanation of why certain animals typically have a certain dental arrangement. We shall return to this example in due course. For the time being, it is important to emphasize this important feature of the explanatory project attempted by Aristotle; a feature that we must keep in mind in trying to understand his theory of causality. This theory has in fact been developed primarily (but not exclusively) for the study of nature.
In the Physics, Aristotle builds on his general account of the four causes by developing explanatory principles that are specific to the study of nature. Here Aristotle insists that all four causes are involved in the explanation of natural phenomena, and that the job of “the student of nature is to bring the why-question back to them all in the way appropriate to the science of nature” (Phys. 198 a 21–23). The best way to understand this methodological recommendation is the following: the science of nature is concerned with natural bodies insofar as they are subject to change, and the job of the student of nature is to provide the explanation of their natural change. The factors that are involved in the explanation of natural change turn out to be matter, form, that which produces the change, and the end of this change. Note that Aristotle does not say that all four explanatory factors are involved in the explanation of each and every instance of natural change. Rather, he says that an adequate explanation of natural change may involve a reference to all of them.
Aristotle goes on by adding a specification on his doctrine of the four causes: the form and the end often coincide, and they are formally the same as that which produces the change (Phys. 198 a 23–26). This is one of the several times where Aristotle offers the slogan “it takes a human being to generate a human being” (for example, Phys. 194 b 13; Metaph. 1032 a 25, 1033 b 32, 1049 b 25, 1070 a 8, 1092 a 16). This slogan is designed to point at the fundamental fact that the generation of a human being can be understood only in the light of the end of the process; that is to say, the fully developed human being. The question thus arises as to what it takes for a human being to be fully developed. Aristotle frames his answer in terms of the human form, maintaining that a human form is fully realized at the end of generation. But this does not explain why it takes a human being to generate a human being. Note, however, that a fully developed human being is not only the end of generation; it is also what initiates the entire process. For Aristotle, the ultimate moving principle responsible for the generation of a human being is a fully developed living creature of the same kind; that is, a human being who is formally the same as the end of generation. (A final clarification is in order here: Aristotle is committed to a hylomorphic explanation of animal generation. His considered view is that the father supplies the form whereas the mother provides the matter.)
Thus, the student of nature is often left with three types of causes: the formal/final cause, the efficient cause, and the material cause. However, the view that there are in nature causes besides material and efficient causes was controversial in antiquity. According to Aristotle, most of his predecessors recognized only the material and the efficient cause. This explains why Aristotle cannot be content with saying that formal and final causes often coincide, but he also has to defend his thesis against an opponent who denies that final causality is a genuine mode of causality.
Physics II 8 contains Aristotle’s most general defense of final causality. Here Aristotle establishes that explaining nature requires final causality by discussing a difficulty that may be advanced by an opponent who denies that there are final causes in nature. Aristotle shows that an opponent who claims that material and efficient causes alone suffice to explain natural change fails to account for their characteristic regularity. Before considering how the defense is attempted, however, it is important to clarify that this defense does not perform the function of a proof. By showing that an approach to the study of nature that ignores final causality cannot account for a crucial aspect of nature, Aristotle does not thereby prove that there are final causes in nature. Strictly speaking, the only way to prove that nature exhibits final causality is to establish it on independent grounds. But this is not what Aristotle does in Physics II 8. Final causality is here introduced as the best explanation for an aspect of nature which otherwise would remain unexplained.
The difficulty that Aristotle discusses is introduced by considering the way in which rain works. It rains because of material processes which can be specified as follows: when the warm air that has been drawn up is cooled off and becomes water, then this water comes down as rain (Phys. 198 b 19–21). It may happen that the corn in the field is nourished or the harvest is spoiled as a result of the rain, but it does not rain for the sake of any good or bad result. The good or bad result is just a coincidence (Phys. 198 b 21–23). So, why cannot all natural change work in the same way? For example, why cannot it be merely a coincidence that the front teeth grow sharp and suitable for tearing the food and the molars grow broad and useful for grinding the food (Phys. 198 b 23–27)? When the teeth grow in just this way, then the animal survives. When they do not, then the animal dies. More directly, and more explicitly, the way the teeth grow is not for the sake of the animal, and its survival or its death is just a coincidence (Phys. 198 b 29–32).
