Supplement to Ayn Rand
Epistemology and Metaphysics
- A.1 Perception
- A.2 Theory of Concepts
- A.3 Existence, Identity, and Consciousness
- A.4 Metaphysics of Human Nature
Rand developed her views on perception largely in conversations with Nathaniel Branden and Leonard Peikoff, who presented them in lectures. These views were later elaborated by Kelley (1986), Peikoff (1991), and others. Rand holds that all knowledge is derived from perception, and a judgment can be “validated” (Rand’s term for establishing an idea’s basis in reality) only by tracing it to its foundations at the perceptual level. In this sense Rand counts as a kind of empiricist. But she rejects the traditional rationalist/empiricist dichotomy, taking it to embody a false alternative: rationalism holds that we can deduce knowledge from concepts acquired without the help of perception, whereas empiricism holds that we can gain propositional knowledge from experience without the help of concepts. For Rand, neither is possible: while the senses provide the raw material of knowledge, conceptual processing is needed to establish knowable propositions. (Whether Rand’s characterization of rationalists and empiricists is fair is debatable.)
For Rand the acquisition of knowledge is a process of differentiation and integration—of discriminating among objects of awareness on the basis of their differences, and then uniting the discriminated phenomena into a cognitively graspable whole. The process begins at the perceptual level (Rand accepts the existence of a pre-perceptual form of consciousness which she calls sensation, but does not assign it much of a role in her theory), when entities are differentiated from their surroundings and integrated as unified wholes.
The primary objects of perception—and the basic building blocks of Rand’s ontology as well—are entities. Attributes and actions are secondary; they make sense only as actions and attributes of entities. This does not mean, however, that entities are bare substrata underlying their attributes. There is no such thing as existence other than as some definite thing with a specific identity; identity is the form that existence takes. Hence an entity just is the totality of its attributes.
Rand distinguishes two senses of “entity” (ITOE: 268–74). In the narrow sense, an entity is an object whose unity is independent of our consciousness. Rand compares entities in this sense to Aristotelian primary substances (though without endorsing the details of Aristotle’s hylomorphism), and regards them as the basic ontological constituents of reality. In the broader sense, an entity is anything we choose to consider apart from its surroundings, even if it has no more unity than what we give it in so considering it—as when we attend either to parts of entities or to groups of entities. Entities in the narrow sense have their entity status metaphysically, and presumably intrinsically, i.e., as explained above, apart from their relationship to our consciousness (though this is a matter of debate in Rand scholarship: Jilk 2003; Bissell 2007). Entities in the broad sense may have their entity status only epistemologically, that is, only in relation to consciousness. Their status as existents, however, remains metaphysical. That is, they really exist apart from our manner of considering them, even if they do not exist as entities apart from our manner of considering them.
While Rand sometimes refers to the evidence of the senses as “data”, she does not regard the deliverances of the senses as “sense-data” understood as features of our subjective experience; the data of the senses, for her, are genuine extramental entities and their attributes. Our perceptual faculties place us in direct contact with reality. In this sense Rand’s theory of perception is a version of direct realism, holding that the objects of perception are extramental entities (rather than, say, subjective experiences on the basis of which we infer entities as their causes).
The validity of sense-perception is not susceptible of proof, because it is presupposed by all proof, since proof just is a matter of adducing sensory evidence. Nor can its validity be denied or questioned, since the very conceptual tools one would have to use to do this are derived from sensory data and so presuppose their validity. Hence perceptual error is not strictly possible, though it is possible to misinterpret perceptual evidence—and phenomena that many would regard as perceptual illusions are instead identified by Rand either as correct perceptions misinterpreted (e.g., optical illusions) or as non-perceptions mistaken for perceptions (e.g., dreams and hallucinations). Rand’s view here bears interesting similarities to the contemporary view known as perceptual disjunctivism.
The formation of concepts and beliefs upon this sensory basis, by contrast, is a volitional process that is quite definitely capable of being subject to error. Rand accepts sensory data as a basic, unquestionable, pre-conceptual starting-point of all knowledge, and so in that sense embraces a version of the epistemologically “Given”. Rand’s “Given”, however, are extramental entities and their attributes, not propositional judgments about them; all propositional judgments are products of the volitional, conceptual level of consciousness and so are potentially fallible.
