Atomism from the 17th to the 20th Century

First published Thu Jun 30, 2005; substantive revision Thu Oct 9, 2014

Atomism in the form in which it first emerged in Ancient Greece was a metaphysical thesis, purporting to establish claims about the ultimate nature of material reality by philosophical argument. Versions of atomism developed by mechanical philosophers in the seventeenth century shared that characteristic. By contrast, the knowledge of atoms that is now taken for granted in modern science is not established by a priori philosophical argument but by appeal to quite specific experimental results interpreted and guided by a quite specific theory, quantum mechanics. If metaphysics involves an attempt to give an account of the basic nature of material reality then it is an issue about which science rather than philosophy has most to say. A study of the path from philosophical atomism to contemporary scientific atomism helps to shed light on the nature of philosophy and science and the relationship between the two.

From the nineteenth century onwards, when serious versions of scientific atomism first emerged, the philosophical relevance of a history of atomism becomes epistemological rather than metaphysical. Since atoms lie far beyond the domain of observation, should hypotheses concerning them form part of empirical science? There were certainly philosophers and scientists of the nineteenth century who answered that question in the negative. Contemporary philosophers differ over the question of whether the debate was essentially a scientific one or a philosophical one. Was there a case to oppose atomism on the grounds that it was unfruitful or lacking in adequate experimental support, or did such a case stem from some general epistemological thesis, perhaps some brand of positivism, that ruled out of court any attempt to explain observable phenomena by invoking unobservable atoms? Many contemporary philosophers see the ultimate triumph of atomism as a victory for realism over positivism. Such claims are historical as well as philosophical, so it is important to get the history straight when evaluating them. In this respect the philosophical literature has yet to catch up with recent advances in the history of nineteenth-century chemistry. This entry gives an account of the key developments in atomism from the seventeenth century until the time, early in the twentieth century, when the existence of atoms ceased to be a contentious issue. The focus is on the epistemological status of the various versions, and on the relationship between science and philosophy.

1. Introduction

Versions of atomism developed by seventeenth-century mechanical philosophers, referred to hereafter as mechanical atomism, were revivals of Ancient Greek atomism, with the important difference that they were presumed to apply only to the material world, and not to the spiritual world of the mind, the soul, angels and so on. Mechanical atomism was a totally general theory, insofar as it offered an account of the material world in general as made up of nothing other than atoms in the void. The atoms themselves were characterised in terms of just a few basic properties, their shape, size and motion. Atoms were changeless and ultimate, in the sense that they could not be broken down into anything smaller and had no inner structure on which their properties depended. The case made for mechanical atomism was largely prior to and independent of empirical investigation.

There were plenty of seventeenth-century versions of atomism that were not mechanical. These tended to be less ambitious in their scope than mechanical atomism, and properties were attributed to atoms with an eye to the explanatory role they were to play. For instance, chemicals were assumed by many to have least parts, natural minima, with those minima possessing the capability of combining with the minima of other chemicals to form compounds.

The flexibility and explanatory potential of mechanical atomism was increased once Newton had made it possible to include forces in the list of their properties. However, there was no way of specifying those forces by recourse to general philosophical argument and they were remote from what could be established empirically also. Newtonian atomism was not fruitful as far as eighteenth-century experimental science is concerned.

It was only in the nineteenth century that atomism began to bear significant fruit in science, with the emergence of atomic chemistry and the kinetic theory of gases. The way in which and the point at which atomic speculations were substantiated or were fruitful is controversial but by the end of the century the fact that the properties of chemical compounds are due to an atomic structure that can be represented by a structural formulae was beyond dispute. The kinetic theory of gases met with impressive empirical success from 1860 until 1885 at least. However, it also faced difficulties. Further, there was the emergence and success of phenomenological thermodynamics, which made it possible to deal with a range of thermal and chemical phenomena without resort to an underlying structure of matter. Atomism was rejected by leading scientists and philosophers such as Wilhelm Ostwald, Pierre Duhem and Ernst Mach up to the end of the nineteenth century and beyond. By that time atomism had been extended from chemistry and the kinetic theory to offer explanations in stereochemistry, electro-chemistry, spectroscopy and so on. Any opposition from scientists that remained was removed by Jean Perrin's experimental investigations of Brownian motion. However, the task of explaining chemical properties in terms of atoms and their structure still remained as a task for twentieth century science.

Twentieth-century atomism in a sense represents the achievement of the Ancient Greek ideal insofar as it is a theory of the properties of matter in general in terms of basic particles, electrons, protons and neutrons, characterised in terms of a few basic properties. The major difference is that the nature of the particles and the laws governing them were arrived at empirically rather than by a priori philosophical argument.

Suggested Reading: Melson (1952) is a somewhat dated but still interesting and useful overview of the history of atomism from a philosophical point of view.Chalmers (2009) is a history of atomism that focuses on the relationship between philosophical and scientific theories about atoms.

2. Atomism in the Seventeenth Century

2.1 Atomism and the Mechanical Philosophy

Influential versions of Greek atomism were formulated by a range of philosophers in the seventeenth century, notably Pierre Gassendi (Clericuzio, 2000, 63–74) and Robert Boyle (Stewart, 1979 and Newman 2006). Neither the content of nor the mode of argument for these various versions were identical. Here the focus is on the version articulated and defended by Robert Boyle. Not only was Boyle one of the clearest and ablest defenders of the mechanical philosophy but he was also a leading pioneer of the new experimental science, so his work proves to be particularly illuminating as far as distinguishing philosophical and empirical aspects of atomism are concerned.

The mechanical philosophy differed from the atomism of the Greeks insofar as it was intended to apply to the material world only and not to the spiritual world. Apart from that major difference, the world-views are alike. Fundamentally there is just one kind of matter characterised by a property that serves to capture the tangibility of matter and distinguish it from void. Boyle chose absolute impenetrability as that property. There are insensibly small portions of matter that, whilst they are divisible in thought or by God, are indivisible as far as natural processes are concerned. Boyle, misleadingly drawing on another tradition that will be discussed in a later section, referred to these particles as minima naturalia or prima naturalia. Here they are referred to as atoms, a terminology only very rarely adopted by Boyle himself. Each atom has an unchanging shape and size and a changeable degree of motion or rest. All properties of the material world are reducible to and arise as a consequence of the arrangements and motions of the underlying atoms. In particular, properties possessed by macroscopic objects, both those detectable directly by the senses, such as colour and taste, and those involved in the interaction of bodies with each other, such as elasticity and degree of heat, are to be explained in terms of the properties of atoms. Those properties of atoms, their shape, size and motion, together with the impenetrability possessed by them all, are the primary ones in terms of which the properties of the complex bodies that they compose, the secondary ones, are to be explained. Such explanations involve the fundamental laws of nature that govern the motions of atoms.

Not all of the mechanical philosophers were mechanical atomists. Descartes provides a ready example of a mechanical philosopher who was not an atomist insofar as he rejected the void and held that particles of matter could be broken down into smaller particles. The mechanical philosophers were divided on the question of the existence of the void, some sharing the opinion of the Greek atomists that void was a pre-requisite for motion but others, like Descartes, rejecting the void as unintelligible and hence regarding all motion as involving the simultaneous displacement of closed loops of matter whether that matter be continuous or particulate. Arguments at the most general level for the intelligibility of the void and its relation to the possibility of motion were inconclusive. In addition to the question of the void, there is the question of whether matter is particulate and whether there are indivisible particles called atoms. Once again, general a priori philosophical arguments were hardly able to settle the question.

Boyle, along with his fellow mechanical philosophers, argued for his position on the grounds that it was clear and intelligible compared to rival systems such as Aristotelianism and those developed in chemical and related contexts by the likes of Paracelsus. The argument operated at the level of the fundamental ontology of the rival philosophies. Boyle insisted that it is perfectly clear what is intended when shape, size and degree of motion are ascribed to an impenetrable atom and when arrangements are ascribed to groups of such atoms. That much can surely be granted. But Boyle went further to insist that it is unintelligible to ascribe to atoms properties other than these primary ones, that is, properties other than those that atoms must necessarily possess by virtue of being portions of matter, such as the forms and qualities of the Aristotelians or the principles of the chemists. ‘Nor could I ever find it intelligibly made out’, wrote Boyle, ‘what these real qualities may be, that they [the scholastics] deny to be either matter, or modes of matter, or immaterial substances’ (Stewart, 1979, 22). If an atom is said to possess elasticity, for example, then Boyle is saying that the ontological status of whatever it is that is added to matter to render it elastic is mysterious, given that it cannot be material. This is not to claim that attributing elasticity and other secondary properties to gross matter is unintelligible. For such properties can be rendered intelligible by regarding them as arising from the primary properties and arrangements of underlying atoms. Secondary properties can be ascribed to the world derivatively but not primitively. So the stark ontology of the mechanical philosopher is established a priori by appealing to a notion of intelligibility.

2.2 Mechanical Reductions and the Problem of Transdiction

Explaining complex properties by reducing them to more elementary ones was not an enterprise unique to the mechanical philosophers. After all, it was a central Aristotelian thesis that the behaviour of materials was due to the proportions of the four elements in them, whilst the elements themselves owed their properties to the interaction of the hot and the cold and the wet and the dry, the fundamental active principles in nature. What a mechanical atomist like Boyle needed, and attempted, to do was establish that they could provide examples of successful mechanical reductions that were clear and intelligible. It was to this end that Boyle stressed how the workings of a key could be explained in terms of nothing other than its shape and size relative to the lock and the workings of a clock can be explained by appeal to nothing other than the properties of its parts.

