Associated with postmodern and postructuralist theory, Jean Baudrillard (1929–2007) is difficult to situate in relation to traditional and contemporary philosophy. His work combines philosophy, social theory, and an idiosyncratic cultural metaphysics that reflects on key events and phenomena of the epoch. A sharp critic of contemporary society, culture, and thought, Baudrillard is often seen as a major guru of French postmodern theory, although he can also be read as a thinker who combines social and cultural criticism in original and provocative ways and a writer who has developed his own style and forms of writing. He was an extremely prolific author who has published over fifty books and commented on some of the most salient cultural and sociological phenomena of the contemporary era, including the erasure of the distinctions of gender, race, and class that structured modern societies in a new postmodern consumer, media, and high tech society; the mutating roles of art and aesthetics; fundamental changes in politics, culture, and human beings; and the impact of new media, information, and cybernetic technologies in the creation of a qualitatively different social order, providing fundamental mutations of human and social life.
For some years a cult figure of postmodern theory, Baudrillard moved beyond the postmodern discourse from the early 1980s to his death in 2007, and in his later writings developed a highly idiosyncratic mode of philosophical and cultural analysis. This entry focuses on the development of Baudrillard’s unique modes of thought and how he moved from social theory to postmodern theory to a provocative type of philosophical analysis. In retrospect, Baudrillard can be seen a theorist who has traced in original ways the life of signs and impact of technology on social life, and who has systematically criticized major modes of modern thought, while developing his own philosophical perspectives.
- 1. Early Writings: From the System of Objects to The Mirror of Production
- 2. Symbolic Exchange and the Postmodern Break
- 3. From Pataphysics to Metaphysics and the Triumph of the Object
- 4. Into the 1990s: From Immanent Reversal to Impossible Exchange
- 5. Theory Fictions: Baudrillard in the Contemporary Moment
- 6. Concluding Assessment
- Secondary Literature
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Early Writings: From the System of Objects to The Mirror of Production
Jean Baudrillard was born in the cathedral town of Reims, France in 1929. He told interviewers that his grandparents were peasants and his parents became civil servants (Gane 1993: 19). Baudrillard also claims that he was the first member of his family to pursue an advanced education and that this led to a rupture with his parents and cultural milieu. In 1956, he began working as a professor of secondary education in a French high school (Lyceé) and in the early 1960s did editorial work for the French publisher Seuil. Baudrillard was initially a Germanist who published essays on literature in Les temps modernes in 1962–1963 and translated works of Peter Weiss and Bertolt Brecht into French, as well as a book on messianic revolutionary movements by Wilhelm Mühlmann. During this period, he met and studied the works of Henri Lefebvre, whose critiques of everyday life impressed him, and Roland Barthes, whose semiological analyses of contemporary society had lasting influence on his work.
In 1966, Baudrillard entered the University of Paris, Nanterre, and became Lefebvre’s assistant, while studying languages, philosophy, sociology, and other disciplines. He defended his “These de Troisième Cycle” in sociology at Nanterre in 1966 with a dissertation on “Le système des objects,” and began teaching sociology in October of that year. Opposing French and U.S. intervention in the Algerian and Vietnamese wars, Baudrillard associated himself with the French Left in the 1960s. Nanterre was a key site of radical politics and the “March 22 movement,” associated with Daniel Cohn-Bendit and the enragés, began in the Nanterre sociology department. Baudrillard said later that he participated in the events of May 1968 that resulted in massive student uprisings and a general strike that almost drove de Gaulle from power.
During the late 1960s, Baudrillard published a series of books that would eventually make him world famous. Influenced by Lefebvre, Barthes, and a series of French thinkers whose influence will be discussed below, Baudrillard undertook serious work in the field of social theory, semiology, and psychoanalysis in the 1960s and published his first book The System of Objects in 1968 (1996), followed by a book on The Consumer Society in 1970 (1998), and For a Critique of the Political Economy of the Sign in 1972 (1981). These early publications are attempts, within the framework of critical sociology, to combine the studies of everyday life initiated by Lefebvre (1971 and 1991 ) with a social semiology that studies the life of signs in social life. This project, influenced by Barthes (1967 , 1972 , and 1983 ), centers on the system of objects in the consumer society (the focus of his first two books), and the interface between political economy and semiotics (the nucleus of his third book). Baudrillard’s early work was one of the first to appropriate semiology to analyze how objects are encoded with a system of signs and meanings that constitute contemporary media and consumer societies. Combining semiological studies, Marxian political economy, and sociology of the consumer society, Baudrillard began his life-long task of exploring the system of objects and signs which forms our everyday life.
