Descartes' Physics

First published Fri Jul 29, 2005; substantive revision Tue Aug 22, 2017

While René Descartes (1596–1650) is well-known as one of the founders of modern philosophy, his influential role in the development of modern physics has been, until the later half of the twentieth century, generally under-appreciated and under-investigated by both historians and philosophers of science. Not only did Descartes provide the first distinctly modern formulation of laws of nature and a conservation principle of motion, but he also constructed what would become the most popular theory of planetary motion of the late seventeenth century. As the renowned historian of science Clifford Truesdell has observed, “[Descartes’ physics] is the beginning of theory in the modern sense” (Truesdell 1984, 6). Yet, for all of the forward-looking, seemingly modern, aspects of Descartes’ physics, many of Descartes’ physical hypotheses bear a close kinship with the Aristotelian-influenced science of late-Medieval and Renaissance Scholasticism. It is this unique amalgam of both old and new concepts of the physical world that may account for the current revival of scholarly interest in Descartes’ physics.

1. A Brief History of Descartes’ Scientific Work

Despite his fame as a philosopher of purely metaphysical problems, such as the relation of the soul and body, or God’s existence, it would not be incorrect to conclude that Descartes was a scientist first and a philosopher second. Not only did Descartes’ interest and work in science extend throughout his entire scholarly career, but some of his most important metaphysical works (e.g., the Meditations) were prompted by a perceived need to equip his science with a metaphysical foundation that would be acceptable to the Aristotelian-influenced Scholastics. Yet, one must be careful not to impose modern conceptions on the “natural philosophy” of earlier centuries, for much seventeenth century science was practically indistinguishable from the more speculative metaphysics of the era (and thus the label “natural philosophy” is particularly apt for describing seventeenth century science). In fact, much of Descartes’ science is only part of a much larger system that embraces all areas of philosophical investigation, including both his physics and metaphysics.

The awakening of Descartes’ interest in physics is often dated to late 1618, when Descartes first met Isaac Beeckman, an amateur scientist and mathematician who championed the new “mechanical” philosophy. The mechanical philosophy’s explanation of natural phenomena, which Descartes quickly adopted, rejected the use of Scholastic substantial forms (see Section 2). Rather, the mechanical approach favored a contact or impact model of the interaction of small, unobservable “corpuscles” of matter (which possess only a limited number of mainly geometric properties, such as size, motion, shape, etc.). Over the course of the next decade, Descartes worked on a large number of problems in both science and mathematics, with particular emphasis on the theory of light, mechanics (including hydrostatics), and the free-fall of terrestrial bodies. Much of Descartes’ output at this time is both highly mathematical and concerns only specific physical problems, not unlike the work of his contemporary Galileo. One of the accomplishments of these years includes his discovery of the law of refraction, often called Snell’s law: when light passes from one medium into another, the sine of the angle of incidence maintains a constant ratio to the sine of the angle of refraction. By the beginning of the 1630s, however, Descartes embarked on a more ambitious plan to construct a systematic theory of knowledge, including physics. The result was The World (1633), an important text in that it essentially contains the blueprints of the mechanical/geometric physics, as well as the vortex theory of planetary motion, that Descartes would continue to refine and develop over the course of his scientific career. Before publishing the treatise, however, he learned of the Church’s (1633) condemnation of Galileo for promoting Copernicanism, which prompted Descartes to withdraw his work from publication (since Descartes also advanced Copernicanism in The World). In the 1630s, the publication of the Geometry, the Optics, and the Meteorology, along with a philosophical introduction, Discourse on the Method (1637) further presented Cartesian hypotheses on such topics as the law of refraction, vision, and the rainbow. Yet, besides a brief sketch of his metaphysics and physics in the Discourse (Parts IV and V), a comprehensive treatment of his physics had to await the 1644 publication of the Principles of Philosophy. This work not only represents Descartes’ most fully developed and exhaustive investigation of physics, it also provides the metaphysical underpinnings of his physical system (in Part I). As an embodiment of his mature views, the Principles will thus form the basis of our examination of Cartesian physics.

1.1 A Note on the Primary Texts

The translations, with minor variations, are from Descartes 1979, 1983, 1984a, 1984b, 1991, but the passages are identified with respect to the Adam and Tannery edition of the Oeuvres de Descartes (1976) according to the standard convention: “AT”, followed by volume and page number. Passages cited from the Principles, however, will be identified by “Pr”, followed by volume and article, and with a final “F” indicating the inclusion of new material from the French translation of 1647.

1.2 Suggested Readings

For recent in-depth examinations of Descartes’ physics, see Garber 1992a and Des Chene 1996. Schuster 2014 covers Descartes’ early physics, from 1618 to 1633. A concise survey of Cartesian physics can be found in Garber 1992b. The scientific career of Descartes, with special emphasis on his physics, is presented in Shea 1991; see also Gaukroger, Schuster, Sutton 2000 for the many aspects of his natural philosophy. Gaukroger 2002 examines the Principles of Philosophy, especially the physics, whereas Slowik 2002 focuses primarily on Cartesian space and relational motion. The historical background to much in Descartes’ physics is also treated in Ariew 2011. On methodology in Descartes’ natural philosophy, see Smith 2009, while Hattab 2009 and Machamer and McGuire 2009 cover the development of various ideas important to his physics.