There is a basic problem with this type of illustration of and support for the mechanical philosophy. Firstly, whilst the examples may indeed be examples of successful reductions, they are not strict mechanical reductions, and they are certainly not reductions to the mechanical properties of atoms. The functioning of a key depends on its rigidity whilst that of clocks and watches depend crucially on the weight of pendulum bobs or the elasticity of springs. On a number of occasions Boyle himself observed that explanations that appealed to such things as elasticity, gravity, acidity and the like fall short of the kind of explanations sought by a mechanical atomist (Chalmers, 1993).

To attempt to produce examples of reduction that conform to the ideal of the mechanical atomists is, in effect, to attempt to bolster the arguments from intelligibility with empirical arguments. The issue of empirical support for mechanical atomism, or any other version of atomism, raises a fundamental problem, a problem that Maurice Mandelbaum (1964, 88–112) has called ‘the problem of transdiction’. How are we to reach knowledge of unobservable atoms from knowledge of the bulk matter to which we have observational and experimental access? Mandelbaum credits Boyle with proposing a solution to the problem and he is endorsed by Newman (2006). Roughly speaking, the solution is that knowledge that is confirmed at the level of observation, that is found to apply to all matter whatsoever, and is scale invariant can be assumed to apply to atoms also. There is no doubt that an argument of this kind is to be found in Boyle, but it is highly problematic and can hardly be regarded as the solution to the epistemological problems faced by a seventeenth-century atomist.

There is something to be said for an appeal to scale invariance along the lines that laws that are shown to hold at the level of observation in a way that is independent of size should be held to hold generally, and in particular, on a scale so minute that it is beyond what can be observed. Boyle draws attention to the fact that the law of fall is obeyed by objects independently of their size and that the same appeal to mechanism can be applied alike to explain the workings of a large town clock and a tiny wristwatch (Stewart, 1979, 143). The question is to what extent recognition of scale invariance of this kind can aid the atomist. There is a range of reasons for concluding that it cannot.

A key problem is that laws established at the level of observation and experiment involve or imply properties other than the primary ones of the mechanical atomist. As mentioned above, the mechanisms of clocks involve the elasticity of springs, the weight of pendulum bobs and the rigidity of gear wheels and the law of fall presupposes a tendency for heavy objects to fall ‘downwards’. So the mechanical atomist cannot apply knowledge of this kind, scale invariant or otherwise, to atoms that are presumed to lack such properties. If we are looking for an empirical case for the list of properties that can be applied to atoms then it would appear that we need some criteria for picking out that subset of properties possessed by observable objects that can be applied to atoms also. Boyle offered a solution to this problem. He suggested that only those properties that occur in all observable objects whatsoever should be transferred to atoms. Since all observable objects have some definitive shape and size then atoms do also. By contrast, whilst some observable objects are magnetic, many are not, and so atoms are not magnetic. This strategy does not give an atomist what is needed. All observable objects are elastic to some degree and are even divisible to some degree and yet mechanical atoms are denied such properties. Conversely, no observable macroscopic object is absolutely impenetrable whereas Boyle assumes that atoms posses precisely that property. Perhaps it should not be surprising that the mechanical atomists of the seventeenth century lacked the resources to forge links between their conjectured atoms and experimental findings.

2.3 Natural Minima

Many speculations about atoms in the seventeenth century came from a source quite distinct from mechanical atomism. That source was the theory of natural minima which had its roots in Aristotle and that was transformed into a detailed atomic theory mainly applicable to chemical change.

Aristotle (On Generation and Corruption, Bk 1, Ch 10) clearly identified what we would refer to as chemical change as a special category presenting problems peculiar to it. It differs from mere alteration, such as the browning of an autumn leaf, where an identifiable material substratum persists, and from generation and corruption, such as the transformation of an olive seed into a tree or the decay of a rose into a heap of dust, where no identifiable material substratum persists. The transformation of a mixture of copper and tin into bronze, an example of what Aristotle called combination, is intermediate between alteration and generation and corruption. Copper and tin do not persist as such in the bronze and to assume so would fail to make the appropriate distinction between a combination and a mixture. Nevertheless, there is some important sense in which the copper and tin are in the bronze because they are recoverable from it. Aristotle had put his finger on a central problem in chemistry, the sense in which elements combine to form compounds and yet remain in the compounds as components of them. Aristotle did not use this terminology, of course, and it should be recognised that he and the scholastics that followed him had few examples of combination, as opposed to alteration and generation and corruption, to draw on. Alloys, which provided them with their stock and just about only example, are not even compounds from a modern point of view. The importance of combination for Aristotelians lay in the philosophical challenge it posed.

Many scholastics came to understand combination as the coming together of the least parts of the combining substances to form least parts of the compound. These least parts were referred to as natural minima. Substances cannot be divided indefinitely, it was claimed, because division will eventually result in natural minima which are either indivisible or are such that, if divided, no longer constitute a portion of the divided substance. But the theory of natural minima was developed to a stage where it involved more than that. The minima were presumed to exist as parts of a substance quite independent of any process of division. What is more, chemical combination was understood as coming about via the combination of minima of the combining substances forming minima of the compound. Talk of chemical combination taking place ‘per minima’ became common.

Natural minima were presumed by the scholastics to owe their being both to matter and form in standard Aristotelian fashion. A key problem they struggled with concerned the relation of the form characteristic of the minima of combining substances and the form of the minima of the resulting compound. Natural minima of copper and tin cannot remain as such in the minima of bronze otherwise the properties of copper and tin would persist in bronze. On the other hand, the form of copper and tin must persist in some way to account for the fact that those metals can be recovered. A common scholastic response was to presume that the forms of the combining minima persist in the minima of the resulting compound but in a way that is subservient to the form of those latter minima. Elements persist in the compound somewhat as individual notes persist in a chord.

Whilst Aristotle and the scholastics can be given the credit for pinpointing a fundamental problem associated with chemical change they can hardly be credited with providing a definitive solution. It should be recognised that adding the assumption of natural minima does not contribute in any way to a solution to the problem posed by chemical change. The problem of understanding how components persist in compounds simply becomes transferred to the problem of how minima of components persist in minima of compounds. So the extent to which acceptance of natural minima became widespread cannot be explained in terms of their contribution to a solution to the fundamental problem of chemical change. There were a number of motivations for assuming minima, all having at least their germs in Aristotle. One idea was that a portion of a substance can resist the corrupting influence of the surrounding medium only if there is a sufficient amount of it. Another stemmed from the common recognition that substances must come into contact if they are to combine. The particulate nature of substances facilitates such contact, as Aristotle hinted (On Generation and Corruption, 1, 10, 328a, 34). A third motivation concerned the logical problems, dating back to Zeno, that were understood to flow from assuming infinite divisibility.

Recognising the need to avoid problems perceived to be associated with infinite divisibility was a point shared by proponents of natural minima and mechanical atomists. But this one point of contact must not blind us to the crucial differences between the two traditions. Mechanical atoms were proposed as components of matter in general. They were unchangeable and possessed a minimum of properties, shape, size and a degree of motion or rest together with the impenetrability of their component matter. The motivation for ascribing just those properties to atoms was to provide an intelligible account of being and change in general. By contrast, natural minima possess properties characteristic of the substances of which they are the minima. The minima are not unchangeable because they are transformed into more complicated minima via chemical combination. The minima were not basic building blocks for the scholastics that developed this theory because their properties needed to be traced back to their composition from the four Aristotelian elements. Finally, the minima theory was developed as an attempt to accommodate chemical change. It was not intended as a theory of everything in the way that mechanical atomism was.

2.4 Seventeenth-Century Eclecticism

Atomic theories became common in the seventeenth century. The emerging emphasis on experiment led the proponents of those theories to become less concerned with philosophical systems and more concerned with the explanation of specific phenomena such as condensation and rarefaction, evaporation, the strength of materials and chemical change. There was an increasing tendency for atomists to borrow in an opportunist way from both the mechanical and natural minima traditions as well as from the alchemical tradition which employed atomistic theories of its own as Newman (1991, 143–190 and 1994, 92–114) has documented. Thus an Aristotelian proponent of the natural minima tradition, Daniel Sennert, whose main interest was in chemistry in medical contexts, drew on the work of the alchemists as well as that of the minima theorists, employed minima in physical as well as chemical contexts, and insisted that his atomism had much in common with that of Democritus (Clericuzio, 2000, 23–29 and Melsen, 1952, 81–89). Boyle referred to his mechanical atoms as natural minima and his first account of atomism involved attributing to an atom properties distinctive of the substance it was a least part of (Newman, 2006, 162ff, Clericuzio, 2000, 166ff) and in fact borrowed heavily from Sennert (Newman, 1996). In subsequent writings he made it clear that in his view least parts of substances are composed of more elementary particles possessing only shape, size and a degree of motion. Whether, according to Boyle, properties other than primary mechanical ones emerge at the level of least parts or at the macroscopic level is an issue on which contemporary commentators disagree (Chalmers, 2009, 155–161), Chalmers, 2010, 8–9, Clericuzio, 2000, 103–148, Newman, 2006, 179–189). The theories of a number of atomists, such as Sebastien Basso, Etienne de Clave and Thomas Digges, were an eclectic mixture of ingredients drawn from mechanical atomism, minima theory and alchemy. (Clericuzio, 2000, Melsen, 1952, Newman, 2006)

The seventeenth-century certainly witnessed the growth of a range of experimental sciences, an occurrence of considerable epistemological significance. However, the experimental basis for seventeenth-century atomism remained extremely weak and none of the various versions of it can be said to have productively informed experiment or to have been confirmed by it, a claim that has been documented by Meinel (1988) in his survey of the experimental basis for atomism in the seventeenth century and is argued in detail in Chalmers (2009). Appeal to atoms to explain the gradual wearing away of a stone, the evaporation of a liquid, the passage of a solution through a filter paper folded multiple times and so on dated back at least as far as Lucretius and were hardly sufficiently powerful to convince anyone disinclined to accept the reality of atoms. Experimental knowledge of the combination and recovery of reacting chemicals, which certainly experienced marked growth in the course of the seventeenth century, did not of itself warrant the assumption that atoms were involved. Evidence revealed by the microscope was new to the seventeenth century, of course, and did reveal a microscopic world previously unknown. But the properties of microscopic systems were not qualitatively distinct from macroscopic ones in a way that aided the demonstration of the emergence of the properties of observable systems, whether microscopic or macroscopic, from the properties of atoms.

