Mary Astell

First published Fri Jul 1, 2005; substantive revision Tue Jun 6, 2023

Mary Astell (1666–1731) was an English philosopher. She was born in Newcastle, and lived her adult life in London. Her patrons were Lady Ann Coventry, Lady Elizabeth Hastings, and Catherine Jones, and among those in her intellectual circle were Lady Mary Chudleigh, Judith Drake, Elizabeth Elstob, Lady Mary Wortley Montagu, and John Norris. In addition to a number of pamphlets, she wrote the following books:

  • A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Parts I and II. Wherein a Method is offer’d for the Improvement of their Minds (1694, 1697)
  • Letters Concerning the Love of God Between the Author of the Proposal to the Ladies and Mr. John Norris: Wherein his late Discourse, shewing That it ought to be intire and exclusive of all other Loves, is further cleared and justified (1695)
  • Some Reflections upon Marriage, Occasion’d by the Duke and Duchess of Mazarine’s Case; which is also considered (1700)
  • The Christian Religion, As Profess’d by a Daughter Of the Church of England (1705)

Today she is best known for her theories on the education of women and her critiques of Norris and John Locke.

1. Metaphysics

Mary Astell designed her metaphysics around an account of God and God’s creation. She was a dualist, maintaining that the two kinds of beings—minds and bodies—come in various degrees of finitude and corruptibility: God is the infinite and incorruptible mind; human minds and corporeal particles are finite, naturally incorruptible beings; and human bodies and physical objects are finite, naturally corruptible beings.

1.1 God

According to Astell, God is the “First Intelligence,” the being whose nature is to be infinite in all perfections. When writing about God’s perfections, Astell often lists wisdom, goodness, justice, holiness, intelligence, presence, power, and self-existence. In keeping with rationalist views of the period, Astell maintains that the correct understanding of metaphysics turns on the correct understanding of God. For this reason, much of her work is dedicated to demonstrating not only what God is, but also how a correct understanding of God can be attained.

Her earliest such account is in A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, where she demonstrates the existence, perfection, and necessary creative power of God. There she gives an example of the correct method for attaining knowledge, one similar to those developed by Descartes in Discourse on the Method and by Arnauld and Nicole in Logic or the Art of Thinking (see section 3.2 of this entry). Her proof of God’s existence includes an account of simple and composed ideas; clear and distinct perceptions; obscure and confused perceptions; adequate and inadequate ideas; proofs by intuition and proofs by comparison of ideas; God’s perfections and our ideas of them; and the relation between ideas and terms (Astell SP, 176–182). In Christian Religion, she frames other arguments for God’s existence in terms of what we can and cannot doubt; God’s perfections and our ideas of them; causality; and the beauty of the created universe (Astell 1705, 7–10 [sections 7–10]).

At times, Astell privileges some of God’s perfections over others: sometimes emphasizing self-existence above all perfections, other times focusing no goodness and wisdom over omnipotence. For example, in Christian Religion, when stating her ontological argument for God’s existence, she notes that “I find that the notion I have of GOD, contains those and all other perfections. Among which Self-existence is most remarkable, as being the original and basis of all the rest” (Astell 1705, 8 [section 7]). This claim is about the order of ideas: her idea of God’s self-existence allows her to understand God’s other perfections. A few lines later, she makes the analogous claim about the order of reality: “And Self-existence is such a Perfection as necessarily includes all other perfections” (section 8).

Broad (2002a, 103) presents evidence that Astell privileges God’s wisdom and goodness over his omnipotence. There are two ways that philosophers of the period thought about God’s attributes of wisdom, power, and goodness. Some held “intellectualist” theories, according to which God exercises his will in accordance with the true nature of things; others held “voluntarist” theories, according to which God exercises his will to create both things and the truth of things. In showing that Astell maintains an intellectualist theology, Broad refers to a number of passages, one of which is the following:

This is then the sum of the matter; GOD who is Infinite in all Perfections, in Justice and Holiness, as well as in Goodness and Mercy, always does what is best and most becoming His Perfections, and cannot act but according to the Essential Nature and Reason of things; nor is it possible that our Wishes or Actions shou’d make any alteration in the immutable Rectitude of His Conduct. (Astell 1705, 95 [section 105] see also 416 [section 407]; see also Astell SP, 205)

1.2 Individuation among Beings: Minds, Bodies, and Mind-Body Unions

Throughout her texts, Astell is concerned with giving an account of how created beings are individuated from each other. Ultimately, she maintains that there are four kinds of created beings: minds, bodies, mind–body unions, and the particles that compose bodies.

About finite minds considered on their own, Astell holds that God creates minds with intrinsic differences. She gives a number of reasons for this view. One has to do with the relationships that God wants minds to have with each other: humans form community only if their minds have different intellectual capacities. Another concerns the relationship between created minds and God: minds were made to contemplate and enjoy God, and God needs their adoration and love. But each mind is limited and, thus, can only love God by adoring a limited amount of his works. So God creates many minds, each with an ability to understand a specific collection of truths, and in this way all of his creation is attended to (Astell SP, 144–146, 154–155).

Though Astell discusses minds as if they are sometimes isolated from bodies, holding that human beings are mind–body unions, she notes that we cannot comprehend the connection between the mind and body: “We know and feel the Union between our Soul and Body, but who amongst us sees so clearly, as to find out with Certitude and Exactness, the secret ties which unite two such different Substances, or how they are able to act upon each other?” (148) The union between the mind and body is mysterious; though we “know and feel” it, we do not have perfect knowledge of it or of how the mind and body interact causally. In Christian Religion, Astell presents this same position by way of a parallel between, on the one hand, our lack of knowledge of the mind–body union, and, on the other hand, our lack of knowledge about the relation between God and humans: “Again, tho’ I do not understand the Philosophy of the Union between the Divine and Human Nature; (neither do I comprehend the Vital Union between my Soul and Body, nor how and in what manner they are joyn’d, tho’ I am sure that so it is) …” (Astell 1705, 51 [section 62]). (See section 2.2 for an additional discussion of these passages.)

Astell presents an array of points about how mind–body unions differ from each other with respect to their abilities. At one point, she writes that perhaps activity in this lifetime is the cause:

For as the Diligent-hand maketh Rich, whil’st the Slothful and Prodigal come to nothing, so the Use of our Powers improves and Encreases them, and the most Observing and Considerate is the Wisest Person: For she lays up in her Mind as in a Store-house, ready to produce on all Occasions, a Clear and Simple Idea of every Object that has at any time presented itself. And perhaps the difference between one Womans Reason and anothers may consist only in this, that the one has amass’d a greater number of such Ideas than the other, and dispos’d them more Orderly in her Understanding so that they are at hand, ready to be apply’d to those Complex Ideas whose Agreement or Disagreement cannot be found out by the means of some of ‘em. (Astell SP, 175–176)

A second possible cause of the variety among human abilities is rooted in God’s creation—God makes some minds with larger “capacities” than others: “The Primary Cause of this is that Limitation which all Created Minds are Subject to, which Limitation appears more visible in some than in others, … because some Minds are endow’d by their Creator with a larger Capacity than the rest…” (159). This point about capacity is discussed in greater detail in section 2.2 below. In brief, Astell holds a distinction between “just” and “capacious” thinking. Whereas she describes just thinking as equally distributed among people in that everyone has the same ability to think in harmonious and well-ordered manners, she describes “capacious” thinking as unevenly distributed among people in that some people have more time and training to attain the vast amounts empirical knowledge that go into this kind of mental activity.

A third possible cause of the variety of human abilities is the one familiar to rationalist philosophers, namely that bodies impede minds from having perfect ideas, for “the Indisposition of the Bodily Organs… cramps and contracts the Operations of the Mind” (159). Also: “For did we consider what we Are, that Humane Nature consists in the Union of a Rational Soul with a Mortal Body, that the Body very often Clogs the Mind in its noblest Operations, especially when indulg’d” (210). Here Astell valorizes the mind over the body. The following passage illustrates another way Astell emphasizes this point:

For I question not but that we shoul’d be convinc’d that the Body is the Instrument of the Mind and no more, that it is of such a much Inferiour Nature, and therefore ought to be kept in such a Case as to be ready on all occasions to serve the Mind. That the true and proper Pleasure of Human Nature consists in the exercise of that Dominion which the Soul has over the Body, in governing every Passion and Motion according to Right Reason, by which we most truly pursue the real good of both, it being a mistake as well of our Duty as our Happiness to consider either part of us singly, so as to neglect what is due to the other. For if we disregard the Body wholly, we pretend to live like Angels whilst we are but Mortals; and if we prefer or equal it to the Mind we degenerate into Brutes. (Astell SP, 210–1)

Whereas the body has merely an “instrumental” role with respect to the mind, the mind has “dominion” over the body, and a governing role over the passions. Humans should correctly employ their minds and bodies so that their humanness does not degenerate into brutishness, or so that they do not presumptuously conduct their lives as if they were angels.