The early Baudrillard described the meanings invested in the objects of everyday life (e.g., the power accrued through identification with one’s automobile when driving) and the structural system through which objects were organized into a new modern society (e.g., the prestige or sign-value of a new sports car). In his first three books, Baudrillard maintained that the classical Marxian critique of political economy needed to be supplemented by semiological theories of the sign which articulated the diverse meanings signified by signifiers into languages organized into systems of meaning. Baudrillard, following Barthes and others, argued that fashion, sports, the media, and other modes of signification produced systems of meaning articulated by specific rules, codes, and logics (terms used somewhat interchangeably by Baudrillard which are elucidated in more detail below).
Situating his analysis of signs, language, and everyday life in a historical framework, Baudrillard argued that the transition from the earlier stage of competitive market capitalism to the stage of monopoly capitalism required increased attention to demand management, to augmenting and steering consumption. At this historical stage, from around 1920 to the 1960s, the need to intensify demand supplemented concern with lowering production costs and with expanding production. In this era of capitalist development, economic concentration, new production techniques, and the development of new technologies, accelerated capacity for mass production and capitalist corporations focused increased attention on managing consumption and creating needs for new prestigious goods, thus producing the regime of what Baudrillard has called sign-value.
On Baudrillard’s analysis, advertising, packaging, display, fashion, “emancipated” sexuality, mass media and culture, and the proliferation of commodities multiplied the quantity of signs and spectacles, and produced a proliferation of sign-value. Henceforth, Baudrillard claims, commodities are not merely to be characterized by use-value and exchange value, as in Marx’s theory of the commodity, but sign-value — the expression and mark of style, prestige, luxury, power, and so on — becomes an increasingly important part of the commodity and consumption (see Goldman and Papson 1996).
From this perspective, Baudrillard claims that commodities are bought and displayed as much for their sign-value as their use-value, and that the phenomenon of sign-value has become an essential constituent of the commodity and consumption in the consumer society. This position was influenced by Veblen’s notion of “conspicuous consumption” and display of commodities analyzed in his Theory of the Leisure Class that Baudrillard argued has become extended to everyone in the consumer society. For Baudrillard, the entire society is organized around consumption and display of commodities through which individuals gain prestige, identity, and standing. In this system, the more prestigious one’s commodities (houses, cars, clothes, and so on), the higher one’s standing in the realm of sign value. Thus, just as words take on meaning according to their position in a differential system of language, so sign values take on meaning according to their place in a differential system of prestige and status.
In The Consumer Society, Baudrillard concludes by extolling “multiple forms of refusal” of social convention, conspicuous consumption, and conformist thought and behavior, all of which can be fused in a “practice of radical change” (1998: 183). He alludes here to the expectation of “violent eruptions and sudden disintegration which will come, just as unforeseeably and as certainly May 68, to wreck this white mass” [of consumption] (1998: 196). On the other hand, Baudrillard also describes a situation where alienation is so total that it cannot be surpassed because “it is the very structure of market society” (1998: 190). His argument is that in a society where everything is a commodity that can be bought and sold, alienation is total. Indeed, the term “alienation” originally signified “to sale,” and in a totally commodified society, alienation is ubiquitous. Moreover, Baudrillard posits “the end of transcendence” (a phrase borrowed from Marcuse) where individuals can neither perceive their own true needs or another way of life (1998: 190ff).
Baudrillard and Neo-Marxism
By 1970, Baudrillard has distinguished himself from the Marxist theory of revolution and instead postulates only the possibility of revolt against the consumer society in an “unforeseeable but certain” form. In the late 1960s, he had associated himself with a group of intellectuals around the journal Utopie which sought to overcome disciplinary boundaries and in the spirit of Guy Debord and the Situationist International to combine reflections on alternative societies, architecture, and modes of everyday life. Bringing together individuals on the margins of architecture, city planning, cultural criticism and social theory, Baudrillard and his associates distinguished themselves from other political and theoretical groupings and developed idiosyncratic and marginal discourse beyond the boundaries of established disciplines and political tendencies. This affiliation with Utopie only lasted into the early 1970s, but it may have helped produce in him a desire to work on the margins, to stand aside from current trends and fads, and to develop his own theoretical positions. His articles from this project have been collected in English translation in Utopia Deferred (2006a).