Suggested Readings: Clericuzio (2000) is a detailed survey of seventeenth-century atomic theories. Stewart (1979) is a collection of Boyle's philosophical papers related to his mechanical atomism. Boyle's atomism is detailed in Newman(2006) and Chalmers (2009). Debates concerning the nature and status of it are in Chalmers(1993), Chalmers (2002), Chalmers (2009), Chalmers (2010), Newman (2006), Newman (2010), Anstey (2002) and Pyle (2002).

3. Newtonian Atomism

3.1 Newton's Atomism

The key sources of Newton's stance on atomism in his published work are Querie 31 of his Opticks, and a short piece on acids (Cohen, 1958, 257–8). Atomistic views also make their appearance in the Principia, where Newton claimed “the least parts of bodies to be—all extended, and hard and impenetrable, and moveable, and endowed with their proper inertia” (Cajori, 1962, 399). If we temporarily set aside Newton's introduction of his concept of force, then Newton's basic matter theory can be seen as a version of mechanical atomism improved by drawing on the mechanics of the Principia. Whereas mechanical atomists prior to Newton had been unclear about the nature and status of the laws governing atoms, Newton was able to presume that his precisely formulated three laws of motion, shown to apply in a wide variety of astronomical and terrestrial settings, applied to atoms also. Those laws provided the law of inertia governing motion of atoms in between collisions and laws of impact governing collisions. Newton also added his precise and technical notion of inertia or mass, another fruit of his new mechanics, to the list of primary properties of atoms. These moves certainly helped to give precise content to the fundamental tenets of mechanical atomism that they had previously lacked.

There is no doubt that Newton shared the assumption of the Ancient and mechanical atomists that there is just one kind of homogeneous matter of which all atoms are composed. This is clear from the way in which Newton explained differing densities of observable matter in terms of the amount of space intervening between the component atoms. Newton argued, for instance that the ratio of space to volume occupied by atoms was seventeen times greater in water than in gold on the grounds that gold is seventeen times more dense. The fact that thin gold films transmit light convinced Newton that the atoms of gold already contains enough space to permit the transmission of light particles. The preponderance of space between the atoms of matter, however bulky or solid they might appear at the observational and experimental level, became a characteristic feature of Newtonian atomism, as Thackray (1968) has stressed.

The picture of Newton's atomism as an elaboration and improvement of mechanical atomism becomes untenable once the role of force in Newton's theorising is taken into account. There is no doubting that Newton's introduction of forces, especially the gravitational force, into his mechanics was a major scientific success borne out by observational and experimental evidence. Newton famously speculated in the Preface to the Principia (Cajori, 1958, xviii), that if all forces operative in nature, including those acting between the smallest, unobservable, particles, were known, then the whole course of nature could be encompassed within his mechanics. However, the fulfilment of such a dream would not constitute the fruition of the mechanical philosophy because of the ontological problems posed by the concept of force.

Newton explicitly rejected the idea that gravitation, or any other force, be essential to matter. But the major point of mechanical atomism had been to admit as properties of atoms only those that they must, essentially, have as pieces of matter. It was in this way that they had endeavoured to avoid introducing Aristotelian forms and qualities, which they regarded as incomprehensible from an ontological point of view. The introduction of forces as irreducible entities flew in the face of the major aim of the mechanical philosophers for clarity and intelligibility on ontological matters. Newton was unable to fashion an unambiguous view on the ontological status of gravity, a force manifest at the level of observation and experiment, let alone forces operative at the atomic level. It is true that, in the case of gravity, Newton had a plausible pragmatic response. He argued that, whatever the underlying status of the force of gravity might be, he had given a precise specification of that force with his law of gravitation and had employed the force to explain a range of phenomena at the astronomical and terrestrial level, explanations that had been confirmed by observation and experiment. But not even a pragmatic justification such as this could be offered for forces at the atomic level.

Mechanical atomism had faced the problem of how to introduce the appropriate kinds of activity into the world relying solely on the shapes, sizes and motions of atoms. They had struggled unsuccessfully to explain elasticity and gravity along such lines and chemistry posed problems of its own. Newtonian forces could readily be deployed to remove these problems. Newton presumed that forces of characteristic strengths (affinities) operated between the least parts of chemicals. What displaces what in a chemical reaction is to be explained simply in terms of the relative strengths of the affinities involved. Elasticity was attributed to attractive and repulsive forces acting between particles of an elastic substance and so on.

Newton developed theories of optics and chemistry that were atomistic in the weak sense that they sought to explain optical and chemical properties by invoking interacting particles lying beyond the range of observation. However, the particles were not ultimate. Newton's position on the least parts of chemical substances was similar to that of Boyle and other mechanical philosophers. They were regarded as made up of a hierarchy of yet smaller particles. So long as the smallest particles were held together by forces, the problem of the ontological status of the forces remained. The least parts of chemicals in Newton's theory were akin to natural minima with the added detail that their action was due to attractive and repulsive forces. As far as the particles of light in Newton's optics are concerned, whether they were ultimate or not, they too acted by way of forces and also suffered fits of easy reflection and easy refraction, the latter being used to explain interference phenomena such as Newton’s rings and why a ray incident on a boundary between two refracting media can be partially reflected and partially transmitted.

However attractive the reduction of the material world to particles interacting by way of forces may have appeared, it must be recognised that there was scant empirical support for the idea. This point is clearest in the context of chemistry. The affinities presumed to act between chemical ‘atoms’ were postulated solely on the basis of the observed chemical behaviour of bulk substances manipulated in the laboratory. The assumption that the chemical behaviour of bulk substances were due to combining atoms added nothing that made a difference to what was testable by experiment. Observed properties of chemical substances were simply projected onto atoms. Newtonians had not formulated a chemical atomic theory that could be used as a basis for the prediction of chemical phenomena at the experimental level. Newton's optics was in an analogous situation. However, here it can be said that that optical theory was able to accommodate a range of optical phenomena in a coherent way that rendered it superior to any rival. The result was the widespread acceptance of the theory in the eighteenth century.

When Newton took for granted that there is just one kind of universal matter and refused to include gravity as a primary property of matter because of worries about the ontological status of force, he was playing the role of a natural philosopher in the tradition of the mechanical philosophy. When he offered a pragmatic justification of his specification of the force of gravity independently of how that force might be explained he was acting as one who sought to develop an experimentally confirmed science independent of the kinds of ultimate explanation sought by the mechanical philosophers. His atomism contained elements of both of these tendencies. A sympathiser could say that whatever the philosophical problems posed by forces, Newtonian atomism was a speculation that at least held the promise of explaining material phenomena in a way that mechanical atomism did not and so experimental support in the future was a possibility. A critic, on the other hand, could argue that, from the philosophical perspective, the introduction of force undermined the case for the clarity and intelligibility of mechanical atomism on which its originators had based their case. From a scientific point of view, there was no significant empirical support for atomism and it was unable to offer useful guidance to the experimental sciences that grew and prospered in the seventeenth century and beyond.

3.2 Eighteenth-Century Developments in Newtonian Atomism

Force was to prove a productive addition to experimental science in no uncertain manner in the eighteenth century. Force laws in addition to the law of gravitation, involving elasticity, surface tension, electric and magnetic attractions and so on were experimentally identified and put to productive use. In the domain of science, scruples about the ontological status of forces were forgotten and this attitude spread to philosophy. Eighteenth-century updates of mechanical atomism typically included gravity and other forces amongst the primary properties of atoms. Acceptance of force as an ontological primitive is evident in an extreme form in the 1763 reformulation of Newtonian atomism by R. Boscovich (1966). In his philosophy of matter atoms became mere points (albeit possessing mass) acting as centres of force, the forces varying with the distance from the centre and oscillating between repulsive and attractive several times before becoming the inverse square law of gravitation at sensible distances. The various short-range attractive and repulsive forces were appealed to as explanations of the cohesion of atoms in bulk materials, chemical combination and also elasticity. Short-range repulsive forces varying with distance enabled Boscovich to remove the instantaneous rebounds of atoms that had been identified as an incoherency in Newton's own atomism stemming from their absolute hardness and inelasticity.