Astell’s account of the mind–body union allows her to argue against the popular view of the period about women, according to which women do not demonstrate the same kinds of intellectual abilities as do men because women are inherently more closely united to their bodies than are men. Equipped with the rationalist account of the mind–body union, Astell can show that much of the uniformity of women’s inabilities is rooted not in the nature of their souls, but rather arises because of social practices that have improperly directed their attentions. Thus the difference between the abilities of women and men should be explained not metaphysically, but epistemologically. For this reason, discussion of this issue is left to section 3.2 of this entry.

In addition to developing an account of the mind–body union, Astell also maintains that the mind and body are “really distinct.” Here she again sees how this view is useful to people in their spiritual growth. When people realize that the mind and body are really distinct from each other, they will also realize that the mind is immortal. That is, they will realize that it has a “future state” beyond this “present life.” When they reflect on this future state, they will be prompted to want a “happy eternity, by knowing and doing the will of our maker.” In this way, God will become more important to them. (Astell 1705, CR 246–247 [section 256]).

In presenting her account of the real distinction between the mind and body in Christian Religion, Astell demonstrates first that the mind is immaterial; then she uses this result to show that it is immortal. Her argument is thus: she maintains that the mind is immaterial in that it has no parts, and so is indivisible; given that it is indivisible, it is incorruptible, and therefore immortal (247 [section 257]). Having ruled out the natural annihilation of minds, Astell turns to the question of whether God would supernaturally annihilate minds. She argues that he would not, for God does nothing in vain, thus he would not create something only to annihilate it (248–249 [sections 257–258]).

Within her discussion about the immortality of minds, Astell contrasts minds with bodies, and she also contrasts different kinds of bodies with each other. In doing so, she explains that human bodies and other physical objects have parts, that is, particles that make them up. As beings with parts, human bodies and physical objects are “perishable,” corruptible. There are several things to say about these corruptible beings in contrast with the particles that make them up. First, the particles that make up the corruptible beings are not themselves corruptible. That is, they do not go in and out of being as they do not have parts. But the corruptible beings do come in and out of being when those particles that make them up change in their configurations. She writes:

Because, tho’ this System of Bones, Flesh, and Skin, &. which I call my body, shall within Threescore Years; and this Wood which is now upon the Fire, shall in an Hour or two; and all other Material Beings shall in their proper Seasons be no more; yet not the least Particle doth totally perish. (Astell 1705, 247–248 [section 257])

She continues to describe the individuality of corruptible beings:

So that a Being is Mortal and Corruptible, or ceases to Be, when those parts of which it consists, and whose particular Composition and Figure is that which denominates it this or that Being, and which distinguishes it from all other Beings, are no longer thus or United, but ceasing to appear under their first Texture and Figure, are therefore very properly said to Be no more. (Astell 1705, 248 [section 257])

Notice here that Astell is talking about how we “denominate” corruptible beings as “this or that” kind of being. In addition, note that in explaining this denomination, she is not merely talking about objective features of objects. Though she mentions “Composition and Figure,” which seem like objective features, she is writes about how these “Textures” appear. These qualifications give reason for viewing Astell as holding that a body’s individuality is based at least in part on how perceivers regard it and thus warrant us to consider Astell as a kind of phenomenalist about the individuation of bodies. This kind of view not entail that perceivers are the sources of beings, for it is consistent with the position that God is the ultimate source of all beings, whether they are human beings, pieces of wood, or the small particles that compose these mortal beings. Rather, on this view, the existence of each of these beings depends first and foremost on God, even though perceivers may play a role in assigning them some aspects of their individuality.

Astell discusses additional related issues that are hotly contested in the period. For example, she offers proof of the real distinction between the mind and body is based on the claims that the nature of the mind is thought and the nature of the body is extension (249–252 [sections 259–261]). (Her view can be compared to Descartes’s; see Atherton, 1993.) In addition, she uses her account of the real distinction between the mind and body to show that matter does not think. (Here she likely has in mind Locke’s view about the possibility of thinking matter; see Bryson (1988), Squadrito (1987; 1991), Taylor (2001), O’Neill (1998a, 528–529), and Broad (2002a, 151–153), who discuss these arguments in detail.)

1.3 The Relation between God and His Creatures

According to Astell, there are several ways in which humans stand in relation to the divine. We may distinguish these by calling them causal, ontological, and ethical relationships. It is significant that Astell maintains each one of these, and each has different implications for other aspects of her systematic philosophy. Briefly, what I’m calling the causal relation between God and humans is based in God’s creation of humans; what I’m calling the ontological relation is based in how humans are imbued with a particle of God; what I’m calling the ethical relation is based in the human obligation to love God.

1.3.1 Causal Relationship

The issue of God’s creation of humans and what this means for humans animates a major thread in Astell’s exchange with Norris about two popular views in England at the time—namely those offered by Occasionalists and Cambridge Platonists. Each of these developed different solutions to a purported problem with Descartes’s ontology. According to Descartes, God created two different kinds of substances—mental and corporeal. He held that, on the one hand, these are “really distinct” from each other in virtue of their essences, and, on the other hand, these are sometimes united together to form mind–body unions. When so united, minds and bodies interact with each other, for instance during sensation. The purported problem can now be stated: how can two substances that have completely different essences—essences that render them “really distinct” substances—interact with each other?

With an eye toward resolving this problem, the Cambridge Platonists retained an account of the interaction between the mind and body, and they also presented a quite different interpretation of the number and nature of substances that exist. Henry More, for example, maintained that, in addition to the souls of God and living creatures, there is the “Spirit of Nature,” which is the causal agent that allows human minds and bodies to interact.

The occasionalist philosophers resolved the problem another way: they agreed with Descartes that the mind and body are really distinct because of their quite different natures, but they denied that there is any interaction between them. Instead, they maintained that God orchestrates a harmonious correlation between events of the mind and events of the body, and he is the efficient (and so direct) cause of human sensations.

Throughout Letters, Norris defends his occasionalism against Astell’s critiques, which were based on Cambridge Platonist views about the nature of the mind–body union. In the appendix—written after Norris convinced Astell to allow him to publish the letters as a volume—Astell presents two final criticisms of Norris’s account. First, occasionalism makes much of God’s creation vain: if God is the efficient cause of all of our sense perceptions, then his creation of material objects is superfluous, for they play no direct role in our sense perceptions (Astell, Norris 1695, 278–80). Second, occasionalism offends God’s majesty, for according to it he repeatedly interferes in creation in order to move bodies and create mental events (Astell, Norris 1695, 278). Astell’s own view about the causation of sensation involves an account of a “sensible congruity” between features of external bodies and powers of the soul that are employed in sensations. See O’Neill (2007) for a discussion of Astell’s views and also for the history of these arguments in St. Thomas’ critiques of medieval Islamic occasionalists. See also Ackworth (1979, 174, 178), Taylor (2001, 511–2), Broad (2002a, 109) on Astell’s views on sensible congruity.

1.3.2 Ontological Relationship

Astell holds not only that God creates humans, but that God gives humans a “particle of divinity” that then exists within the self (Astell SP, 53). (Note that this is the case even though the mind is indivisible, as described above in section 1.2.) That is, God and humans share some being with each other. Here Astell follows in the tradition of the Cambridge Platonists, maintaining that human beings are “deiform” in this manner. This point has implications for Astell’s theory of education (described below in section 3.1).

Note that it might seem as though the ontological and causal relations are the same relations. They are, indeed, both metaphysical relationships. However, there are important differences between these two relationships. For example, it is possible to hold that humans are caused by God without holding that humans have something of God in them. In such a case, there is a causal relationship, but not an ontological one. For Astell, though, humans are not just Divinely caused, they are also Divinely imbued. Thus humans are in both causal and ontological relationships with God.

1.3.3 Ethical Relationship

According to Astell, in addition to being in causal and ontological relationships with God, they are also in an ethical relationship with God: they are to love God. (Additional ethical and theological ramifications of Astell’s view about this obligation are discussed in section 4.3.)

