Arrow's Theorem

First published Mon Oct 13, 2014

Kenneth Arrow's “impossibility” theorem—or “general possibility” theorem, as he called it—answers a very basic question in the theory of collective decision-making. Say there are some alternatives to choose among. They could be policies, public projects, candidates in an election, distributions of income and labour requirements among the members of a society, or just about anything else. There are some people whose preferences will inform this choice, and the question is: which procedures are there for deriving, from what is known or can be found out about their preferences, a collective or “social” ordering of the alternatives from better to worse? The answer is startling. Arrow's theorem says there are no such procedures whatsoever—none, anyway, that satisfy certain apparently quite reasonable assumptions concerning the autonomy of the people and the rationality of their preferences. The technical framework in which Arrow gave the question of social orderings a precise sense and its rigorous answer is now widely used for studying problems in welfare economics. The impossibility theorem itself set much of the agenda for contemporary social choice theory. Arrow accomplished this while still a graduate student. In 1972, he received the Nobel Prize in economics for his contributions.

1. The Will of the People?

Some of the trouble with social orderings is visible in a simple but important example. Say there are three alternatives \(A\), \(B\) and \(C\) to choose among. There is a group of three people 1, 2 and 3 whose preferences are to inform this choice, and they are asked to rank the alternatives by their own lights from better to worse. Their individual preference orderings turn out to be:

  1. ABC
  2. BCA
  3. CAB

That is, person 1 prefers \(A\) to \(B\), prefers \(B\) to \(C\), and prefers \(A\) to \(C\); person 2 prefers \(B\) to \(C\), and so on. Now, we might hope somehow to arrive at a single “social” ordering of the alternatives that reflects the preferences of all three. Then we could choose whichever alternative is, socially, best—or, if there is a tie for first place, we could choose some alternative that is as good as any other. Suppose, taking the alternatives pair by pair, we put the matter to a vote: we count one alternative as socially preferred to another if there are more voters who prefer it than there are who prefer the other one. We determine in this way that \(A\) is socially preferred to \(B\), since two voters (1 and 3) prefer \(A\) to \(B\), but only one (voter 2) prefers \(B\) to \(A\). Similarly, there is a social preference for \(B\) to \(C\). We might therefore expect to find that \(A\) is socially preferred to \(C\). By this reckoning, though, it is just the other way around, since there are two voters who prefer \(C\) to \(A\). We do not have a social ordering of the alternatives at all. We have a cycle. Starting from any alternative, moving to a socially preferred one, and from there to the next, you soon find yourself back where you started.[1]

This is the “paradox of voting”. Discovered by the Marquis de Condorcet (1785), it shows that possibilities for choosing rationally can be lost when individual preferences are aggregated into social preferences. Voter 1 has \(A\) at the top of his individual ordering. This voter's preferences can be maximized, by choosing \(A\). The preferences of 2 or 3 can also be maximized, by choosing instead their maxima, \(B\) or \(C\). Pairwise majority decision doesn't result in a social maximum, though. \(A\) isn't one because a majority prefers something else, \(C\). Likewise, \(B\) and \(C\) are not social maxima. The individual preferences lend themselves to maximization; but, because they cycle, the social preferences do not.

Are there other aggregation procedures that are better than pairwise majority decision, or do the different ones have shortcomings of their own? Condorcet, his contemporary Jean Charles de Borda (1781), and later Charles Dodgson (1844) and Duncan Black (1948), among others, all addressed this question by studying various procedures and comparing their properties. Arrow broke new ground by coming at it from the opposite direction. Starting with various requirements that aggregation procedures might be expected to meet, he asked which procedures fill the bill. Among his requirements is Social Ordering, which insists that the result of aggregation is always an ordering of the alternatives, never a cycle. After the introduction in Section 2 of the technical framework that Arrow set up in order to study social choice, Section 3.1 sets out further conditions that he imposed. Briefly, these are: Unrestricted Domain which says that aggregation procedures must be able to handle any individual preferences at all; Weak Pareto, which requires them to respect unanimous individual preferences; Non-Dictatorship, which rules out procedures by which social preferences always agree with the strict preferences of some one individual; and finally Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives, which says that the social comparison among any two given alternatives is to depend on individual preferences among only that pair. Arrow's theorem, stated in Section 3.2, tells us that, except in the very simplest of cases, no aggregation procedure whatsoever meets all the requirements.

The tenor of Arrow's theorem is deeply antithetical to the political ideals of the Enlightenment. It turns out that Condorcet's paradox is indeed not an isolated anomaly, the failure of one specific voting method. Rather, it manifests a much wider problem with the very idea of collecting many individual preferences into one. On the face of it, anyway, there simply cannot be a common will of all the people concerning collective decisions, that assimilates the tastes and values of all the individual men and women who make up a society.

There are some who, following Riker (1982), take Arrow's theorem to show that democracy, conceived as government by the will of the people, is an incoherent illusion. Others argue that some conditions of the theorem are unreasonable, and from their point of view the prospects for collective choice look much brighter. After presenting the theorem itself, this entry will take up some main points of critical discussion. Section 4 considers the meaning and scope of Arrow's conditions, and Section 5 discusses aggregation procedures that are available when not all of them need be satisfied. Section 6 concludes with an overview of proposals to study within Arrow's technical framework certain aggregation problems other than the one that concerned him.

Amartya Sen once expressed regret that the theory of social choice does not share with poetry the amiable characteristic of communicating before it is understood (Sen 1986). Arrow's theorem is not especially difficult to understand and much about it is readily communicated, if not in poetry, then at least in plain English. Informal presentations go only so far, though, and where they stop sometimes misunderstandings start. This exposition uses a minimum of technical language for the sake of clarity.

2. Arrow's Framework

The problem of finding an aggregation procedure arises, as Arrow framed it, in connection with some given alternatives between which there is a choice is to be made. The nature of these alternatives depends on the kind of choice problem that is being studied. In the theory of elections, the alternatives are people who might stand as candidates in an election. In welfare economics they are different states of a society, such as distributions of income and labour requirements. The alternatives conventionally are referred to using lower case letters from the end of the alphabet as \(x, y, z, \ldots\); the set of all these alternatives is \(X\). The people whose tastes and values will inform the choice are assumed to be finite in number, and they are enumerated \(1, \ldots, n\).

Arrow's problem arises, then, only after some alternatives and people have been fixed. It is for them that an aggregation procedure is sought. Crucially, though, this problem arises before relevant information about the people's preferences among the alternatives has been gathered, whether that is by polling or some other method for eliciting or determining preferences. The question that Arrow's theorem answers is, more precisely, this: Which procedures are there for arriving at a social ordering of some given alternatives, on the basis of some given people's preferences among them, no matter what these preferences turn out to be?

In practice, meanwhile, we sometimes must select a procedure for making social decisions without knowing for which alternatives and people it will be used. In recurring elections for some public office, for instance, there is a different slate of candidates each time, and a different population of voters, and we must use the same voting method to determine the winner, no matter who the candidates and voters are and no matter how many of them there happen to be. Such procedures are not directly available for study within Arrow's framework, with its fixed set \(X\) of alternatives and people \(1, \ldots, n\). Arrow's theorem is still relevant to them, though. It tells us that even when the alternatives and people are held fixed, then still there is no “good” method for deriving social orderings. Now, if there is no good method for voting even once, with the particular candidates and voters who are involved on that occasion, then nor, presumably, is there a good method that can be used repeatedly, with different candidates and voters each time.

2.1 Individual Preferences

Arrow assumed that social orderings will be derived, if at all, from information about people's preferences. This information is, in his framework, merely ordinal. It is the kind of information that is implicated in Condorcet's paradox of voting, in Section 1, where each person ranks the alternatives from better to worse but there is nothing beyond this about how strong anybody's preferences are, or about how the preferences of one person compare in strength to those of another. In confining aggregation procedures to ordinal information, Arrow argued that:

[I]t seems to make no sense to add the utility of one individual, a psychic magnitude in his mind, with the utility of another individual. (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 11)

His point was that even if people do have stronger and weaker preferences, and even if the strengths of their preferences can somehow be measured and made available as a basis for social decisions, nevertheless ordinal information is all that matters because preferences are “interpersonally incomparable”. Intuitively, what this means is that there is no saying how much more strongly someone must prefer one thing to another in order to make up for the fact that someone else's preference is just the other way around. Arrow saw no reason to provide aggregation procedures with information about the strength of preferences because he thought that they cannot put such information to meaningful use.