Aristotle’s reply is that the opponent is expected to explain why the teeth regularly grow in the way they do: sharp teeth in the front and broad molars in the back of the mouth. Moreover, since this dental arrangement is suitable for biting and chewing the food that the animal takes in, the opponent is expected to explain the regular connection between the needs of the animal and the formation of its teeth. Either there is a real causal connection between the formation of the teeth and the needs of the animal, or there is no real causal connection and it just so happens that the way the teeth grow is good for the animal. In this second case it is just a coincidence that the teeth grow in a way that it is good for the animal. But this does not explain the regularity of the connection. Where there is regularity there is also a call for an explanation, and coincidence is no explanation at all. In other words, to say that the teeth grow as they do by material necessity and this is good for the animal by coincidence is to leave unexplained the regular connection between the growth of the teeth and the needs of the animal. Aristotle offers final causality as his explanation for this regular connection: the teeth grow in the way they do for biting and chewing food and this is good for the animal. (See Code 1997: 127–134.)
One thing to be appreciated about Aristotle’s reply is that the final cause enters in the explanation of the formation of the parts of an organism like an animal as something that is good either for the existence or the flourishing of the animal. In the first case, something is good for the animal because the animal cannot survive without it; in the second case, something is good for the animal because the animal is better off with it. This helps us to understand why in introducing the concept of end (telos) that is relevant to the study of natural processes Aristotle insists on its goodness: “not everything that is last claims to be an end (telos), but only that which is best” (Phys. 194 a 32–33).
Once his defense of the use of final causes is firmly in place, Aristotle can make a step further by focusing on the role that matter plays in his explanatory project. Let us return to the example chosen by Aristotle, the regular growth of sharp teeth in the front and broad molars in the back of the mouth. What explanatory role is left for the material processes involved in the natural process? Aristotle does not seem to be able to specify what material processes are involved in the growth of the teeth, but he is willing to recognize that certain material processes have to take place for the teeth to grow in the particular way they do. In other words, there is more to the formation of the teeth than these material processes, but this formation does not occur unless the relevant material processes take place. For Aristotle, these material processes are that which is necessary to the realization of a specific goal; that which is necessary on the hypothesis that the end is to be obtained.
Hypothetical necessity is often equated to conditional necessity. But this equation can be a first approximation at best. Stating the conditions under which something is the case is not yet giving a successful explanation. In other words, conditional necessity is a wider, and indeed weaker, notion than hypothetical necessity (see Stein 2016: 353–382, for a lucid reflection on this point).
Physics II 9 is entirely devoted to the introduction of the concept of hypothetical necessity and its relevance for the explanatory ambition of Aristotle’s science of nature. In this chapter, matter is reconfigured as hypothetical necessity. By so doing Aristotle acknowledges the explanatory relevance of the material processes, while at the same time he emphasizes their dependency upon a specific end.
In the Physics, Aristotle builds on his general account of the four causes in order to provide the student of nature with the explanatory resources indispensable for a successful investigation of the natural world. However, the Physics does not provide all the explanatory resources for all natural investigations. Aristotle returns to the topic of causality in the first book of the Parts of Animals. This is a relatively independent and self-contained treatise entirely devoted to developing the explanatory resources required for a successful study of animals and animal life. Here Aristotle completes his theory of causality by arguing for the explanatory priority of the final cause over the efficient cause.