While most atomists were able to rid themselves of scruples about accepting forces as ontologically primitive, the issue of the empirical foundation for the various unobservable forces hypothesised remained. The best arguments that could be mounted were hypothetical-deductive. Forces postulated at the atomic level were credited with some empirical support if they could serve to explain observable phenomena. The form of such arguments, as well as their inconclusiveness, can be illustrated by Newton's demonstration in the Principia (Bk. 2, Prop. 23) that a gas consisting of a static array of atoms repelling each other with a force inversely proportional to their separation would obey Boyle's law. The fact that some of these theories did indeed reproduce the experimentally established facts was certainly a point in their favour, but hardly served to establish them. Whewell brought the point home by identifying competing theories of capillarity, due to Poisson and Laplace, that were equally able to reproduce the phenomena but which were based on incompatible atomic force laws, as Gardner (1979, 20) has pointed out.

The problem besetting those seeking experimental support for atomic theories is most evident in chemistry. Although many eighteenth-century chemists espoused versions of Newtonian chemistry their chemical practice owed nothing to it (Thackray, 1970). As philosophers they payed lip-service to atomism but as experimental chemists they worked independently of it. As early as 1718 Ettienne Geoffroy spelt out how the blossoming experimental science of chemical combination, involving extensive use of mineral acids to form an array of salts, could be understood in terms of what substances combined with what and could be recovered from what and to what degree. His table of the degrees of ‘rapport’ of chemical substances for each other summarised experimental data acquired by manipulating substances in the laboratory and became an efficient device for ordering chemical experience and for guiding the search for novel reactions. Klein (1995) has highlighted this aspect of Geoffroy's work and how his 1718 paper in effect shows how a large section of the experimental chemistry of the time could be construed as a practical tradition divorced from a speculative metaphysics, atomistic or otherwise. Eighteenth-century tables of affinity, modelled on Geoffroy's version, became increasingly detailed as the century proceeded. Many of the chemists who employed them interpreted the affinities featuring in them as representing attractions between chemical atoms, but such an assumption added nothing that could not be fully represented in terms of combinations of chemical substances in the laboratory.

The fact that Newtonian atomism offered little that was of practical utility to chemistry became increasingly recognised by chemists as the eighteenth century progressed. The culmination of the experimental program involving the investigation of the combination and analysis of chemical substances was, of course, Lavoisier's system involving chemical elements. But whatever sympathy Lavoisier may have had for Newtonian atomism of the kind championed by Laplace, he was at pains to distance his new chemistry from it. Substances provisionally classified as elements were those that could not be broken down into something simpler in the laboratory. Progress in eighteenth-century chemistry led away from rather than towards atomism. It was not until Dalton that the situation changed early in the nineteenth century.

The assessment that eighteenth-century atomism was ill-confirmed by experiment and failed to give useful guidance to experimentalists is a judgement that is fairly insensitive to what theory of confirmation one adopts or what one might require of an adequate scientific explanation. This situation was transformed by the emergence of Daltonian atomism, a strong candidate for the first atomic theory that had a productive link with experiment.

Suggested Reading: Thackray (1970) is an authoritative and detailed account of Newton's atomism and its development in the eighteenth century. The relation between Newton's atomism and his mechanics is discussed in Chalmers (2009, Chapter 7).

4. Chemical Atomism in the Nineteenth Century

4.1 Dalton's Atomism

The status of atomism underwent a transformation when John Dalton formulated his version of chemical atomism early in the nineteenth century. His atomic theory had implications for the way chemicals combine by weight and, for the first time, it would seem, a direct path was uncovered that took scientists from experimental measurement to a property of atoms, namely, their relative weight. An assessment of the fruitfulness and epistemological status of Dalton's atomism can easily be distorted if we are uncritically influenced by the recognition that Dalton's basic assumptions are in fact correct from a modern point of view. This section will involve a summary of the basic features of Dalton's chemistry as he published it in 1808 together with the way in which its content can be usefully expressed using chemical formulae introduced by Berzelius five years later. The following sections will explore, first the issue of the epistemological status of this early version and then the nature and status of subsequent elaborations of chemical atomism during the first half century of its life. These latter issues very much involve developments in organic chemistry, issues that have been highlighted by historians of chemistry only in the last few decades.

Dalton was able to take for granted assumptions that had become central to chemistry since the work of Lavoisier. Chemical compounds were understood as arising through the combination of chemical elements, substances that cannot be broken down into something simpler by chemical means. The weight of each element was understood to be preserved in chemical reactions. By the time Dalton (1808) made his first contributions to chemistry the law of constant composition of compounds could be added to this. Proust had done much to substantiate experimentally the claim that the relative weights of elements making up a chemical compound remain constant independent of its mode of preparation, its temperature and its state.

The key assumption of Dalton's chemical atomism is that chemical elements are composed of ‘ultimate particles’ or atoms. The least part of a chemical compound is assumed to be made up of characteristic combinations of atoms of the component elements. Dalton called these ‘compound atoms’. According to Dalton, all atoms of a given substance whether simple or compound, are alike in shape, weight and any other particular. This much already entails the law of constant proportions. Although Dalton himself resisted the move, Berzelius was able to show how Dalton's theory can be conveniently portrayed by representing the composition of compounds in terms of elements by chemical formulae in the way that has since become commonplace. Hereafter this device is employed using modern conventions rather than any of the various ones used by Berzelius and his contemporaries,

As Dalton stressed, once the chemical atomic theory is accepted, the promise is opened up of determining the relative weights of atoms by measuring the relative weights of elements in compounds. If an atom of element A combines with an atom of element B to form a compound atom of compound AB, then the relative weights of A and B in the compound as measured in the laboratory will be equal to the relative weights of atoms of A and B. However, there is a serious under-determination of relative atomic weights by measurements of combining weights in the laboratory. If the compound atom in our example were A2B rather than AB then the relative atomic weight of B would be twice what it would be if the formula were AB. Dalton himself attempted to resolve this problem with a simplicity assumption. Formulae were always to take the simplest form compatible with the empirical data. If there was only one compound of A and B known then it was assumed to be AB, whilst if there were two then a more complicated compound, A2B or AB2 became necessary. As is illustrated by the latter example, as well as the problem of the truth of the simplicity assumption there was the problem of its ambiguity. Chemical atomists were to struggle for several decades with various solutions to the problem of arriving at definitive formulae and relative atomic weights, as we shall see.

This deficiency of Dalton's atomism aside, links were forged between it and experimentally determined combining weights that went beyond the law of constant proportions to include the laws of multiple and reciprocal proportions. If two elements combine together in more than one way to form compounds, as is the case with the various oxides of nitrogen and carbon, for example, then Daltonian atomism predicts that the weights of one of the elements in each compound, relative to a fixed weight of the second, will bear simple integral ratios to each other. This is the law of multiple proportions, predicted by Dalton and soon confirmed by a range of experiments. Daltonian atomism also predicts that if the weights of elements A and B that combine with a fixed weight of element C are x and y respectively, then if A and B combine to form a compound then the relative weights of A and B in the compound will be in the ration x:y or some simple multiple of it. This law was also confirmed by experiment.

There is a further component that needs to be added to the content of early atomic chemistry, although it did not originate with Dalton, who in fact did not fully embrace it. Gay Lussac discovered experimentally that when gases combine chemically they do so in volumes that bear an integral ratio to each other and to the volume of the resulting compound if gaseous, provided that all volumes are estimated at the same temperature and pressure. For instance, one volume of oxygen combines with two volumes of hydrogen to form two volumes of steam. If one accepts atomism, this implies that there are some whole-number ratios between the numbers per unit volume of atoms of various gaseous elements at the same temperature. Following suggestions made by Avogadro and Ampere early in the second decade of the nineteenth century, many chemists assumed that equal volumes of gases contain equal numbers of ‘atoms’, with the important implication that relative weights of atoms could be established by comparing vapour densities. As Dalton clearly saw, this can only be maintained at the expense of admitting that ‘atoms’ can be split. The measured volumes involved in the formation of water, for example, entail that, if equal volumes contain equal numbers of atoms then a water ‘atom’ must contain half of an oxygen ‘atom’. The resolution of these problems required a clear distinction between atoms of a chemical substance and molecules of a gas, the grounds for which became available only later in the century. This problem aside, the empirical fact that gases combine in volumes that are in simple ratios to each other became a central component of chemistry, although it should be noted that at the time Gay Lussac proposed his law, only a small number of gases were known to chemists. The situation was to change with the development of organic chemistry in the next few decades.

4.2 The Status of Daltonian Chemistry

If Dalton's atomism was viewed as a contribution to natural philosophy in the tradition of mechanical atomism, designed to give a simple and intelligible account of the ultimate nature of the material world, then it did not have a lot going for it. It marked a decisive break with the idea that there is just one kind of matter, an assumption that extended from Democritus to Newton and beyond. If Dalton's atoms were regarded as ontologically basic, then there needed to be as many kinds of matter as there are chemical elements. Further, atoms of each element needed to posses a range of characteristic properties to account for chemical combination as well as physical aggregation and other physical properties. As a philosophical theory of the ultimate nature of material reality, Daltonian atomism was not a serious contender and was not treated as such. A more significant issue is the status of Daltonian chemistry as an experimental science. To what extent was Daltonian chemistry borne out by and able to fruitfully guide experiment?