2. The Strategy of Cartesian Physics

Like many of his contemporaries (e.g., Galileo and Gassendi), Descartes devised his mechanical theory in large part to refute the widely held Aristotelian-based Scholastic explanation of natural phenomena that employed an ontology of “substantial forms” and “primary matter”. Briefly, Scholastic natural philosophy viewed a material body as comprising both an inert property-less substratum (primary matter) and a quality-bearing essence (substantial form), with the latter providing the body’s causal capacities. A quantity of matter, for example, possesses weight, color, texture, and all of the other bodily properties, only in virtue of being conjoined with a determinate form (of a billiard ball, chair, etc.). Descartes admits that he had earlier held such a view of gravity, envisioning the substantial form as a kind of goal-directed (teleological) mental property of bodies: “what makes it especially clear that my idea of gravity was taken largely from the idea I had of the mind is the fact that I thought that gravity carried bodies towards the centre of the earth as if it had some knowledge of the centre within itself. For this surely could not happen without knowledge, and there can be any knowledge except in a mind” (AT VII 442). In a revealing passage from The World, Descartes declares the Scholastic hypothesis to be both an unintelligible and inadequate methodological approach to explaining natural phenomena:

If you find it strange that I make no use of the qualities one calls heat, cold, moistness, and dryness…, as the philosophers [of the schools] do, I tell you that these qualities appear to me to be in need of explanation, and if I am not mistaken, not only these four qualities, but also all the others, and even all of the forms of inanimate bodies can be explained without having to assume anything else for this in their matter but motion, size, shape, and the arrangement of their parts (AT XI 25–26).

Descartes’ plan is to reduce the class of metaphysically suspect properties, such as heat, weight, taste, to the empirically quantifiable attributes of size, shape, and motion. In other words, Descartes intends to replace the “mentally” influenced depiction of physical qualities in Scholastic natural philosophy with a theory that requires only the properties of extension to describe the manifest order of the natural world. Consequently, Descartes was an early exponent of what came to be known as the “primary/secondary” property distinction, a concept that was very much “in the air” among the critics of Scholasticism.

Nevertheless, even if Descartes’ mechanistic natural philosophy shunned the metaphysics of substantial forms, his underlying methodology or approach to science remained very close to the Scholastic tradition. By the time of the composition of the Principles, Descartes had formulated a method that, like the Scholastics, strived to explain natural phenomena based on the allegedly simple and irrefutable “facts” and/or observations, drawn from rational reflection on concepts or from everyday experience, about the most fundamental aspects of reality. These supposedly basic facts thereby provide the requisite metaphysical foundation for his physical hypotheses: in other words, one proceeds from our “clear and distinct” knowledge of general metaphysical items, such as the nature of material substance and its modes, to derive particular conclusions on specific types of physical processes, for instance the laws of nature. This method of conducting science is quite contrary to the modern approach, needless to say, since modern scientists do not first engage in a metaphysical search for first principles on which to base their work. Yet, this is exactly the criticism that Descartes leveled at Galileo’s physics (in a letter to Mersenne from 1638): “without having considered the first causes of nature, [Galileo] has merely looked for the explanations of a few particular effects, and he has thereby built without foundations” (AT II 380; see, also, the Preface to the French translation of the Principles, AT IXB 5–11). The structure of the Principles, Descartes’ most comprehensive scientific work, reflects these priorities: Part I recapitulates the arguments (well-known from the Meditations) for the existence of God, mental substance, and other metaphysical topics; whereas the remaining Parts proceed to explain the nature of material substance, physics, cosmology, geology, and other branches of science, supposedly based on these fundamental metaphysical truths. This preoccupation with metaphysical foundations, and the causal explanations of natural phenomena derived from them, might also account for the absence in the Principles of Descartes’ more mathematical work in physics, such as his discovery of the law of light refraction. As he argued in the Rules for the Direction of the Mind (1628), pure mathematicians are only concerned with finding ratios and proportions, whereas natural philosophers are intent on understanding nature (AT X 393–395). The development of modern physics, which is inextricably intertwined with modern mathematics, thus stands in sharp contrast to the latent Scholasticism evident in Descartes’ metaphysical approach to physics.

3. Space, Body, and Motion

Descartes’ many hypotheses concerning space and body are best appreciated when viewed as a continuation of a long debate within Medieval/Renaissance philosophy centered upon the Aristotelian dictum that whatever possessed dimensionality was body (see, Grant 1981). While some philosophers, such as Telesio, Campanella, and Bruno, held space to be always filled with matter (i.e., a plenum) yet somehow independent of matter, others, like Patrizi and Gassendi, endorsed a more absolutist notion that allowed spaces totally devoid of matter (i.e., vacuum). Rejecting these anti-Aristotelian ideas of empty space, Descartes equated the defining property, or “essence”, of material substance with three-dimensional spatial extension: “the extension in length, breadth, and depth which constitutes the space occupied by a body, is exactly the same as that which constitutes the body” (Pr II 10). Consequently, there cannot exist a space separate from body (Pr II 16), since all spatial extension simply is body (and he rejects the possibility of a vacuum that is not extended). If, for example, God removed the matter within a vessel (such that nothing remained), then the sides of the vessel would immediately become contiguous (but not through motion; Pr II 18). Descartes’ actual concept of “space” can be regarded as a sort of conceptual abstraction from this bodily spatial extension, which he also dubs “internal place”:

We attribute a generic unity to the extension of the space [of a body], so that when the body which fills the space has been changed, the extension of the space itself is not considered to have been changed or transported but to remain one and the same; as long as it remains of the same size and shape and maintains the same situation among certain external bodies by means of which we specify that space. (Pr II 10F)

Relative to an arbitrarily chosen set of bodies, it is thus possible to refer to the abstract (generic) spatial extension of a portion of the plenum that different extended bodies successively “occupy”; and, presumably, by this process of abstraction the internal place of the entire plenum can be likewise constructed. Descartes takes a similar view of time, which is judged to be a generalized abstraction from the “durations” of particular bodies (where duration is an attribute of substance; Pr II 56–57; see Gorham 2007 for more on time in Descartes). Also like the Scholastics, Descartes rejects any form of atomism, which is the view that there exists a smallest indivisible particle of matter. Rather, he holds that since any given spatially extended length is divisible in thought, thus God has the power to actually divide it (Pr II 20). The material entities that interact in Descartes’ physics come in distinct units or corpuscles (see Section 7), which explains the “corpuscularian” title often attributed to his mechanical system, but these corpuscles are not indivisible.

Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy also presents his most extensive discussion of the phenomena of motion, which is defined as “the transfer of one piece of matter or of one body, from the neighborhood of those bodies immediately contiguous to it and considered at rest, into the neighborhood of others” (Pr II 25). Descartes attempts to distinguish his “proper” conception of motion, as a change of the “neighborhood” of contiguous bodies, from the common or “vulgar” conception of motion, which is change of internal place (Pr II 10–15, 24–28). The surface of these containing bodies (that border the contained body) is also called the “external place” of the contained body. Descartes notes that the vulgar concept of motion allows a body to simultaneously take part in many (possibly contradictory) motions, as when a sitting passenger on a ship views himself as at rest relative to the parts of the ship, but not at rest relative to the shore (Pr II 24). Yet, when motion is viewed as a translation of the contiguous neighborhood, a body can only partake in one motion, which dispels the apparent contradiction (since the body must either be at rest, or in translation away from, its contiguous neighborhood).

Nevertheless, Descartes’ hypothesis of motion may sanction a species of relative motion, since his phrase, “considered at rest”, implies that the choice of which bodies are at rest or in motion is purely arbitrary. According to the “relational” theory (or at least the more strict versions of relationism), space, time, and motion are just relations among bodies, and not separately existing entities or properties that are in any way independent of material bodies. Motion only exists as a “relative difference” among bodies: that is, the bodies do not possess individual, determinate properties of speed, velocity, acceleration (e.g., body C has the speed property of “5 miles per hour”); rather, all that really exists is a difference in their relative speed, velocity, and acceleration (e.g., there is a speed difference among bodies C and B of “5 miles per hour”). Several passages in Descartes’ analysis of motion seem to support this strong variety of relationism: “we cannot conceive of the body AB being transported from the vicinity of the body CD without also understanding that the body CD is transported from the vicinity of the body AB” (Pr II 29). Hence, “all the real and positive properties which are in moving bodies, and by virtue of which we say they move, are also found in those [bodies] contiguous to them, even though we consider the second group to be at rest” (Pr II 30). This form of relational motion has been dubbed the “reciprocity of transfer” in the recent literature. Yet, as will be discussed in a later section, Descartes also holds that rest and motion are different bodily states, a view that is incompatible with a strict relationism as regards motion. Therefore, Cartesian reciprocity of transfer only satisfies relationism (along with its ban on individual bodily states of motion) for moving bodies (i.e., when there is a translation manifest between a body and its contiguous neighborhood). Many of the difficulties associated with Cartesian physics can be traced to the enormous ontological burden that Descartes places on his hypothesis of motion. In a later section we will examine the problem of integrating his account of motion with the Cartesian laws of nature, but a brief discussion of the apparent circularity of Descartes’ definitions of motion and body is required at this point. After describing motion as the transference of a body from the surrounding neighborhood of bodies, Descartes states that by “one body, or one part of matter, I here understand everything which is simultaneously transported” (Pr II 25). The problem, of course, is that Descartes has defined motion as a change of contiguous bodies, and then proceeds to define body as that which moves (translates, transports). Although this circularity threatens the entire edifice of Cartesian physics, it is possible that Descartes intended both motion and body to possess an equal ontological importance in his theory, such that neither is the more fundamental notion (which serves as the basis for constructing or defining the other notion). Yet, their intrinsic interrelationship entails that any attempted definition of one must inevitably incorporate the other. The problem with this reconstruction of Descartes’ reasoning, however, is that Descartes explicitly deems motion to be a “mode” of extension; where a mode is a lesser ontological category that, roughly, can be understood as a way that extension manifests itself, or as a “property” of extension (Pr I 53; shape is also mentioned as a mode of extension). Finally, another difficulty implicit in Descartes’ theory is the fact that a resting body, according to the definition of body and place, would seem to “blend” into the surrounding plenum: that is, if a body is “everything which is simultaneously transported”, then it is not possible to discern a resting body from the surrounding plenum matter that forms the external place of that resting body. In addition, Descartes rejects any explanation of the solidity of a body that employs a bond among its particles (since the bond itself would be either a substance or property, and thus the solidity of the bond would presumably need to be explained; Pr II 55). A macroscopic material body is, essentially, held together just by the relative rest of its constituent material parts. This raises the obvious difficulty that the impact of such bodies should result in their dispersion or destruction (for there is nothing to hold them together). These sorts of complications prompted many later natural philosophers, who were generally sympathetic to Descartes’ mechanical philosophy, to search for an internal property of matter that could serve as a type of individuating and constitutive principle for bodies; e.g., Leibniz’ utilization of “force”.

Related to the alleged circularity of the definitions of motion and body, as well as the problem of resting bodies, is the difficulty in reconciling Descartes’ definition of “substance” with his claim that individual bodies are substances. If, as Descartes believes, substances are not dependent on other things in order to exist (Pr I 51), then any part of extension (which is a body, via Pr II 10, as explained above) would not qualify as a substance since it depend on its contiguous neighbors to delimit and define its boundary. Yet, Descartes often declares that individual bodies are substances; e.g., “the two halves of a portion of matter, no matter how small they may be, are two complete substances” (AT III 447). One of the most popular replies to this difficulty, from Spinoza (Ethics, Part I, Prop. 15) to many contemporary commentators (e.g., Keeling 1968, Lennon 1993, Sowaal 2004, and numerous others), is to declare that only the whole plenum is a substance, and not any of its constituent parts. The problem with this attempted solution, however, is that it lacks textual support, as is evident in the Pr I 51 quotation above. Likewise, some of these reconstructions, such as Lennon’s, would seem to violate central aspects of Cartesian physics and metaphysics, for he interprets motion as a phenomenal contribution of the mind, such that the plenum and its parts do not move or change at all. Along these same lines, some scholars (e.g., Schaffer 2009) have concluded that Descartes was a supersubstantivalist, i.e., the view that space (spacetime, in the modern setting) is the only predicable or fundamental substance. While Descartes’ identification of corporeal substance and space (see above, Pr II 10) might seem to support this reading, supersubstantivalism takes space as primary, and matter as secondary or derived from space (see Sklar 1974, 222). Descartes, on the contrary, takes matter or body as primary and space as a derived, abstract concept: “the same extension which constitutes the nature of body also constitutes the nature of space, and . . . these two things differ only in the way that the nature of the genus or species differs from that of the individual” (Pr II 11). Whereas space is a genus or species concept for Descartes (which is a universal; Pr I 59), space is the individual for the supersubstantivalist, and thus ascribing supersubstantivalism to Descartes violates his nominalism (Pr II 8). Indeed, the reason that Descartes seeks to equate bodily and spatial extension in this part of the Principles is that he strives to reject any view that treats space as a separate, usually incorporeal, entity that is independent of matter (e.g., the popular imaginary space tradition, which was a forerunner to the absolutist or substantivalist conception): “That corporeal substance, when distinguished from its quantity or extension, is confusedly conceived as if it were incorporeal” (Pr II 9).