Why humans should love God and what this love “looks like” constitutes a major thread of discussion between Astell and John Norris in Letters Concerning the Love of God. Here Astell debates with Norris about the nature of God’s causality and human’s subsequent obligation to love God, discussing the pros and cons of occasionalist and Cambridge Platonist accounts. (See Wilson, 2004, for a detailed discussion of this text.) Norris had claimed in Practical Discourses upon Several Divine Subjects (1693) that we should love God because he alone is the source of our sensation, and so the source of our pleasure, and so the source of our good. Note here Norris holds that the causal relationship humans have with God determines the ethical relationship that humans have to God. Astell objects: our reason for loving God should not depend on the occasionalist tenet about God’s direct causal role in the universe. As their discussion continues, they touch on a range of issues, including the extent of God’s causal role in creation, the causal powers of physical objects, the workings of human sense perception, the mind–body union, and the ways humans can and should love God and his creation.

Though Astell and Norris disagree on the philosophical basis of why humans should love God, they agree on many aspects of their account of what love is. According to their view, they hold that love is an integral aspect of minds: as bodies have motion so minds have love. They also agree that there are two basic kinds of love and that these are differentiated in part with respect to the objects on which the love is focused, whether human or God. They hold that humans are to offer each other “benevolence” and offer God “desire.” Why? First it is useful to understand how these two forms of love differ: benevolence is a love in which one being wishes another well; desire is a love a being has when some other being is their good and can satisfy their need.

Humans, like any created being, lacks the causal power to ultimately satisfy the metaphysical needs of other created beings. Thus, it does not make sense for them to desire each other. They can, though, wish each other well. This kind of love is marked by its disinterestedness (that is, the well-wisher does not expect anything to be given in response) and it is motivated by altruism and charity.

Whereas humans cannot satisfy the metaphysical needs of each other, God can satisfy humans’ needs. Thus God merits human “desire,” which is a love of something insofar as it is our good. However, though we properly “desire” God, we do not properly offer him “benevolence”: God does not need our well-wishing, for God does not lack anything that we could offer.

2. Epistemology

Astell develops three themes common to rationalism: an emphasis of the mind over the body; a theory of innate ideas as the origin of knowledge; and a methodology that leads the novice from confusion to clarity. Section 1 above on metaphysics, addresses Astell’s emphasis of the mind over body. This section reconstructs her accounts of mind, ideas, knowledge, belief, and method.

2.1 Mind and Ideas

Astell holds that the mind has two faculties: the understanding and the will. The understanding is the capacity to receive and compare ideas, and the will is the power of preferring and directing thoughts and motions (Astell SP, 205). Each faculty has a proper object: the proper object of the understanding is truth, which has “being from Eternity in the Divine Ideas” (137); the proper object of the will is the good, which is God’s will (206). When the understanding is healthy, it has knowledge (130); when the will is healthy, it is regular—that is, it is guided by the understanding (205, 209). The task of the understanding is to govern the will by obtaining truth (130).

Astell holds a view according to which there are not merely innate ideas, but also innate inclinations. She explains that the innate ideas are “rudiments of knowledge” (128) that are “inseparable” from the understanding and are the sources of our other ideas (Astell SP, 205). In addition, she states that we are born with inclinations that are “inseparable” from the will (205). She explains that our innate ideas make us rational creatures. Irrational creatures, on the other hand, act according to the will of God and by mechanism. But equipped with reason, humans are voluntary agents: we choose our actions according to principles in the understanding, and we determine our wills (128).

Astell provides two accounts of ideas, one general and one strict. In doing so, she presents her views on knowledge and clear and distinct perceptions. Here is the general account of ideas, which is broad enough to encompass all thinking:

By Ideas we sometimes understand in general all that which is the immediate Object of the Mind, whatever it Perceives; and in this large Sense it may take in all Thought, all that we are any ways capable of Discerning: So when we have no Idea of a thing, ’tis as much as to say we know nothing of the matter. (168)

In the general sense, ideas—the immediate objects of the mind—are required for knowledge insofar as we need to have some idea of a thing in order to have knowledge of it in the sense that we are familiar with it. But Astell also gives a stricter, more restricted account of the term 'idea' when she is talking about the more philosophical notion of knowledge as that which is clear and distinct:

Again, it [the word ‘idea’] is more strictly taken for that which represents to the Mind some object distinct from it, whether Clearly or Confusedly; when this is its import, our Knowledge is said to be as Clear as our Ideas are. For that Idea which represents a thing so Clearly, that by an Attent and Simple View we may discern its Properties and Modifications, at least so far as they can be Known, is never false; for our Certainty and Evidence depends on it, if we Know not Truly what is thus represented to our Minds we know nothing. (Astell SP, 168)

Ideas in the strict sense represent what is distinct from the mind. As such, ideas must be clear in order for them to afford knowledge.

For Astell, though ideas can be confused, they are not themselves the sources of error. Rather, Astell locates falsity and error in both judgments and in language (169, 171). About judgment: she holds that judgment involves the comparison of two ideas; error arises when we lack an “intermediate idea” (a “middle term”) in order to make a judgment (146–7, 172–3) (see section 2.2 for a discussion of middle terms). It will help us to avoid this kind of error in judgment if we properly use our words that are associated with ideas (172). To do this kind of work, we need to first examine ideas about morality and religion, separating the ideas we apprehend through philosophical reflection from those we have adopted by custom, the latter of which are so often not true ideas. For example, Astell stresses that women need to release the false ideas they have about their natures (ideas they gained from their society) and come to understand that they have immortal natures based in the “particle of Divinity” that they have within their selves (53). Ultimately all reasonings and deductions should begin from ideas that are clear and are “as distinct as the nature of the subject will permit” (169–72). (This issue has implications for Astell’s ethics, as explained in section 4 below.)

2.2 Intuition and Authority, Knowledge and Faith

Astell offers her account of knowledge and faith in order to explain that people should become aware of how these two different ways of apprehending truth are not just different, but rather that there are ways in which faith is superior to knowledge. Many people hold that knowledge should be praised over faith because knowledge cannot be disbelieved, whereas faith can. But Astell resists this view. She explains that there are some aspects of faith that make it even more praiseworthy than knowledge, even though what is grasped by faith can be disbelieved. Her account of knowledge is explained first, then her account of faith, then her discussion of the different “modes of understanding” that can arise from these when used in combination. We conclude with a practical reason for why Astell finds this discussion so important—it is integral to current discussions about education and privilege, namely about the education of workers of all sexes and women of the gentry.

One of the first things to note about Astell’s account of knowledge is how different it is from the view that is so often held by analytic philosophers of the 20th and 21st centuries. According to the latter’s view, knowledge is true, justified belief. Astell, however, holds a view of knowledge according to which it is marked by its origin, clarity, distinctness, and the means by which it is affirmed. On her view, the highest form of epistemic grasp that we have of truth is via an ability she calls “intuition” (146). She writes that intuition yields just a few truths, each of which is self-evident (150). At one point she describes intuition as an “immediate View” (Astell SP, 149). As such, intuition is a capacity that directly apprehends truths; this means that these direct apprehensions are not first beliefs that later are found to be justified. Rather Astellian intuitions are themselves self-evident, not needing external justification. In the context of this discussion, Astell directly cites Descartes’s words from Principles of Philosophy, Part I, section 45 (AT VIIIA 21–2; CSM I 207):

That (to use the Words of a Celebrated Author) may be said to be “Clear which is Present and Manifest to an attentive Mind;” so as we say we see Objects Clearly, when being present to our Eyes they sufficiently Act on ’em, and our Eyes are dispos’d to regard ’em. And that Distinct, which is so Clear, Particular, and Different from all other things, that it contains not any thing in it self which appears not manifestly to him who considers it as he ought. (Astell SP, 172)

Though Astell uses some of Descartes’s language when describing intuitions, she diverges from his views on issues of which ideas are clear and distinct, holding that ideas of God and of our own souls are clear, but not distinct (173), noting that although we can know some of the attributes of these substances, we cannot know their true natures (173). In addition, she explains that we do not have a distinct idea of God because he is infinite, and she notes that there are additional reasons for offering this view, though the “Reasons [are] too long to be mentioned here” (173).

She does, however, explain that the idea of God is gained by intuition, and that according to this intuition we apprehend that “GOD is One Simple Essence, Undivided, and Infinite in all Perfection” (147). Astell explains that once we have some intuitions, we can draw deductions from them and thus attain additional truths that themselves cannot be doubted. Astell uses the term ‘science’ to describe this kind of knowledge (149). Astell does not give an example, but perhaps she has in mind Descartes’s deductions of the laws of physics from the clear and distinct perceptions of God and corporeal substance, for example, his deduction of the law of conservation of motion and the law of inertia (Principles II, 36 and 37; CSM I 239–40; AT VIIIA 61–3).

