Supplement to Aristotle’s Political Theory

Presuppositions of Aristotle’s Politics

Aristotle’s political philosophy is distinguished by its underlying philosophical doctrines. Of these the following five principles are especially noteworthy:

(1) Principle of teleology Aristotle begins the Politics by invoking the concept of nature (see Political Naturalism). In the Physics Aristotle identifies the nature of a thing above all with its end or final cause (Physiscs II.2.194a28–9, 8.199b15–18). The end of a thing is also its function (Eudemian Ethics II.1.1219a8), which is its defining principle (Meteorology IV.12.390a10–11). On Aristotle’s view plants and animals are paradigm cases of natural existents, because they have a nature in the sense of an internal causal principle which explains how it comes into being and behaves (Phys. II.1.192b32–3). For example, an acorn has an inherent tendency to grow into an oak tree, so that the tree exists by nature rather than by craft or by chance. The thesis that human beings have a natural function has a fundamental place in the Eudemian Ethics II.1, Nicomachean Ethics I.7, and Politics I.2. The Politics further argues that it is part of the nature of human beings that they are political or adapted for life in the city-state. Thus teleology is crucial for the political naturalism which is at the foundation of Aristotle’s political philosophy. (For discussion of teleology see the entry on Aristotle’s biology.)

(2) Principle of perfection Aristotle understands good and evil in terms of his teleology. The natural end of the organism (and the means to this end) is good for it, and what defeats or impedes this end is bad. For example, he argues that animals sleep in order to preserve themselves, because “nature operates for the sake of an end, and this is a good,” and sleeping is necessary and beneficial for entities which cannot move continuously (De Somno 2.455b17–22). For human beings the ultimate good or happiness (eudaimonia) consists in perfection, the full attainment of their natural function, which Aristotle analyzes as the activity of the soul according to reason (or not without reason), i.e., activity in accordance with the most perfect virtue or excellence (EN I.7.1098a7–17). This also provides a norm for the politician: “What is most choiceworthy for each individual is always the highest it is possible for him to attain” (Pol. VII.14.1333a29–30; cf. EN X.7.1177b33–4). This ideal is to be realized in both the individual and the city-state: “that way of life is best, both separately for each individual and in common for city-states, which is equipped with virtue” (Pol. VII.1.1323b40–1324a1). However, Aristotle recognizes that it is generally impossible to fully realize this ideal, in which case he invokes a second-best principle of approximism: it is best to attain perfection, but, failing that, a thing is better in proportion as it is nearer to the end (see De Caelo II.12.292b17–19).

Aristotle’s perfectionism was opposed to the subjective relativism of Protagoras, according to which good and evil is defined by whatever human beings happened to desire. Like Plato, Aristotle maintained that the good was objective and independent of human wishes. However, he rejected Plato’s theory that the good was defined in terms of a transcendent form of the good, holding instead that good and evil are in a way relative to the organism, that is, to its natural end.

(3) Principle of community Aristotle maintains that the city-state is the most complete community, because it attains the limit of self-sufficiency, so that it can exist for the sake of the good life (Pol. I.2.1252b27–30). Individuals outside of the city-state are not self-sufficient, because they depend on the community not only for material necessities but also for education and moral habituation. “Just as, when perfected, a human is the best of animals, so also when separated from law and justice, he is the worst of all” (1253a31–3). On Aristotle’s view, then, human beings must be subject to the authority of the city-state in order to attain the good life. The following principle concerns how authority should be exercised within a community.

(4) Principle of rulership Aristotle believes that the existence and well-being of any system requires the presence of a ruling element: “Whenever a thing is established out of a number of things and becomes a single common thing, there always appears in it a ruler and ruled …. This [relation] is present in living things, but it derives from all of nature” (1254a28–32). Just as an animal or plant can survive and flourish only if its soul rules over its body (Pol. I.5.1254a34–6, De Anima I.5.410b10–15; compare Plato Phaedo 79e-80a), a human community can possess the necessary order only if it has a ruling element which is in a position of authority, just as an army can possess order only if it has a commander in control. Although Aristotle follows Plato in accepting this principle, he rejects Plato’s further claim that a single science of ruling is appropriate for all (see Plato Statesman 258e–259c). For Aristotle different forms of rule are required for different systems: e.g., political rule for citizens and despotic rule for slaves. The imposition of an inappropriate form of rule results in disorder and injustice. This point becomes clearer in the light of the following corollary of the principle of rulership.

(5) Principle of the rule of reason Aristotle agrees with Plato’s dictum that, whenever a system contains a rational element, it is appropriate for it to rule over the nonrational part, because the rational element alone knows what is best for the whole (see Plato Republic IV.441e). Aristotle elaborates on this principle: observing that different individuals can exemplify rationality in different ways and to different degrees, he maintains that different modes of rule are appropriate for different sorts of ruler and subject. For example, a child has a deliberative capacity, but it is undeveloped and incomplete in comparison with an adult’s, so that a child is a fit subject for paternal rule by its father; but paternal rule would be inappropriate between two adults who both have mature rational capacities (see Politics I.13 and III.6). In a political context the principle of the rule of reason also implies that different constitutions are appropriate for different city-states depending on the rational capacities of their citizens. This is an important consideration, for example, in Aristotle’s discussions of democracy and the rule of law (see Politics III.11 and 15–16).

The aforementioned principles account for much of the distinctive flavor of Aristotle’s political philosophy, and they also indicate where many modern theorists have turned away from him. Modern philosophers such as Thomas Hobbes have challenged the principles of teleology and perfectionism, arguing against the former that human beings are mechanistic rather than teleological systems, and against the latter that good and bad depend upon subjective preferences of valuing agents rather than on objective states of affairs. Liberal theorists have criticized the principle of community on the grounds that it cedes too much authority to the state. Even the principles of rulership and of the rule of reason — which Aristotle, Plato, and many other theorists regarded as self-evident — have come under fire by modern theorists like Adam Smith and F. A. Hayek who argued that social and economic order may arise spontaneously as if by an “invisible hand.” Modern neo-Aristotelian political theorists are committed to defending one or more of these doctrines (or a modified version of them) against such criticisms.

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