4. The Laws of Motion and the Cartesian Conservation Principle

Foremost among the achievements of Descartes’ physics are the three laws of nature (which, essentially, are laws of bodily motion). Newton’s own laws of motion would be modeled on this Cartesian breakthrough, as is readily apparent in Descartes’ first two laws of nature: the first states “that each thing, as far as is in its power, always remains in the same state; and that consequently, when it is once moved, it always continues to move” (Pr II 37), while the second holds that “all movement is, of itself, along straight lines” (Pr II 39; these two would later be incorporated into Newton’s first law of motion). By declaring that motion and rest are primitive states of material bodies without need of further explanation, and that bodies only change their state when acted upon by an external cause, it is not an exaggeration to claim that Descartes helped to lay the foundation for the modern theory of dynamics (which studies the motion of bodies under the action of forces). For the Aristotelian-influenced Scholastics who had endeavored to ascertain the causal principles responsible for the “violent” motions of terrestrial bodies (as opposed to their “natural” motions to specific regions of the plenum), the explanation for these forced, unnatural motions seemed to lie in some type of internal bodily property, or external agent, that was temporarily possessed by, or applied to, a body—an explanation that accounts for the fact that the body’s motion both originates and concludes in a state of rest (since, while on the earth’s surface, the terrestrial element has no natural motions). According to the medieval “impetus” theory, for example, these violent motions occur when a quality is directly transferred to a body from a moving or constrained source, say, from a stretched bow to the waiting arrow. This property causes the observed bodily motion until such time that it is completely exhausted, thus bringing about a cessation of the violent movement (and the arrow’s fall back to earth). Implicit in the Scholastic view is the basic belief that a terrestrial body continuously resists change from a state of rest while situated upon the earth, since the depletion of the impetus property eventually effects a corresponding return of the body’s original motionless, earthbound condition. Descartes, on the other hand, interpreted the phenomena of motion in an entirely new light, for he accepts the existence of inertial motion (uniform or non-accelerating motion) as a natural bodily state alongside, and on equal footing with, the notion of bodily rest. He argues, “because experience seems to have proved it to us on many occasions, we are still inclined to believe that all movements cease by virtue of their own nature, or that bodies have a tendency towards rest. Yet this is assuredly in complete contradiction to the laws of nature; for rest is the opposite of movement, and nothing moves by virtue of its own nature towards its opposite or own destruction” (Pr II 37). While one can find several natural philosophers whose earlier or contemporary work strongly foreshadowed Descartes’ achievement in the first and second laws—namely, Galileo and Isaac Beeckman (see Arthur 2007)—the precise formulation put forward in the Principles of Philosophy is quite unique (especially as regards the second law, since both Galileo and Beeckman appear to sanction a form of circular inertial motion, which possibly betrays the influence of the Scholastic’s circular motion of the celestial element). A fascinating blending of Scholasticism and the new physics is also evident in the above quotation, since Descartes invokes the logic of contrary properties in his statement that “nothing moves by virtue of its own nature towards its opposite or own destruction”. That is, rest and motion are opposite or contrary states, and since opposite states cannot (via the Scholastic principle) transform into one another, it follows that a body at rest will remains at rest and a body in motion will remains in motion. Consequently, Descartes has employed a Scholastic/Medieval argument to ground what is possibly the most important concept in the formation of modern physics, namely inertia. Yet, it is important to note that Descartes’ first and second laws do not correspond to the modern concept of inertia, since he incorrectly regards (uniform, non-accelerating) motion and rest as different bodily states, whereas modern theory dictates that they are the same state.

While Descartes’ first and second laws deal with the rest and motion of individual bodies, the third law of motion is expressly designed to reveal the properties exhibited among several bodies during their collisions and interactions. In short, the third law addresses the behavior of bodies under the normal conditions in his matter-filled world; when they collide: “The third law: that a body, upon coming in contact with a stronger one, loses none of its motion; but that, upon coming in contact with a weaker one, it loses as much as it transfers to that weaker body” (Pr II 40). In the following sections of the Principles, Descartes makes explicit the conserved quantity mentioned in this third law:

We must however notice carefully at this time in what the force of each body to act against another or resist the action of that other consists: namely, in the single fact that each thing strives, as far as in its power, to remain in the same state, in accordance with the first law stated above….This force must be measured not only by the size of the body in which it is, and by the [area of the] surface which separates this body from those around it; but also by the speed and nature of its movement, and by the different ways in which bodies come in contact with one another. (Pr II 43)

As a consequence of his first law of motion, Descartes insists that the quantity conserved in collisions equals the combined sum of the products of size and speed of each impacting body. Although a difficult concept, the “size” of a body roughly corresponds to its volume, with surface area playing an indirect role as well. This conserved quantity, which Descartes refers to indiscriminately as “motion” or “quantity of motion”, is historically significant in that it marks one of the first attempts to locate an invariant or unchanging feature of bodily interactions. To give an example, if a body B of size 3 and speed 5 collides with a body C of size 2 and speed 4, then the total quantity of motion of the system is 23, a quantity which remains preserved after the collision even though the bodies may possess different speeds.