But there is another kind of truth that we hold, one apprehended in a quite different way from how we apprehend via intuition. This is faith. Truths apprehended by faith are brought to us via authority versus intuition. When the authority is Divine (that is, when it is brought by revelation), then we gain “Divine faith” (149). Our perceptions of these truths are clear or distinct (149). Astell uses the term ‘opinion’ to describe these apprehensions and all the additional truths that are deduced from them.

In some cases, we apprehend two truths, but we do not have a third “middle” term to compare them. For example, we apprehend (by both intuition and authority) that God is one simple essence that is undivided and infinite. In addition, we also apprehend by authority that God is Father, Son, and Holy Spirit (147). How can these both be true? Astell explains that we have no third idea that we could use to compare them. She explains that God did not impart this third idea to us because it would be “too dazzling, too bright for Mortality to bear.” Does this mean that it is unreasonable to accept these two truths? Not for Astell. She explains that we know both, though we do not know the manner in which both are true (148). Though Astell does not give further explanation here of how a “middle term” would function to help us know the manner in which they are both true, she likely has in mind something like the following: though we can apprehend both a triangle and a straight angle, we might be perplexed if someone told us that they were equivalent. Our confusion would be relieved once we realized that each one measured 180 degrees. Thus “amount of degrees” is the manner in which the triangle and straight angle are equivalent. Similarly, we lack an idea that allows us to square (so to speak) the seemingly opposed truths that God is simple and undivided with the truth that God is Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. Thus we must hold the congruity of two truths as a matter of faith. Astell gives additional examples: we know and feel the mind-body union, but we know neither the “secret ties” that unite them nor how they interact; we know we have liberty and we know God governs all, but we do not have a middle term to reconcile these (see section 1.2 for a related discussion of these passages).

We can now address Astell’s claim that knowledge (science) and faith (opinion) are not merely on a par, but that there are ways in which faith is superior to knowledge. Note first that the two are different in at least two ways: (1) they are the results of different abilities—intuition (for knowledge/science) and authority (for faith/opinion); and (2) they have different aspects to them, science being immutable and opinion being variable (150). However, as Astell explains, these differences do not imply that one is rationally proved and thus certain and that the other is not. Rather, Astell emphasizes that they are proved in different ways: “Science Demonstrates things that are Seen, so Faith is the Evidence of such as are Not Seen” (150; note that Astell here references Hebrews 11:1–6 from the Christian Bible). We should not expect that knowledge and faith work in the same way, as they are the results of such different capacities; as every sense has its proper object (the eyes have colors, the ears have sounds, etc.), so every capacity of the understanding has its proper object: science has as its objects truths that can cannot be disbelieved (because of their clarity and/or distinctness), whereas faith has as its objects truths that are not marked by distinctness or clarity, and thus can admit of disbelief (151). Thus faith requires a deliberate activity of the will that knowledge does not: when we have knowledge, our will is compelled by the clarity of the perception; but when we have faith, our will is not so compelled. Given this, faith has a special result that knowledge lacks; that is, faith involves an activity of the will that is capable of reward (151).

In addition, Astell explains that we should not claim that science is somehow more certain than faith. In comparison with truths held by science, we can gain as much if not more certainty when we hold a truth via faith if we show (1) that God gave us the truth and (2) God is not deceived or a deceiver (151). Indeed, Astell holds that revelation is an improvement on reason (147).

For Astell, what is most important is that we align our abilities with their proper objects: we should believe objects of faith, we should know objects of knowledge (152). That is, we should not place faith in what is an object of science, nor should we adhere “blindly to the Dictates of some famous Philosopher in Physical Truths, the Principles of which we have as much right to examine, and to make deductions from ‘em as he had” (152).

This connects to Astell’s view on wisdom: “to Know what is to be Known, and to Believe what is to be Believ’d is the property of a Wise person” (152). It also provides one of the theoretical bases for Astell’s views on education, which focuses in part on how to grasp truths that can be self-evident (see section 3.2). Astell points out how this distinction between knowledge and belief was playing a role in current controversies about gender, education, and social rank (close to what we today understand as social class). Some of this discussion centered around issues of people’s free time that could be used for study. Locke, for example, thought that men of the gentry and nobility had the time and means to gain knowledge, but that everyone else without these gendered, financial, and social privileges who lacked this time and/or the means to improve themselves (and their “capacities”) could make do with belief. Consider what Locke writes in On the Reasonableness of Christianity:

The greatest part of mankind want leisure or capacity for demonstration, nor can they carry a train of proofs, which in that way they must always depend upon for conviction, and cannot be required to assent to till they see the demonstration. Whenever they stick, the teachers are always put upon proof, and must clear the doubt, by a thread of coherent deductions from the first principle, how long, or how intricate soever that be. And you may as soon hope to have all the day-labourers and tradesmen, the spinsters and dairy-maids, perfect mathematicians, as to have them perfect in ethics this way: hearing plain commands, is the sure and only course to bring them to obedience and practice. The greatest part cannot know, and therefore they must believe. (Reasonabless of Christianity, section 243 in Locke’s Works, vol 7, p. 143, and see also Reasonableness, section 302; see also Essay Concerning Human Understanding 4.20.2–3; for a discussion of these issues, see Wolterstorff 1996, p. 71 ff.)

With his reference to “day-labourers,” “tradesmen,” “spinsters,” and “dairy-maids,” Locke is explicitly speaking of people of all genders who work with their hands. But the term ‘spinster’ can also refer to the single gentry woman—that is, to someone like Astell herself. Thus Locke’s statement lends itself to the following interpretation: whereas people with greater gendered, financial, and social privilege should think for themselves, people who are without such privilege should listen “to plain commands.” That is, they should be told what to think without fully understanding why they should think those things. In other words, they should follow authority, whether that be God’s authority or human authority.

There are important issues of consent involved here. Consider even on the most charitable reading of Locke’s statement, according to which he is speaking about wanting to make life easier for people who do not have time and resources to gain education in religious matters and thus aim to serve them in their best interests. Who is to prevent the kind of manipulation that can happen when a religious teacher oversteps their bounds and issues “plain commands” that manipulate people against their best interests? Shouldn’t the socially marginalized people be able to defend themselves against this kind of situation by fully understanding for themselves the truths that are in their best interests?

It is for these kinds of reasons that Astell resists this view. In contrast to Locke’s view, she argues that all people, regardless of gender and social station (and thus temporal constraints), have the ability to have clear and distinct ideas that are obtained by spiritual practices like the ones of philosophical meditation that she and Descartes each offers. As she puts it, “For the difference between a plow-man and a Doctor does not seem to me to consist in this, That the Business of the one is to search after Knowledge, and that the other has nothing to do with it” (Astell SP, 153). Further she writes: “The Meanest Person shou’d Think as Justly, tho’ not as Capaciously, as the greatest Philosopher” (168). According to Astell, no matter where a person is situated within the social strata of society and no matter what their gender is, they should be able to have well-ordered thoughts—that is, thoughts that are “just.” She admits that everyone may not have time to have as many thoughts as someone else—that is, they may not have time to do vast amounts of empirical study, book learning, and language learning as someone else who has more time to dedicate to these kinds of endeavors that would give them “capacious” learning. But for Astell, such capacious thinking is not as important as just thinking. In addition, the process of attaining just thinking does not take a long amount of time, and everyone should be given the opportunity to think in this way. Thus, Astell advocates for everyone’s need to have the kind of philosophical meditation that yields well-ordered, harmonious thinking.

3. Method: Philosophy of Education

One thread that runs through rationalist philosophies concerns the relation between knowledge and method. Methods are pedagogical strategies that lead novices from confusion to knowledge (clarity). As long as novices are confused, it is because they lack a method that leads them from their particular forms of confusion to knowledge. The job of the philosopher is to understand the confusions and to devise a method that will support the novices on their journeys (see Nelson 2005). For example, Plato explains how the body confuses the soul, and he illustrates how the dialectic can lead his interlocutor to grasp the forms. Descartes agrees with Plato about the body’s confusion of the soul, adding that scholastic teachings lead to further confusion, especially in that they reinforce childhood prejudice, which is rooted in an overemphasis on the senses. His famous method of doubt is one instantiation of his general account of method, encapsulated in the four rules he presents in Part II of Discourse on the Method (AT VI 18–9; CSM I 20). In Discourse on the Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, the meditator utilizes the method of doubt so she can move from confusion and obscurity to clarity and distinctness. This issue relates to epistemology (because it is about knowledge, see section 2) and ethics (insofar as confusion and knowledge inform moral agency and action, see section 4).