Baudrillard thus had an ambivalent relation to classical Marxism by the early 1970s. On one hand, he carried forward the Marxian critique of commodity production which delineates and criticizes various forms of alienation, domination, and exploitation produced by capitalism. At this stage, it appeared that his critique takes place from the standard neo-Marxian vantage point which assumes that capitalism is blameworthy because it is homogenizing, controlling and dominating social life, while robbing individuals of their freedom, creativity, time and human potentialities. On the other hand, he cannot point to any revolutionary forces and in particular did not discuss the situation and potential of the working class as an agent of change in the consumer society. Indeed, Baudrillard has no theory of the subject as an active agent of social change whatsoever, thus following the structuralist and poststructuralist critique of the philosophical and practical subject categorized by Descartes, Kant, and Sartre which was long dominant in French thought. Structuralists and poststructuralists argued that subjectivity was produced by language, social institutions, and cultural forms and was not independent of its construction in these institutions and practices.
Nor does Baudrillard develop a theory of class or group revolt, or any theory of political organization, struggle, or strategy of the sort frequent in post-1960s France. Yet Baudrillard’s work here is particularly close to the work of the Frankfurt school, especially that of Herbert Marcuse, who had already developed some of the first Marxist critiques of the consumer society (see Kellner 1984 and 1989b). Like Lukàcs (1971) and the Frankfurt School, Baudrillard analyzes how the commodity and commodification permeate social life and come to dominate individual thought and behavior. Following the general line of critical Marxism, Baudrillard argues that the process of social homogenization, alienation, and exploitation constitutes a process of reification in commodities, technologies, and things (i.e., “objects”) come to dominate people (“subjects”) divesting them of their human qualities and capacities.
For Lukàcs, the Frankfurt School, and Baudrillard, reification — the process whereby human beings become dominated by things and become more thinglike themselves — comes to govern social life. Conditions of labor imposed submission and standardization on human life, as well as exploiting workers and alienating them from a life of freedom and self-determination. In a media and consumer society, culture and consumption also became homogenized, depriving individuals of the possibility of cultivating individuality and self-determination.
In a sense, Baudrillard’s work can be read as an account of a further stage of reification and social domination than that described by the Frankfurt School who described how individuals were controlled by ruling institutions and modes of thought. Baudrillard goes beyond the Frankfurt School by applying the semiological theory of the sign to describe how commodities, media, and technologies provide a universe of illusion and fantasy in which individuals become overpowered by consumer values, media ideologies and role models, and seductive technologies like computers which provide worlds of cyberspace. Eventually, he will take his analysis of domination by signs and the system of objects to even more pessimistic conclusions where he concludes that the thematic of the “end of the individual” sketched by the Frankfurt School has reached its fruition in the total defeat of human subjectivity by the object world (see Section 3).
Yet in some writings, Baudrillard has a somewhat more active theory of consumption than that of the Frankfurt School’s that generally portrays consumption as a passive mode of social integration. By contrast, consumption in Baudrillard’s early writings is itself a kind of labor, “an active manipulation of signs,” a way of inserting oneself within the consumer society, and working to differentiate oneself from others. Yet this active manipulation of signs is not equivalent to postulating an active human subject that could resist, redefine, or produce its own signs, thus Baudrillard fails to develop a genuine theory of agency.
Baudrillard’s first three works can thus be read in the framework of a neo-Marxian critique of capitalist societies. One could read Baudrillard’s emphasis on consumption as a supplement to Marx’s analysis of production and his focus on culture and signs as an important supplement to classical Marxian political economy, which adds a cultural and semiological dimension to the Marxian project. But in his 1973 provocation, The Mirror of Production (translated into English in 1975), Baudrillard carries out a systematic attack on classical Marxism, claiming that Marxism is but a mirror of bourgeois society, placing production at the center of life, thus naturalizing the capitalist organization of society.
Although in the 1960s, Baudrillard participated in the tumultuous events of May 1968, and was associated with the revolutionary Left and Marxism, he broke with Marxism in the early 1970s, but remained politically radical though unaffiliated the rest of the decade. Like many on the Left, Baudrillard was disappointed that the French Communist Party did not support the radical ‘60s movements and he also distrusted the official Marxism of theorists like Louis Althusser who he found dogmatic and reductive. Consequently, Baudrillard began a radical critique of Marxism, one that would be repeated by many of his contemporaries who would also take a postmodern turn (see Best and Kellner 1991 and 1997).
Baudrillard (1975) argues that Marxism, first, does not adequately illuminate premodern societies that were organized around religion, mythology, and tribal organization and not production. He also argues that Marxism does not provide a sufficiently radical critique of capitalist societies and alternative critical discourses and perspectives. At this stage, Baudrillard turns to anthropological perspectives on premodern societies for hints of more emancipatory alternatives. Yet it is important to note that this critique of Marxism was taken from the Left, arguing that Marxism did not provide a radical enough critique of, or alternative to, contemporary capitalist and communist societies organized around production. Baudrillard concluded that French communist failure to support the May 68 movements was rooted in part in a conservatism that had roots in Marxism itself. Hence, Baudrillard and others of his generation began searching for alternative critical positions.
