The Cambridge Platonists

First published Wed Oct 3, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jun 29, 2020

The Cambridge Platonists were a group of English seventeenth-century thinkers associated with the University of Cambridge. The most important philosophers among them were Henry More (1614–1687) and Ralph Cudworth (1617–1688), both fellows of Christ’s College, Cambridge. The group also included Benjamin Whichcote (1609–1683), Peter Sterry (1613–1672), John Smith (1618–1652), Nathaniel Culverwell (1619–1651), and John Worthington (1618–1671). All of them studied at Emmanuel College, Cambridge, apart from More who studied at Christ’s College, Cambridge, where Cudworth was later appointed Master. Their personal and intellectual fortunes were impacted by events of the English Civil War and its aftermath. They developed their philosophical views against a background of the Calvinistic scholasticism which prevailed at Cambridge in their formative years. They did not self-identify as a group or as Platonists. They only came to be referred to as Platonists in the eighteenth century. But in so far as they all held the philosophy of Plato and Plotinus in high regard, and adopted principles of Platonist epistemology and metaphysics, the designation ‘Platonist’ is apt. They drew on a wide range of philosophical sources besides Platonism. For example, among ancient philosophers, they were well acquainted with Aristotle and with Stoicism. They shared the Renaissance Humanists’ regard for the achievements of ancient philosophy, as well as their interpretation of ancient philosophy, which was informed by a strong sense of its relevance of to contemporary life. At the same time, they were also very much abreast of new developments in philosophy and science – with Descartes, Hobbes and Spinoza as well as Bacon, Boyle and the Royal Society. Smith, Culverwell, Cudworth and More were among the first Englishmen to read Descartes. Both More and Cudworth were fellows of the Royal Society. The framework within which they read and understood ancient and modern philosophy was that of the ‘perennial philosophy’ (philosophia perennis) adopted by Italian Renaissance philosophers such as Marsilio Ficino, and Agostino Steucho, but also employed by Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. They also emphatically repudiated the scholasticism that prevailed in academic philosophy and took a lively interest in the developments that brought about the scientific revolution. They therefore form part of the philosophical revolution of the seventeenth century, especially since they sought an alternative philosophical foundation to Aristotelianism which was waning fast in the face of challenges from scepticism and competing alternative philosophies, notably those of Hobbes and Descartes.

At a time when philosophy in the universities was considered the handmaid of theology, they devoted their considerable philosophical learning to religious and moral issues, to defending the existence of God and the immortality of the soul, and to formulating a practical ethics for Christian conduct. Convinced of the compatibility of reason and faith, they held the eternal existence of moral principles and of truth, and that the human mind is equipped with the principles of reason and morality. Their optimistic view of human capacities is underscored by their emphasis on the freedom of the will. Their anti-determinism led them to propose arguments for human autonomy. They were all dualists for whom mind is ontologically prior to matter, and for whom the truths of the mind are superior to sense-knowledge. They accepted post-Galilean science, and propounded an atomistic theory of matter. But they repudiated the new mechanistic natural philosophy in favour of the view the fundamental causal principle in the operations of nature is some form of immaterial agent or spirit.

Benjamin Whichcote

The oldest member of the group, Benjamin Whichcote, is usually considered to be the founding father of Cambridge Platonism. During the Civil War period, Whichcote was appointed Provost of King’s College, Cambridge, and he served as Vice Chancellor of the University in 1650. However, he was removed from his post at King’s College at the Restoration in 1660, and was obliged to seek employment elsewhere, as a clergyman in London. The interruption to his academic career may explain why he never published any philosophical treatises as such. The main source for his philosophical views are his posthumously-published sermons and aphorisms. Whichcote’s tolerant, optimistic and rational outlook set the intellectual tone for Cambridge Platonism. Whichcote’s philosophical views are grounded in his repudiation of Calvinist theology. He held that God being supremely perfect is necessarily good, wise and loving. Whichcote regarded human nature as rational and perfectible, and he believed that it is through reason as much as revelation that God communicates with man. ‘God is the most knowable of any thing in the world’ (Patrides, 1969, p.58). Without reason we would have no means of demonstrating the existence of God, and no assurance that revelation is from God. By reason Whichcote did not mean the disputatious logic of the schools but discursive, demonstrative and practical reason enlightened by contemplation of the divine. He held that moral principles are immutable absolutes which exist independently of human minds and institutions, and that virtuous conduct is grounded in reason. Whichcote’s Aphorisms amount to a manual of practical ethics which amply illustrates his conviction that the fruit reason is not ‘bare knowledge’ but action, or knowledge which ‘doth go forth into act’. It is through reason that we gain knowledge of the natural world, and recognise natural phenomena as ‘the EFFECTS OF GOD’. Although Whichcote’s published writings do not discuss natural philosophy as such, his recognition of the demonstrative value of natural philosophy for the argument from design anticipates the use of natural philosophy in the apologetics of Cudworth and More.