Accordingly, the preferences of individual people are represented in Arrow's framework by binary relations \(R_{i}\) among the alternatives: \(xR_{i}y\) means that individual \(i\) weakly prefers alternative \(x\) to alternative \(y\). That is, either \(i\) strictly prefers \(x\) to \(y\), or else \(i\) is indifferent between them, finding them equally good. Each individual preference relation \(R_{i}\) is assumed to be connected (for all alternatives \(x\) and \(y\), either \(xR_{i}y\), or \(yR_{i}x\), or both) and transitive (for all \(x\), \(y\) and \(z\), if \(xR_{i}y\) and \(yR_{i}z\), then \(xR_{i}z\)). That these relations have these structural properties was, for Arrow, a matter of the “rationality” of the preferences they represent; for further discussion, see the entries on Preferences and Philosophy of Economics. Connected, transitive relations are called weak orderings. They are “weak” in that they allow ties—in this connection, indifference.

A preference profile is a list \(\langle R_{1}, \ldots, R_{n}\rangle\) of weak orderings of the set \(X\) of alternatives, one for each of the people \(1, \ldots, n\). The list of three individual orderings in the paradox of voting is an example of a preference profile for the alternatives \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\) and people 1, 2, and 3. A profile is a representation of the individual preferences of everybody who will be consulted in the choice among the alternatives. It is in the form of profiles that Arrow's aggregation procedures receive information about individual preferences. Often it is convenient to write \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) instead of \(\langle R_{1}, \ldots, R_{n}\rangle\). Other profiles are written \(\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\), and so on.

Amartya Sen extended Arrow's framework to take into account not only ordinal information about people's preferences among pairs of alternatives, but also cardinal information about the utility they derive from each one. In this way he was able to investigate the consequences of other assumptions than Arrow's about the measurability and interpersonal comparability of individual preferences. See Section 5.3 and the entry social choice theory for details and references.

2.2 Multiple Profiles

Arrow required aggregation procedures to derive social orderings from more than just a single profile, representing everyone's actual preferences. In his framework they must reckon with many profiles, representing preferences that the people could have.

Variety among preferences is the result, in Arrow's account, of the different standards by which we assess our options. Our preferences depend on our “tastes” in personal consumption but importantly, for social choice, they also depend on our socially directed “values”. Now, we are to some extent free to have various tastes, values, and preferences; and we are free, also, to have these independently of one another. Any individual can have a range of preferences, then, and for any given sets of people and alternatives there are many possible preference profiles. One profile \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) represents the preferences of these people among their alternatives in, if you will, one possible world. Another profile \(\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\) represents preferences of the same people, and among the same alternatives, but in another possible world where their tastes and values are different.

Arrow's rationale for requiring aggregation procedures to handle many profiles was epistemic. As he framed the question of collective choice, a procedure is sought for deriving a social ordering of some given alternatives on the basis of some given people's tastes and values. It is sought, though, before it is known just what these tastes and values happen to be. The variety among profiles to be reckoned with is a measure, in Arrow's account of the matter, of how much is known or assumed about everybody's preferences a priori, which is to say before these have been elicited. When less is known, there are more profiles from which a social ordering might have to be derived. When more is known, there are fewer of them.

There are other reasons for working with many profiles, even when people's actual preferences are known fully in advance. Serge Kolm (1996) suggested that counterfactual preferences are relevant when we come to justify the use of some given procedure. Sensitivity analysis, used to manage uncertainty about errors in the input, and to determine which information is critical in the sense that the output turns on it, also requires that procedures handle a range of inputs.

With many profiles in play there can be “interprofile” conditions on aggregation procedures. These coordinate the results of aggregation at several profiles at once. One such condition that plays a crucial role in Arrow's theorem is Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives. It requires that whenever everybody's preferences among two alternatives are in one profile the same as in another, the collective ordering must also be the same at the two profiles, as far as these alternatives are concerned. There is to be this much similarity among social orderings even as people's tastes and values change. Sections 3.1 and 4.5 discuss in more detail the meaning of this controversial requirement, and the extent to which it is reasonable to impose it on aggregation procedures.

Ian Little raised the following objection in an early discussion of (Arrow 1951):

If tastes change, we may expect a new ordering of all the conceivable states; but we do not require that the difference between the new and the old ordering should bear any particular relation to the changes of taste which have occurred. We have, so to speak, a new world and a new order; and we do not demand correspondence between the change in the world and the change in the order (Little 1952: 423–424).

Little apparently agreed with Arrow that there might be a different social ordering were people's tastes different, but unlike Arrow he thought that it wouldn't have to be similar to the actual or current ordering in any special way. Little's objection was taken to support the “single profile” approach to social welfare judgments of Abram Bergson (1938) and Paul Samuelson (1947), and there was a debate about which approach was best, theirs or Arrow's. Arguably, what was at issue in this debate was not—or should not have been—whether aggregation procedures must handle more than a single preference profile, but instead whether there should be any coordination of the output at different profiles. Among others Sen (1977) and Fleurbaey and Mongin (2005) have made this point. If they are right then the substance of Little's objection can be accommodated within Arrow's multi-profile framework simply by not imposing any interprofile constraints. Be this as it may, Arrow's framework is nowadays the dominant one.

2.3 Social Welfare Functions

Sometimes a certain amount is known about everybody's preferences before these have been elicited. Profiles that are compatible with what is known represent preferences that the people could have, and might turn out actually to have, and it is from these “admissible” profiles that we may hope to derive social orderings. Technically, a domain, in Arrow's framework, is a set of admissible profiles, each concerning the same alternatives \(X\) and people \(1, \ldots, n\). A social welfare function \(f\) assigns to each profile \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) in some domain a binary relation \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\) on \(X\). Intuitively, \(f\) is an aggregation procedure and \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\) represents the social preferences that it derives from \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\). Arrow's social welfare functions are sometimes called “constitutions”.

Arrow incorporated into the notion of a social welfare function the further requirement that \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\) is always a weak ordering of the set \(X\) of alternatives. Informally speaking, this means that the output of the social welfare function must always be a ranking of the alternatives from better to worse, perhaps with ties. It may never be a cycle. This requirement will appear here, as it does in other contemporary presentations of Arrow's theorem, as a separate condition of Social Ordering that social welfare functions might be required to meet. See Section 3.1. This way, we can consider the consequences of dropping this condition without changing any basic parts of the framework. See Section 4.2.

Arrow established a convention that is still widely observed of using ‘\(R\)’ to denote the social preference derived from “\(\langle R_{i}\rangle\)”. The social welfare function used to derive it is, in his notation, left implicit. One advantage of writing ‘\(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\)’ instead of ‘\(R\)’ is that when we state the conditions of the impossibility theorem, in the next section, the social welfare function will figure explicitly in them. This makes it quite clear that what these conditions constrain is the functional relationship between individual and social preferences. Focusing attention on this was an important innovation of Arrow's approach.

3. Impossibility

With the conceptual framework now in place, Section 3.1 sets out the “conditions” or constraints that Arrow imposed on social welfare functions, and Section 3.2 states the theorem itself. Section 4 explains the conditions more fully, discusses reasons that Arrow gave for imposing them, and considers whether it is proper to do so.

Arrow's conditions often are called axioms, and his approach is said to be axiomatic. This might be found misleading. Unlike axioms of logic or geometry, Arrow's conditions are not supposed to express more or less indubitable truths, or to constitute an implicit definition of the object of study. Arrow himself took them to be questionable “value judgments” that “express the doctrines of citizens' sovereignty and rationality in a very general form” (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 31). Indeed, as we will see in Section 4, and as Arrow himself recognized, sometimes it is not even desirable that social welfare functions should satisfy all conditions of the impossibility theorem.

Arrow restated the conditions in the second edition of Social Choice and Individual Values (Arrow 1963). They appear here in the canonical form into which they have settled since then.

3.1 These Conditions…

A first requirement is that the social welfare function \(f\) can handle any combination of any individual preferences at all:

Unrestricted Domain (U): The domain of \(f\) includes every list \(\langle R_{1}, \ldots, R_{n}\rangle\) of \(n\) weak orderings of \(X\).

Condition U requires that \(f\) is defined for each “logically possible” profile of individual preferences. A second requirement is that, in each case, \(f\) produces an ordering of the alternatives, perhaps with ties:

Social Ordering (SO): For any profile \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) in the domain, \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\) is a weak ordering of \(X\).

Notice that, as the paradox of voting in Section 1 shows, these two conditions U and SO by themselves already rule out aggregating preferences by pairwise majority decision, if there are at least three alternatives to choose between, and three people whose preferences are to be taken into account.