2. Symbolic Exchange and the Postmodern Break
The Mirror of Production and his next book Symbolic Exchange and Death (1976), a major text finally translated in 1993, are attempts to provide ultraradical perspectives that overcome the limitations of an economistic Marxist tradition that privileges the economic sphere. This ultra-leftist phase of Baudrillard’s itinerary would be short-lived, however, though in Symbolic Exchange and Death, Baudrillard produces one of his most important and dramatic provocations. The text opens with a Preface that condenses his attempt to provide a significantly different approach to society and culture. Building on the French cultural theory of Georges Bataille, Marcel Mauss, and Alfred Jarry, he champions “symbolic exchange” which resists capitalist values of utility and monetary profit for cultural values. Baudrillard argues that in Bataille’s claim that expenditure and excess is connected with sovereignty, Mauss’s descriptions of the social prestige of gift-giving in premodern society, Jarry’s theater that ridicules French culture, and Saussure’s anagrams, there is a break with the values of capitalist exchange and production, or the production of meaning in linguistic exchange. These cases of “symbolic exchange,” Baudrillard believes, break with the values of production and describe poetic exchange and creative cultural activity that provides alternatives to the capitalist values of production and exchange.
The term “symbolic exchange” was derived from Georges Bataille’s notion of a “general economy” where expenditure, waste, sacrifice, and destruction were claimed to be more fundamental to human life than economies of production and utility (1988 ). Bataille’s model was the sun that freely expended its energy without asking anything in return. He argued that if individuals wanted to be truly sovereign (e.g., free from the imperatives of capitalism) they should pursue a “general economy” of expenditure, giving, sacrifice, and destruction to escape determination by existing imperatives of utility.
For Bataille, human beings were beings of excess with exorbitant energy, fantasies, drives, needs, and heterogeneous desire. At this point, Baudrillard presupposes the truth of Bataille’s anthropology and general economy. In a 1976 review of a volume of Bataille’s Complete Works, Baudrillard writes: “The central idea is that the economy which governs our societies results from a misappropriation of the fundamental human principle, which is a solar principle of expenditure” (1987: 57). In the early 1970s, Baudrillard took over Bataille’s anthropological position and what he calls Bataille’s “aristocratic critique” of capitalism that he now claims is grounded in the crass notions of utility and savings rather than the more sublime “aristocratic” notion of excess and expenditure. Bataille and Baudrillard presuppose here a contradiction between human nature and capitalism. They maintain that humans “by nature” gain pleasure from such things as expenditure, waste, festivities, sacrifices, and so on, in which they are sovereign and free to expend the excesses of their energy (and thus to follow their “real nature”). The capitalist imperatives of labor, utility, and savings by implication are “unnatural,” and go against human nature.
Baudrillard argues that the Marxian critique of capitalism, by contrast, merely attacks exchange value while exalting use value and thus utility and instrumental rationality, thereby “seeking a good use of the economy.” For Baudrillard:
Marxism is therefore only a limited petit bourgeois critique, one more step in the banalization of life toward the ‘good use’ of the social! Bataille, to the contrary, sweeps away all this slave dialectic from an aristocratic point of view, that of the master struggling with his death. One can accuse this perspective of being pre- or post-Marxist. At any rate, Marxism is only the disenchanted horizon of capital — all that precedes or follows it is more radical than it is (1987: 60).
This passage is highly revealing and marks Baudrillard’s switch to an “aristocratic critique” of political economy deeply influenced by Bataille and Nietzsche. For Bataille and Baudrillard are presenting a version of Nietzsche’s aristocratic “master morality” where “superior” individuals create their own values and their life articulates an excess, overflow, and intensification of creative and erotic energies. Nietzsche was a major influence throughout Baudrillard’s life and, especially in the last decades of his work, Nietzschean motifs, modes of thought, and writing practices increasingly informed his work. Baudrillard became increasingly radical and “un-contemporary,” standing alone against current trends and fashions, in a fiercely individualistic mode of thought. Nietzschean categories like fate, reversal, uncertainty, and an aristocratic assault on conventional wisdom began to shape his writings, that often, a la Nietzsche, took the form of aphorisms or short essays.
For some time, Baudrillard would continue to attack the bourgeoisie, capital, and political economy, but from a perspective which champions “aristocratic” expenditure and sumptuary, aesthetic and symbolic values. The dark side of his switch in theoretical and political allegiances is a valorization of (i.e., a giving or assigning of value to) sacrifice and death that informs Symbolic Exchange and Death (in which sacrifice provides a giving that subverts bourgeois values of utility and self-preservation, an idea that has sinister implications in an era of suicide bombings and terrorism).