Like Plato and Descartes, Astell provides an explanation of the novice’s initial confusion and offers a method that can be employed to resolve the condition. In doing so, she focuses on the trajectory of a very specific group of female novices, namely the “Ladies” she names in the title of her text A Serious Proposal to the Ladies. These are the gentry and noble women of her social circle, women who are predominantly English and likely identify as White, which is a new racial category just being constructed during Astell’s century. Thus, Astell is not theorizing the condition of all women, for she is not talking about, for example, the women of various races and national origins whom she and her peers paid, indentured, and/or enslaved to serve them, both at home and abroad (see Perry, 1986, 253–62, for a discussion of the ways in which Astell’s patrons were involved in colonialist ventures). In what follows, the women Astell is theorizing are referred to in ways that continue to make it clear that they were a specific group of women—they were, for example, “Astell’s novices,” “the women of Astell’s intended audience,” or (simply) the “Ladies.”

Astell theorizes what is specific about her novice’s initial confusions and she constructs a method tailored specifically for them. In doing so, she theorizes some of the political issues about power that are intertwined with how these epistemic problems arise, and she also theorizes how they can be resolved. Note that Astell theorizes “some” of the political issues. On the one hand, she addresses how these women are disadvantaged and dominated by men of their rank and race, as well as by the institutions that support these men. But on the other hand, she does not theorize the ways in which these women themselves—herself included—were advantaged and elevated by their gender, sexuality, race, rank, and national origin, as well as by the colonial institutions that supported Astell and her audience. That is, Astell is theorizing her own and her audience’s domination by men, but not these women’s privilege.

As Astell sees it, the problem that faces her novice is that this woman has a diseased mind as the result of social conditioning in a hierarchy that disadvantages her because of (what we today call) her gender. This diseased mind manifests in part as a particular skeptical predicament: she has a radical doubt about her nature, for she believes God made her with a degraded reason and a natural pride and vanity. That is, she adopts the prejudice that she is incapable of improving because she sees herself as naturally proud and vain (Astell SP, 58, 62). Gripped with this skeptical predicament, she has no desire to improve her mind, and she lacks an ability to understand her perfections, which would otherwise guide her in living a virtuous life (80–1, 200, 202, 228). Thus she develops an account of (what has been called by Sowaal [2007, 2016]) the Women’s Defective Nature Prejudice, and develops strategies for how to resolve it (see sections 3.1 and 3.2). (See Forbes for how this view of prejudice connects with contemporary feminism.)

Another way Astell frames the problem facing the women of her audience is in terms of an account of the passions. She maintains that all “Rational Natures” have within them both generosity and a striving for perfection (62). Here we assume she is using the term ‘generosity’ in the Cartesian sense. Descartes writes:

The first consists in his knowing that nothing truly belongs to him but this freedom to dispose his volitions, and that he ought to be praised or blamed for no other reason than his using this freedom well or badly. The second consists in his feeling within himself a firm and constant resolution to use it well—that is, never to lack the will to undertake and carry out whatever he judges to be best. To do that is to pursue virtue in a perfect manner. (AT 11 445–6; CSM I 364)

For our purposes, this passage can be glossed in the following manner: a person has generosity when she realizes that she is merely her will and she has the resolution to use it well. For Descartes, generosity is both a passion and a virtue. It is the keystone passion in that when one has it, one does not have vices. This is so because vices rest on a misunderstanding of what one is and what one’s goods are. (See Sowaal 2017 for a longer discussion of Astell on generosity.)

Astell explains that because the women of her audience are not provided with effective educations in the knowledge of what things exist and what their properties are (that is, an education in metaphysics), they do not develop the knowledge of what they truly are (their wills), nor do they develop the resolution to use their wills well. Instead, they focus on creating physical perfection and also on the praises that accompany it. Thus they develop vanity and pride, the “feminine vices” (Astell SP, 62–64).

Ultimately, Astell has in mind two goals regarding the transformation of the women she addresses: one for their “temporal” lifetimes, one for their “eternal” lifetimes, namely their salvation.

For this lifetime: these women need to gain “empire” over their selves. Indeed, Astell employs the term ‘empire’ many times in Serious Proposal to mean self-control (56, 58, 72, 86). Of course, for Astell, this empire is the result of divine grace (not human effort), which may be occasioned when a person engages in spiritual practices of surrender. (See Kotva for a discussion of effort and grace in the early modern period.)

With respect to salvation: these women need to learn to separate their minds from their bodies while on earth. If they do not learn to perfect their rational capacities by forming clear and distinct perceptions—thereby polishing their innate ideas and ordering and employing them correctly—, then they will not be able to separate their minds from their bodies when they die, and their souls will not reach heaven. She writes:

And since our Happiness in the next World, depends so far on those dispositions which we carry along with us out of this, that without a right habitude and temper of mind we are not capable of Felicity; and seeing our Beatitude consists in the contemplation of the divine Truth and Beauty, as well as in the fruition of his Goodness, can Ignorance be a fit preparative for Heaven? Is’t likely that she whose Understanding has been busied about nothing but froth and trifles, shou’d be capable of delighting her self in noble and sublime Truths? (80–81)

In this way Astell’s rationalist education remedies a practical problem of the individuation of the body and soul at death by suggesting a path for a specific group of women. This elucidates the kind of education Astell promotes: it is not preparation for a career as a doctor, lawyer, curate, or scientist; nor is it the precursor to what we today call a “liberal education.” Instead it is an education that teaches the women of her rank and race how to cultivate intellectual enjoyment and perfection, and ultimately generosity and virtue.

Astell recognizes that these women need to employ a method to aid them in these practices that will prepare them for grace. These women have been raised to be idle and to concern themselves with frivolous things. When they seek to better themselves, they do not know how to do so, and so they are quickly discouraged: “they want [lack] the method of doing it; they know not how to look into their Souls, or if they do, they find so many disorders to be rectified, so many wants to be supplied, that frightened with the difficulty of the world they lay aside the thoughts of undertaking it” (124).

Astell offers two proposals for the education of the women she directly addresses and seeks to teach. One takes place at a women’s monastery she calls the Religious Retirement, the other can be done outside such an institution.

3.1 Method for Inhabitants of a Monastic Community

Astell is keen to offer a method for a person who is living in a monastic-like community to use to gain knowledge. She also explains how and why this method works; in doing so, she employs her account of human nature and the way that it can degenerate into ignorance.

For Astell, the issue of knowledge and ignorance is always also an issue of health and disease. As stated above, Astell, like the Cambridge Platonists, holds that the human being is “deiform,” it is divinely imbued with a “particle of Divinity” that exists “within” it’s soul (Astell SP, 53). (For a discussion of deiform in Cambridge Platonists, see Gill, chapters 1–3.) When a person is healthy, this divinity within expresses itself as a “spark of Piety” (107). But when people internalize prejudices that they have learned from the “Tyrant Custom” (67), they do not nurture this particle of Divinity, but rather they develop a “spiritual” “disease” (84, 88, 102, 74), a disease which comes with many prejudices. Healing will come to the Ladies who enter the Religious Retirement when they learn how to transform every “Spot” that has turned into a prejudice that is marring “the beauty of [their] lovely Soul[s]” (87).

In order to heal, the “Ladies” at the Religious Retirement will engage in individual and communal spiritual practices that teach them how to “look into” their own souls (41), “into” each other’s souls (100), and into the “Soul” of the “happy Society” itself (87). When a person practices “looking into” the souls of oneself, one’s fellow, and one’s community, her body and soul will gather with these additional bodies and souls such that they form into “one body, whose Soul is love” (87). When each person in the group does this, then each person’s spark gathers with each other person’s spark. Together, these sparks unite into one, “breathing forth it self in flames of holy desires after GOD and acts of Benevolence to each other” (87).

Astell maintains that as these Ladies engage in these practices, they will get closer to attaining a perfected spiritual condition that consists in piety, apprehension of truth, generosity, and friendship, each of which is needed for these Ladies to engage in their proper vocations.

3.2 Method for People Living Outside a Monastic Community

Though Astell thinks that communal prayer, like that described above, is one way of gaining access to the truth, she also recognizes additional methods that will lead a person to metaphysical knowledge. In doing so, she suggests in Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Part II, that the women of her audience employ six rules that will aid them in their metaphysical reflections (176–9).