To state the next requirements it is convenient to use some shorthand. For any given individual ordering \(R_{i}\), let \(P_{i}\) be the strict or asymmetrical part of \(R_{i}: xP_{i}y\) if \(xR_{i}y\) but not \(yR_{i}x\). Intuitively, \(xP_{i}y\) means that \(i\) really does prefer \(x\) to \(y\), in that \(i\) is not indifferent between them. Similarly, let \(P\) be the strict part of \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\). The next condition of Arrow's theorem is:

Weak Pareto (WP): For any profile \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\), and any alternatives \(x\) and \(y\), if for all \(i\), \(xP_{i}y\), then \(xPy\).

WP requires \(f\) to respect unanimous strict preferences. That is, whenever everyone strictly prefers one alternative to another, the social ordering that \(f\) derives must agree. Pairwise majority decision satisfies WP.[2] Many other well-known voting methods such as Borda counting satisfy it as well (see Section 5.2). So WP requires that \(f\) is to this extent like them.

The next condition ensures that social preferences are not based entirely on the preferences of any one person. Person \(d\) is a dictator of \(f\) if for any alternatives \(x\) and \(y\), and for any profile \(\langle\ldots, R_{d},\ldots\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\): if \(xP_{d}y\), then \(xPy\). When a dictator strictly prefers one thing to another, the society always does as well. Other people's preferences can still influence social preferences. So can “non-welfare” features of the alternatives such as, in the case of social states, the extent to which people are equal, their rights are respected, and so on. But all these can make a difference only when the dictator is indifferent between two alternatives, having no strict preference one way or the other. The condition is now simply:

Nondictatorship (D): \(f\) has no dictator.

To illustrate, pick some person \(d\), any one at all, and from each profile \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) in the domain take the ordering \(R_{d}\) representing the preferences of \(d\). Now, in each case, let the social preference be that. In other words, for each profile \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\), let \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\) be \(R_{d}\). This social welfare function \(f\) bases the social ordering entirely on the preferences of \(d\), its dictator. It is intuitively undemocratic and D rules it out.

To state the last condition of Arrow's theorem, another piece of shorthand is handy. For any given relation \(R\), and any set \(S\), let \(R|S\) be the restriction of \(R\) to \(S\). It is that part of \(R\) concerning just the members of \(S\).[3] The restriction of \(\langle R_{1}, \ldots, R_{n}\rangle\) to \(S\), written \(\langle R_{1}, \ldots, R_{n}\rangle|S\), is just \(\langle R_{1}|S, \ldots, R_{n}|S\rangle\). Take for instance the profile from the paradox of voting in Section 1:

  1. ABC
  2. BCA
  3. CAB

Its restriction to the set \(\{A,C\}\) of alternatives is:

  1. AC
  2. CA
  3. CA

Now the remaining condition can be stated:

Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives (I): For all alternatives \(x\) and \(y\) in \(X\), and all profiles \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) and \(\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\), if \(\langle R_{i}\rangle|\{x,y\} = \langle R^*_{i}\rangle|\{x,y\}\), then \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle |\{x,y\} = f\langle R^*_{i}\rangle |\{x,y\}\).

I says that whenever two profiles \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) and \(\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\) are identical, as far as some alternatives \(x\) and \(y\) are concerned, so too must the social preference relations \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\) and \(f\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\) be identical, as far as \(x\) and \(y\) are concerned. For example, consider the profile:

  1. BAC
  2. CAB
  3. BCA

Its restriction to the pair {\(A\),\(C\)} is identical to that of the profile of the paradox of voting. Suppose the domain of a social welfare function includes both of these profiles. Then, to satisfy I, it must derive from each one the same social preference among \(A\) and \(C\). The social preference among \(A\) and \(C\) is, in this sense, to be “independent” of anybody's preferences among either of them and the remaining “irrelevant” alternative \(B\). The same is to hold for any two profiles in the domain, and for any other pair taken from the set \(X\) = {\(A\), \(B\), \(C\)} of all alternatives. Some voting methods do not satisfy I (see Section 5.2), but pairwise majority decision does. To see whether \(x\) is socially preferred to \(y\), by this method, you need look no further than the individual preferences among \(x\) and \(y\).

3.2 …are Incompatible

Arrow discovered that, except in the very simplest of cases, the five conditions of Section 3.1 are incompatible.

Arrow's Theorem: Suppose there are more than two alternatives. Then no social welfare function \(f\) satisfies U, SO, WP, D, and I.

Arrow (1951) has the original proof of this “impossibility” theorem. See among many other works Kelly 1978, Campbell and Kelly 2002, Geanakoplos 2005 and Gaertner 2009 for variants and different proofs.

4. The Conditions, again

Taken separately, the conditions of Arrow's theorem do not seem severe. Apparently, they ask of an aggregation procedure only that it will come up with a social preference ordering no matter what everybody prefers (U and SO), that it will resemble certain democratic arrangements in some ways (WP and I), and that it will not resemble certain undemocratic arrangements in another way (D). Taken together, though, these conditions exclude all possibility of deriving social preferences. It is time to consider them more closely.

4.1 Unrestricted Domain

Arrow's domain condition U says that the domain of the social welfare function includes every list of \(n\) weak orderings of \(X\). For example, suppose the alternatives are \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\), and that the people are 1, 2, and 3. There are 13 weak orderings of three alternatives, so the unrestricted domain contains 2197 (that is, \(13^{3}\)) lists of weak orderings of \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\). A social welfare function \(f\) for these alternatives and people, if it satisfies U, maps each one of these “logically possible” preference profiles onto a collective preference among \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\).

In Arrow's account, the different profiles in a domain represent preferences that the people might turn out to have. To impose U, on his epistemic rationale, amounts to assuming that they might have any preferences at all: it is only when their preferences could be anything that it makes sense to require the social welfare function to be ready for everything. Arrow wrote in support of U:

If we do not wish to require any prior knowledge of the tastes of individuals before specifying our social welfare function, that function will have to be defined for every logically possible set of individual orderings. (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 24)

There have been misunderstandings. Some think U requires of social welfare functions that they can handle “any old” alternatives. It does nothing of the sort. What it requires is that the social welfare function can handle the widest possible range of preferences among whichever alternatives there are to choose among, and whether there happen to be many of these or only a few of them is beside the point: the domain of a social welfare function can be completely unrestricted even if there are in \(X\) just two alternatives. One way to sustain this unorthodox understanding of U is, perhaps, to think of Arrow's \(x, y, z, \ldots\) not as alternatives properly speaking—not as candidates in elections, social states, or what have you—but as names or labels that represent these on different occasions for choosing. Then, it might be thought, variety among the alternatives to which the labels can be attached will generate variety among the profiles that an aggregation procedure might be expected to handle. Blackorby et al. (2006) toy with this idea at one point, but they quickly set it aside. It does not seem to have been explored in the literature.

Of course, there is nothing to keep anyone from reinterpreting Arrow's basic notions, including the set \(X\) of alternatives, in any way they like; a theorem is a theorem no matter what interpretation it is given. It is important to realize, though, that to interpret \(x, y, z, \ldots\) as labels is not standard, and can only make nonsense of much of the theory of social choice to which Arrow's theorem has given rise.[4]

Arrow already knew that U is a stronger domain condition than is needed for an impossibility result. The free triple property and the chain property are weaker conditions that replace U in some versions of Arrow's theorem (Campbell and Kelly 2002). These versions, being more informative, are, from a logical point of view, better. U is simpler to state than their domain conditions, though, and might be found more intuitive. Notice that the weaker domain conditions still require a lot of variety among profiles. A typical proof of an Arrow-style impossibility theorem requires that the domain is unrestricted with respect to some three alternatives. In this case there is always a preference profile like the one implicated in the paradox of voting in Section 1, from which pairwise majority decision derives a cycle.

Whether it is sensible to impose U or any other domain condition on a social welfare function depends very much on the particulars of the choice problem being studied. Sometimes, in the nature of the alternatives under consideration, and the way in which individual preferences among them are determined, imposing U certainly is not appropriate. If for instance the alternatives are different ways of dividing up a pie among some people, and it is known prior to selecting a social welfare function that these people are selfish, each caring only about the size of his own piece, then it makes no obvious sense to require of a suitable function that it can handle cases in which some people prefer to have less for themselves than to have more. The social welfare function will never be called on to handle such cases for the simple reason that they will never arise. Arrow made this point as follows:

[I]t has frequently been assumed or implied in welfare economics that each individual values different social states solely according to his consumption under them. If this be the case, we should only require that our social welfare function be defined for those sets of individual orderings which are of the type described; only such should be admissible (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 24).