Culverwell, Smith and Sterry

Whichcote’s optimism about human reason and his conviction that philosophy properly belongs within the domain of religion, are shared by the other Cambridge Platonists, all of whom affirmed the compatibility of reason and faith. The fullest statement of this position is Henry More’s The Apology of Henry More (1664) which sets out rules for the application of reason in religious matters, stipulating the use of only those ‘Philosophick theorems’ which are ‘solid and rational in themselves, nor really repugnant to the word of God’. Like Whichcote, Peter Sterry, John Smith and Nathaniel Culverwell are known only through posthumously published writings. The first published treatise by any of the Cambridge Platonists was Nathaniel Culverwell’s An Elegant and Learned Discourse of the Light of Nature of 1652. Like the other Cambridge Platonists Culverwell emphasises the freedom of the will and proposes an innatist epistemology, according to which the mind is furnished with ‘clear and indelible Principles’ and reason an ‘intellectual lamp’ placed in the soul by God to enable it to understand God’s will promulgated in the law of nature. These innate principles of the mind also include moral principles. The soul is a divine spark, which derives knowledge by inward contemplation, not outward observation. Like the other Cambridge Platonists, Culverwell held that goodness is intrinsic to all things, and that moral principles do not depend on the will of God. He nevertheless underscored the importance of natural law as the foundation of moral obligation..

John Smith taught mathematics at Queen’s College until his premature death in 1652. His posthumously published Select Discourses (1659) discusses a number of metaphysical and epistemological issues relating to religious belief – the existence of God, immortality of the soul and the rationality of religion. Smith outlines a hierarchy of four grades of cognitive ascent from sense combined with reason, through reason in conjunction with innate notions, and, thirdly, through disembodied, self-reflective reason; and finally divine love.

Peter Sterry’s only philosophical work, his posthumously-published A Discourse of the Freedom of the Will (1675), is the most visionary of all the writings of the Cambridge Platonists. Sterry was deeply involved with events outside Cambridge as chaplain first to the Parliamentary leader, Lord Brooke, and then to Oliver Cromwell. After the death of Cromwell he retired to a Christian community in East Sheen. In his Discourse Sterry argues that to act freely consists in acting in accordance with ones nature, appropriately to ones level of being, be that plant, animal or intellectual entity. Human liberty is grounded in the divine essence and entails liberty of the understanding and of the will.

Henry More

A life-long fellow of Christ’s College, Cambridge, Henry More was the most prolific of the Cambridge Platonists. He was also the most directly engaged in contemporary philosophical debate: not only did he enter into correspondence with Descartes (between 1648 and 1649) but he also wrote against Hobbes, and was one of the earliest English critics of Spinoza (whom he attacks in Demonstrationum duarum propositionum ... confutatio and Epistola altera both published in his Opera omnia, 1671). Although he eventually became a critic of Cartesianism, he initially advocated the teaching of Cartesianism in English Universities. More’s published writings included, besides philosophy, poetry, theology and bible commentary. His main philosophical works are his An Antidote Against Atheism (1653), his Of the Immortality of the Soul (1659), Enchiridion metaphysicum (1671), and Enchiridion ethicum (1667). Like the other Cambridge Platonists, More used philosophy in defence of theism against the claims of rational atheists. The most important statement of More’s theological position his An Explanation of the Grand Mystery of Godliness appeared in 1660. In opposition to Calvinist pessimistic voluntarism, this propounds a moral, rational providentialism in which he vindicates the goodness and justice of God by invoking the Origenist doctrine of the pre-existence of the soul. It also makes the case for religious toleration.