Rule 1: “Acquaint our selves thoroughly with the State of the Question, have a Distinct Notion of our Subject whatever it be, and of the Terms we make use of, knowing precisely what it is we drive at.”
Rule 2: “Cut off all needless Ideas and whatever has not a necessary Connexion to the matter under consideration.”
Rule 3: “To conduct our Thoughts by Order, beginning with the most Simple and easie Objects, and ascending by Degrees to the Knowledge of more Compos’d.”
Rule 4: “Not to leave out part of our Subject unexamin’d.”
Rule 5: “Always keep our Subject Directly in our Eye, and Closely pursue it thro all, our Progress.”
Rule 6: “To judge no further than we Perceive, and not to take anything for Truth, which we do not evidently Know to be so.”

Like many of Astell’s views and distinctions, these rules are ripe for comparison with Descartes’s, as well as with those presented by Arnauld and Nicole. Indeed, these rules are part of Astell’s version of Arnauld and Nicole’s Port-Royal Logic, which she designs specifically for the women of her audience so that they can escape their everyday skepticism; only once they resolve their skeptical predicaments can they begin to embark on a project of reflection involving philosophical skepticism, as Descartes presents it in Discourse on the Method and Meditations on First Philosophy (see Sowaal 2007).

The method encapsulated in these six rules is to be employed when a meditator addresses a particular subject of inquiry. Astell recognizes that even prior to such reflections, the meditator must first disengage from the skeptical predicament that can arise from having adopted the social prejudice that they are defective (see section 3). Instead of holding beliefs because authorities told them to, and instead of continuing to hold them because they once did, these women should learn to maintain beliefs because they are self-evident. To learn how to reveal self-evident truths, Astell suggests a number of strategies. One strategy involves reflecting on how the former prejudices led to mischief, promoted error, and hindered the free range of thought. Another strategy involves reflecting on how the prejudices provided a means for skepticism to take root. For example, when one holds a belief, one often draws further conclusions from it. But when one finds that the conclusion is false, one often questions the whole group of claims, concluding that nothing can be known (Astell SP, 133–4). Here Astell’s treatment is largely Cartesian.

However, Astell departs from the Cartesian project when she presents another strategy her novice can use to release herself from the skeptical predicament. This strategy involves reflecting on teleological arguments about the design of God’s creation (153–4, 168). These arguments are designed to help the novice realize that God would not have created her so that she is naturally defective (that is, naturally proud, vain, and unimprovable). Such reflection will lead the novice to search for the perfections God has bestowed upon her and the role they play in her life, as well as in her community and creation as a whole. Through these considerations, she will be drawn to the conclusion that she is a rational being who can and ought to improve her rationality in order to fulfill God’s plan for creation.

Ultimately Astell’s novice will benefit from metaphysical reflection on what truly exists—God, mind, and body—for such reflection will result in her correctly understanding what she is and how she stands in relation to God. A central aspect of this will be her new comprehension of the understanding, the will, and the origin of error. She will come to grasp that the limitation of the understanding is not a defect, but rather that limitations are natural and necessary; thus, while ignorance cannot be avoided, error can. She will realize that the understanding is passive and that judgment—and therefore error—belongs to the will. She will learn to suspend her judgment until she has clarity and to direct her will to a good end (159). With this new understanding of her will and her new resolution to develop better habits in employing her will, her generosity (which formerly degraded into pride, vanity) will be restored, as will her virtue.

4. Ethics

Astell can also be read as contributing to several different kinds of ethical frameworks and theories.

4.1 Ethics as Care of the Self

Astell can be read as part of a long-standing ethical tradition that is focused on the self and how it relates to its own moral agency. This has been described recently by Hadot and Foucault as “philosophy as a way of life.” Like philosophers in this tradition, Astell focuses on the self and its condition (see sections 1.3, 3.1), articulates spiritual practices that the self can use to further its relationship with truth (see sections 3.1, 3.2), offers ways for the self to critique social customs (see section 2.1), and attends to ways the self can continue to grow in freedom from domination (see section 3). In philosophizing in this manner, Astell is steeped in Christian theology and the traditions of monasticism. (See Webb 2020 for a reading of Astell as a “care of the self” philosopher; see Kendrick 2018 for a reading of Astell as informed by Christian theology.)

4.2 Virtue Theory

Astell can be read as working within the virtue theory tradition, which focuses on the character of the moral agent, for she writes about themes like virtue, moral education, moral judgment, character, friendship, and the role of passions in moral action. However, it can be argued that Astell should be considered a virtue “theorist”—and not be considered a virtue “ethicist”—because she does not hold the tenet that goodness is metaphysically prior to rightness. (See Broad 2016 for a reading along these lines.)

When discussing the passions, Astell draws on Descartes, explaining that passions arise out of the mind-body union. Like Descartes, she holds that we will always have passions, for we are embodied souls. Given that we will always have passions, it is a good practice to learn how to properly direct them and even remedy them, if needed. This task involves properly aligning passions correctly with reason such that they develop into virtues.

Astell develops her account of the passions by arguing that specific passions are not naturally connected with men versus women. That is, women and men do not necessarily have virtues or vices that align with (what we today call) the gender of their bodies. Rather, anyone—despite their gender—can have any passion, virtue, or vice. This means that even men can develop the so-called “feminine vices.” This point is important to Astell because of (what can be called) the Women’s Defective Nature Prejudice, described above (in section 3), according to which Astell’s “Ladies” are seen as naturally having “feminine vices” such as imprudence, vanity, and pride. Astell shows that such vices are not natural or inherent features of the souls of women. (See Sowaal 2007 and 2016 for a reading along these lines.)

The passion that is central to Astell’s theory is love. Her account of love draws on neo-Platonic Christian ethics and traditions of monasticism (especially practices of communal contemplation, meditation, simplification, and prayer). According to Astell, humans have both an ability and duty to love. Section 1.3 above discussed the metaphysical implications Astell draws from this; here and in the next section, we turn to the ethical and religious implications.

For Christian philosophers, Astell included, the love of God is central to theological ethics, for it is one of the two lessons that Jesus emphasized from his Jewish education and commanded of his followers: love God and love your neighbor as yourself (Matthew 22: 36–40). Thus the philosopher can ask: what makes it possible for us to discharge these duties? That is, how is the world made such that we can love God and love each other? As mentioned above, Astell addresses these issues by describing two kinds of love—that of desire and benevolence. We can now say a bit more about her view: for Astell, the human ability to desire God—that is, to stand before God and ask that God complete the human self—allows for the possibility for humans to offer benevolence to each other—that is, to truly wish each other well. These are the grounds for Astell’s account of friendship, which is a theory that allows for universal friendship that does not require either partiality or reciprocity (unlike what is required for Aristotelian friendship). In writing about friendship, Astell is especially interested in giving an account of how women can be “spiritual” friends with each other. Thus she examines same-sex friendship, and she considers women’s social bonds as they exist outside of the family unit. (See Kendrick 2018 for a reading along these lines.)

4.3 Deontological Ethics

Given that Astell discusses duties to love God and neighbor, it is possible to read Astell as part of the deontological tradition. This tradition focuses on moral agents insofar as they have duties they must discharge. Such a reading may develop along the following lines.

Humans have duties to God based on their relationship with God: the human originates in God and God communicates his perfections—namely those of freedom and rationality—to the human; thus humans have the duty to understand and obey God’s will, participate in the divine, contribute to the world’s moral perfection, and bring glory to God.

Humans also have duties to themselves and their fellows, namely to cultivate their own rational capacities and to help others do the same. This discharge has social ramifications: a human with perfected rationality and freedom has the ability to engage properly in friendships and marriages.

In this way, Astell’s educational plans for the “Ladies” can help these women develop rationality and freedom such that they can properly discharge their duties to themselves, their fellows, and God. (See Lascano 2016 for a reading along these lines.)


Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, A. and Nicole, P., Logic or the Art of Thinking: Containing, besides rules, several new observations appropriate for forming judgment, J. V. Buroker (tr. and ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Astell, M., The Christian Religion, As Profess’d by a Daughter of the Church of England. In a Letter to the Right Honourable, T.L. C.I., London: R. Wilkin, 1705.
  • –––, Astell: Political Writings, P. Springborg (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • –––, [SP], A Serious Proposal to the Ladies. Parts I and II, P. Springborg (ed.), Ontario: Broadview Literary Texts, 2002.
  • –––, The Christian Religion, As Professed by a Daughter of the Church of England, J. Broad (ed.), Toronto, ON: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies and Iter Publishing, 2013.
  • Astell, M. and Norris, J., Letters Concerning the Love of God, Between the Author of the Proposal to the Ladies and Mr. John Norris: Wherein his late Discourse, shewing That it ought to be intire and exclusive of all other Loves, is further cleared and justified, London: J. Norris, 1695.
  • –––, Letters Concerning the Love of God, E. D. Taylor and M. New (ed.), Aldershot: Ashgate, 2005.
  • Descartes, R., The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch (eds. and trs.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985, Vol. I (abbreviated as ‘CSM’ and cited by page number).
  • –––, Oeuvres de Descartes, C. Adam and P. Tannery (eds.), Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin, 1996, Vol. VI (abbreviated as ‘AT’ and cited by page number).
  • Locke, J., An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, P. H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Norris, J., Practical Discourses Upon several Divine Subjects, London: S. Manship, 1693.