Significantly enough, there is no attempt to argue for the existence of four fundamental modes of causality in the first book of the Parts of Animals. Evidently, Aristotle expects his reader to be already familiar with his general account of the four causes as well as his defense of final causality. The problem that here concerns Aristotle is presented in the following way: since both the final and the efficient cause are involved in the explanation of natural generation, we have to establish what is first and what is second (PA 639 b 12–13). Aristotle argues that there is no other way to explain natural generation than by reference to what lies at the end of the process. This has explanatory priority over the principle that is responsible for initiating the process of generation. Aristotle relies on the analogy between artistic production and natural generation, and the teleological model that he has developed for the explanation of artistic production. Consider, for example, house-building. There is no other way to explain how a house is built, or is being built, than by reference to the final result of the process, the house. More directly, the bricks and the beams are put together in the particular way they are for the sake of achieving a certain end: the production of the house. This is true also in the case of natural generation. In this context Aristotle’ slogan is “generation is for the sake of substance, not substance for the sake of generation” (PA 640 a 18–19). This means that the proper way to explain the generation of an organism like an animal, or the formation of its parts, is by reference to the product that lies at the end of the process; that is to say, a substance of a certain type.
From Aristotle we learn that Empedocles explained the articulation of the human spine into vertebrae as the result of the twisting and turning that takes place when the fetus is in the womb of the mother. Aristotle finds this explanation unacceptable (PA 640 a 19–26). To begin with, the fetus must have the power to twist and turn in the way it does, and Empedocles does not have an explanation for this fact. Secondly, and more importantly, Empedocles overlooks the fact that it takes a human being to generate a human being. That is to say, the originating principle of the generation is a fully developed human being which is formally the same as the final outcome of the process of generation. It is only by looking at the fully developed human being that we can understand why our spine is articulated into vertebrae and why the vertebrae are arranged in the particular way they are. This amounts to finding the role that the spine has in the life of a fully developed human being. Moreover, it is only by looking at the fully developed human being that we can explain why the formation of the vertebrae takes place in the particular way it does. (For further information about the explanatory priority of the final over the efficient cause, see Code 1997: 127–143.)
Perhaps we are now in the position to understand how Aristotle argues that there are four kinds of causes and at the same time says that proper knowledge is knowledge of the cause or knowledge of the why (APost. 71 b 10–12, 94 a 20; Phys. 194 b 17–20; Metaph. 981 a 28–30). Admittedly, at least at first sight, this is a bit confusing. Confusion dissolves when we realize that Aristotle recognizes the explanatory primacy of the final/formal cause over the efficient and material cause. Of course this does not mean that the other causes can be eliminated. Quite the contrary: Aristotle is adamant that, for a full range of cases, all four causes must be given in order to give an explanation. More explicitly, for a full range of cases, an explanation which fails to invoke all four causes is no explanation at all. At the same time, however, the final/formal cause is the primary cause and knowledge of this cause amounts to knowledge of the why.
We have already seen that Aristotle is not committed to the view that everything has all four kinds of causes, Rather, his view is that a scientific explanation requires up to four kinds of causes. We may illustrate this point with the help of an example. Consider, in particular, the case of a lunar eclipse. In the Metaphysics, Aristotle says that an eclipse of the moon does not have a final cause (Metaph. 1044 b 12). He also says that, strictly speaking, a lunar eclipse does not have matter. Rather, it has a cause that plays a role analogous to matter. This second claim can be inferred from what Aristotle says about the things that exist by nature but are not substances. With respect to these things, Aristotle says that they do not have matter but rather something that underlies (Metaph. 1044 b 8–9). In the case of a lunar eclipse, that which underlies is the subject affected by the eclipse, that is, the moon. The moon is not strictly speaking the matter of the eclipse but rather the subject that undergoes an eclipse when the earth comes in the middle between the moon and the sun. Should we give the earth as the efficient cause of a lunar eclipse? We have to be careful here. By saying that the moon is a deprivation of light caused by the earth, we distinguish this particular deprivation of light from other kinds of deprivation of light. Still, by citing the earth as the efficient cause of a lunar eclipse, we are not yet giving the most precise description of the efficient cause. More directly, we are not yet saying what the earth is doing to cause a lunar eclipse. A lunar eclipse is a deprivation of light caused by the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon. By coming in the middle of the moon and the sun the earth blocks the light and causes the moon to suffer an eclipse. Hence, it is the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon is the proximate efficient cause of a lunar eclipse. Citing the proximate efficient cause is also giving the most accurate description, and indeed the full explanation, of a lunar eclipse. (An insightful discussion of how Aristotle explains natural phenomena such as a lunar eclipse and sleep can be found in Code 2015: 11–45).