Moreover, Descartes envisions the conservation of quantity of motion as one of the fundamental governing principles of the entire cosmos. When God created the universe, he reasons, a certain finite amount of motion (quantity of motion) was transmitted to its material occupants; a quantity, moreover, that God continuously preserves at each succeeding moment. (For more on the difficult issue of God’s continuous recreation or preservation of the material world, see, e.g., Gorham 2004, Hattab 2007, and Schmaltz 2008).

It is obvious that when God first created the world, He not only moved its parts in various ways, but also simultaneously caused some of the parts to push others and to transfer their motion to these others. So in now maintaining the world by the same action and with the same laws with which He created it, He conserves motion; not always contained in the same parts of matter, but transferred from some parts to others depending on the ways in which they come in contact. (Pr II 62)

In the Principles, Descartes conservation law only recognizes a body’s degree of motion, which correlates to the scalar quantity “speed”, rather than the vectorial notion “velocity” (which is speed in a given direction). This distinction, between speed and velocity, surfaces in Descartes’ seven rules of impact, which spell out in precise detail the outcomes of bodily collisions (although these rules only describe the collisions between two bodies traveling along the same straight line). Descartes’ utilization of the concept of speed is manifest throughout the rules. For example:

Fourth, if the body C were entirely at rest,…and if C were slightly larger than B; the latter could never have the force to move C, no matter how great the speed at which B might approach C. Rather, B would be driven back by C in the opposite direction: because…a body which is at rest puts up more resistance to high speed than to low speed; and this increases in proportion to the differences in the speeds. Consequently, there would always be more force in C to resist than in B to drive, …. (Pr II 49F)

Astonishingly, Descartes claims that a smaller body, regardless of its speed, can never move a larger stationary body. While obviously contradicting common experience, the fourth collision rule does nicely demonstrate the scalar nature of speed, as well as the primary importance of quantity of motion, in Cartesian dynamics. In this rule, Descartes faces the problem of preserving the total quantity of motion in situations distinguished by the larger body’s complete rest, and thus zero value of quantity of motion. Descartes conserves the joint quantity of motion by equipping the stationary object C with a resisting force sufficient to deflect the moving body B, a solution that does uphold the quantity of motion in cases where C is at rest. That is, since B merely changes its direction of inertial motion, and not its size or degree of speed (and C equals zero throughout the interaction), the total quantity of motion of the system is preserved. For Descartes, reversing the direction of B’s motion does not alter the total quantity of motion, a conclusion that is in sharp contrast to the later hypothesis, usually associated with Newton and Leibniz, that regards a change in direction as a negation of the initial speed (i.e., velocity). Thus, by failing to foresee the importance of conjoining direction and speed, Descartes’ law falls just short of the modern law for the conservation of momentum.

In this context, the complex notion of “determination” should be discussed, since it approximately corresponds to the composite direction of a body’s quantity of motion. In some passages, Descartes apparently refers to the direction of a body’s motion as its determination: “there is a difference between motion considered in itself, and its determination in some direction; this difference makes it possible for the determination to be changed while the quantity of motion remains intact” (Pr II 41). Yet, a single motion does not have just one determination, as is clear in his critique of Hobbes’ interpretation of determinations: “What he [Hobbes] goes on to say, namely that a ‘motion has only one determination,’ is just like my saying that an extended thing has only a single shape. Yet this does not prevent the shape being divided into several components, just as can be done with the determination of motion” (April 21, 1641; AT III 356). In the same way that a particular shape can be partitioned into diverse component figures, so a particular determination can be decomposed into various constituent directions. In his Optics, published in 1637, Descartes’ derivation of his law of refraction seemingly endorses this interpretation of determinations. If a ball is propelled downwards from left to right at a 45 degree angle, and then pierces a thin linen sheet, it will continue to move to the right after piercing the sheet but now at an angle nearly parallel with the horizon. Descartes reasons that this modification of direction (from the 45 degree angle to a smaller angle) is the net result of a reduction in the ball’s downward determination through collision with the sheet, “while the one [determination] which was making the ball tend to the right must always remain the same as it was, because the sheet offers no opposition at all to the determination in this direction” (see Figure 1).


Figure 1. Diagram from the Optics.

Descartes’ determination hypothesis also incorporates a certain quantitative element, as revealed in a further controversial hypothesis that is often described as the “principle of least modal action”. In a letter to Clerselier (February 17th, 1645), Descartes explains:

When two bodies collide, and they contain incompatible modes, [either different states of speed, or different determinations of motion] then there must occur some change in these modes in order to make them compatible; but this change is always the least that may occur. In other words, if these modes can become compatible when a certain quantity of them is changed, then no larger quantity will change (AT IV 185).

This principle can be illustrated with respect to our previous example involving the fourth collision rule. If both B and C were to depart at the same speed and in the same direction after impact, it would be necessary for the smaller body B to transfer at least half of its quantity of motion to the larger stationary body C. Yet, Descartes reasons that it is easier for B in this situation to merely reverse it direction than to transfer its motion:

When C is the larger [body], B cannot push it in front of itself unless it transfers to C more than half of its speed, together with more than half of its determination to travel from left to right in so far as this determination is linked with its speed. Instead it rebounds without moving body C, and changes only its whole determination, which is a smaller change than the one that would come about from more than half of this determination together with more than half of its speed (AT IV 186).

Consequently, reversing B’s direction of motion, a change of one mode (determination), constitutes a lesser modal change than a transference of motion between two bodies, which alters two modes (speed and determination). In this passage, it is important to note that if B were to transfer motion to C, it would change both half of B’s speed and half of its determination, even though the direction of B’s quantity of motion is preserved. As a result, a body’s determination is apparently linked to its magnitude of speed.