In his philosophical writings, More elaborated a philosophy of spirit which explained all the phenomena of mind and of the physical world as the activity of spiritual substance controlling inert matter. More conceived of both spirit and body as spatially extended, but defined spiritual substance as the obverse of material extension: where body is inert and solid, but divisible; spirit is active and penetrable, but indivisible. It was in his correspondence with Descartes that he first expounded his view that all substance, whether material or immaterial, is extended. He went on to argue space is infinite, anticipating that other native of Grantham, Isaac Newton, and that God who is an infinite spirit is an extended being (res extensa). In Enchiridion metaphysicum, he argues that the properties of space are analogous to the attributes of God (infinity, immateriality, immobility etc.).

Within the category of spiritual substance More includes not just the souls of living creatures and God himself but the main intermediate causal agent of the cosmos, the Spirit of Nature (or ‘Hylarchic Principle’). Conceived as the interface between the divine and the material, the Spirit of Nature is a ‘Superintendant Cause’ which combines efficient and teleological causality to ensure the smooth-running of the universe according to God’s plan. It can also be understood as encapsulating ‘certain general Modes and Lawes of Nature’ (More, A Collection, Preface, p. xvi) since it is the Spirit of Nature that is responsible for uniting individual souls with bodies, and for ensuring the regular operation of non-animate nature. More sought, by this hypothesis, to account for phenomena that apparently defy the laws of mechanical physics (for example the inter-vortical trajectory of comets, the sympathetic vibration of strings and tidal motion). More underpinned his soul-body dualism by his theory of ‘vital congruity’ which explains soul-body interaction as a sympathetic attraction between soul and body engineered by the operation the Spirit of Nature.

The most consistent theme of his philosophical writings, are arguments for demonstrating the existence and providential nature of God. The foundation stone of More’s philosophical and apologetic enterprise is his philosophy of spirit, especially his arguments for the existence of incorporeal causal agents, that is, souls or spirits. Furthermore, More attempted to answer materialists like Thomas Hobbes whom he regarded as an atheist. More’s strategy was to show that the same arguments that materialists use demonstrate the existence and properties of body, also support the obverse, the existence of incorporeal substances. In this way More sought to demonstrate that the idea of incorporeal substance, or spirit, was as intelligible as that of corporeal substance, i.e. body. Like Plato (in Laws 10), More argues that the operations of the nature cannot be explained simply in terms of the chance collision of material particles. Rather we must posit some other source of activity, which More identifies as ‘spirit’. It is a short step, he argues, from grasping the concept of spirit, to accepting the idea of an infinite spirit, namely God.

More underpins these a priori arguments for the existence of spirit, with a wide range of a posteriori arguments, taken from observed phenomena of nature to demonstrate the actions of spirit. Through this excursus into observational method he accumulated a wide variety of data ranging from experiments conducted by Robert Boyle and members of the Royal Society, to supernatural effects including cases of witchcraft and demons. He was censured by Boyle for misappropriating his experiments to endorse his hypothesis of the Spirit of Nature. Although his belief in evil spirits appears inconsistent with his otherwise rational philosophy, it should be remembered that belief in witchcraft was (a) not unusual in his time, and (b) was entirely consistent with the theory of spirit according to which to deny the existence of spirits good or evil, leads, logically to the denial of the existence of God. As he put it, alluding to James I’s defence of episcopacy, “That saying is no less true in Politicks ‘No Bishop, no King,’ than this in Metaphysicks, ‘No Spirit, no God’ ” (More, 1662, Antidote, p. 142). His most well-known fellow-believer was Royal Society member, Joseph Glanvill (1636–1680), whose Sadducismus triumphatus, More edited.

More also published a short treatise on ethics entitled Enchiridion Ethicum (1667, translated as An Account of Virtue), which was probably intended for to be used as a textbook. Indebted to Descartes’ theory of the passions this argues that knowledge of virtue is attainable by reason, and the pursuit of virtue entails the control of the passions by the soul. Motivation to good is supplied by rightly-directed emotion, while virtue is achieved by the exercise free will or autoexousy (More uses the same term as Cudworth), that is the ‘Power to act or not act within ourselves’. Anticipating Shaftesbury’s concept of moral sense More posits a special faculty of the soul combining reason and sensation which he calls the ‘Boniform Faculty’.