Section 5.1 considers some of the possibilities that open up when there is no need to reckon with all “logically possible” individual preferences.

4.2 Social Ordering

Condition SO requires that the result of aggregating individual preferences is always a weak ordering of the alternatives, a binary relation among them that is both transitive and connected. Intuitively, the result has to be a ranking of the alternatives from better to worse, perhaps with ties. There is never to be a cycle of social preferences, like the one derived by pairwise majority decision in the paradox of voting, in Section 1.

Arrow did not state SO as a separate condition. He built it into the very notion of a social welfare function, arguing that the result of aggregating preferences will have to be an ordering if it is to “reflect rational choice-making” (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 19). Criticized by Buchanan (1954) for transferring properties of individual choice to collective choice, Arrow in the second edition of Social Choice and Individual Values gave a different rationale. There he argued that transitivity is important because it ensures that collective choices are independent of the path taken to them (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 120). He did not develop this idea further.

Charles Plott (1973) elaborated a suitable notion of path independence. Suppose we arrive at our choice by what he called divide and conquer: first we divide the alternatives into some smaller sets—say, because these are more manageable—and we choose from each one. Then we gather together all the alternatives that we have chosen from the smaller sets, and we choose again from among these. There are many ways of making the initial division, and a choice procedure is said to be path independent if the choice we arrive at in the end is independent of which division we start with (Plott 1973: 1080). In Arrow's account, social choices are made from some given “environment” \(S\) of feasible alternatives by maximizing a social ordering \(R\): the choice \(C(S)\) from among \(S\) is the set of those \(x\) within \(S\) such that for any \(y\) within \(S, xRy\). It is not difficult to see how intransitivity of \(R\) can result in path dependence. Consider again the paradox of voting of Section 1. \(A\) is strictly favoured above \(B\), and \(B\) above \(C\); but, contrary to transitivity, \(C\) is strictly favoured above \(A\). Starting with the division \(\{\{A,B\}, \{B,C\}\}\), our choice from among \(\{A,B,C\}\) will be \(\{A\}\); but starting instead with \(\{\{A,C\}, \{B,C\}\}\) we will arrive in the end at \(\{B\}\).

Plott's analysis reveals a subtlety. The full strength of SO is not needed to secure path independence of choice. It is sufficient that social preference is a (complete and) quasi-transitive relation, having a strict component that is transitive but an indifference component that, perhaps, is not transitive. Sen (1969: Theorem V) demonstrated the compatibility of this weaker requirement with all of Arrow's other conditions, but noted that the aggregation function he came up with would not generally be found attractive. Its unattractiveness was no accident. Allan Gibbard showed that the only social welfare functions made available by allowing intransitivity of social indifference, while keeping Arrow's other requirements in place, are what he called liberum veto oligarchies (Gibbard 1969, 2014). There has in every case to be some group of individuals, the oligarchs, such that the society always strictly prefers one alternative to another if all of the oligarchs strictly prefer it, but never does so if that would go against the strict preference of any oligarch.[5] A dictatorship, in Arrow's sense, is a liberum veto oligarchy of one. Relaxing SO by limiting the transitivity requirement to strict social preferences therefore does not seem a promising way of securing, in spite of Arrow's theorem, the existence of acceptable social welfare functions.

4.3 Weak Pareto

Condition WP requires that whenever everybody ranks one alternative strictly above another the social ordering agrees. This has long been a basic assumption in welfare economics and might seem completely uncontroversial. That the community should prefer one social state to another whenever each individual does, Arrow argued in connection with compensation, is “not debatable except perhaps on a philosophy of systematically denying people whatever they want” (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 34).

But WP is not as harmless as it might seem, and in combination with U it tightly constrains the possibilities for social choice. This is evident from Sen's (1970) demonstration that these two conditions conflict with the idea that for each person there is a personal domain of states of affairs, within which his preferences must prevail in case of conflict with others'. This important problem of the “Paretian libertarian” meanwhile has its own extensive literature. For further discussion, see the entry social choice theory.

We may think of WP as a vestige of what Sen called:

Welfarism: The judgement of the relative goodness of alternative states of affairs must be based exclusively on, and taken as an increasing function of, the respective collections of individual utilities in these states (Sen 1979: 468).

In Arrow's ordinal framework, welfarism insists that individual preference orderings are the only basis for deriving social preferences. Non-welfare factors—physical characteristics of social states, people's motives in having the preferences they do, respect for rights, equality—none of these are to make any difference except indirectly, through their reflections in individual preferences. WP asserts the demands of welfarism in the special case in which everybody's strict preferences coincide. Sen argued that even these limited demands might be found excessive on moral grounds (Sen 1979: Section IV). Section 4.5 has further discussion of welfarism.

4.4 Non-Dictatorship

Someone is a dictator, in Arrow's sense, if whenever he strictly prefers one alternative to another the society always prefers it as well. The preferences of people other than the dictator can still make a difference, and so can non-welfare factors, but only when the dictator is indifferent between two alternatives, having no strict preference one way or the other. Arrow's non-dictatorship condition D says that there is to be no dictator. Plainly it rules out many undemocratic arrangements, such as identifying social preferences in every case with the individual preferences of some one person. This apparently straightforward condition has attracted very little attention in the literature.

In fact there is more to the non-dictatorship condition than meets the eye. An Arrovian dictator is just someone whose strict preferences invariably are a subset of the society's strict preferences, and that by itself doesn't mean that his preferences form a basis for social preferences, or that the dictator has any power or control over these. Aanund Hylland once made a related point while objecting to the unreflective imposition of D in single profile analyses of social choice:

In the single-profile model, a dictator is a person whose individual preferences coincide with the social ones in the one and only profile under consideration. Nothing is necessarily wrong with that; the decision process can be perfectly democratic, and one person simply turns out to be on the winning side on all issues. (Hylland 1986: 51, footnote 10)

The non-dictatorship condition for this reason sometimes goes too far. Even pairwise majority voting, that paradigm of a democratic procedure, is in Arrow's sense sometimes a dictatorship. Consider Zelig. He has no tastes, values or preferences of his own but temporarily takes on those of another, whoever is close at hand. He is a human chameleon, the ultimate conformist.[6] Zelig one day finds himself on a committee of three that will choose among several options using the method of pairwise majority voting and, given his peculiar character, the range of individual orderings that can arise is somewhat restricted. In each admissible profile, two of the three individual orderings are identical: Zelig's and that of whoever is seated closest to him at the committee meeting.[7] Now suppose it so happens that Zelig strictly prefers one option \(x\) to another, \(y\). Then someone else does too; that makes two of the three and so, when they vote, the result is a strict collective preference for \(x\) above \(y\). The committee's decision procedure is, in Arrow's sense, a dictatorship, and Zelig is the dictator. But of course really Zelig is a follower, not a leader, and majority voting is as democratic as can be. It's just that this one mad little fellow has a way of always ending up on the winning side.

Arrow imposed D in conjunction with the requirement U that the domain is completely unrestricted. Perhaps this condition expresses something closer to its intended meaning then. With an unrestricted domain, a dictator, unlike Zelig, is someone whose preferences conflict with everybody else's in a range of cases, and it is in each instance his preferences that agree with social preferences, not theirs. However this may be, the example of Zelig shows that whether it is appropriate to impose D on social welfare functions depends on the details of the choice problem at hand. The name of this condition is misleading. Sometimes there is nothing undemocratic about having a “dictator”, in Arrow's technical sense.

4.5 Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives

Arrow's independence condition requires that whenever all individual preferences among a pair of alternatives are the same in one profile as they are in another, the social preference among these alternatives must also be the same for the two profiles. Speaking figuratively, what this means is that when the social welfare function goes about the work of aggregating individual orderings, it has to take each pair of alternatives separately, paying no attention to preferences for alternatives other than them. Some aggregation procedures work this way. Pairwise majority decision does: it counts \(x\) as weakly preferred to \(y\), socially, if as many people weakly prefer \(x\) to \(y\) as the other way around, and plainly there is no need to look beyond \(x\) and \(y\) to find this out.

Condition I is not Arrow's formulation. It is a simpler one that has since become the standard in expositions of the impossibility theorem. Arrow's formulation concerns choices made from within various “environments” \(S\) of feasible options by maximizing social orderings:

Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives (choice version): For all environments \(S\) within \(X\), and all profiles \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) and \(\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\), if \(\langle R_{i}\rangle|S = \langle R^*_{i}\rangle|S\), then \(C(S)= C^*(S)\).