On the whole, in his mid-1970s work, Baudrillard was extricating himself from the familiar Marxian universe of production and class struggle into a quite different neo-aristocratic and metaphysical world-view. Baudrillard seems to assume at this point that pre-capitalist societies were governed by forms of symbolic exchange similar to Bataille’s notion of a general economy. Influenced by Mauss’ theory of the gift and countergift, Baudrillard claimed that pre-capitalist societies were governed by laws of symbolic exchange rather than production and utility. Developing these ideas, Baudrillard sketched a fundamental dividing line in history between symbolic societies — i.e., societies fundamentally organized around premodern exchange — and productivist societies (i.e., societies organized around production and commodity exchange). He thus rejects the Marxian philosophy of history which posits the primacy of production in all societies and rejects the Marxian concept of socialism, arguing that it does not break radically enough with capitalist productivism, offering itself merely as a more efficient and equitable organization of production rather than as a completely different sort of society with a different values and forms of culture and life.
Henceforth, Baudrillard would contrast — in one way or another — his ideal of symbolic exchange to the values of production, utility, and instrumental rationality that govern capitalist (and socialist) societies. “Symbolic exchange” thus emerges as Baudrillard’s “revolutionary” alternative to the values and practices of capitalist society, and stands for a variety of heterogeneous activities in his 1970s writings. For instance, he writes in the Critique: “The exchange of looks, the present which comes and goes, are like the air people breathe in and out. This is the metabolism of exchange, prodigality, festival — and also of destruction (which returns to non-value what production has erected, valorized). In this domain, value isn’t even recognized” (1981: 207). He also describes his conception of symbolic exchange in The Mirror of Production where he writes: “The symbolic social relation is the uninterrupted cycle of giving and receiving, which, in primitive exchange, includes the consumption of the ‘surplus’ and deliberate anti-production” (1975: 143). The term therefore refers to symbolic or cultural activities which do not contribute to capitalist production and accumulation and which potentially constitute a “radical negation” of productivist society.
At this stage of his thought, Baudrillard stood in a French tradition of extolling “primitive” or premodern culture over the abstract rationalism and utilitarianism of modern society. His defense of symbolic exchange over production and instrumental rationality thus stands in the tradition of Rousseau’s defense of the “natural savage” over modern man, Durkheim’s posing mechanical solidarities of premodern societies against the abstract individualism and anomie of modern ones, Bataille’s valorization of expenditure of premodern societies, or Mauss’ or Levi-Strauss’ fascination with the richness of “primitive societies” or “the savage mind.” After deconstructing the modern master thinkers and his own theoretical fathers (Marx, Freud, Saussure, and his French contemporaries) for missing the richness of symbolic exchange, Baudrillard continues to champion the symbolic and radical forms of thought and writing in a quest that takes him into ever more esoteric and exotic discourse.
Thus, against the organizing forms of modern thought and society, Baudrillard champions symbolic exchange as an alternative. Against modern demands to produce value and meaning, he calls for their extermination and annihilation, providing as examples, Mauss’s gift-exchange, Saussure’s anagrams, and Freud’s concept of the death drive. In all of these instances, there is a rupture with the forms of exchange (of goods, meanings, and libidinal energies) and thus an escape from the forms of production, capitalism, rationality, and meaning. Baudrillard’s paradoxical concept of symbolic exchange can be explained as expression of a desire to liberate himself from modern positions and to seek a revolutionary position outside of modern society. Against modern values, he advocates their annihilation and extermination.
In 1970s like Baudrillard posits another divide in history as radical as the rupture between premodern symbolic societies and modern ones. In the mode of classical social theory, he systematically develops distinctions between premodern societies organized around symbolic exchange, modern societies organized around production, and postmodern societies organized around “simulation” by which he means the cultural modes of representation that “simulate” reality as in television, computer cyberspace, and virtual reality. Baudrillard’s distinction between the mode of production and utility that organized modern societies and the mode of simulation that he believes is the organizing form of postmodern societies postulates a rupture between modern and postmodern societies as great as the divide between modern and premodern ones. In theorizing the epochal postmodern rupture with modernity, he declares the “end of political economy” and of an era in which production was the organizing form of society. Following Marx, he argues that this modern epoch was the era of capitalism and the bourgeoisie, in which workers were exploited by capital and provided a revolutionary force of upheaval. Baudrillard, however, declared the end of political economy and thus the end of the Marxist problematic and of modernity itself:
The end of labor. The end of production. The end of political economy. The end of the signifier/signified dialectic which facilitates the accumulation of knowledge and of meaning, the linear syntagma of cumulative discourse. And at the same time, the end simultaneously of the exchange value/use value dialectic which is the only thing that makes accumulation and social production possible. The end of linear dimension of discourse. The end of the linear dimension of the commodity. The end of the classical era of the sign. The end of the era of production (Baudrillard 1993a: 8).