A basic issue concerning the empirical statues of Daltonian atomism was already pinpointed in an early exchange between Dalton (1814) and Berzelius (1815). Dalton was keen to present himself as the Newton of chemistry. In his view, just as Newton had explained Kepler’s laws with his new mechanics, so he, Dalton, had explained the laws of proportion with his atomism. Without atomism the joint truth of the three laws of proportion is a mystery. Berzelius questioned the experimental grounds for assuming anything stronger than the laws of proportion, since, he argued, all of the chemistry could be accommodated by the latter. That is, nothing testable by the chemistry of the time follows from Dalton's atomic theory that does not follow from the laws of proportion plus the experimental law of combining volumes for gases.

Berzelius (1814) expressed his version of Daltonian chemistry using formulae. Dalton had pictured atoms as spheres and compound atoms as characteristic arrangements of spheres. Berzelius claimed that the two methods were equivalent but that his method was superior because it was less hypothetical. It is clear that Berzelius's version cannot be both less speculative and equivalent to Dalton's theory at the same time. But it is also clear what Berzelius intended. His point was that the testable empirical content of the two theories were equivalent as far as the chemistry of the time was concerned, but that his version was less speculative because it did not require a commitment to atoms. The symbols in Berzelian formulae can be interpreted as representing combing weights or volumes without a commitment to atoms. A Daltonian atomist will typically take the hydrogen atom as a standard of weight and the atomic weight of any other element will represent the weight of an atom of that element relative to the weight of the hydrogen atom. On such an interpretation the formula H2O represents two atoms of hydrogen combined with one of oxygen. But, more in keeping with the weight determinations that are carried out in the laboratory, it is possible to interpret atomic weights and formulae in a more empirical way. Any sample of hydrogen whatever can be taken as the standard, and the atomic weight of a second element will be determined by the weight of that element which combines with it. The formula H2O then represents the fact that water contains two atomic weights of hydrogen for every one of oxygen. Of course, determining atomic weights and formulae requires some decision to solve the under-determination problem, but that is the case whether one commits to atoms or not.

Berzelius was right to point out that as far as being supported by and serving to guide the chemistry of the time was concerned, his formulation using formulae served as well as Dalton's formulation without committing to atomism. What follows from this will depend on one's stand on confirmation and explanation in science. A strong-minded empiricist might conclude from Berzelius’s observation that Dalton's atomism had no place in the chemistry of the time. Others might agree with Dalton that the mere fact that Dalton's theory could explain the laws of proportion in a way that no available rival theory could constituted a legitimate argument for it in spite of the lack of evidence independent of combining weights and volumes. Atomism could be defended on the grounds that attempts to articulate and improve it might well fruitfully guide experiment in the future and lead to evidence for it that went beyond combining weights and volumes. But such articulations would clearly require properties to be ascribed to atoms in addition to their weight.

Berzelius himself took this latter option. He developed an atomic theory that attributed the combination of atoms in compounds to electrostatic attractions. He developed a ‘dualist’ theory to bring order to compounds involving several types of molecules. For instance, he represented copper sulphate as (CuO + SO3). Here electropositive copper combines with electronegative oxygen but in a way that leaves the combination slightly electropositive, whereas electropositive sulphur combines with oxygen in a way that leaves the combination slightly electronegative. The residual charges of the ‘radicals’ as they became known could then account for their combination to form copper sulphate.

Berzelius's conjectures about the electrical nature of chemical combination owed their plausibility to the phenomenon of electrolysis, and especially the laws governing it discovered by Faraday, which linked the weights of chemicals deposited in electrolysis to chemical equivalents. But evidence for the details of his atomistic theory independent of the evidence for the experimental laws that the theory was designed to support was still lacking. Contemporaries of Berzelius proposed other atomic theories to explain electrical properties of matter. Ampère proposed electrical currents in atoms to explain magnetism and Poisson showed how electrostatic induction could be explained by assuming atomic dipoles. In each of these cases some new hypothesis was added to atomism for which there was no evidence independent of the phenomenon explained. Nevertheless, the fact that there existed this range of possible explanations all assuming the existence of atoms can be seen as constituting evidence for atoms by those favouring inferences to the best explanation.

In the early decades of the life of Dalton's atomic chemistry various attempts were made to solve the problem of the under-determination of atomic weights and formulae. We have already mentioned the appeal to the equal numbers hypothesis and vapour densities. The fact that chemists of the time did not have the resources to make this solution work has been explored in detail by Brooke (1981) and Fisher (1982). A second method was to employ an empirical rule, proposed by Dulong and Petit, according to which the product of the specific heats and the atomic weights of solids is a constant. The problem with this at the time was, firstly, that some atomic weights needed to be known independently to establish the truth of the rule, and, secondly, there were known counter-instances. A third method for determining atomic weights employed Mitscherlich’s proposal (Rocke, 1984, 154–6) that substances with similar formulae should have similar crystal structure. This method had limited application and, again, there were counter-examples.

Our considerations so far of the status of Daltonian atomism have not yet taken account of the area in which chemistry was to be making spectacular progress by the middle of the nineteenth century, namely, organic chemistry. This is the topic of the next section.

4.3 Progress in Organic Chemistry Using Chemical Formulae

The period from the third to the sixth decades of the nineteenth century witnessed spectacular advances in the area of organic chemistry and it is uncontroversial to observe that these advances were facilitated by the use of chemical formulae. Inorganic chemistry differs from organic chemistry insofar as the former involves simple arrangements of a large number of elements whereas organic chemistry involves complicated arrangements of just a few elements, mainly carbon, hydrogen, oxygen and to a lesser extent, nitrogen.

It was soon to become apparent that the specification of the proportions of the elements in an organic compound was not sufficient to identify it or to give an adequate reflection of its properties. Progress became possible when the arrangements of the symbols representing the elements in formulae were deployed to reflect chemical properties. The historical details of the various ways in which chemical properties were represented by arrangements of symbols are complex. (For details see Rocke (1984) and Klein (2003)). Here we abstract from those details to illustrate the kinds of moves that were made.

The simplest formula representing the composition of acetic acid is CH2O using modern atomic weights. This formula cannot accommodate the fact that, in the laboratory, the hydrogen in acetic acid can be replaced by chlorine in four distinct ways yielding four distinct chemical compounds. Three of those compounds are acids that have properties very similar to acetic acid, and in which the relative weights of chlorine vary as 1:2:3. The fourth compound has the properties of a salt rather than an acid. These experimental facts can be captured in a formula by doubling the numbers and rearranging the symbols, so that we have C2H4O2, rearranged to read C2H3O2H. The experimental facts can now readily be understood in terms of the substitution of one or more of the hydrogens by chlorine, with the three chloro-acetic acids represented as C2H2ClO2, C2HCl2O2H and C2Cl3O2H and the salt, acetyl chloride, as C2H3O2Cl. Such formulae came to be known as ‘rational formulae’ as distinct from the ‘empirical formula’ CH2O. Representing the replacement of one element in a compound by another in the laboratory by the replacement of one symbol by another in a chemical formula became a standard and productive device that was to eventually yield the concept of valency in the 1860s. (Oxygen has a valency of two because two hydrogens need to be substituted for each oxygen.)

Other devices employed to fashion rational formulae involved the notion of a radical, a grouping of elements that persisted through a range of chemical changes so that they play a role in organic chemistry akin to that of elements in inorganic chemistry. Series of compounds could be understood in terms of additions, for example to the methyl radical, CH3, or to the ethyl radical, C2H5, and so on. ‘Homologous series’ of compounds could be formed by repeatedly adding CH2 to the formulae for such radicals so that the properties, and indeed the existence, of complex compounds could be predicted by analogy with simpler ones. Another productive move involved the increasing recognition that the action of acids needed to be understood in terms of the replacement of hydrogen. Polybasic acids were recognised as producing two or more series of salts depending on whether one, two or more hydrogens are replaced. Yet another important move involved the demand that rational formulae capture certain asymmetric compounds, such as methyl ethyl ether, CH3C2H5O, as distinct from methyl ether, (CH3)2O, and ethyl ether, (C2H5)2O. By 1860, the idea of tetravalent carbon atoms that could combine together in chains was added. By that stage, the demand that rational formulae reflect a wide range of chemical properties had resulted in a set of formulae that was more or less unique. The under-determination problem that had blocked the way to the establishment of unique formulae and atomic weights had been solved by chemical means.

4.4 Implications of Organic Chemistry for Atomism

The previous section was deliberately written in a way that does not involve a commitment to atomism. It is possible to understand the project of adapting rational formulae so that they adequately reflect chemical properties by interpreting the symbols as representing combining weights or volumes as Berzelius had already observed in his early debates with Dalton. Philosophers and historians of science have responded in a variety of ways to this situation.

Pierre Duhem (2002), in his classic analysis of the logic of nineteenth-century chemistry at the end of that century, construed it as being independent of, and offering no support for, atomism. Paul Needham (2004a, 2004b) has recently supported his case. Klein (2003, 18–20) notes that many of the pioneers of the developments in organic chemistry referred to combining volumes or portions or proportions rather than atoms. She attributes the productivity of the use of formulae to the fact that they ‘conveyed a building-block image of chemical proportions without simultaneously requiring an investment in atomic theories, together with the simplicity of their maneuverability on paper’ (2003, 35).