Here \(C(S)\) is the set of those options from \(S\) that are, in the sense of the social ordering \(f\langle R_{i}\rangle\), as good as any other; and \(C^*(S)\) stands for the maxima by \(f\langle R^*_{i}\rangle\).

This is Arrow's Condition 3 (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 27). Notice that Arrow didn't write ‘all environments \(S\)’. He wrote ‘a given environment \(S\)’, which is ambiguous: his Condition 3 can be read either as concerning all environments, or just some particular one. The stronger universal reading is needed for an impossibility theorem, though, so it must be what Arrow intended. The universal reading secures equivalence to I. Crucially, every pair {\(x\),\(y\)} of alternatives is an environment.

Iain McClean (2003) finds a first statement of Independence, and appreciation of its significance, already in (Condorcet 1785). Meanwhile much controversy has surrounded this condition, and not a little confusion. Some of each can be traced to an example with which Arrow sought to motivate it. When one candidate in an election dies after polling, he wrote,

[…] the choice to be made among the set \(S\) of surviving candidates should be independent of the preferences of individuals for candidates not in \(S\). […] Therefore, we may require of our social welfare function that the choice made by society from a given environment depend only on the orderings of individuals among the alternatives in that environment (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 26).

Evidently Arrow took this for his choice version of the independence condition. He continued:

Alternatively stated, if we consider two sets of individual orderings such that, for each individual, his ordering of those particular alternatives in a given environment is the same each time, then we require that the choice made by society from that environment be the same when individual values are given by the first set of orderings as they are when given by the second (Arrow 1951 [1963]: 26–27).

It is not clear why Arrow thought the case of the dead candidate involves different values and preference profiles. As he set the example up, it is natural to imagine that everybody's values and preferences stay the same while one candidate becomes unfeasible (“we'd all still prefer \(A\), but sadly he's not with us any more”). Apparently, then, Arrow's example misses its mark. There has been much discussion of this point in the literature. Hansson (1973) argues that Arrow confused his independence condition for another; compare Bordes and Tideman (1991) for a contrary view. For discussion of several notions of independence whose differences have not always been appreciated, see Ray (1973).

The following condition has also been called Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives:

(\(I^*\)) For all \(x\) and \(y\), and all \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) and \(\langle R_{i}^*\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\), if for all \(i: xR_{i}y\) if and only if \(xR^*_{i}y\), then \(x f\langle R_{i}\rangle y\) if and only if \(x f\langle R_{i}^*\rangle y\).

If the intention is to express Arrow's independence condition this is a mistake because \(I^*\), though similar in appearance to I, has a different content. I says that whenever everybody's preferences concerning a pair of options are the same in one profile as they are in another, the social preference must also be the same at the two profiles, as far as this pair is concerned. This is not what \(I^*\) says because the embedded antecedent ‘for all \(i: xR_{i}y\) if and only if \(xR^*_{i}y\)’ is satisfied not only when everybody's preferences among \(x\) and \(y\) are the same in \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) as they are in \(\langle R_{i}^*\rangle\), but in other instances as well. For example, suppose that in \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) everybody is indifferent between some social state \(T\) and another state \(S\) (in which case for all \(i\), both \(T R_{i} S\) and \(S R_{i} T\)), while in \(\langle R_{i}^*\rangle\) everybody strictly prefers \(T\) to \(S\) (for all \(i\), \(T R^*_{i} S\) but not \(S R^*_{i} T\)). Then the antecedent ‘for all \(i: T R_{i} S\) if and only if \(T R^*_{i} S\)’ is satisfied, although individual preferences among \(T\) and \(S\) are not the same in the two profiles. \(I^*\) sometimes constrains \(f\) though \(I\) does not and it is a more demanding condition.

The additional demands of \(I^*\) are sometimes excessive. Let \(T\) be the result of reforming some tried and true status quo, \(S\). Now suppose we favor reform if it is generally thought that change will be for the better, but not otherwise. Then we will be on the lookout for a social welfare function \(f\) that derives a strict social preference for \(T\) above \(S\) when everybody strictly prefers \(T\) to \(S\), but a strict preference for \(S\) above \(T\) when everyone is indifferent between these states. \(I^*\) rules out every \(f\) that conforms to this desideratum because it requires a weak social preference for \(T\) to \(S\) in both cases or in neither.

Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives might be said to require that the social comparison among any given pair of alternatives, say social states, depends only on individual preferences among this pair. This is correct but it leaves some room for misunderstanding. I says that the only preferences that count are those concerning just these two social states. That doesn't mean that preferences are the only thing that counts, though. And, indeed, as far as I is concerned, non-welfare features of the two states may also make a difference.

The doctrine that individual preferences are the only basis for comparing the goodness of social states is welfarism (mentioned already in Section 4.3). An example illustrates how nasty it can be:

In the status quo \(S\), Peter is filthy rich and Paul is abjectly poor. Would it be better to take from Peter and give to Paul? Let \(T\) be the social state resulting from transferring a little of Peter's vast wealth to Paul. Paul prefers \(T\) to \(S\) (“I need to eat”) and Peter prefers \(S\) to \(T\) (“not my problem”). This is one case. Compare it to another. Social state \(T^*\) arises from a different status quo \(S^*\), also by taking from Peter and giving to Paul. This time, though, their fortunes are reversed. In \(S^*\) it is Peter who is poor and Paul is the rich one, so this is a matter of taking from the poor to give to the rich. Even so, we may assume, the pattern of Peter's and Paul's preferences is the same in the second case as it is in the first, because each of them prefers to have more for himself than to have less. Paul prefers \(T^*\) to \(S^*\) (“I need another Bugatti”) and Peter prefers \(S^*\) to \(T^*\) (“wish it were my problem”). Since everybody's preferences are the same in the two cases, welfarism requires that the relative social goodness is the same as well. In particular, it allows us to count \(T\) socially better than \(S\) only if we also count \(T^*\) better than \(S^*\). Whatever we think about taking from the rich to give to the poor, though, taking from the poor to give to the rich is quite another thing. As Samuelson said of a similar case, “[o]ne need not be a doctrinaire egalitarian to be speechless at this requirement” (Samuelson 1977: 83).

Condition I does not express welfarism. Applied to this example, I states that there is to be no change in the social comparison among the status quo \(S\) and the result \(T\) of redistribution unless Peter's preferences among these states change, or Paul's do (assume they are the only people involved). In this sense, the social preference among these states may be said to depend “only” on individual preferences among them. I says the same about \(S^*\) and \(T^*\) or about any other pair of alternatives. But I is silent about any relationship between the social comparison among \(S\) and \(T\), on the one hand, and the social comparison among \(S^*\) and \(T^*\), on the other. In particular, it leaves a social welfare function free to count \(T\) socially better than \(S\) (for increasing equality), while also counting \(T^*\) worse than \(S^*\) (for decreasing equality). Intuitively speaking, I allows a social welfare function to “shift gears” as we go from one pair of social states to the next, depending on the non-welfare features encountered there.

The condition that expresses welfarism is:

Strong Neutrality (SN): For all alternatives \(x\), \(y\), \(z\) and \(w\), and all profiles \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) and \(\langle R_{i}^*\rangle\): IF for all \(i\): \(xR_{i}y\) if and only if \(zR^*_{i}w\), and \(yR_{i}x\) if and only if \(wR^*_{i}z\), THEN \(x f\langle R_{i}\rangle y\) if and only if \(z f\langle R_{i}^*\rangle w\), and \(y f\langle R_{i}\rangle x\) if and only if \(w f\langle R_{i}^*\rangle z\).

SN is more demanding than I.[8] I requires consistency for each pair of alternatives separately, as we go from one profile in the domain to the next. SN also requires this, but in addition it requires consistency as we go from one pair to the next, whether that is within a single profile or among several different ones. This is how SN keeps non-welfare features from making any difference: by compelling the social welfare function to treat any two pairs of alternatives the same way, if the pattern of individual preference is the same for both.

Since \(I^*\) and SN are logically stronger than I, obviously a version of Arrow's theorem can be had using either one of them instead of I. Such a theorem will be less interesting, though—not only because it is logically weaker but also because, as we have seen, these more demanding conditions often are unreasonable.

The meaning of Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives is not easily grasped, and its ramifications are not immediately obvious. It is therefore surprising to see just how little has been said, over the many decades that have passed since Arrow published his famous theorem, to justify imposing this condition on social welfare functions. Let us turn, now, to some arguments for and against.