The discourse of “the end” signifies his announcing a postmodern break or rupture in history. People are now, Baudrillard claims, in a new era of simulation in which social reproduction (information processing, communication, and knowledge industries, and so on) replaces production as the organizing form of society. In this era, labor is no longer a force of production but is itself a “one sign amongst many” (1993a: 10). Labor is not primarily productive in this situation, but is a sign of one’s social position, way of life, and mode of servitude. Wages too bear no rational relation to one’s work and what one produces but to one’s place within the system (1993a: 19ff.). But, crucially, political economy is no longer the foundation, the social determinant, or even a structural “reality” in which other phenomena can be interpreted and explained (31ff.). Instead people live in the “hyperreality” of simulations in which images, spectacles, and the play of signs replace the concepts of production and class conflict as key constituents of contemporary societies.
From now on, capital and political economy disappear from Baudrillard’s story, or return in radically new forms. Henceforth, signs and codes proliferate and produce other signs and new sign machines in ever-expanding and spiraling cycles. Technology thus replaces capital in this story and semiurgy (interpreted by Baudrillard as proliferation of images, information, and signs) replaces production. His postmodern turn is thus connected to a form of technological determinism and a rejection of political economy as a useful explanatory principle — a move that many of his critics reject (see Kellner 1989, Norris 1992, and the studies in Kellner 1994).
Symbolic Exchange and Death and the succeeding studies in Simulation and Simulacra (1994 ) articulate the principle of a fundamental rupture between modern and postmodern societies and mark Baudrillard’s departure from the problematic of modern social theory. For him, modern societies are organized around the production and consumption of commodities, while postmodern societies are organized around simulation and the play of images and signs, denoting a situation in which codes, models, and signs are the organizing forms of a new social order where simulation rules. In the society of simulation, identities are constructed by the appropriation of images, and codes and models determine how individuals perceive themselves and relate to other people. Economics, politics, social life, and culture are all governed by the mode of simulation, whereby codes and models determine how goods are consumed and used, politics unfold, culture is produced and consumed, and everyday life is lived.
Baudrillard’s postmodern world is also one in which previously important boundaries and distinctions — such as those between social classes, genders, political leanings, and once autonomous realms of society and culture — lose power. If modern societies, for classical social theory, were characterized by differentiation, for Baudrillard, postmodern societies are characterized by dedifferentiation, the “collapse” of (the power of) distinctions, or implosion. In his society of simulation, the realms of economics, politics, culture, sexuality, and the social all implode into each other. In this implosive mix, economics is fundamentally shaped by culture, politics, and other spheres, while art, once a sphere of potential difference and opposition, is absorbed into the economic and political, while sexuality is everywhere. In this situation, differences between individuals and groups implode in a rapidly mutating or changing dissolution of the social and the previous boundaries and structures upon which social theory had once focused.
In addition, his postmodern universe is one of hyperreality in which entertainment, information, and communication technologies provide experiences more intense and involving than the scenes of banal everyday life, as well as the codes and models that structure everyday life. The realm of the hyperreal (e.g., media simulations of reality, Disneyland and amusement parks, malls and consumer fantasylands, TV sports, virtual reality games, social networking sites, and other excursions into ideal worlds) is more real than real, whereby the models, images, and codes of the hyperreal come to control thought and behavior. Yet determination itself is aleatory in a non-linear world where it is impossible to chart causal mechanisms in a situation in which individuals are confronted with an overwhelming flux of images, codes, and models, any of which may shape an individual’s thought or behavior.
In this postmodern world, individuals flee from the “desert of the real” for the ecstasies of hyperreality and the new realm of computer, media, and technological experience. In this universe, subjectivities are fragmented and lost, and a new terrain of experience appears that for Baudrillard renders previous social theories and politics obsolete and irrelevant. Tracing the vicissitudes of the subject in present-day society, Baudrillard claims that contemporary subjects are no longer afflicted with modern pathologies like hysteria or paranoia. Rather, they exist in “a state of terror which is characteristic of the schizophrenic, an over-proximity of all things, a foul promiscuity of all things which beleaguer and penetrate him, meeting with no resistance, and no halo, no aura, not even the aura of his own body protects him. In spite of himself the schizophrenic is open to everything and lives in the most extreme confusion” (1988: 27). For Baudrillard, the “ecstasy of communication” means that the subject is in close proximity to instantaneous images and information, in an overexposed and transparent world. In this situation, the subject “becomes a pure screen a pure absorption and re-absorption surface of the influent networks” (1988: 27). In other words, an individual in a postmodern world becomes merely an entity influenced by media, technological experience, and the hyperreal.