Secondary Sources

  • The secondary sources listed below will be of particular interest to philosophers who are pursuing further examination of Astell’s metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and social and political philosophy.
  • Achinstein, S., 2007, “Mary Astell. Religion and Feminism: Texts in Motion”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener & M. Michelson, Burlington, VT: Ashgate, pp. 17–30.
  • Acworth, R., 1979, The Philosophy of John Norris of Bemerton (1657–1712), Hildesheim/New York: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • Alvarez, D. P., 2011, “Reason and Religious Tolerance: Mary Astell’s Critique of Shaftesbury”, Eighteenth Century Studies, 44(4): 475–494.
  • Apetrei, S., 2008a, “‘Call no man master upon earth’: Mary Astell’s Tory Feminism and an Unknown Correspondence”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 41(4): 507–23.
  • –––, 2008b, Women, Feminism and Religion in Early Enlightenment England, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Atherton, M., 1993, “Cartesian Reason and Gendered Reason”, in A Mind of One’s Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity, L.M. Antony and C. Witt (eds.), Boulder and Oxford: Westview Press, pp. 19–34.
  • Bejan, T.M., 2019, “‘Since All the World is mad, why should I be so?’ Mary Astell on Equality, Hierarchy, and Ambition”, in Political Theory, 47(6): 781–808.
  • Broad, J., 2002a, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Broad, J., 2002b, “Mary Astell (1666–1731)”, in British Philosophers 1500–1899, P.B. Dematteis and P.S. Fosl (eds.), Dictionary of Literary Biography 252, pp. 3–10.
  • –––, 2003, “Adversaries or Allies? Occasional Thoughts on the Masham-Astell Exchange”, Eighteenth-Century Thought, 1: 123–49.
  • –––, 2007, “Astell, Cartesian Ethics, and the Critique of Custom”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 165–179.
  • –––, 2009, “Mary Astell on Virtuous Friendship”, Parergon: Journal of the Australian and New Zealand Association for Medieval and Early Modern Studies, 26(2): 65–86.
  • –––, 2014, “Mary Astell on Marriage and Lockean Slavery”, History of Political Thought, 35(4): 717–738.
  • –––, 2015, The Philosophy of Mary Astell: An Early Modern Theory of Virtue, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016, “Mary Astell and the Virtues”, in Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss (eds.), State College, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 16–34.
  • Broad, J. and K. Green, 2009, A History of Women’s Political Thought in Europe, 1400–1700, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bryson, C.B., 1988, “Mary Astell: Defended of the ‘Disembodied Mind’”, Hypatia, 13(4): 40–62.
  • Carroll, B. A., 1990, “The Politics of ‘Originality’: Women and the Class System of the Intellect,” Journal of Women’s History, 2(2): 136–63.
  • Coogan, M. D., et al., (eds.), 2010, The New Oxford Annotated Bible: New Revised Standard Version: An Ecumenical Study Bible. College ed.; Fully rev. 4th ed, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Detlefsen, K. 2016. “Custom, Freedom and Equality: Mary Astell on Marriage and Women’s Education”, in Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss (eds.), State College, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 74–92.
  • Duran, J., 2000, “Mary Astell: A Pre-Humean Christian Empiricist and Feminist, in Presenting Women Philosophers, C. Tougas and S. Ebenreck (eds.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 147–154.
  • –––, 2006, Eight Women Philosophers: Theory, Politics, and Feminism, Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • –––, 2014, “Christianity and Women’s Education: Anna Maria van Schurman and Mary Astell,” Philosophy & Theology, 26(1): 3–18.
  • Dussinger, J. A., 2013, “Mary Astell’s Revisions of Some Reflections upon Marriage (1730)”, The Papers of the Bibliographical Society of America, 107(1): 49–79.
  • Ellenzwig, S., 2003, “The Love of God and the Radical Enlightenment: Mary Astell’s Brush with Spinoza”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 63(3): 379–87.
  • Ezell, M. J. M., 1993, Writing Women’s Literary History, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Foucault, M., 1997. “The Ethics of the Concern of the Self as a Practice of Freedom”, in Ethics: Subjectivity and Truth, Paul Rabinow (ed.), New York: New Press, 281–301.
  • Forbes, A.F., 2019, “Mary Astell on Bad Custom and Epistemic Injustice”, Hypatia 34(4): 777–801.
  • Gill, M. B., 2006, The British Moralists on Human Nature and the Birth of Secular Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Goldie, M., 2007, “Mary Astell and John Locke”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson, Burlington, VT: Ashgate, pp. 17–30.
  • Hadot, P., 1995, Philosophy as a Way of Life: Spiritual Exercises from Socrates to Foucault, Arnold I Davidson (ed.),Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Harris, J., 2012, “Philosophy and sexual politics in Mary Astell and Samuel Richardson”, Intellectual History Review, 22(3): 445–63.
  • Hartmann, Van. C., 1998, “Tory Feminism in Mary Astell’s Bart’lemy Fair”, Journal of Narrative Technique, 28(3): 243–65.
  • Herberg, E., 1999, “Mary Astell’s Rhetorical Theory: A Woman’s Viewpoint”, in The Changing Tradition: Women in the History of Rhetoric, C. M. Sutherland and R. Sutcliffe (eds.), Calgary: University of Calgary Press, pp. 147–157.
  • Hill, B., 1986, The First English Feminist: “Reflections upon Marriage” and Other Writings by Mary Astell, Aldershot, Hants: Grower Publishing.
  • –––, 1987, “A Refuge from Men: The Idea of a Protestant Nunnery”, Past & Present, 117: 107–130.
  • James, R., 1976, “Mary, Mary, Quite Contrary, Or, Mary Astell and Mary Wollstonecraft Compared”, Studies in Eighteenth Century Culture, Ronald C. Rosbottom (ed.), 5: 121–139.
  • Johns, A., 1996, “Mary Astell’s ‘Excited needles’: Theorizing Feminist Utopia in Seventeenth-Century England”, Utopian Studies, 7(1): 60–74.
  • Kendrick, N., 2018, “Mary Astell’s Theory of Spiritual Friendship”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 26(1): 46–65.
  • Kinnaird, J. K., 1979, “Mary Astell and the Conservative Contribution to English Feminism”, Journal of British Studies, 19(1): 53–75.
  • Kolbrener, W., 2003, “Gendering the Modern, Mary Astell’s Feminist Historiography”, The Eighteenth Century, 44(1): 1–24.
  • –––, 2007, “Astell’s ‘Design of Friendship’ in Letters and A Serious Proposal, Part I”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 49–64.
  • –––, 2014, “Slander, Conversation and the Making of the Christian Public Sphere in Mary Astell’s A Serious Proposal to the Ladies and The Christian Religion as Profess’d by a Daughter of the Church of England”, in Religion and Women in Britain, c. 1660–1760, S. Apetrei and H. Smith (eds.), Farnham Surrey, England; Burlington, VT: Ashgate, pp. 131–144.
  • Kolbrener W. and M. Michelson, 2007, Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, Aldershot: Ashgate. [Reprint of the introduction is available online.]
  • Kotva, S., 2020, Effort and Grace: On the Spiritual Exercise of Philosophy: Reinventing Philosophy as a Way of Life, New York: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Lascano, M., 2016, “Mary Astell on the Existence and Nature of God”, in Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss (eds.), State College, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 168–187.
  • Lister, A., 2004, “Marriage and Misogyny: The Place of Mary Astell in the History of Political Thought”, History of Political Thought, 25(1): 44–72.
  • Locke, J., 1989, An Essay concerning Human Understanding. Ed. P.H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––. Reasonableness of Christianity. The Works of John Locke in Nine Volumes. London: Rivington, 1824.
  • McCrystal, J., 1992, “A Lady’s Calling: Mary Astell’s Notion of Women”, Political Theory Newsletter, 4: 156–70.
  • –––, 1993, “Revolting Women The Use of Revolutionary Discourse in Mary Astell and Mary Wollstonecraft Compared”, History of Political Thought, 14(2): 189–203.
  • Miller, S., 2008, Engendering the Fall: John Milton and Seventeenth-Century Women Writers, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Myers, J. E., 2012, “Enthusiastic Improvement: Mary Astell and Damaris Masham on Sociability”, Hypatia, 28(3): 533–550.
  • Nadelhaft, J., 1982, “The Englishwoman’s Sexual Civil War: Feminist Attitudes Towards Men, Women, and Marriage”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 43(4): 555–579.
  • Nelson, A., 2005, “The Rationalist Impulse”, in A Companion to Rationalism, A. Nelson (ed.), Malden, MA: Blackwell, pp. 3–11.
  • O’Donnell, S., 1978, “Mr. Locke and the Ladies: The Indelible Words on the Tabula Rasa”, Studies in Eighteenth Century Culture, 8: 151–164.
  • O’Neill, E., 1998, “Astell, Mary (1666–1731)”, in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Vol. 1, E. Craig (ed.), New York: Routledge, pp. 527–30.
  • ––, 1998b, “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and their Fate in History,” in Philosophy in a Feminist Voice: Critiques and Reconstructions, J. A. Kournay (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 17–62.
  • –––, 1999, “Women Cartesians, ‘Feminine Philosophy’, and Historical Exclusion”, in Feminist Interpretations of René Descartes, S. Bordo (ed.), University Park, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 232–257.
  • –––, 2005, “Early Modern Women Philosophers and the History of Philosophy,” Hypatia, 20(3): 185–197.
  • –––, 2007, “Mary Astell on the Causation of Sensation”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 145–64.
  • Perry, R., 1981, “Two Forgotten Wits”, The Antioch Review, 39(4): 431–438.
  • –––, 1982, “Mary Astell’s Poetry”, Tulsa Studies in Women’s Literature, 1(2): 201–202.
  • –––, 1984, “Mary Astell’s Response to the Enlightenment”, in Women and the Enlightenment, M. Hunt, M. Jacob, P. Mack, and R. Perry (eds.), New York: The Haworth Press, Inc., pp. 13–40.
  • –––, 1985, “Radical Doubt and the Liberation of Women”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 18(4): 472–493.
  • –––, 1986, The Celebrated Mary Astell: An Early English Feminist, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1990, “Mary Astell and the Feminist Critique of Possessive Individualism”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 23(4): 444–457.
  • Pickard, C. “Great in Humilitie’: A Consideration of Mary Astell’s Poetry”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot, England: Ashgate, pp. 115–126.
  • Schillace, B. L., 2013, “Reproducing Custom: Mechanical Habits and Female Machines in Augustan Women’s Education”, Feminist Formations, 25(1): 111–137.
  • Shapiro, L., 2013, “The Outward and Inward Beauty of Early Modern Women”, Review Philosophique de la France et de l’Étranger, T.: Penser au Féminin Au XVIIe Siécle, 203(3): 327–346.
  • Sharrock, C., 1992, “De-ciphering Women and De-scribing Authority: The Writings of Mary Astell”, in Women, Writing, History 1640–1740, I. Grundy and S. Wiseman (eds.), Athens: University of Georgia Press, pp. 109–124.
  • Smith, F., 1916, Mary Astell, Columbia: Columbia University Press.
  • Smith, H. L., 1982, Reason’s Disciples: Seventeenth-Century English Feminists, Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • –––, 2007, “‘Cry up liberty’: The Political Context for Mary Astell’s Feminism”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 193–204.
  • Sowaal, A., 2007, “Mary Astell’s Serious Proposal: Mind, Method, and Custom”, Philosophy Compass, 2(2): 227–43.
  • –––, 2016, “Mary Astell and the Development of Vice: Pride, Courtship, and the Women’s Human Nature Question”, in Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss (eds.), State College, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 57–72.
  • –––, 2017, “Mary Astell on Liberty”, in Women and Liberty, 1600–1800, Jacqueline Broad and Karen Detlefsen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 178–194.
  • Spender, D., 1982, Women of Ideas and What Men Have Done to Them: From Aphra Behn to Adrienne Rich, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Springborg, P., 1995, “Mary Astell (1666–1731), Critic of Locke”, American Political Science Review, 89(3): 621–633.
  • –––, 1996, “Introduction”, Astell: Political Writings, P. Springborg (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. xi–xlviii.
  • –––, 2002, “Introduction”, A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Parts I and II, Ontario: Broadview Literary Texts.
  • –––, 2005, Mary Astell: Theorist of Freedom from Domination, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Squadrito, K.M., 1987, “Mary Astell’s Critique of Locke’s View of Thinking Matter”, Journal of History of Philosophy, 25: 433–439.
  • –––, 1991, “Mary Astell”, A History of Women Philosophers. Vol. III: 1600–1800, M.E. Waithe (ed.), Dordrecht, Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Stanton, K. S., 2007, “‘Affliction, The Sincerest Friend’”, Prose Studies: History, Theory, Criticism, 29(1): 104–114.
  • Staves, S., 2002, “Church of England Clergy and Women Writers”, Huntington Library Quarterly: Reconsidering the Bluestockings, 65(1/2): 81–103.
  • Sutherland, C. M., 1991, “Outside the Rhetorical Tradition: Mary Astell’s Advice to Women in Seventeenth-Century England”, Rhetorica: A Journal of the History of Rhetoric, 9(2): 147–163.
  • –––, 1995, “Mary Astell: Reclaiming Rhetorica in the Seventeenth Century”, in Reclaiming Rhetoria: Women in the Rhetorical Tradition, A. Lunsford (ed.), Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, pp. 93–116.
  • –––, 2005, The Eloquence of Mary Astell, Calgary: University of Calgary Press.
  • –––, 2009, Reason and Religion in Clarissa: Samuel Richardson and “The Famous Mr. Norris, of Bemerton”, Farnham: Ashgate.
  • Sutherland, C. M. and R. Sutcliffe, 1999, The Changing Tradition: Women in the History of Rhetoric, Calgary: University of Calgary Press.
  • Taylor, E. D., 2001, “Mary Astell’s Ironic Assault on John Locke’s Theory of Thinking Matter”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 62(3): 505–522.
  • ––, 2005a, “Introduction Mary Astell and John Norris: A Correspondence”, in Mary Astell And John Norris: Letters Concerning The Love Of God, E. D. Taylor and M. New (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 1–41. [Reprint available online.]
  • –––, 2005b–6, “Mary Astell’s Work toward a New Edition of ‘A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Part II’”, Studies in Bibliography, 57: 197–232.
  • Thickstun, M. O., 1991, “‘This was a Woman that taught’: Feminist Scriptural Exegesis in the Seventeenth Century”, Studies in Eighteenth-Century Culture, 21: 149–158.
  • Waters, K., 2002, “Sources of Political Authority: John Locke and Mary Astell”, in Introduction, Women and Men Political Theorists: Enlightened Conversations, Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, pp. 5–19.
  • Webb, Simone. 2020, “Philosophy as a Feminist Spirituality and Critical Practice for Mary Astell”, in Metaphilosophy 51(2–3): 280–302.
  • Weiss, P., 2004, “Mary Astell: Including Women’s Voices in Political Theory”, Hypatia, 19(3): 63–84.
  • –––, 1996, “Wollstonecraft and Rousseau: The Gendered Fate of Political Theorists”, in Feminist Interpretations of Mary Wollstonecraft (Series: Re-Reading the Canon), M. J. Falco (ed.), University Park, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 15–32.
  • –––, 2009, Canon Fodder: Historical Women Political Thinkers, University Park: Penn State University Press.
  • Wilson, C., 2004, “Love of God and Love of Creatures”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 21(3): 281–298.
  • Wolterstorff, N., 1976, Reason Within the Bounds of Religion. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Wm. B. Eerdmans Publishing Co.
  • Zook, M., 2007, “Religious Nonconformity and the Problem of Dissent in the Works of Aphra Behn and Mary Astell”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot, Hants: Ashgate, pp. 99–113.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2023 by
Alice Sowaal <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free