Rand rejects the view that some perceptions are of the qualities of objects as they are independently of us (primary qualities), whereas others (secondary qualities) are caused by the primary qualities, and are entirely in the mind (ITOE: 279ff ). Instead, she distinguishes between the content of a perception and its form; when we perceive an object as, e.g., square and red, what we perceive are its intrinsic features in a certain form, a form that is determined by the nature of the object, the nature of our perceptual organs, and the environment. Thus, we perceive the object’s shape as square, and the reflectance properties of its surface as red; both are the result of the interaction of our perceptual organs with what is out there. Neither squareness nor redness belong either to the object apart from our mode of perception, or to our mode of perception apart from the object in its environment. Hence, these attributes are neither intrinsic nor subjective but relational and objective (Kelley 1986; Peikoff 1991).
Thus while Rand is a direct realist in the sense explained above, she is not a naive realist in the sense of regarding all perceived attributes as enjoying equal extramental status. It is possible for us to misidentify features of a perception’s form as belonging to its content (and presumably vice versa). But Rand does not regard this fact as impugning the reliability of the senses, since the judgment that a particular feature belongs to a perception’s content rather than its form is not contributed by the perception itself but is a volitionally, fallibly formed conceptual response to that perception.
Nor is the existence of features belonging to the form rather than the content of perception indicative of any flaw in our perceptual faculties. On the contrary, every process must have some definite nature and occur by some definite means; thus it is inevitable, on Rand’s view, that the way objects appear to us should depend on the nature of our perceptual organs. The fact that the form of our knowledge is partly determined by the means by which it is acquired does not invalidate its status as knowledge. To assume otherwise would be, in effect, to conclude that “you can know nothing, because you know it by means of something”—that you are “blind … because you have eyes, and deaf … because you have ears” (1997: 655). Nor, again, should the discovery that attributes like color are not intrinsic features of entities be taken to imply their subjectivity. Inasmuch as such attributes depend not on consciousness alone but rather on the relationship between consciousness and its objects, they are neither intrinsic nor subjective, but rather objective. (Thus an entity can exist intrinsically even if some of its attributes exist only objectively.)
Rand rejects Kant’s idea of innate conceptual categories on the grounds that it confuses the form of thought with the object and content of thought, thus cutting us off from reality (ITOE, Ch. 8). Some critics, however, see Rand’s own distinction as strikingly reminiscent of Kant (Walsh 2000). Critics also argue that Rand makes the reliability of perception vacuous (since nothing counts as perception unless it’s accurate); assumes a foundationalist approach that conflates the perceptual process by which judgments are formed with the way in which they are to be justified; and leaves it unclear how judgments with propositional structure can be validated by sensory data lacking such structure (Dipert 1987; Long 2000). On the positive side, several philosophers have developed Rand’s theory of perception in a way that engages with problems in contemporary analytic epistemology (Kelley 1986; Ghate 2013; Salmieri 2013).
A.2 Theory of Concepts
The process of differentiation and integration that begins at the perceptual level continues at the level of concept-formation, as we selectively attend to certain attributes of an entity, discriminate it from entities lacking those attributes, and mentally group it together with entities that share the attributes. This makes it possible to treat entities as units, that is, as members of a group (ITOE; Kelley 1984; Kelley and Krueger 1984; Peikoff 1991). An entity’s status as a unit is not intrinsic, since the basis of its status is our mental process of differentiation and integration. But neither is its status subjective, because the process is based on actually existing similarities and differences. Its status is, therefore, objective. Consequently, Rand rejects as a false alternative the debate between realists and nominalists over the nature of universals. (“Realism”, as a theory about universals, is to be distinguished from the kind of perceptual realism that Rand accepts.) Rand identifies universals with concepts, understood as attributes of consciousness, and so repudiates the intrinsicism of the realists; for Rand, the problem of universals belongs to epistemology, not to metaphysics. But because she takes concepts to be objective in her sense, Rand likewise distinguishes her theory from nominalism, which she interprets as a subjectivist approach to universals.
Attributes can also be regarded as units. This makes possible the process of measurement, which involves relating perceptible attribute-units to larger or smaller quantities, including those too large or too small to perceive, thus permitting the expansion of our knowledge beyond the perceptual level. Measurement is here understood broadly, as covering ordinal as well as cardinal relationships, and thus applies to all concepts, not just narrowly quantitative ones. Concepts expand the range of our knowledge by reducing the number of units with which we must deal.