We have discussed Arrow's attempt to motivate I using the example of the dead candidate in an election. In the second edition of Social Choice and Individual Values he offered another rationale. Independence, he argued, embodies the principle that welfare judgments are to be based on observable behavior. Having expressed approval for Bergson's use of indifference maps, Arrow continued:

The Condition of Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives extends the requirement of observability one step farther. Given the set of alternatives available for society to choose among, it could be expected that, ideally, one could observe all preferences among the available alternatives, but there would be no way to observe preferences among alternatives not feasible for society. (Arrow 1963: 110)

Arrow seems to be saying that social decisions have to be made on the basis of preferences for feasible alternatives because these are the only ones that are observable. Arguably, though, this is insufficient support. Arrow's choice version of Independence, as we have seen, concerns all environments \(S\). The observability argument, though, apparently just concerns some “given” feasible alternatives. See Hansson (1973: 38) on this point.

Gerry Mackie (2003) argues that there has been equivocation on the notion of irrelevance. It is true that we often take nonfeasible alternatives to be irrelevant. That presumably is why, in elections, we do not ordinarily put the names of dead people on ballots, along with those of the live candidates. But I also excludes from consideration information on preferences for alternatives that, in an ordinary sense, are relevant. An example illustrates Mackie's point. George W. Bush, Al Gore, and Ralph Nader ran in the United States presidential election of 2000. Say we want to know whether there was a social preference for Gore above Bush. I requires that this question be answerable independently of whether the people preferred either of them to, say, Abraham Lincoln, or preferred George Washington to Lincoln. This seems right. Neither Lincoln nor Washington ran for President that year. They were, intuitively, irrelevant alternatives. But I also requires that the ranking of Gore with respect to Bush should be independent of voters' preferences for Nader, and this does not seem right because he was on the ballot and, in the ordinary sense, he was a relevant alternative to them. Certainly Arrow's observability criterion does not rule out using information on preferences for Nader. They were as observable as any in that election.

A different rationale has been suggested for imposing I specifically in the case of voting. Many voting procedures are known to present opportunities for voters to manipulate outcomes by misrepresenting their preferences. Section 5.2 discusses the example of Borda counting, which allows voters to promote their own favorite candidates by strategically putting others' favorites at the bottom of their lists. Borda counting, it will be seen, violates I. Proofs of the Gibbard-Sattherthwaite theorem (Gibbard 1973, Sattherthwaite 1975) associate vulnerability to strategic voting systematically with violation of I, and Iain McLean argues on this ground that voting methods ought to satisfy this condition: “Take out [I] and you have gross manipulability” (McLean 2003: 16). This matter of strategic voting did not play a part in Arrow's presentation of the impossibility theorem, though, and was not dealt with seriously in the literature until after its publication. See the entry on social choice theory for discussion of this important theme in contemporary theory of social choice.

5. Possibilities

Arrow's theorem, it has been said, is about the impossibility of trying to do too much with too little information about people's preferences. This remark directs attention towards two main avenues leading from Arrow-inspired pessimism toward a sunnier view of the possibilities for collective decision making: not trying to do so much, and using more information. One way of not trying to do so much is to relax the requirement, it is a part of SO, that all social preferences are transitive. Section 4.2 briefly considered this idea but found it unpromising. Another way is to soften the demand of U that there be a social ordering for each “logically possible” preference profile. That is, we can restrict the domains of social welfare functions. Section 5.1 discusses this important “escape route” from Arrow's theorem in some detail. Alternatively, by loosening the independence constraint I, we can release to social welfare functions more of the information that is carried by individual preference orderings. See Section 5.2. Finally, by extending Arrow's framework we can admit information about the strengths of individual preferences that was ruled out of consideration by Arrow. Section 5.3 discusses this escape route.

5.1 Domain Restrictions

Sometimes, in the nature of the alternatives under consideration and how individual preferences among them are determined, not all individual preferences can arise. When studying such a case within Arrow's framework there is no need for a social welfare function that can handle each and every \(n\)-tuple of individual orderings. Some but not all profiles are admissible, and the domain is said to be restricted. In fortunate cases, it is then possible to find a social welfare function that meets all assumptions and conditions of Arrow's theorem—apart, of course, from U. Such domains are said to be Arrow consistent. This Section considers some important examples of Arrow consistent domains.

For a simple illustration, consider the following profile:

  1. ABC
  2. ABC
  3. CBA

Here, two of the three people have the same strict preference ordering. Reckoning the collective preference by pairwise majority decision, it is easy to see that the result is the ordering of this majority: ABC. Consider now a domain made up entirely of such profiles, in which most of the three voters share the same strict preferences. On such a domain, pairwise majority decision always derives an ordering and so it satisfies SO. This social welfare function is nondictatorial as well provided the domain, though restricted, still retains a certain variety. In the above profile, voter \(3\) strictly prefers \(B\) to \(A\). Both of the others strictly prefer \(A\) to \(B\), though, and that is the social preference: with this profile in the domain, \(3\) is no dictator. Pairwise majority decision satisfies D if each of the voters disagrees in this way with both of the others, in some or other profile.[9] It always satisfies WP and I. On such a domain, we have now seen, this aggregation procedure satisfies all of Arrow's non-domain conditions. Such a domain is Arrow consistent.

Full identity of preferences is not needed for Arrow consistency. It can be enough that everybody's preferences are similar, even if they never entirely agree. An example illustrates the case of single peaked domains.

Suppose three bears get together to decide how hot their common pot of porridge will be. Papa bear likes hot porridge, the hotter the better. Mama bear likes cold porridge, the colder the better. Baby bear most likes warm porridge; hot porridge is next best as far as he is concerned (“it will always cool off”), and he doesn't like cold porridge at all. These preferences among hot, warm and cold porridge can be represented as a preference profile:

  • Papa: Hot Warm Cold
  • Mama: Cold Warm Hot
  • Baby: Warm Hot Cold

Or else they can be pictured like this:

[A graph, y-axis labeled 'preference' and x-axis having 'Cold', 'Warm', and 'Hot' in that order. First line, labeled 'Mama', goes from Cold/preference high to  Hot/preference low.  Second line, labeled 'Papa', goes from Cold/preference low to Hot/preference high.  Third line, labeled 'Baby', goes from Cold/preference low to Warm/preference high to Hot/preference medium ]

Figure 1

This preference profile is single peaked. Each bear has a “bliss point” somewhere along the ordering of the options by their temperature, and each bear likes options less and less as we move along this common ordering away from the bliss point, on either side. Single peaked preferences arise with respect to the left-right orientation of political candidates, the cost of alternative public projects, and other salient attributes of options. Single peaked profiles, in which everybody's preferences are single peaked with respect to a common ordering, arise naturally when everybody cares about the same thing in the options under consideration—temperature, left-right orientation, cost, or what have you—even if, as with the bears, there is no further consensus about which options are better than which.

Duncan Black (1948) showed that if the number of voters is odd, and their preference profile is single peaked, pairwise majority decision always delivers up an ordering.[10] Furthermore, he showed, the maximum of this ordering is the bliss point of the median voter—the voter whose bliss point has, on the common ordering, as many voters' bliss points to one side as it has to the other. In the example this is Baby bear, and warm porridge is the collective maximum. This example illustrates the way in which single peakedness can facilitate compromise.

Say the number of voters is odd. Now consider a single-peaked domain—one that is made up entirely of single peaked profiles. Black's result tells us that pairwise majority decision on this domain satisfies SO. Provided the domain is sufficiently inclusive (so that for each \(i\) there is within the domain some profile in which \(i\) is not the median voter) it also satisfies D. Pairwise majority decision always satisfies WP and I, so such a domain is Arrow consistent.

With an even number of voters, single peakedness does not ensure satisfaction of SO. For example, suppose there are just two voters and that their individual orderings are:

  1. CAB
  2. BCA

Pairwise majority decision derives from this profile a weak social preference for \(A\) to \(B\), since there is one who weakly prefers \(A\) to \(B\), and one who weakly prefers \(B\) to \(A\). Similarly, it derives a weak social preference for \(B\) to \(C\). Transitivity requires a weak social preference for \(A\) to \(C\), but there is none. On the contrary, there is a strict social preference for \(C\) above \(A\), since that is the unanimous preference of the voters. Still, this profile is single peaked with respect to the common ordering \(BCA\):

[A graph, y-axis labeled 'preference' and x-axis having 'B', 'C', and 'A' in that order. First line, labeled '1' goes from B/low preference to C/high preference to A/medium preference.  Second line, labeled '2', goes from B/high preference to A/low preference.]