A number of chemists involved in the early advances of organic chemistry who did adopt atomism expressed their ontological commitment to ‘chemical atoms’. In doing so they distinguished their theories from those brands of physical atomism that were in the tradition of mechanical or Newtonian atomism and which sought to explain phenomena in general, and chemistry in particular, by reference to a few physical properties of atoms. Chemical atoms had more in common with natural minima insofar as they were presupposed to have properties characteristic of the substances they were atoms of. Chemical atomism lent itself to the idea that it was developments in chemistry that were to indicate which properties were to be attributed to chemical atoms, as exemplified in the path that led to the property ‘valency’. Alan Rocke (1984, 10–15 and 2013) interprets the use of formulae in organic chemistry as involving a chemical atomism that is weaker than physical atomism but stronger than a commitment only to laws of proportion.

Dalton's atomism had given a line on just one property of atoms, their relative weight. But it is quite clear that they needed far richer properties to play there presumed role in chemistry. It was to be developments in chemistry, and later physics, that were to give further clues about what properties to ascribe to atoms. (We have seen how chemists came to ascribe the property of valency to them.) There was no viable atomistic theory of chemistry in the nineteenth century that was such that chemical properties could be deduced from it. The phenomenon of isomerism is often regarded as a success for atomism. (See Bird, (1998, p. 152) for a recent example.) There are reasons to doubt this. The fact that there are chemical substances with the same proportional weights of the elements but with widely different chemical properties was a chemical discovery. It could not be predicted by any atomic theory of the nineteenth-century because no theory contained within its premises a connection between the physical arrangement of atoms and chemical properties.Isomerism could be accommodated to atomism but could not, and did not, predict it.

The emergence of unique atomic weights and the structural formulae that organic chemistry had yielded by the 1860s were to prove vital ingredients for the case for atomism that could eventually be made. But there are reasons to be wary of the claim that atomism was responsible for the rise of organic chemistry and the extent to which the achievement improved the case for atomism needs to be elaborated with more caution that is typically the case. Glymour (1980, 226–263) offers an account of how Dalton's atomism was increasingly confirmed and relative atomic weights established by 1860 that conforms to his ‘bootstrapping’ account of confirmation, an account that is adopted and built on by Gardner (1979). These accounts do not take organic chemistry into account. In one sense, doing so could in fact help to improve Glymour's account by offering a further element to the interlocking and mutually supporting hypotheses and pieces of evidence that are involved in his case. But in another sense, the fact that organic chemistry led to unique formulae by chemical means casts doubt on Glymour's focus on the establishment of definitive atomic weights as the problem for chemistry. There is a case for claiming that correct atomic weights were the outcome of, rather than a precondition for, progress in organic chemistry prior to 1860. After all, the majority of the formulae productively involved in that dramatic progress were the wrong formulae from a modern point of view! For instance, use of homologous series to project properties of lower hydrocarbons on to higher ones are not affected if the number of carbon atoms in the correct formulae are doubled, which results from taking 6 as the relative atomic weight of carbon, as many of the contemporary organic chemists did.

Suggested Readings: Rocke (1984) is a detailed study of the relevant theories in eighteenth-century chemistry whilst Klein (2003) is a historical and philosophical analysis of the introduction of formulae into organic chemistry. The empirical status of atomism in nineteenth-century chemistry is discussed in Chalmers (2009, Chapters 9 and 10)

5. Atomism in Nineteenth-Century Physics

5.1 The Kinetic Theory of Gases

The first atomic theory that had empirical support independent of the phenomena it was designed to explain was the kinetic theory of gases. This discussion will pass over the historical detail of the emergence of the theory and consider the mature statistical theory as developed by Maxwell from 1859 (Niven, (1965, Vol. 1, 377–409, Vol. 2, 26–78) and developed further by Boltzmann (1872).

The theory attributed the behaviour of gases to the motions and elastic collisions of a large number of molecules. The motions were considered to be randomly distributed in the gas, while the motion of each molecule was governed by the laws of mechanics both during and in between collisions. It was necessary to assume that molecules acted on each other only during collision, that their volume was small compared with the total volume of the gas and that the time spent in collision is small compared to the time that elapses between collisions. While the molecules needed to be assumed to be small, they needed to be sufficiently large that they could not move uninterrupted through the gas. The irregular path of a molecule through the body of a gas from collision to collision was necessary to explain rates of diffusion.

The kinetic theory was able to explain the gas laws connecting volume, temperature and pressure. It also predicted Avogadro’s law that equal volumes of gases contain equal numbers of molecules and so explained Gay Lussac's law also. This legitimated the use of vapour densities for the determination of relative molecular weights. This in turn led to definitive atomic weights and formulae that coincided with those that organic chemistry had yielded by the 1860’s. The kinetic theory of gases also explained the laws of diffusion and even predicted a novel phenomena that was quite counter-intuitive, namely, that the viscosity of a gas, the property that determines its ease of flow and the ease with which objects flow through it, is independent of its density. Counter-intuitive or not, the prediction was confirmed by experiment.

It was known from experiment that the behaviour of gases diverges from the gas laws as pressure is increased and they approach liquefaction. The gas laws were presumed to apply to ‘ideal gases’ as opposed to real gases. The behaviour of real gases approaches that of ideal gases as their pressure is reduced. The kinetic theory had an explanation for this distinction, for at high pressure the assumptions of the kinetic theory, that the volume of molecules is small compared with the total volume of the gas they form part of and that the time spent in collision is small compared to the time between collisions, become increasingly inaccurate. The theory was able to predict various ways in which a real gas will diverge from the ideal gas laws at high pressures (Van der Waals equation) and these were confirmed by experiments on gases approaching liquefaction.

The kinetic theory of gases explained a range of experimental laws and successfully predicted new ones. However, there were some key difficulties. One of them was the departure of experimentally measured values of the ratio of the two specific heats of a gas, measured at constant pressure and at constant volume, from what the theory predicted. This prediction followed from a central tenet of the theory that energy is distributed equally amongst the degrees of freedom of a molecule. The difficulty could be mitigated by assuming that molecules of monatomic gases were perfectly smooth spheres that could not be set rotating and that diatomic molecules were also smooth to the extent that they could not be set rotating about the axis joining the two atoms in the molecule. But, as Maxwell made clear, (Niven, 1965, Vol. 2, 433) it must be possible for molecules to vibrate in a number of modes in order to give rise to the spectra of radiation that they emit and absorb, and once this is admitted the predictions of the theory clash unavoidably with the measured specific heats.

The second major difficulty stemmed from the time reversibility of the kinetic theory. The time inverse of any process is as allowable as the original within the kinetic theory. This clashes with the time asymmetry of the second law of thermodynamics and the time-directedness of the observed behaviour of gases. Heat flows spontaneously from hot regions to cold regions and gases in contact spontaneously mix rather than separate. It is true that defenders of the kinetic theory such as Maxwell and Boltzmann were able to accommodate the difficulty by stressing the statistical nature of the theory and attributing time asymmetries to asymmetries in initial conditions. But this meant that a fundamental tenet of thermodynamics, the second law, was in fact only statistically true. Violations were improbable rather than impossible. Defenders of the kinetic theory had no direct experimental evidence for deviations from the second law.

5.2 The Status of the Kinetic Theory

The kinetic theory explained known experimental laws and predicted new ones. That empirical success could not be accommodated by some truncated version of the theory that avoided a commitment to atomism in the way that use of chemical formulae could for chemistry. Insofar as the kinetic theory explained anything at all, it did so by attributing the behaviour of gases to the motions and collisions of molecules. On the other hand, it did face apparent empirical refutations as we have seen. Those wishing to assert the truth of the kinetic theory, and hence of an atomic theory, had a case but also faced problems.

For those inclined to judge theories by the extent to which they fruitfully guide experiment and lead to the discovery of experimental laws, we get a more qualified appraisal. For two decades or more the mature kinetic theory proved to be a fruitful guide as far as the explanation and prediction of experimental laws is concerned. But, in the view of a number of scientists involved at the time, the kinetic theory had ceased to bear fruit for the remainder of the century, as Clarke (1976, 88–9) has stressed.

It might appear that the success of the kinetic theory marked a successful instantiation of the kind of atomism aspired to by the mechanical or Newtonian atomists, since macroscopic phenomena are explained in terms of atoms with just a few specified mechanical properties. There are reasons to resist such a view. Firstly, neither the molecules of the kinetic theory nor the atoms composing them were ultimate particles. As we have noted, it was well appreciated that they needed an inner structure to accommodate spectra. Secondly, it was well apparent that the mechanical properties attributed to molecules by the kinetic theory could not constitute an exhaustive list of those properties. Further properties were required to explain cohesion and chemical interaction for instance. Thirdly, and perhaps most fundamentally, the kinetic theory was not an attempt to give an atomic account of the ultimate structure of matter. Maxwell, for one, was quite clear of the distinction between an atomism that made claims about the ultimate structure of matter for some very general metaphysical reasons, on the one hand, and a specific scientific theory postulating atoms on the other (Niven, 1965, Vol. 2, 361–4). The kinetic theory was an example of the latter insofar as it was proposed, not as an ultimate theory, nor as a theory of matter in general, but as a theory designed to explain a specified range of phenomena, in this case the macroscopic behaviour of gases and, to a less detailed extent, of liquids and gases too. As such, it was to be judged by the extent it was able to fulfil that task and rejected or modified to the extent that it could not. A case for the existence of atoms or molecules and for the properties to be attributed to them was to be sought in experimental science rather than philosophy.