5. The Problem of Relational Motion

As discussed in previous sections, there are various ways in which Descartes’ laws of motion violate a strict relationism. One of the most problematic instances involves the relational compatibility of the fourth and fifth collision rules. Whereas the fourth rule concludes that a large object remains at rest during impact with a smaller moving body, such that the smaller body is deflected back along its initial path, the fifth rule concludes that a large body will move a smaller stationary object, “transferring to [the smaller body] as much of its motion as would permit the two to travel subsequently at the same speed” (Pr II 50). From a relational standpoint, however, rules four and five constitute the same type of collision, since they both involve the interaction of a small and large body with the same relative motion (or speed difference) between them. One might be tempted to appeal to the basic Cartesian tenet that motion and rest are different intrinsic states of bodies, or the reciprocity of transfer thesis, to circumvent this difficulty (see section 3): i.e., there is an ontological difference between a body that is, or is not, undergoing a translation with respect to its contiguous neighborhood, and this is sufficient to distinguish the case of rule four from rule five (since the large body is really at rest in four, and really in motion in five).

The problem with this line of reasoning, however, is that it only works if one presupposes that the two bodies are approaching one another, and this is not a feature of the system that can be captured by sole reference to the contiguous neighborhood of each individual body. Even if there is reciprocity of transfer between a body and its neighborhood, it is still not possible to determine which collision rule the impact will fall under, or if the bodies will even collide at all, unless some reference frame is referred to that can compute the motion of both bodies relative to one another. Suppose, for instance, that a certain spatial distance separates two bodies, and that one of the bodies is, and the other is not, undergoing a translation relative to its neighboring bodies. Given this scenario, it is not possible to determine if; (i) the translating body is approaching the non-translating body, or (ii) the spatial interval between them remains fixed and the translating body simply undergoes a change of neighborhood (i.e., the neighborhood moves relative to a stationary body). In short, Descartes’ reciprocity of transfer thesis underdetermines the outcome of his bodily collisions, as well as the capacity to apply, and make predictions from, the Cartesian collision rules. The context of the collision rules also supports the view that the motions of the impacting bodies are determined from an external reference frame, rather than from the local translation of their contiguous neighborhoods. In elucidating the fourth rule, for instance, Descartes states that B could never move C “no matter how great the speed at which B might approach C” (Pr II 49)—and only an external perspective, not linked to the bodily reciprocity of transfer, could determine that B “approaches” C. Such admissions make it very difficult to reconcile Descartes’ physics with a strict relational theory of space and motion, although it may be compatible with weaker forms of relationism that can countenance various external reference frames, structures, or other methods for determining the individual states of bodily motion. These weaker relationist strategies (or even non-relational, absolutist interpretations) of Descartes’ physics come at a high price, however, since the reciprocity of transfer thesis must be abandoned. For these reasons, it is more likely that Descartes’ reciprocity of transfer thesis is intended to counter any interpretation that regards motion as caused by a bodily property, as some Scholastics had held (such as Buridan), rather then defend relational motion (see Maier 1982 on these earlier views of motion). That is, if there is nothing in the moving body that differs from its neighborhood of contiguous bodies (see Pr II 30), then a body’s motion is not due to it possessing a special property that its neighborhood lacks.

6. “Force” in Cartesian Physics

Despite the mechanistic, non-teleological character of Descartes’ analysis of motion and bodily interactions, there are many seemingly metaphysical and qualitative traits in Cartesian physics that do not sit comfortably with his brand of reductionism (i.e., that material bodies are simply extension and its modes). In fact, returning to the Cartesian laws of nature (section 4), it is evident that Descartes has allotted a fundamental role to the action of bodily “forces” or “tendencies”: for example, the tendency of bodies to follow straight lines, the resistance to motion of a large resting body (to a smaller moving body), etc. In The World, he states: “the virtue or power in a body to move itself can well pass wholly or partially to another body and thus no longer be in the first; but it cannot no longer exist in the world” (AT XI 15). As an early remark concerning his conservation principle, this explanation seems to envision force much like a property or “power” possessed by individual material objects, similar to the qualitative, metaphysical properties of the Scholastics (as in the “impetus” theory). For these reasons, the nature of bodily forces or tendencies is a philosophical question of much interest in the study of Descartes’ physics.

In order to better grasp the specific role of Cartesian force, it would be useful to closely examine his theory of centrifugal effects, which is closely associated with the second law of nature. Besides straight-line motion, Descartes’ second law also mentions the “center-fleeing” (centrifugal) tendencies of circularly moving material bodies: “all movement is, of itself, along straight lines; and consequently, bodies which are moving in a circle always tends to move away from the center of the circle which they are describing” (Pr II 39). At first glance, the second law might seem to correspond to the modern scientific dissection of centrifugal force: specifically, the centrifugal effects experienced by a body moving in a circular path, such as a stone in a sling, are a normal consequence of the body’s tendency to depart the circle along a straight tangential path. Yet, as stated in his second law, Descartes contends (wrongly) that the body tends to follow a straight line away from the center of its circular trajectory. That is, the force exerted by the rotating stone, as manifest in the outward “pull” on the impeding sling, is a result of a striving towards straight line inertial motion directed radially outward from the center of the circle, rather than a striving towards straight line motion aimed along the circle’s tangent. Descartes does acknowledge, however, the significance of tangential motion in explicating such “center-fleeing” tendencies, but he relegates this phenomenon to the subordinate status of a composite effect. By his reckoning, the tendency to follow a tangential path exhibited by a circling body, such as the flight of the stone upon release from the sling, can be constructed from two more basic or primary inclinations: first, the tendency of the object to continue along its circular path; and second, the tendency of the object to travel along the radial line away from the center. Thus, Descartes is willing to admit that “there can be strivings toward diverse movements in the same body at the same time” (Pr III 57), a judgment that seems to presuppose the acceptance of some type of “compositional” theory of tendencies analogous to his dissection of determinations. Yet, since he believes that “the sling, …, does not impede the striving [of the body along the circular path]” (Pr III 57), he eventually places sole responsibility for the production of the centrifugal force effects on the radially directed component of “striving”. He states, “If instead of considering all the forces of [a body’s] motion, we pay attention, to only one part of it, the effect of which is hindered by the sling;…;we shall say that the stone, when at point A, strives only [to move] toward D, or that it only attempts to recede from the center E along the straight line EAD” (Pr III 57; see Figure 2).