Figure 2

Majority decision with “phantom” voters can be used to establish Arrow consistency when the number of people is even. Let there be \(2n\) people, and let each profile in the domain be single peaked with respect to one and the same ordering of the alternatives. Let \(R_{2n+1}\) be an ordering that also is single peaked with respect to this common ordering. \(R_{2n+1}\) represents the preferences of a “phantom” voter. Now take each profile \(\langle R_{1},\ldots, R_{2n}\rangle\) in the domain and expand it into \(\langle R_{1},\ldots, R_{2n}, R_{2n+1}\rangle\), by adding \(R_{2n+1}\). The set of all the expanded profiles is a single peaked domain and, because the real voters together with the phantom are odd in number, Black's result applies to it. Let \(g\) be pairwise majority decision for the expanded domain. We obtain a social welfare function \(f\) for the original domain by assigning to each profile the ordering that \(g\) assigns to its expansion. That is, we put:

\[ f\langle R_{1},\ldots, R_{2n}\rangle = g\langle R_{1},\ldots, R_{2n}, R_{2n+1}\rangle. \]

This \(f\) satisfies SO because \(g\) does. It satisfies WP because there are more real voters than phantoms (\(2n\) to \(1\); we could have used any odd number of phantoms smaller than \(2n\)). \(f\) satisfies I because the phantom ordering is the same in all profiles of the expanded domain. If the domain includes sufficient variety among profiles then \(f\) also satisfies D and is Arrow consistent. This nice idea of phantom voters was introduced by Moulin (1980), who used it to characterize a class of voting schemes that are non-manipulable, in that they do not provide opportunities for strategic voting.

Domain restrictions have been the focus of much research in recent decades. Gaertner (2001) provides a general overview. Le Breton and Weymark (2006) survey work on domain restrictions that arise naturally when analyzing economic problems in Arrow's framework. Miller (1992) suggests that deliberation can facilitate rational social choice by transforming initial preferences into single peaked preferences. List and Dryzek (2003) argue that deliberation can bring about a “structuration” of individual preferences that facilitates democratic decision making even without achieving full single-peakedness. List et al. (2013) present empirical evidence that deliberation sometimes does have this effect.

As Samuelson described it, the single profile approach might seem to amount to the most severe of domain restrictions:

[O]ne and only one of the […] possible patterns of individuals' orderings is needed. […] From it (not from each of them all) comes a social ordering. (Samuelson 1967: 48–49)

According to Sen (1977), though, the Bergson-Samuelson social welfare function has more than a single profile in its domain. It has in fact a completely unrestricted domain, for while according to Samuelson only one profile is needed “it could be any one” (Samuelson 1967: 49). What distinguishes the single profile approach, on Sen's way of understanding it, is that there is to be no coordinating the behavior of the social welfare function at several different profiles, by imposing on it interprofile conditions such as I and SN (see Section 4.5). Either way, though, and just as Samuelson insisted, Arrow's theorem does not limit the single profile approach because one of its conditions is inappropriate in connection with it. Either U is inappropriate (if there is a single profile in the domain) or else I is inappropriate (if there are no interprofile constraints).

Certain impossibility theorems that are closely related to Arrow's have been thought relevant to single-profile choice even so. These theorems do not use Arrow's interprofile condition \(I\) but use instead an intraprofile neutrality condition. This condition says that whenever within any single profile the pattern of individual preferences for one pair \(x\),\(y\) of options is the same as for another pair \(z,w\), the social ordering derived from this profile must also be the same for \(x\), \(y\) as it is for \(z\), \(w\):

Single-Profile Neutrality (SPN): For any \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\), and any alternatives \(x\), \(y\), \(z\) and \(w\): IF for all \(i: xR_{i}y\) if and only if \(zR_{i}w\), and \(yR_{i}x\) if and only if \(wR_{i}z\), THEN \(x f\langle R_{i}\rangle y\) if and only if \(z f\langle R_{i}\rangle w\), and \(y f\langle R_{i}\rangle x\) if and only if \(w f\langle R_{i}\rangle z\).

SPN follows from the strong neutrality (SN) condition of Section 4.5, on identifying \(\langle R_{i}\rangle\) with \(\langle R_{i}^*\rangle\). Parks (1976), and independently Kemp and Ng (1976), showed that there are “single profile” versions of Arrow's theorem using SPN instead of I. These theorems were supposed to block the Bergson-Samuelson approach. In fact, condition SPN is just as easily set aside as SN, and for the same reason: both exclude non-welfare information that is relevant to the comparison of social states from an ethical standpoint. Samuelson (1977) ridiculed SPN using an example about redistributing chocolate. It is similar in structure to the example of Peter and Paul, in Section 4.5.

5.2 More Ordinal Information

Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives severely limits which information about individual preferences may be used for what. It requires a social welfare function, when assembling the social preference among a pair of alternatives, to take into account only those of people's preferences that concern just this pair. This Section discusses two kinds of information that is implicit in preferences for other alternatives, and illustrates their use in social decision making: information about the positions of alternatives in individual orderings, and information about the fairness of social states.

Positional voting methods take into account where the candidates come in the different individual orderings—whether it is first, or second, … or last. Borda counting is an important example. Named after Jean-Charles de Borda, a contemporary of Condorcet, it had already been proposed in the 13th Century by the pioneering writer and social theorist Ramon Lull. Nicholas of Cusa in the 15th Century recommended it for electing Holy Roman Emperors. Borda counting is used in some political elections and on many other occasions for voting, in clubs and other organizations. Consider the profile:

  1. ABCD
  2. BACD
  3. BACD

Let each candidate receive four points for coming first in some voter's ordering, three for coming second, two for a third place and a single point for coming last; the alternatives then are ordered by the total number of points they receive, from all the voters. The Borda count of \(A\) is then 10 (or \(4+3+3\)) and that of \(B\) is 11 \((3+4+4)\), so \(B\) outranks \(A\) in the social ordering. This method applies with the obvious adaptation to any election with a finite number of candidates.

Now suppose voter \(1\) moves \(B\) from second place to last on his own list, and we have the profile:

  1. ACDB
  2. BACD
  3. BACD

Then \(B\) will receive just 9 points \((1+4+4)\). \(A\) receives the same 10 as before, though, and now outranks \(B\). This example illustrates two important points. First, Borda counting does not satisfy Arrow's condition I, since while each voter's ranking of \(A\) with respect to \(B\) is the same in the two profiles, the social ordering of this pair is different. Second, Borda counting provides opportunities for voters to manipulate the outcome of an election by strategic voting. If everybody's preferences are as in the first profile, voter \(1\) might do well to misrepresent his preferences by putting \(B\) at the bottom of his list. In this way, he can promote his own favorite, \(A\), to the top of the social ordering (he will get away with this, of course, only if the other voters do not see what he is up to and adjust their own rankings accordingly, by putting his favorite \(A\) at the bottom). The susceptibility of Borda counting to strategic voting has long been known. When this was raised as an objection, Borda's indignant response is said to have been that his scheme was intended for honest people. Lull and Nicholas of Cusa recommended, before voting by this method, earnest oaths to tell the truth and stripping oneself of all sins.

For further discussion of positionalist voting methods, see the entries voting methods and social choice theory; for an analytical overview, see Pattanaik's (2002) handbook article. Barberà (2010) reviews what is known about strategic voting.

Mark Fleurbaey (2007) has shown that social welfare functions need more ordinal information than I allows them if they are to respond appropriately to a certain fairness of social states. He gives the example of Ann, who has ten apples and two oranges, and Bob, with three apples and eleven oranges. This allocation is said to be “envy free” if, intuitively, she would be at least as happy with his basket of fruit as she is with her own, and he would be as happy with hers. Let the distribution of fruit in one social state \(S\) be as described, and consider the state \(S^*\) in which the allocations are reversed. That is, in \(S^*\) it is Ann that has three apples and eleven oranges, while Bob has ten apples and two oranges. More technically, \(S\) is envy free if Ann weakly prefers \(S\) to \(S^*\), and Bob does too. Plainly, the envy freeness of social states is a matter of individual preferences. In general, therefore, it will vary from one profile in the domain of a social welfare function to the next.