5.3 Phenomena Connected Via Atomism

During the half-century that followed the emergence of unique chemical formulae and viable versions of the kinetic theory around 1860 the content of atomism was clarified and extended and the case for it improved by the development of atomic explanations of experimental effects that involved connections between phenomena of a variety of kinds, the behaviour of gases, the effect of solutes on solutions, osmotic pressure, crystallography and optical rotation, properties of thin films, spectra and so on. In several of these cases atomic explanations were offered of experimental connections for which there were no available alternative explanations so that the case for atomism understood as an inference to the best explanation was strengthened.

Stereo-chemistry emerged as a result of taking the structures depicted in chemical formulae of substances to be indicative of actual structures in the molecules of those substances. Pairs of substances that had crystal structures that were mirror images of each other but which were otherwise chemically identical were represented by formulae that were themselves mirror images of each other. Optical rotation gave independent evidence for the reality of these underlying structures. Some chemists were reluctant to assert that the structures were in fact depictions of the physical arrangements of atoms in space, a stand supported by the fact that there was still no theory that connected physical arrangements of atoms with physical and chemical properties. There were eminent scientists, notably Ostwald (1904) and Duhem (2002), who, whilst accepting that the phenomena were indicative of some underlying structure, refused to make the further assumption that the formulae with their structures referred to arrangements of atoms at all. Two factors provide a rationale for their stance. Firstly, the use of formulae in chemistry could be accepted without committing to atomism, as we have discussed above, and as both Ostwald and Duhem stressed. Secondly, an analogy with electromagnetism indicates that structural features need not be indicative of underlying physical arrangements accounting for those structures. The electric field has the symmetry of an arrow and the magnetic field the symmetry of a spinning disc, but there is no known underlying physical mechanism that accounts for these symmetries. Stereo-chemistry may not have provided a case for atomism that was logically compelling, but it certainly enabled that case to be strengthened.

Another set of phenomena providing opportunities to develop atomism involved the effects of solutes on solutions. It was discovered that effects such as the depression of freezing point and vapour pressure and the elevation of boiling point of a solvent brought about by dissolving a non-electrolytic solute in it are proportional to the weight of dissolved substance and, what is more, that the relative effects of differing solutes in a given solvent were determined by the molecular weight of the solute. More specifically, the magnitude of the various physical effects of a solute was dependent on the number of gram molecules of the dissolved solute, independent of the chemical nature of the solute. This provided a way of measuring the molecular weight of soluble substances that complimented the method involving the measurement of the vapour pressure of volatile ones. The strong suggestion that these effects depended on the number of molecules per unit volume was strengthened when it was discovered that the osmotic pressure of a solute in a solvent obeys the gas laws. That is, the osmotic pressure exerted by a solute in a definite volume of solvent, measurable as the pressure exerted on a membrane permeable to the solvent but not the solute, was exactly the same as if that same amount of solute were to fill that same volume as a gas.

While the above could readily be explained by atomism, an anti-atomist could still accept the experimental correlations by interpreting molecular weights as those yielded by chemical formulae independently of an atomic interpretation. Ostwald took that course. The move became less plausible once the phenomena were extended to include solutions of non-electrolytes. For electrolytes, physical phenomena such as modification of boiling and freezing points and osmotic pressure could be explained in terms of the concentration of ions rather than molecules, where the ions were the charged atoms or complexes of atoms employed by the atomists to explain electrolysis. This enabled new experimental connections to be forged between, for example, osmotic pressure, and the conductivity of electrolytes. What is more, the charges that needed to be attributed to ions to explain electrolysis were themselves linked to the valencies of the chemists. The atomic interpretation of electrolysis required a corresponding atomistic interpretation of electric charge, with each monovalent ion carrying a single unit of charge, a bi-valent ion carrying two such units and so on.

Yet another breeding ground for atomism came in the wake of the electromagnetic theory of light (1865) and the experimental production of electromagnetic radiation by an electric oscillator (1888). Helmholtz (1881) observed that optical dispersion could be readily explained if it were assumed that the transmission of light through a medium involved the oscillation of particles that were both massive and charged. The adsorption and emission of spectra characteristic of atoms also suggested that they were due to the oscillations of charged particles on the atomic or sub-atomic scale. These assumptions in conjunction with the kinetic theory of gases led to an explanation of the width of spectral lines as a Doppler shift due to the velocity of radiating molecule, making possible estimates of the velocities of molecules that were in agreement with those deduced from the diffusion rate of gases.

Strong evidence for the charged and massive particles assumed in an atomic explanation of electrolysis and radiation was provided by the experiments on cathode rays performed by J. J. Thomson (1897). The experimental facts involving cathode rays could be explained on the assumption that they were beams of charged particles each with the same value for the ratio of their charge to their mass. Thomson’s experiments enabled that ratio to be measured. A range of other experiments in the ensuing few years, especially by Milliken, enabled the charge on the cathode particles, electrons, to be estimated, and this led to a mass of the electron very much smaller than that of atoms. The fact that identical electrons were emitted from cathodes of a range of materials under a range of conditions strongly suggested that the electron is a fundamental constituent of all atoms.

5.4 Thermodynamics as a Rival to Atomism

As the considerations of the previous section indicate, there is no doubt that those wishing to make a case for atoms were able to steadily strengthen their case during the closing decades of the nineteenth century. However, it is important to put this in perspective by taking account of spectacular developments in thermodynamics which were achieved independently of atomism, and which could be, and were, used to question atomism, branding it as unacceptably hypothetical.

Phenomenological thermodynamics, based on the law of conservation of energy and the law ruling out spontaneous decreases in entropy, supported an experimental programme that could be pursued independently of any assumptions about a micro-structure of matter underlying properties that were experimentally measurable. The programme was developed with impressive success in the second half of the nineteenth century. Especially relevant for the comparison with atomism is the extension of thermodynamics, from the late 1870s, to include chemistry. Two of the striking accomplishments of the programme were in areas that had proved a stumbling block for atomism, namely, thermal dissociation and chemical affinity.

Gibbs (1876–8) developed a theory to account for what, from the point of view of the atomic theory, had been regarded as ‘anomalous’ vapour densities by regarding them as consisting of a mixture of vapours of different chemical constitution in thermal equilibrium. The theory was able to predict relative densities of the component vapours as a function of temperature in a way that was supported by experiment. It is true that atomists could not only accommodate this result by interpreting it in atomic terms but also welcomed it as a way of removing the problems the phenomena had caused for the determination of molecular weights from vapour densities. But it remains the fact that the thermodynamic predictions are independent of atomic considerations once it is recognised that the chemical formulae needed for them can be, and were, obtained and interpreted in a way independent of atomism. As a matter of historical fact, Deville, the major participant in the experimental confirmation, was opposed to atomism, as Duhem (2002, 96–7) stressed.

From the time Newton introduced the notion of forces of affinity acting between atoms and responsible for their chemical behaviour there had been a problem forging a link between those forces and experimentally measurable effects. Daltonian atomists simply assumed that atoms combine in the way required to account for the measurable proportions of elements in compounds. The theory gave no account of the relative strengths of chemical bonding or hints of what would replace what in a chemical reaction. Chemical thermodynamics was able to make headway with this problem. Considerations based on entropy changes and heats of reaction made it possible to predict in which direction a particular chemical reaction will proceed and to provide an experimental measure of the affinities involved, where the affinities are not forces between atoms but provide a measure of the facility with which one macroscopic chemical substance combines with another. In the late nineteenth century leading scientists such as Ostwald, Duhem and Planck were inclined to take thermodynamics as the model of how science should proceed, maintaining a secure and productive relationship with experiment whilst avoiding hypotheses of the kind involved in atomism.

The factor that is usually considered as turning the tables decisively in favour of the atomists is Jean Perrin's experiments on Brownian motion. Nye (1972, 145–52) has documented how Ostwald and others conceded that the experiments settled the case in favour of atoms.

Suggested Readings: Clarke (1976) is a detailed investigation of the relationship between thermodynamics and the kinetic theory which contains good summaries of both theories. Clarke's case that objections to the kinetic theory were based largely on scientific grounds is contested in Nyoff (1988) which contains a good treatment of the specific heats problem, and is further discussed in de Regt (1996).

6. Brownian Motion

6.1 The Density Distribution of Brownian Particles

Brownian motion is the fluctuating motion of particles of an emulsion visible through a microscope. Two features of it led physicists in the late nineteenth century to suspect that it was caused by the molecular motions assumed in the kinetic theory. Those two features were its permanence and its random character. Perrin’s experiments of 1908 were able to give precision to those suspicions. He was able to show that the motions of the particles are indeed random, in a technical sense, and he showed that the general features of the motion are permanent, once equilibrium has been reached. The density distribution and mean free path of the particles remain constant at constant temperature. The kinetic theory had a ready explanation of these features, attributing the randomness to the randomness of the motions of the molecules making up the liquid in which the emulsion was suspended, and the equilibrium conditions as a dynamic equilibrium corresponding to the distribution of velocities formalised by Maxwell. Those wishing to resist the conclusion that Brownian motion constituted strong evidence for the kinetic theory needed to offer some alternative explanation for the two features.

The randomness of the motion rules out causes, such as convection currents in the liquid, which operate on a scale larger than the dimensions of the particles. Causes of that kind would lead to correlations between the motions of neighbouring particles and that is precisely what is ruled out by a truly random motion of particles. The permanence of the motion is a puzzle because the particles, moving through a viscous liquid, will be slowed down, losing heat to the liquid, suggesting that the whole motion should come to a halt just as a sizeable object such as a cricket ball, projected into a liquid, will be brought to rest. General, quantitative features of Perrin’s results made life difficult for the anti-atomists, but there was yet more to his case.