Figure 2. Diagram that accompanies Pr III 57.

Descartes’ use of the terms “tendency” and “striving” in his rotating sling example should not be equated with his previous concept of a determination of motion. A determination is confined to a body’s actual motion, whereas a body’s tendency towards motion only occurs at a single instant. He states: “Of course, no movement is accomplished in an instant; yet it is obvious that every moving body, at any given moment in the course of its movement, is inclined to continue that movement in some direction in a straight line,…” (Pr II 39). In another passage in the Principles, Descartes identifies these strivings as a “first preparation for motion” (Pr III 63). Hence, while determinations necessitate a span of several instants, tendencies towards motion are manifest only at single instants. This is a crucial distinction, for it partitions Cartesian dynamics into two ontological camps: forces that exist at moments of time, and motions that can only subsist over the course of several temporal moments. In many parts of the Principles, moreover, Descartes suggests that quantity of motion is the measure of these bodily tendencies, and thus quantity of motion has a dual role as the measure of non-instantaneous bodily motion as well as the instantaneous bodily tendencies (see Pr III 121).

Given his rejection of the Scholastic qualitative tradition in physics, Descartes’ depiction of centrifugal effects as due to a “tendency” or “striving” of moving bodies thus raises a host of intriguing ontological questions (and may even reveal a vestigial influence of his earlier Scholastic training). That is, even as his penchant for a geometrical world view increased, as manifest in the identification of extension as matter’s primary quality, Descartes continued to treat inertial motion and its accompanying force effects as if they were essential characteristics of bodies. Descartes’ own remarks on the ontological status of inertial force, furthermore, disclose a certain degree of ambiguity and indecision. In a 1638 letter, (six years before the Principles), he concludes:

I do not recognize any inertia or natural sluggishness in bodies…; and I think that by simply walking, a man makes the entire mass of the earth move ever so slightly, since he is putting his weight now on one spot, now on another. All the same, I agree …that when the largest bodies (such as the largest ships) are pushed by a given force (such as a wind), they always move more slowly than others. (AT II 467)

In this passage, Descartes seems to deny the existence of inertial force if conceived as a form of Scholastic quality that material bodies can possess; rather, bodies are “indifferent to motion”, so even the slightest weight should move the entire earth. On the other hand, he is willing to acknowledge the commonly observed fact that larger objects are much harder to set in motion than smaller objects. Consequently, although Descartes finds the existence of “forces of resistance” (or “natural sluggishness”) problematic, as is the case with such similar properties as weight, he does not entirely relegate inertia to the phenomenological status of the so-called secondary properties of matter (such as color, taste, etc., which only exist in the mind). The main reason for this inclusion of inertial force effects into scientific discourse can probably be traced to Descartes’ classification of motion as an intrinsic characteristic or “mode” of extension (see Section 3). As the concluding sections of the Principles state: “I have now demonstrated [there] are nothing in the [material] objects other than…certain dispositions of size, figure and motion…” (Pr IV 200). Since inertial forces are a consequence or a by-product of motion, as the product of the size times speed of bodies, Descartes apparently did not object to incorporating these phenomena within the discussion of the modes of material substance.

Yet, even if Descartes described force as an intrinsic fact of material interactions, the exact nature of the relationship between force and matter remains rather unclear. In particular, is force a property actually contained or present within bodies? Or, is it some sort of derivative phenomenal effect of the action of speed and size, and thus not present within extension? On the former interpretation (as favored by Alan Gabbey 1980, and Martial Gueroult 1980), forces exist in bodies in at least one important sense as “real” properties or modes whose presence occasions the Cartesian laws of nature. While many of Descartes’ explanations might seem to favor this interpretation (e.g., “[a body] at rest has force to remain at rest”, Pr II 43), Daniel Garber charges that such views run counter to Descartes’ demand that extension alone comprise the essence of matter. Garber suggests that we view Cartesian force as a sort of shorthand description of the dynamical regularities maintained in the world by God, and not as some form of quality internal to bodies: “The forces that enter into the discussion [of the Cartesian collision laws] can be regarded simply as ways of talking about how God acts, resulting in the law-like behavior of bodies; force for proceeding and force of resisting are ways of talking about how, …, God balances the persistence of the state of one body with that of another” (Garber 1992a, 298; see also Hatfield 1979, Des Chene 1996, and Manchak 2009, for more approaches). In various passages associated with the conservation principle, Garber’s interpretation apparently gains credibility. For instance: “So in now maintaining the world by the same action and with the same laws with which He [God] created it, He conserves motion; not always contained in the same parts of matter, but transferred from some parts to others depending on the ways in which they come in contact” (Pr II 42). In retrospect, however, it must be acknowledged that Descartes’ classification of material substance with extension, as exemplified in his demand that there exists nothing in bodies except “certain dispositions of size, figure and motion”, is so open-ended and equivocal as to easily accommodate both of the interpretations surveyed above. All that can be safely concluded is that Descartes envisioned the forces linked with bodily inertial states as basic, possibly primitive, facts of the existence of material bodies—a broad judgment that, by refusing to take sides, opts out of this difficult ontological dispute.

