Notes to Arrow’s Theorem

1. Arrow’s use of the expression ‘social preference’ is compatible with the idea that groups of people can have collective beliefs, desires and other intentional states, but it should not be taken to presuppose this. ‘Preference’, in social choice theory, is to some extent a term of art.

2. Let this aggregation procedure be defined precisely, now, as follows: \(x\) is weakly preferred to \(y\), socially, if there are as many people who weakly prefer \(x\) to \(y\) as there are who weakly prefer \(y\) to \(x\). More technically, pairwise majority decision is that social welfare function \(f\) that assigns, to any given profile \(\langle R_i\rangle\) in its domain, the relation \(R\) such that:

\[ xRy \text{ if and only if } |\{i: xR_{i}y\}| \geq |\{i: yR_{i}x\}|. \]

It is now easy to see that \(f\) satisfies WP. Suppose that \(xP_{i}y\), for all \(i\). It follows from the definition of strict preference that, in this case, \(|\{i: xR_{i}y\}| = n > 0 = |\{i: yR_{i}x\}|\). Then, by definition of \(f\), \(xRy\) but not \(yRx\). So, once again by definition of strict preference, \(xPy\).

3. That is, \(x R|S y\) if and only if \(xRy\) while both \(x\) and \(y\) are members of \(S\).

4. The letters ‘\(x\)’, ‘\(y\)’, ‘\(z\)’ that Arrow used to refer to alternatives are of course representations, and they might just as well be called ‘labels’, but that is another thing. For an example of the confusion created by interpreting alternatives \(x, y, z, \ldots\) as labels, notice that this blurs the standard distinction between Arrow’s condition Independence of Irrelevant Alternatives and the condition of Strong Neutrality. Section 4.5 gives the latter a precise statement and explains how these conditions differ. Informally speaking, what Independence requires is that, for any given pair of alternatives, the social welfare function maintains a certain consistency as we go from one profile to the next within its domain. Strong Neutrality requires this, and in addition it requires a similar consistency as we go from one pair of alternatives to the next, whether this is within any given profile in the domain or among different ones. Now, if we think of \(x\) and \(y\) as labels that pick out different alternatives in different profiles, then Independence already demands consistency from one pair of alternatives to the next.

5. Remarkably, Gibbard obtained this result while still a student. It first appears in a term paper that he wrote for a joint seminar of Arrow, Rawls and Sen at Harvard, in 1968–1969 (for more historical details surrounding this result, see Weymark 2014).

6. This example derives from Woody Allen’s spoof documentary Zelig (1983).

7. The domain is restricted but it still contains many profiles. Suppose there are three alternatives to choose between, that the other two members of the committee can have any preferences at all, independently of one another, and that Zelig can end up with the preferences of either one. Then the decision procedure might be called on to handle any of 338 (or \(13^{2} \times 2\)) preference profiles.

8. Notice that Arrow didn’t write ‘all environments \(S\)’. He wrote ‘a given environment \(S\)’, which is ambiguous: his Condition 3 can be read either as concerning all environments, or just some particular one. The stronger universal reading is needed for an impossibility theorem, though, so it must be what Arrow intended. The universal reading secures equivalence to I. Crucially, every pair {\(x\),\(y\)} of alternatives is an environment.

9. SN reduces \(I\) when we equate \(x\) with \(z\), and equate \(y\) with \(w\), so that we are in effect dealing with just a single pair of alternatives.

10. The case of Zelig in Section 4.4 is not like this. His preferences never conflict with those of both of the others.

11. Since pairwise majority decision does not derive an ordering from the profile that gives rise to Condorcet’s paradox, in Section 1, Black’s result tells us that this profile is not single peaked. It is a simple but useful exercise to verify, by checking the different ones, that there is no linear ordering of the alternatives with respect to which all three individual orderings of that profile are single peaked.

Copyright © 2019 by
Michael Morreau <>

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