As was observed in Section 5.3, it had been experimentally established that the osmotic pressure of a solute in small concentrations obeys the gas laws. A natural step from the point of view of the kinetic theory is to assume that the difference between the molecules of a solute distributed through the liquid in which it is dissolved and Brownian particles all of like size suspended in a liquid is simply one of scale. Einstein (1905, 1906,1907) was the first to stress this point and to give a detailed account of Brownian motion as a thermal agitation. Perrin's initial work on the density distribution of Brownian particles seems to have been carried out in ignorance of Einstein's paper. But it was soon brought to his attention and influenced his subsequent work with full acknowledgment given to Einstein.

Perrin's observations revealed that the density distribution of Brownian particles decreased exponentially with height. He was able to explain this quantitatively by appeal to Newtonian mechanics and statistics. Because of the decrease in their density with height, more particles per second strike a unit area of the lower surface of a thin horizontal layer in the liquid than will strike a unit area of the upper surface. As a result there will be a net pressure directed upwards. Perrin was able to derive a value for the pressure in terms of the number of particles per unit volume, their mass and the mean of the squares of their velocities. Equilibrium is reached when the upwards force due to the pressure is equal to the weight of the particles arising from the excess of the density of the material of the particles over that of the suspending liquid. The resulting equation, when integrated, showed the density of the particle distribution to vary exponentially with height and also enabled Perrin to calculate a value for the mean kinetic energy of the Brownian particles from the measured variation in density of the particle distribution. It transpired that the mean kinetic energy depended only on temperature and was independent of the material of the particles, their size and the density of the liquid in which the particles were suspended.

Once Perrin was able to calculate the mean kinetic energy of the Brownian particles he could support the most basic assumptions of kinetic theory without a need to complicate matters by adding additional hypotheses. From the point of view of the kinetic theory, systems are in equilibrium when the mean kinetic energy of the molecules in those systems are equal, with particle collisions being the mechanism by means of which equilibrium is reached. Brownian particles constitute a system that differs from the molecules constituting a gas only quantitatively, not qualitatively. If a system of Brownian particles is in thermal equilibrium with a gas at some temperature, T, then, from the point of view of the kinetic theory, the mean kinetic energy of the particles must be equal to that of the molecules of the gas. By measuring the mean kinetic energy of Brownian particles from the observable density distribution at temperature, Tr, Perrin had in effect measured the mean kinetic energy of the molecules of a gas at that temperature. That knowledge enabled him to calculate Avogadro's number. As Perrin (1990, 104) remarked, it was with ‘the liveliest emotion’ that he found that number to be in accord with previous, more indirect, estimates of Avogadro's number.

Perrin stressed the extent to which the value for Avogadro’s number yielded by his experiments on density distribution formed the basis of a strong argument from coincidence for the kinetic theory. Perrin posed the question of what density distribution of Brownian particles might have been suspected prior to his experiments if the kinetic theory is ignored. Since the particles were denser than the liquid in which they were suspended, a reasonable assumption might be that the particles fall to the bottom so that the density distribution is zero. This experimental result, substituted into Perrin’s formula, would have led to an infinitely large value for N. Another plausible assumption might have attributed an even distribution to the suspended particles. Such an outcome would have led to a value of zero for N. A decrease in density with height yields some value in between these two extremes. Prior to the experiment, then, the range of plausible results to be expected from feeding the measured distribution into Perrin's equation, derived on the basis of the kinetic theory, is immense. And yet the outcome was a number very close to that predicted by the kinetic theory.

6.2 Further Dimensions of Perrin's Case

There were yet further dimensions to Perrin's experiments. In his 1905 paper, Einstein had derived expressions for the mean displacement and rotation of Brownian particles as a function of time on the basis of the kinetic theory. Perrin was able to show how these predictions were borne out by his observations of the particles. He, in effect, showed that propositions basic to the kinetic theory, such as the independence of orthogonal components of the velocity of particles and the equi-partition of energy amongst their degrees of freedom, were satisfied by the Brownian particles. What is more, it was again possible to calculate values for N from the experimentally determined mean displacements and rotations, and in both cases the measured values were within a few percent of 68 × 1022.

It was not long before Avogadro's number could be calculated by methods not closely tied to the kinetic theory of gases. Rayleigh speculated that the brightness of the sky is due to the scattering of light from the sun by molecules in the atmosphere. The theory predicted that light of shorter wavelength is scattered more effectively than that of longer wavelength, a prediction borne out by the blueness of the sky and the redness of sunsets. It also predicted that the scattered light be polarised, also in conformity with observation. It was possible to calculate Avogadro's number from the ratio of the intensity of skylight to that of light coming direct from the sun. Once the charge on the electron had been measured it was also possible to calculate Avogadro's number from the relation between current passed and weight of substance deposited in electrolysis. Radioactivity was to provide further access to the number. In all cases, the values for Avogadro's number agreed to a degree that could be reconciled with the accuracy of the experiments and the degree of approximation involved in the calculations.

There is a further important aspect of the extent to which Perrin's experiments supported the kinetic theory. One of the major objections raised by opponents of that theory was the fact that it implied that the second law of thermodynamics is only statistically true. Perpetual motion machines of the second kind become improbable rather than impossible. It is difficult to resist the conclusion that the constant lifting of Brownian particles against gravity refutes the unqualified version of the second law. When a Brownian particle moves upwards then the first law of thermodynamics, the conservation of energy, requires that the potential energy gained by the particle must come from somewhere. If it comes from the heat of the suspending liquid then this is in contradiction to the second law. An opponent of the kinetic theory and a defender of the literal truth of the second law is required to supply some alternative source of the energy. Needless to say, no suitable alternative was forthcoming. Once the kinetic theory is assumed, the rising of a Brownian particle is understood as a the result of a statistical fluctuation. What is more, the randomness and the smallness of the scale on which the violations of the second law take place ensures that it is not possible to employ the phenomenon to extract useful work.

The force of Perrin's argument for the kinetic theory, and hence for the reality of molecules, stems from the fact that his argument requires only the central assumptions of the theory, the equipartition of energy and the randomness of molecular agitation, without requiring the addition of auxiliary or simplifying assumptions. It is this fact that made his calculations of Avogadro's number qualitatively distinct from, and more telling than, other estimates. Ostwald cited this as the reason for his conversion to belief in molecules (Nye, 1972, 151–152). Interestingly, the derivation of the ratio of the principle specific heats of a gas similarly requires only the basic assumptions of the kinetic theory cited above. That is why the clash of the prediction with measured values spelt serious trouble for the classical kinetic theory. Equipartition of energy breaks down for the vibrational modes of a molecule and for rotational modes also at temperatures sufficiently low, as Perrin (1990, 73) noted.

Suggested Readings: Perrin (1990) is an English translation of his classic defence of atomism written in 1913. Nye (1972) is a useful historical survey of Perrin's work on Brownian motion. A recent philosophical analysis of the significance of Perrin's experiments, which contains references to earlier analyses by other philosophers, is Achinstein (2001), 243–265. Mayo (1996, 214–250) is an attempt to construe Perrin's argument as involving bottom-up rather than top-down reasoning. Doubts about the use of Perrin's experiments by philosophers are raised by van Fraassen (2009), to which Chalmers (2011) is a response.

7. Concluding Remarks

If we take atomism to involve the claim that the properties of macroscopic matter arise as a result of the combinations and motions of tiny particles, then it is a position confirmed by the time of the Solvay Conference in 1911 in a way that left little room for sensible doubt. But if we take atomism in a stronger sense, to mean a theory that explains all of the properties of macroscopic matter in terms of underlying particles with specified properties and governed by specified laws, then it must be denied that atomism had reached its objective in 1911. There were identifiable inadequacies and gaps in the specification of the properties of atoms and the electrons and protons that compose them and there were to an increasing extent problematic experimental results that were eventually to lead to a radical change in the laws that were presumed to govern the behaviour of atomic and sub-atomic particles.

Acceptance of the kinetic theory implied acceptance of the existence of atoms and molecules with a well-defined mass. However, it was perfectly clear that they must have further properties. For example, they needed properties that would explain chemical combination, and, specifically, the notion of valency. They also needed properties that would account for spectra. Answers to these challenges were forthcoming in the form of the electron structure of the atom and the quantum mechanics that governs it. There is a sense in which contemporary physics, with its account of the properties of atoms and molecules in terms of their electron structure and the explanation of many macroscopic phenomena in terms of the atomic and molecular structures underlying them, comes close to the ideal of Democritus. A general account of the properties of the material world is offered in terms of underlying particles with a few well-defined properties governed by well-defined laws. The difference between the contemporary situation and the ideals of Democritus or the mechanical philosophers lies in the epistemological access to the general atomistic theory. The contemporary theory became possible only as a result of centuries of scientific development. The quantum mechanical laws governing the atomic world were responses to quite specific problems revealed by experiment in areas such as black-body radiation, emission and absorption spectra, the specific heats of gases and radioactivity. The properties ascribed to electrons, for instance, such as their charge and half-integral spin, were themselves responses to quite specific experimental findings involving discharge tube phenomena and spectra. Atomism, which began its life as speculative metaphysics, has become a securely established part of experimental science.


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