7. Cartesian Cosmology and Astrophysics

Descartes’ vortex theory of planetary motion proved initially to be one of the most influential aspects of Cartesian physics, at least until roughly the mid-eighteenth century. A vortex, for Descartes, is a large circling band of material particles. In essence, Descartes’ vortex theory attempts to explain celestial phenomena, especially the orbits of the planets or the motions of comets, by situating them (usually at rest) in these large circling bands. The entire Cartesian plenum, consequently, is comprised of a network or series of separate, interlocking vortices. In our solar system, for example, the matter within the vortex has formed itself into a set of stratified bands, each lodging a planet, that circle the sun at varying speeds. The minute material particles that form the vortex bands consist of either the atom-sized, globules (secondary matter) or the “indefinitely” small debris (primary matter) left over from the impact and fracture of the larger elements; tertiary matter, in contrast, comprises the large, macroscopic material element (Pr III 48–54). This three-part division of matter, along with the three laws of nature, are responsible for all cosmological phenomena in Descartes’ system, including gravity. As described in Pr III 140, a planet or comet comes to rest in a vortex band when its radially-directed, outward tendency to flee the center of rotation (i.e., centrifugal force; see Section 6) is balanced by an equal tendency in the minute elements that comprise the vortex ring. If the planet has either a greater or lesser centrifugal tendency than the small elements in a particular vortex, then it will, respectively, either ascend to the next highest vortex (and possibly reach equilibrium with the particles in that band) or be pushed down to the next lowest vortex—and this latter scenario ultimately supplies Descartes’ explanation of the phenomenon of gravity, or “heaviness”. More specifically, Descartes holds that the minute particles that surround the earth account for terrestrial gravity in this same manner (Pr IV 21–27). As for the creation of the vortex system, Descartes reasons that the conserved quantity of motion imparted to the plenum eventually resulted in the present vortex configuration (Pr III 46). God first partitioned the plenum into equal-sized portions, and then placed these bodies into various circular motions that, ultimately, formed the three elements of matter and the vortex systems (see Figure 3).


Figure 3. Plenum vortices in the Principles, Pr III 53.

Besides the ontological economy of only requiring inertial motion and its attendant force effects, Descartes’ choice of circularly moving bands of particles may have also been motivated by worries over, for lack of a better term, “plenum crowding”. In the Principles, he argues: “It has been shown…that all places are full of bodies…. From this it follows that no body can move except in a complete circle of matter or ring of bodies which all move at the same time” (Pr II 33). Circular motion is therefore necessary for Descartes because there are no empty spaces for a moving object to occupy. Although the world is described as “indefinitely” large (Pr I 26–27, with only God receiving the more positive description, infinite), the non-circular motion of a single body could violate the Cartesian conservation principle by resulting in an indeterminate material displacement. As an aside, it is enormously difficult to reconcile Descartes’ collision rules with his claim that all bodily motion occurs in circular paths; moreover, since the bodies that comprise the circular path all move simultaneously, it seems to follow from the definition of “body” (see Section 3) that there is only one moving body (and not many).

Returning to the vortex theory, Descartes allots a considerable portion of the Principles to explicating various celestial phenomena, all the while adopting and adapting numerous sub-hypotheses that apply his overall mechanical system to specific celestial events. One of the more famous of these explanations is the Cartesian theory of vortex collapse, which also provides an hypothesis on the origins of comets (Pr III 115–120). Briefly, Descartes reckons that a significant amount of first element matter constantly flows between adjacent vortices: as the matter travels out of the equator of one vortex, it passes into the poles of its neighbor. Under normal conditions, primary matter flows from the poles of a vortex into its center, i.e., the sun, which is itself comprised of primary matter. Due to centrifugal force, these particles press out against the surrounding secondary globules as they begin their advance towards the equator (Pr III 120–121); the pressure exerted by the primary and secondary elements (on a person’s optic nerve) also serving as the cause of light (Pr III 55–64, IV 195). Since the adjacent vortices also possess the same tendency to swell in size, a balance of expansion forces prevents the encroachment of neighboring vortices. On occasion, however, a buildup of larger elements on the sun’s surface, identified as sunspots, may conspire to prevent the incoming flow of first element matter from the poles. If the sunspots ultimately cover the entire surface of the sun, the vortex’s remaining primary matter will be expelled at the equator, and thus it no longer has a source of outward pressure to prevent the encroachment of neighboring vortices. Once the vortex is engulfed by its expanding neighbors, the encrusted sun may become either a planet in a new vortex, or end up as a comet passing through many vortices.

On the whole, the vortex theory offered the natural philosopher a highly intuitive model of celestial phenomena that was compatible with the mechanical philosophy. The theory was regarded as superior to Newton’s theory of universal gravitation since it did not posit a mysterious, occult quality (gravity) as the cause of the planetary orbits or the free-fall of terrestrial objects. The vortex theory likewise provided a built-in explanation for the common direction of all planetary orbits. Additionally, the vortex theory allowed Descartes to endorse a form of Copernicanism (i.e., sun-centered world) without running afoul of Church censorship. Since the alleged motion of the earth was one of the Church’s principal objections to Galileo’s science, Descartes hoped to avoid this objection by placing the earth at rest within a vortex band that circled the sun, such that the earth does not undergo a change of place relative to the containing surface of the neighboring material particles in its vortex band (Pr III 24–31; and section 3). Through this ingenious maneuver, Descartes could then claim that the earth does not move—via his definition of place and motion—and yet maintain the Copernican hypothesis that the earth orbits the sun. “The Earth, properly speaking, is not moved, nor are any of the Planets; although they are carried along by the heaven” (Pr III 28). In the long run, however, Descartes’ vortex theory failed for two fundamental reasons: first, neither Descartes nor his followers ever developed a systematic mathematical treatment of the vortex theory that could match the accuracy and predictive scope of the (continuously improving) Newtonian theory; and second, many attempts by Cartesian natural philosophers to test Descartes’ various ideas on the dynamics of circularly moving particles (e.g., by using large spinning barrels filled with small particles) did not meet the predictions advanced in the Principles (see Aiton 1972).


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