Rand holds a “measurement-omission” theory of abstraction; that is, she regards concept-formation as a matter of grouping items together on the basis of a commensurable characteristic while omitting the specific measurements (e.g., grouping red objects together while omitting specific shades of red). Such abstraction does not falsify its objects, as in omitting specific measurements we do not claim that they do not exist, we merely omit to specify them. (On this point Rand arguably follows the Aristotelian tradition; see Long 2006.) The similarities on the basis of which we form our earliest concepts are perceptually identified; more sophisticated concepts involve conceptually identified similarities.
The extramental attributes on the basis of which we form our concepts are presumably intended by Rand to be particulars, not universals (since otherwise she would be a traditional realist). But Rand says little about the metaphysical status of the “similarity” or “sameness” that we identify among such attribute-particulars. Theories of universals traditionally seek to account both for generic identity across specific difference (e.g., how redness applies to two distinct shades of red), and specific identity across numerical difference (e.g., how a specific shade of red applies to two particulars of that shade). Rand’s theory of measurement-omission seems primarily intended to address the former issue; she has little to say about the latter. Rand’s insistence that everything in reality is particular has been taken by critics as undermining the possibility of the mind-independent similarities needed to ground the objectivity of concepts (for how can two objects be similar if there’s nothing real that they share in common?). But it is possible that Rand would regard similarities as themselves being relational property-particulars or tropes, rather than universals, so that the canine-similarity between Fido and Lassie would be a different particular from the canine-similarity between Lassie and Snoopy.
Abstractions, once formed, are “open-ended”, applying not just to the specific concretes from which they were formed but to all concretes of the same kind. The characteristics on the basis of which items are conceptually grouped should be essential, that is, explanatorily fundamental; but since Rand regards explanation as an epistemological rather than a metaphysical category, essences are objective, not intrinsic. These essential characteristics also determine the definition of the concept. Both the process of forming a concept, for example, table, and the process of arriving at a definition, correspond to the two main functions of conciousness: integration and differentiation (ITOE: 41). The genus of table integrates it with other existents of the same kind (chairs, cupboards, etc.), whereas its differentia distinguishes it from other existents of the same kind (and, of course, other kinds). However, the meaning of a concept lies not in its definition but in its referents, where membership in the class of referents is determined not by anything like Fregean “sense”, but rather by a prospective member’s fundamental similarities (whether as yet known or unknown) to the original concretes on which the concept is based. Definitions are context-relative and can change in response to new discoveries without changing the concept itself. What, then, is an objective definition, valid for everyone? It is the definition based on “the widest context of knowledge available to man on the subjects relevant to the units of a given concept” (ITOE: 46). Because concepts do not change when their definitions change with the growth of knowledge, we have continuity of reference. Indeed, the growth of human knowledge would be impossible without this stability and open-endedness of concepts (ITOE: 27–8, 66–67). The development of science, then, does not threaten scientific objectivity or progress, as some have claimed (Feyerabend 1965; Kuhn 1970). Rather, the development of the conceptual structure of science illustrates Rand’s theory of concepts and cognitive development (Lennox 2013). Rand rejects the analytic-synthetic distinction; that is, she denies any significant difference in metaphysical or modal status, as well as in means of being known, between those characteristics of a class that are and those that are not mentioned in the definition. Despite various differences, Rand’s overall discussion of reference obviously bears intriguing similarities to the realist theories of reference developed by Saul Kripke and Hilary Putnam during the 1970s, although Rand developed her ideas independently, their earliest statement appearing in the 1966–1967 issues of her periodical The Objectivist.
Critics have objected that Rand offers no argument against the possibility that some concepts may have their referents determined by the definition (Browne 2000; Long 2005a,b). Rand describes the meaning of “capitalism”, for example, as “full, pure, uncontrolled, unregulated laissez-faire” (1964a: 33). Since Rand does not regard such as a system as ever having existed, it’s hard to see how the concept of “capitalism” could have been formed on the basis of its referents (what referents?). If instead Rand’s definition of “capitalism” serves as the criterion to determine what would count as a referent, then some statements will be “true by definition” after all, thereby potentially resurrecting the analytic-synthetic distinction.