This brief discussion of the explanation of eclipse of the moon brings us back to a point that was already made in connection with Aristotle’s explanation of the production of an artifact such as a bronze statue. There too we are required to look for the most accurate description of the efficient cause, which is to be identified with the art of bronze-casting a statue rather than the artisan. It is possible to build on both examples to conclude that Aristotle is concerned not only with finding the relevant kinds of causes but also with giving the most accurate description of those causes. By his lights, it is only the most accurate description of all the relevant causes that gives us the full explanation, and thereby scientific knowledge, of something.
The study of nature was a search for answers to the question “why?” before and independently of Aristotle. A critical examination of the use of the language of causality by his predecessors, together with a careful study of natural phenomena, led Aristotle to elaborate a theory of causality. This theory is presented in its most general form in Physics II 3 and in Metaphysics V 2. In both texts, Aristotle argues that a final, formal, efficient or material cause can be given in answer to a why-question.
Aristotle further elaborates on causality in the rest of Physics II and in Parts of Animals I. Aristotle explores the systematic interrelations among the four modes of causality and argues for the explanatory priority of the final cause. In so doing Aristotle not only expands on his theory of causality; he also builds explanatory principles that are specific to the study of nature. Aristotle considers these principles an indispensable theoretical framework for a successful investigation of the natural world. Both Physics II and Parts of Animals have a foundational character. More directly, Aristotle expects the student of nature to have mastered these principles before engaging in the investigation of any aspect of the natural world.
Although Aristotle’s theory of causality is developed in the context of his science of nature, its application goes well beyond the boundaries of natural science. This is already clear from the most general presentation of the theory in Physics II 3 and in Metaphysics V 2. Here the four causes are used to explain human action as well as artistic production. In addition, any theoretical investigation that there might be besides natural science will employ the doctrine of the four causes.
Consider, briefly, the case of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. Here Aristotle is seeking wisdom. Part of the argument of the Metaphysics is in an attempt to clarify what sort of wisdom Aristotle is seeking. Suffice it to say that Aristotle conceives of this wisdom as a science of substance that is, or is a part of, a science of being qua being (for further information about this argument, see the entry Aristotle’s Metaphysics, especially Sections 1 and 3.) What is important is that this science consists in a causal investigation, that is, a search for the relevant causes. This helps us to understand why the most general presentation of Aristotle’s theory of causality is repeated, in almost the same words, in Physics II 3 and in Metaphysics V 2. Although the Physics and the Metaphysics belong to two different theoretical enterprises, in both cases we are expected to embark on an investigation that will eventuate in causal knowledge, and this is not possible without a firm grasp of the interrelations between the four (types of) causes.
- account: logos
- art: technê
- artisan: technitês
- cause: aitia, aition
- difficulty: aporia
- end: telos
- essence: to ti ên einai
- form: eidos
- generation: genesis
- goal: telos
- knowledge: epistêmê
- hypothesis: hypothesis
- necessity: anankê
- principle: archê
- why: dia ti, dioti
- wisdom: sophia
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The Four Causes
- Annas, J., 1982, “Inefficient Causes,” Philosophical Quarterly, 32: 311–322; reprinted in T. Irwin (ed.), Classical Philosophy. Collected Papers, New York/London: Routledge, 1995, 11–27.
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Art and Nature
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Teleology and Necessity
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- –––, 1984, “The Place of Nature in Aristotle’s Teleology,” Apeiron, 18: 126–140.
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Thanks to Christopher Shields, Greg Salmieri, István Bodnár, and Mark Goodwin for commenting on drafts of this entry.