More used a number of different genres for conveying his philosophical ideas to non-specialist readers. The most popular among these were his Philosophical Poems (1647) and his Divine Dialogues (1668). In Conjectura cabbalistica (1653), he presented core themes of his philosophy in the form of an exposition of occulted truths contained in the first book of Genesis. Subsequently he undertook a detailed study of the Jewish Kabbalist texts translated and published by Knorr von Rosenroth in Kabbala denudata (1679). These studies were based on the belief, then current, that kabbalistic writings contained, in symbolic form, original truths of philosophy, as well as of religion. Kabbalism therefore exemplified the compatibility of philosophy and faith. In addition to philosophy More published several studies of biblical prophecy (e.g. Apocalypsis apocalypseos, 1680, Paralipomena prophetica, 1685). In 1675, More prepared a Latin translation of his works, Opera omnia which ensured his philosophy reached a European audience as well as an English one.

Ralph Cudworth

Like his friend Henry More, Ralph Cudworth spent his entire career as a teacher at the University of Cambridge, ending up as Master of Clare College. Cudworth published only one major work of philosophy in his lifetime, The True Intellectual System of the Universe (1678). Among the papers he left at his death, were the treatises published posthumously as A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality (1731) and his A Treatise of Freewill (1848). These papers also included two further manuscript treatises on the topic of ‘Liberty and Necessity’, which have never been printed.

Cudworth’s True Intellectual System propounds an anti-determinist system of philosophy grounded in his conception of God as a fully perfect being, infinitely wise and good. The created world reflects the perfection, wisdom and goodness of its creator. It must, therefore be orderly, intelligible, and organised for the best. This anti-voluntarist understanding of God’s attributes is also the foundation of epistemology and ethics, since God’s wisdom and goodness are the guarantors of truth and of moral principles. By contrast, a philosophy founded on a voluntaristic conception of the deity would have no ground of certainty or of morality because it would depend on the arbitrary will of God who could, by arbitrary fiat, decree non-sense to be true and wrong to be right. It follows that misconceptions of God’s attributes, which emphasise his power and will, result by definition in false philosopical systems with sceptical and atheistic implications.

Much of The True Intellectual System amounts to an extended consensus gentium argument for belief in God, demonstrable from an analysis of ancient sources which showed that most ancient philosophers were theists, and therefore that theism is compatible with philosophy. Among the non-theists, Cudworth (1678, p. 165) identifies four schools of atheistic philosophy, each of which is a type of materialism: Hylopathian atheism or materialism, ‘Atomical or Democritical’ atheism, Cosmo-plastic atheism (which makes the world-soul the highest numen), and Hylozoic atheism (which attributes life to matter). Each of these ancient brands of atheism has its latter-day manifestations in philosophers such as Hobbes (an example of a Hylopathian atheist) and Spinoza (a latter-day Hylozoist).

The philosophy constitutive of Cudworth’s intellectual system combines atomist natural philosophy with Platonic metaphysics. Cudworth conceives this as having originated with Moses from whom it was transmitted via Pythagoras to Greek and other philosophers, including Descartes whom Cudworth regarded as a reviver of Mosaic atomism. For Cudworth, as for Plato, soul is ontologically prior to the physical world. Since motion, life, thought and action cannot be explained in terms of material particles, haphazardly jolted together, there must be some guiding originator, namely soul or spirit. In order to account for movement, life and orderliness in the operations of nature, Cudworth proposed his hypothesis of ‘the Plastick Life of Nature’. Similar in conception to More’s Spirit of Nature, Cudworth’s Plastic Nature is a formative principle which acts as an intermediary between the divine and the natural world, as the means whereby God imprints His presence on his creation and makes His wisdom and goodness manifest (and therefore intelligible) throughout created nature.

The Platonist principle that mind precedes the world lies at the foundation of Cudworth’s epistemology which is discussed in A Treatise of Eternal and Immutable Morality. This is the most fully developed theory of knowledge by any of the Cambridge Platonists, and the most extensive treatment of innatism by any seventeenth-century philosopher. For Cudworth, as for Plato, ideas and moral principles ‘are eternal and self-subsistent things’. The external world is, intrinsically, intelligible, since it bears the imprint of its creator in the order and relationship of its component parts, as archetype to ectype. Cognition depends on the same principles, for just as the created world is a copy of the divine archetype, so also human minds contain the imprint of Divine wisdom and knowledge. Since the human mind mirrors the mind of God, it is ready furnished with ideas and the ability to reason. Cognition therefore entails recollection and the ideas of things with which the mind thinks are therefore ‘anticipations’– for which Cudworth adopts the Stoic term prolepsis. Cognition is not a passive process, but involves the active participation of the mind. Although innate knowledge is the only true knowledge, Cudworth does not reject sense knowledge because sensory input is essential for knowledge of the body and the external world. However, raw sense data is not, by itself, knowledge since it requires mental processing in order to become knowledge. As Cudworth puts it, we cannot understand the book of nature unless we know how to read.