Concepts (or attempts at concepts) that group their purported referents according to non-essential or inconsistent characteristics, or otherwise embody mistaken presuppositions—such as “phlogiston, ” or “extremism” (which implicitly treats any consistent or thoroughgoing conviction as bad, regardless of its content)—are invalid and cannot be rationally used. In Rand’s view, “anti-concepts” or “package deals” like “extremism” or “selfishness” are frequently employed as an ideological strategy to hinder people’s ability to grasp politically inconvenient concepts. Rand’s theory of concepts thus has a normative dimension (Gotthelf 2013). Judgments that deny their own conceptual presuppositions are likewise invalid. The possibility that all of our experience is a dream, for example, is rejected as what Rand calls a “stolen concept” fallacy, since possession of the concept “dream” presupposes the ability to distinguish dreaming from waking. This is because genuine possession of a concept requires both the ability to derive an abstraction from concretes and the ability to go on to apply it to new concretes; if all our experience were a dream, the concept of waking could neither be derived from nor applied to any concretes. Those who claim to have grasped a concept but are unable to recognize instances of it “have not performed either part of the cycle: neither the abstraction nor the translating of the abstraction into the concrete”. As with an electric circuit, “no part of it can be of any use, until and unless the cycle is completed” (Journal entry for 4 May 1946, in 1997: 481).
Thus many people who appear to be operating at the conceptual level may not in fact be fully doing so. Rand appeals to this “anti-conceptual mentality”—the result of laziness or miseducation—to explain the prevalence of thoughtless social conformity, since those who have not mastered higher abstractions are compelled to navigate the social world by imitating the concrete behavior of other people. In other words, for an anti-conceptual mentality a concept like “justice” would simply refer to the concrete practices that people in a given society engage in when they use the term, thereby forestalling the possibility of any critical reflection on the actual justice of those practices (1982a: ch. 4; 1999a: ch. 3).
A.3 Existence, Identity, and Consciousness
Epistemologically, the most important concepts are those Rand identifies as axiomatic concepts. (Axioms themselves are secondary, being propositional expressions of the corresponding concepts, which themselves are non-propositional.) The three axiomatic concepts to which Rand devotes the most attention are existence, identity, and consciousness. These three, she tells us, are implicit in all knowledge, and cannot be rejected without being relied upon in the course of the attempted rejection. Unlike ordinary concepts, they are not susceptible of definition (except ostensively), because there are no more basic concepts in terms of which they could be defined. Nor are the axioms that express them susceptible of proof, since they are presupposed by all proof (ITOE; Peikoff 1991).
The concept of existence identifies as basic and unquestionable the fact that something exists; to ask for a cause or explanation of there being something rather than nothing is to misunderstand the place of existence in the hierarchy of concepts. (This is one of Rand’s reasons for rejecting the idea of a divine creator as the cause of the universe; though it is a matter of dispute whether this objection works if such a creator is merely supposed to be responsible for the existence of everything other than itself.) Rand’s expression of this concept in propositional form, as the axiom that “existence exists”, is intended not as the mere tautological observation that “whatever exists, exists”, but rather as a recognition that something does indeed exist.
The concept of identity identifies the fact that everything that exists is some kind of thing or other—that it has a specific, non-contradictory nature. This concept—which Rand often expresses in propositional form as the Law of Identity, “A is A”—has as a corollary the principle of causality: since everything has a specific nature, a thing can act only in ways consistent with that nature.
Finally, the concept of consciousness identifies the fact that consciousness exists; Rand agrees with the Cartesian view that one cannot coherently deny the existence of one’s own consciousness. Unlike Descartes, however, Rand denies the “prior certainty of consciousness”, i.e., the idea that we can be aware of the contents of our own minds without knowing whether any extramental reality corresponds to them; for Rand, there can be no content without an external reality. Rand regards consciousness as inherently relational: to be conscious is to be conscious of something beyond one’s own consciousness, and of one’s consciousness itself only secondarily.
Existence has primacy over consciousness both epistemologically and metaphysically (with the latter explaining the former): epistemologically, because consciousness has to be aware of a distinct object before it can be aware of itself; metaphysically, because consciousness is a response to its objects and so cannot precede them—thus ruling out metaphysical theories like theism and idealism that, in Rand’s view, make existence dependent on consciousness.
From the fact that consciousness—both perceptual and conceptual—is an active and causally complex process, it does not follow that it is creative or distortive with regard to its objects. To suppose otherwise, Rand holds—to demand that consciousness, in order to be in contact with reality, must be purely passive and not involve any sort of processing—is to object to consciousness on the absurd grounds that it has a specific identity and employs specific means, and thus, once again, to regard us as blind because we have eyes and deaf because we have ears.