Thus, Baudrillard’s categories of simulation, implosion, and hyperreality combine to create an emergent postmodern condition that requires entirely new modes of theory and politics to chart and respond to the novelties of the contemporary era. His style and writing strategies are also implosive (i.e., working against previously important distinctions), combining material from strikingly different fields, studded with examples from the mass media and popular culture in an innovative mode of postmodern theory that does not respect disciplinary boundaries. His writing attempts to itself simulate the new conditions, capturing its novelties through inventive use of language and theory. Such radical questioning of contemporary theory and the need for new theoretical strategies are thus legitimated for Baudrillard by the large extent of changes in the current era.
For instance, Baudrillard claims that modernity operates with a mode of representation in which ideas represent reality and truth, concepts that are key postulates of modern theory. A postmodern society explodes this epistemology by creating a situation in which subjects lose contact with the real and fragment and dissolve. This situation portends the end of modern theory that operated with a subject-object dialectic in which the subject was supposed to represent and control the object. In the story of modern philosophy, the philosophic subject attempts to discern the nature of reality, to secure grounded knowledge, and to apply this knowledge to control and dominate the object (e.g., nature, other people, ideas, and so on). Baudrillard follows here the poststructuralist critique that thought and discourse could no longer be securely anchored in a priori or privileged structures of “the real.” Reacting against the mode of representation in modern theory, French thought, especially some deconstructionists (Rorty’s “strong textualists”), moved into the play of textuality, of discourse, which allegedly referred only to other texts or discourses in which “the real” or an “outside” were banished to the realm of nostalgia.
In a similar fashion, Baudrillard, a “strong simulacrist,” claims that in the media and consumer society, people are caught up in the play of images, spectacles, and simulacra, that have less and less relationship to an outside, to an external “reality,” to such an extent that the very concepts of the social, political, or even “reality” no longer seem to have any meaning. And the narcoticized and mesmerized (some of Baudrillard’s metaphors) media-saturated consciousness is in such a state of fascination with image and spectacle that the concept of meaning itself (which depends on stable boundaries, fixed structures, shared consensus) dissolves. In this alarming and novel postmodern situation, the referent, the behind and the outside, along with depth, essence, and reality all disappear, and with their disappearance, the possibility of all potential opposition vanishes as well. As simulations proliferate, they come to refer only to themselves: a carnival of mirrors reflecting images projected from other mirrors onto the omnipresent television and computer screen and the screen of consciousness, which in turn refers the image to its previous storehouse of images also produced by simulatory mirrors. Caught up in the universe of simulations, the “masses” are “bathed in a media massage” without messages or meaning, a mass age where classes disappear, and politics is dead, as are the grand dreams of disalienation, liberation, and revolution.
Baudrillard claims that henceforth the masses seek spectacle and not meaning. They implode into a “silent majority,” signifying “the end of the social” (1983b). Baudrillard implies that social theory loses its very object as meanings, classes, and difference implode into a “black hole” of non-differentiation. Fixed distinctions between social groupings and ideologies implode and concrete face-to-face social relations recede as individuals disappear in worlds of simulation — media, computers, virtual reality itself. Social theory itself thus loses its object, the social, while radical politics loses its subject and agency.
Nonetheless, he claims, at this point in his trajectory (i.e., the late 1970s and early 1980s) that refusal of meaning and participation by the masses is a form of resistance. Hovering between nostalgia and nihilism, Baudrillard at once exterminates modern ideas (e.g., the subject, meaning, truth, reality, society, socialism, and emancipation) and affirms a mode of symbolic exchange which appears to manifest a nostalgic desire to return to premodern cultural forms. This desperate search for a genuinely revolutionary alternative was abandoned, however, by the early 1980s. Henceforth, he develops yet more novel perspectives on the contemporary moment, vacillating between sketching out alternative modes of thought and behavior and renouncing the quest for political and social change.