Cudworth’s theory of the mind as active is matched by an anti-determinist ethics of action, according to which the soul freely directs itself towards the good. In A Treatise Cudworth argues not only that ideas exist independently of human minds, but also the principles of morality are eternal and immutable. In a concerted attack on Hobbesian moral relativism, Cudworth, argues that the criteria of right and wrong, good and evil, justice and injustice are not a matter of convention, but are founded in the goodness and justice of God. Like Plato in the Euthyphro, Cudworth argues that it is not God’s will that determines goodness, but that God wills things because they are good. The exercise of virtue is not, however, a passive process, but requires the free exercise of the individual will. Cudworth sets out his theory of free will in three treatises on ‘Liberty and Necessity’, only one of which has been published, and that posthumously – A Treatise of Freewill (1848). According to Cudworth, the will is not a faculty of the soul, distinct from reason, but a power of the soul which combines the functions of both reason and will in order to direct the soul towards the good. Cudworth’s use of the terms ‘hegemonikon’ (taken from Stoicism) and ‘autexousion’ (taken from Plotinus) underlines the fact that the exercise of will entails the power to act. It is internal direction, not external compulsion that induces us to act either morally or immorally. Without the freedom (and therefore power) to of act, there would be no moral responsibility. Moral conduct is active, not passive. Virtuous action is therefore a matter of active internal self-determination, rather than determination from without.

In A Treatise of Freewill, Cudworth elaborates his conception of the hegemonikon, an integrative power of the soul, which combines the higher intellectual functions of the soul, will and reason with the lower, animal, appetites of the soul. Furthermore, Cudworth conceives of the hegemonikon not simply as the soul but the whole person, ‘that which is properly we ourselves’ (Cudworth, 1996, p. 178). Cudworth’s concept of hegemonikon lays the basis for a concept of self identity founded in a subject that is at once thinking, autonomous and end-directed. Cudworth did not (as far as is known) develop a political philosophy. However, the political implications of his ethical theory set him against Hobbes, but also, in many ways anticipate John Locke.


Among the immediate philosophical heirs of the Cambridge Platonists, mention should be made of Henry More’s pupil, Anne Conway (1631–1679), one of the very few female philosophers of the period. Her Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy (1692) includes a critique of More’s dualistic philosophy of spirit, proposing instead a metaphysical monism that anticipates Leibniz. Another figure linked to More was John Norris (1657–1712) who was to become the leading English exponent of the philosophy of Malebranche. Whichcote’s philosophical wisdom was admired by Anthony Ashley Cooper, third Earl of Shaftesbury who published his Select Sermons in 1698. Shaftesbury’s tutor, John Locke was the intimate friend of Cudworth’s philosophical daughter, Damaris Masham.

The Cambridge Platonists have yet to receive full recognition as philosophers. Evidence from publication and citation suggests that their philosophical influence was more far-reaching than is normally recognised in modern histories of philosophy. Culverwell’s Discourse was reprinted four times, including at Oxford. The impact of Cudworth on Locke has yet to be fully investigated. Richard Price, and Thomas Reid were both indebted to Cudworth. As the first philosophers to write primarily and consistently in the English language (preceded only by Sir Kenelm Digby), their impact is still felt in English philosophical terminology, through their coinage of such familiar terms as ‘materialism‘, ‘consciousness‘, and ‘Cartesianism‘.

The intellectual legacy of the Cambridge Platonists extends not just to philosophical debate in seventeenth-century England and to Scottish Enlightenment thought, but into the European Enlightenment and beyond. Leibniz certainly read Cudworth and More, whose works were known beyond the English-speaking world thanks to Latin translations More’s Opera omnia appeared in 1675–9, and Cudworth’s entire printed works were translated into Latin by Johann Lorenz Mosheim and published in Jena in 1733. Cudworth’s theory of Plastic Nature was taken up in vitalist debates in the French enlightenment. Although their critique of Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza has ensured that the Cambridge Platonists are never completely ignored in philosophical history, they deserve to be considered an important strand in English seventeenth-century philosophy.


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