According to Rand, as we’ve seen, our senses cannot deceive us; and in forming conceptual judgments on the basis of sensory evidence, we can be deceived only if we allow ourselves to fall into inattention or evasion. Hence certainty is always available to us. But while Rand takes knowledge to require certainty, she distinguishes certainty from infallibility or inerrancy: a judgment can be certain, within a given context of available knowledge, even if it needs to be revised in the light of new information. Peikoff interprets Rand to hold that, so long as a contextual qualifier is understood to be implicit in one’s judgments at each stage (e.g., “So far as can be determined in the light of present knowledge …”), the revised judgments need not contradict the original ones (Peikoff 1991). But this is a problematic notion, and Rand herself never makes any statement to this effect.
Rand rejects both dogmatism (asserting knowledge or demanding assent in the absence of contextually sufficient evidence) and skepticism (denying knowledge, or demanding the withholding of assent, in the presence of contextually sufficient evidence). Mysticism—in the sense of claims to a non-rational, non-sensory mode of knowledge—is likewise rejected as a form of dogmatism. The application of logic—the “art of non-contradictory identification”—to sensory data should be the sole ultimate determinant of belief.
A.4 Metaphysics of Human Nature
Rand’s conception of the role of metaphysics is fairly minimalist; its task is the investigation of the most general features of existence as such—of “being qua being”, in Aristotle’s phrase. Hence a great deal of traditionally metaphysical inquiry into the specific characteristics of the universe and its constituents she regards as properly the province of the special sciences rather than philosophy. Moreover, consistent with her conviction that many of the central issues of philosophy turn on phenomena that are properly to be understood as objective rather than intrinsic, she tends to assign a broader role to epistemology than to metaphysics. For Rand, metaphysics tells us that entities have definite natures, epistemology tells us how to investigate those natures, and the special sciences then do the actual investigating.
Nevertheless, Rand does take a stand on a number of metaphysical questions more specific than the priority of existence to consciousness or of entities to attributes. For example, Rand denies the possibility of actualized infinities (as opposed to potential infinities, in the Aristotelian sense of processes that can be continued indefinitely), on the grounds that the axiom of identity requires every magnitude to be of some definite measurable extent. On the other hand, Rand maintains that given the character of existence as basic and unquestionable, it makes no sense to think of reality as a whole coming into or going out of existence; the universe is a fundamental fact that cannot be created or destroyed but has always existed. It’s not clear whether Rand holds that the universe is infinitely old (a position that would seem to sit oddly with her denial of actualized infinities—though of course Aristotle held the same combination of views), or only that it was not preceded by a temporal period of nothingness (a potentially distinct claim if one holds, as Rand does, that the passage of time requires change).
But most of Rand’s more specific metaphysical theses have to do with the nature of one particular type of entities—human beings. Rand regards human beings, and indeed living organisms generally, as teleologically ordered systems, though her teleology takes a naturalized form that makes no essential reference to purposiveness; her point is simply that organisms depend for their existence on the successful carrying out—conscious or otherwise—of self-maintenance activities, and so are necessarily organized around the goal of furthering their life functions. Rand rejects both substance dualism and reductive materialism, holding that a human being is an integrated unit of mind and body, a unified entity, with mental characteristics neither separable from nor fully explicable in terms of physical ones. (Whether Rand’s position is best identified as property dualism, nonreductive physicalism, or neither is unclear.)
Consciousness is not epiphenomenal, but rather is causally efficacious—or, perhaps more precisely, human beings are causally efficacious in virtue, inter alia, of possessing consciousness; we know this on the basis of direct experience. Moreover, while perception is automatic, at the conceptual level the operation of consciousness is free from causal necessitation. The reality of incompatibilist free will is axiomatic, since the conceptual tools needed to question its reality presuppose our volitional command over our thought-processes, and in particular, our ability to raise or lower our level of mental alertness—inasmuch as our ability to judge whether we are reasoning correctly presupposes that our thinking is not directed by factors beyond our knowledge and control (N. Branden 1971).
Free choices are not uncaused, since for Rand actions (in general, not just human actions) are caused not by prior events but by the natures of the entities involved. There is even a sense in which free choices are necessitated—namely, it is necessary that human beings, given their nature as conscious rational beings, make free choices, though it is not necessary that they choose this rather than that.
Beyond the realm of human choice, however, Rand regards all facts and events as necessary and “metaphysically given”. Rand seems to consider this position a corollary of the primacy of existence, though it is unclear, given Rand’s exception for human choice, why there could not also be entities whose nature was such as to behave probabilistically, as postulated by many interpretations of quantum physics. (By contrast, the distinct view that a quantum particle’s present state is merely probabilistic clashes much more obviously with the primacy of existence.)