Notes to Ayn Rand

1. For concerns about the accuracy of the published version of Rand’s journals, see Sciabarra 1998 and Burns 2009.

2. Michael Shermer discusses the cultish features of Rand’s followers, but also writes that many of her ideas, including her defense of reason, individualism, and laissez-faire capitalism, are powerful and insightful (Shermer 1993).

3. True, they owe their existence and nature—their function—to human purposes, and do not care if they are harmed. But in this they are no different from black tulips. At best, Rand’s argument supports her claim that the genesis of value is life.

4. Kelley (2015) seems to be moving towards the eudaimonist position, but complicating this interpretation is the fact that his essay begins and ends with the claim that life (survival?) is the standard of value.

5. Kira (We the Living) loses everyone and everything she loves to a vicious totalitarian system, but retains her passionate love for life. Roark (Fountainhead), condemned to work in a quarry, perhaps forever, never succumbs to bitterness or hatred towards those who have deprived him of his life-blood—building—treating his pain as an adversary to be vanquished. Francisco’s house in Galt’s Gulch (Atlas Shrugged) serves as a metaphor for the virtuous hero’s ability to affirm life in the face of sorrow: the “silent, locked exterior” of the house bespeaks the sorrow and loneliness of Francisco’s years of painful renunciation of the woman and the work he loves, but the interior is filled with an “invigorating brightness”, the sorrow overcome by his affirmation of life (Rand 1957 [1992]: 710).

6. In “Philosophy and Sense of Life” (Rand 1966b), however, Rand argues that (i) we start forming our emotional outlook on life—our “sense of life”—long before we have acquired conscious convictions about the world, and that (ii) most people’s sense of life is closer to the truth than their conscious convictions. In her fiction, too, Rand often indicates that emotions can sometimes be more trustworthy in apprising us of the truth than reason, a view that has recently gained support from cognitive, evolutionary, and social psychology. Time and again she shows her heroes justifiably accepting the evidence of their emotions, without quite understanding why. Thus, in an early scene in Atlas Shrugged we read that Dagny is convinced that Francisco has become a worthless playboy and that she ought to grant him no personal recognition; but when during their conversation she realizes that she still desires him, we are told that she neither fights it nor regrets it (1957 [1992]: 117–18). In The Fountainhead, we see Dominique telling Gail Wynand, a man whose principles she despises, that it will take her “years to understand” why she has started feeling loyal to him, for it “contradicts everything” she’s done and thought—but she knows she owes it to him to warn him against Ellsworth Toohey (1943: 499–500).

7. McConnell’s (2010) oral history of Rand’s life contains many examples of people who attested to Rand’s generosity. One example comes from June Kuriso, née Kato (86–107). Kuriso was attending college in Los Angeles, where she lived in a church-sponsored hostel for Japanese people who had been interned. On Saturdays June would go to Rand and Frank O’Connor’s ranch in San Fernando, spending the weekend typing pages of Atlas Shrugged as Rand wrote them. Rand paid her enough for those two days ($48, the equivalent of between $485 and $524 in today’s dollars) to enable June to support herself through the week and pay for her college expenses. Rand was also very kind and friendly towards her. “When you get right down to it, I’m talking about extreme fondness, love. She was so good to me” (104). Another example is Rand’s persistence over a period of three years in rescuing her first English teacher and her mother’s close friend, Maria Strakhow, from a Displaced Persons’ camp in Austria, paying for her passage and putting her up in her own home for a year (94; and Berliner, 1995a, pp. 301, 360, 362, 367, 369, 376, 377, 401, 406, 409, 426).

8. Nor are these examples of out-of-character behavior; we are clearly meant to believe that Roark, Dagny, Rearden, and Rand’s other heroes and heroines have kind and generous characters. Thus, we read that when Mallory looks up at Roark, he sees “the calmest, kindest face”—though “a face without a hint of pity” (1943: 321), and Keating tells Roark that he is “the kindest man” he knows for not dredging up the past and throwing it in his face now that he is down and out (1943: 574–75). Kelley (1996) and Smith (2006) give instrumentalist arguments for elevating the status of the virtues of benevolence in the Objectivist ethics.

9. This is not to say, however, that Rand cannot recognize the positive obligations and correlative rights created by contracts, parenthood, and so on.

10. Marx’s labor theory of value and worker-exploitation led him, famously, to use the same argument from self-ownership to reject private property rights in The Communist Manifesto.

11. The only exception is Anthem’s Golden One, who has her hands full as the prospective first mother of a new generation of people in a new world. In addition, although The Fountainhead’s Dominique is a successful journalist, she is not interested in it as a career: her only project is to remain free of all ties to the world.

12. See, for example, the story of the young man who is saved from despair by seeing Roark’s Monadnock Valley Resort:

He thought only that he wished to find joy and reason and meaning in life … Let me see that in one single act of man on earth … the final, the fulfilled, the innocent of pain. Don’t help me or serve me, but let me see it once, because I need it … show me that it is possible—show me your achievement—and the knowledge will give me courage for mine…. [T]here it was before his eyes … [Roark] did not know that he had given someone the courage to face a lifetime. (1943: 503–6)

13. Rand’s position bears some resemblance to C.S. Lewis’s self-refutation argument against naturalism, famously critiqued by G.E.M. Anscombe. See C.S. Lewis, Miracles, ch. 3. London & Glasgow 1947, revised 1960; and G.E.M. Anscombe, “Reply to Mr. C.S. Lewis’s Argument that ‘Naturalism’ is Self-Refuting”, Socratic Digest 4 (1948), 7–15; reprinted in The Collected Philosophical Papers of G. E. M. Anscombe, Vol. II: Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind (Oxford 1981), 224–232.

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