We might expect that, other things being equal, the envy freeness of a social state will promote it in the social ordering above an alternative state that is not envy free. But, as Fleurbaey has shown, I does not allow this. Starting from the status quo \(S\), consider whether it would be better, socially, to take an apple and an orange from Bob and give both of them to Ann. Let \(T\) be the state arising from this transfer. We may assume for the sake of the example that Ann always strictly prefers having more for herself to having less, and that Bob's preferences are similarly self-interested, so that in all admissible profiles Ann strictly prefers \(T\) to \(S\), while Bob strictly prefers \(S\) to \(T\). Their preferences among these states are opposite and, absent relevant differences between the states, it would appear that there is no basis for a social preference one way or the other. This is where fairness might be expected to come in. Relative to one profile of individual preferences—in which both Ann and Bob weakly prefer \(S\) to \(S^*\)—the status quo \(S\) is envy free but \(T\) is not. A social welfare function that promotes envy freeness will come out against transfer by ranking \(S\) strictly above \(T\). Relative to another profile though, in which \(T\) is the envy free state—Ann and Bob weakly prefer \(T\) to the result \(T^*\) of a swap—instead \(T\) will outrank \(S\) in the social ordering. In direct conflict with I, the social preference among \(S\) and \(T\) will switch as we go from one profile to the other, although all individual preferences among \(S\) and \(T\) stay the same. The social ranking of \(S\) and \(T\) turns on preferences for the “irrelevant” results \(S^*\) and \(T^*\) of swapping, because the fairness of \(S\) and \(T\) does.

Fleurbaey recommends a weaker condition, attributing it to Hansson (1973) and to Pazner (1979):

Weak Independence: Social preferences on a pair of options should only depend on the population's preferences on these two options and on what options are indifferent to each of these options for each individual (Fleurbaey 2007: 23).

Fleurbaey (2007) discusses social welfare functions satisfying weak independence together with Arrow's conditions apart, of course, from I. The approach to social welfare that is sketched there is developed at length in (Fleurbaey and Maniquet 2011).

5.3 Cardinal Information

Another way to have social orderings in spite of Arrow's theorem is to derive them from more information about individual preferences than is available in Arrow's profiles. Sen in particular has argued that social decisions should be based on richer information than just orderings of the alternatives according to individual preferences. Restricting the domains of social welfare functions (Section 5.1) and allowing them to use more ordinal information (Section 5.2) are ways of getting around Arrow's theorem while working within his framework. Developing this idea means extending it.

Sen (1970) extended Arrow's framework by representing the preferences of individuals \(i\) not as orderings \(R_{i}\) but as utility functions \(U_{i}\) that map the alternatives onto real numbers: \(U_{i}(x)\) is the utility that \(i\) obtains from \(x\). A utility function \(U_{i}\) contains at least as much information as an individual preference ordering because we can reduce it to an ordering by putting \(xR_{i}y\) if \(U_{i}(x) \ge U_{i}(y)\). There is in general more information, though, because we cannot always go in reverse: different utility functions reduce to the same ordering. A preference profile in Sen's framework is a list \(\langle U_{1}, \ldots, U_{n}\rangle\) of utility functions, and a domain is a set of these. An aggregation function, now a social welfare functional, maps each profile in some domain onto a weak ordering of the alternatives.

Sen showed how to study various assumptions concerning the measurability and interpersonal comparability of utilities by coordinating the social orderings derived from profiles that, depending on these assumptions, carry the same information. For instance, ordinal measurement with interpersonal noncomparability—built by Arrow right into his technical framework—amounts, in Sen's more flexible set up, to a requirement that the same social ordering is to be derived from any utility profiles that reduce to the same list of orderings. At the other extreme, utilities are measured on a ratio scale with full interpersonal comparability if those profiles yield the same social ordering that can be obtained from each other by rescaling, or multiplying all utility functions by the same positive real number. Sen explored different combinations of such assumptions.

One important finding was that having cardinal utilities is not by itself enough to avoid an impossibility result. In addition, utilities have to be interpersonally comparable. Intuitively speaking, to put information about preference strengths to good use it has to be possible to compare the strengths of different individuals' preferences. See Sen (1970: Theorem 8*2). Interpersonal comparability opens up many possibilities for aggregating utilities and preferences. Two important ones can be read off from classical utilitarianism and Rawls's difference principle. For details, see the entry on social choice theory.

6. Reinterpretations

The Arrow-Sen framework lends itself to the study of a range of aggregation problems other than those for which it was originally developed. This Section briefly discusses some of them.

6.1 Judgment Aggregation

On an epistemic conception, the value of democratic institutions lies, in part, in their tendency to arrive at the truth in matters relevant to public decisions (see Estlund 2008, but compare Peter 2011). This idea receives some support from Condorcet's jury theorem. It tells us, simply put, that if individual people are more likely than not to judge correctly in some matter of fact, independently of one another, then the collective judgment of a sufficiently large group, arrived at by majority voting, is almost certain to be correct (Condorcet 1785). The phenomenon of the “wisdom of crowds”, facilitated by cognitive diversity among individuals, provides further and arguably better support for the epistemic conception (Page 2007, Landemore 2012). But there are theoretical limits to the possibilities for collective judgment on matters of fact. Starting with Kornhauser and Sager's (1986) discussion of group deliberation in legal settings, work on the theory of judgment aggregation has explored paradoxes and impossibility theorems closely related to those that Condorcet and Arrow discovered in connection with preference aggregation. See List (2012) and the entry social choice theory for overviews of this rapidly developing field of research.

6.2 Multi-Criterial Decision

In many decision problems there are several criteria by which to compare alternatives and, putting these criteria in place of people, it is natural to study such problems within the Arrow-Sen framework. Arrow's theorem, if analogues of its various assumptions and conditions are appropriate, then tells us that there is no procedure for arriving at an “overall” ordering that assimilates different criterial comparisons.

Kenneth May (1954) used Arrow's framework to study the determination of individual preferences. It had been found experimentally that people's preferences, elicited separately for different pairs of options, often are cyclical. May explained this by analogy with the paradox of voting as the result of preferring one alternative to another when it is better by more criteria than not. More generally, he reinterpreted Arrow's theorem as an argument that intransitivity of individual preferences is to be expected when different criteria “pull in different directions”. Susan Hurley (1985, 1989) considered a similar problem in practical deliberation when the criteria are moral values. She argued that Arrow's theorem does not apply in this case. One strand of her argument is that, unlike a person, a moral criterion can rank any given alternatives just one way. It cannot “change its mind” about them (Hurley 1985: 511), and this makes it inappropriate to impose the analogue of the domain condition U on procedures for weighing moral reasons.

Arrow's framework has also been used to study multicriterial evaluation in industrial decision making (Arrow and Raynaud 1986) and in engineering design (Scott and Antonsson 2000; compare Franssen 2005).

There are multicriterial problems in theoretical deliberation as well. Okasha (2011) uses the Arrow-Sen framework to study the problem of choosing among rival scientific theories by criteria including fit to data, simplicity, and scope. He argues that the impossibility theorem threatens the rationality of theory choice. See Morreau (2015) for a reason to think that it does not apply to this problem, and Morreau (2014) for a demonstration that impossibility theorems relevant to single profile choice (see Sections 2.2 and 5.1) might sometimes apply even so. In related work, Jacob Stegenga (2013) argues that Arrow's theorem limits the possibilities for combining different kinds of evidence.

6.3 Overall Similarity

Things are more similar to each other in one respect, less similar in another. Much philosophy relies on notions of aggregate or “overall” similarity and Arrow's framework has also been used to study these.

Overall similarity lies at the foundation of David Lewis's metaphysics (Lewis 1968, 1973a, 1973b). He wrote little about how similarities and differences in various respects might go together to yield overall similarities, though (Lewis 1979) gives some idea of what he had in mind. The Arrow-Sen framework lends itself to studying this aggregation problem as well; and an impossibility theorem, if it applies, limits the possibilities for arriving at overall similarities of the sort that Lewis presupposes. Morreau (2010) presents the case that a variant of Arrow's theorem does apply. Kroedel and Huber (2013) take a more optimistic view of overall similarity.

According to Popper (1963), some scientific theories, though false, are closer to the truth than others. Work on his notion of verisimilitude has distinguished “likeness” and “content” dimensions, and the question arises whether these can be combined into a single ordering of theories by their overall verisimilitude. Zwart and Franssen (2007) argue that Arrow's theorem does not apply to this problem but, using a theorem inspired by it, they argue that there is no good way to combine the different dimensions even so. See Schurz and Weingartner (2010) and Oddie (2013) for constructive criticism of their views.

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Acknowledgments

I thank Mark Fleurbaey, Christian List, Gerry Mackie and John Weymark for their comments and suggestions.

Copyright © 2014 by
Michael Morreau <michael.morreau@uit.no>

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