In a sense, there is a parodic inversion of historical materialism in Baudrillard. In place of Marx’s emphasis on political economy and the primacy of the economic, for Baudrillard it is the model, the superstructure, that generates the real in a situation he refers to as the “end of political economy” (1993a). For Baudrillard, sign values predominate over use values and exchange values; the materiality of needs and commodity use-values to serve them disappear in Baudrillard’s semiological imaginary, in which signs take precedence over the real and reconstruct human life. Turning the Marxist categories against themselves, masses absorb classes, the subject of praxis is fractured, and objects come to rule human beings. Revolution is absorbed by the object of critique and technological implosion replaces the socialist revolution in producing a rupture in history. For Baudrillard, in contrast to Marx, the catastrophe of modernity and eruption of postmodernity is produced by the unfolding of technological revolution. Consequently, Baudrillard replaces Marx’s hard economic and social determinism with its emphasis on the economic dimension, class struggle, and human praxis, with a form of semiological idealism and technological determinism where signs and objects come to dominate the subject.
Baudrillard thus concludes that the “catastrophe has happened,” that the destruction of modernity and modern theory which he noted in the mid-1970s, has been completed by the development of capitalist society itself, that modernity has disappeared and a new social situation has taken its place. Against traditional strategies of rebellion and revolution, Baudrillard begins to champion what he calls “fatal strategies” that push the values of the system to the extreme in the hopes of collapse or reversal, and eventually adopts a style of highly ironic metaphysical discourse that renounces emancipation and the discourse and hopes of progressive social transformation.
3. From Pataphysics to Metaphysics and the Triumph of the Object
Baudrillard’s thought from the mid-1970s to his death in 2007 challenges theories in a variety of disciplines. During the 1980s, his major works of the 1970s were translated into many languages and new books of the 1980s were in turn translated into English and other major languages in short order. Consequently, he became world-renown as one of the most influential thinkers of postmodernity. Baudrillard became something of an academic celebrity, travelling around the world promoting his work and winning a significant following, though more outside of the field of academic theory than within his own discipline of sociology.
At the same time that his work was becoming extremely popular, Baudrillard’s own writing became increasingly difficult and obscure. In 1979, he published Seduction (1990), a difficult text that represented a major shift in his thought. The book marks a turning away from the more sociological discourse of his earlier works to a more philosophical and literary discourse. Whereas in Symbolic Exchange and Death (1993a ), Baudrillard sketched out ultra-revolutionary perspectives as a radical alternative, taking symbolic exchange as his ideal, he now takes seduction as his alternative to production and communicative interaction. Seduction, however, does not undermine, subvert, or transform existing social relations or institutions, but is a soft alternative, a play with appearances, and a game with feminism, a provocation that provoked a sharp critical response. Baudrillard’s concept of seduction is idiosyncratic and involves games with signs which set up seduction as an aristocratic “order of sign and ritual” in contrast to the bourgeois ideal of production, while advocating artifice, appearance, play, and challenge against the deadly serious labor of production. He interprets seduction primarily as a ritual and game with its own rules, charms, snares, and lures. His writing mutates at this point into a neo-aristocratic aestheticism dedicated to stylized modes of thought and writing, which present a set of categories — reversibility, the challenge, the duel, — that move Baudrillard’s thought toward a form of aristocratic aestheticism and metaphysics.
Baudrillard’s proliferating metaphysical speculations are evident in Fatal Strategies (1983, translated in 1990), another turning point in his career. This text presented a bizarre metaphysical scenario concerning the triumph of objects over subjects within the “obscene” proliferation of an object world so completely out of control that it surpasses all attempts to understand, conceptualize and control it. His scenario concerns the proliferation and growing supremacy of objects over subjects and the eventual triumph of the object. In a discussion of “Ecstasy and Inertia,” Baudrillard discusses how objects and events in contemporary society are continually surpassing themselves, growing and expanding in power. The “ecstasy” of objects is their great proliferation and expansion; ecstasy as going outside of or beyond oneself: the beautiful as more beautiful than beautiful in fashion, the real more real than the real in television, sex more sexual than sex in pornography. Ecstasy is thus the form of obscenity (fully explicit, nothing hidden) and of the hyperreality described by Baudrillard earlier taken to another level, redoubled and intensified. His vision of contemporary society exhibits a careening of growth and excrescence (croissance et excroissance), expanding and excreting ever more goods, services, information, messages or demands — surpassing all rational ends and boundaries in a spiral of uncontrolled growth and replication.
Yet growth, acceleration, and proliferation have reached such extremes, Baudrillard suggests, that the ecstasy of excrescence (i.e., increasing numbers of goods) is accompanied by inertia. The process of growth presents a catastrophe for the subject, for not only does the acceleration and proliferation of the object world intensify the aleatory dimension of chance and non-determinacy, but the objects themselves come to dominate the exhausted subject, whose fascination with the play of objects turns to apathy, stupefaction, and inertia.
In retrospect, the growing power of the world of objects over the subject has been Baudrillard’s theme from the beginning, thus pointing to an underlying continuity in his project. In his early writings, he explored the ways that commodities were fascinating individuals in the consumer society and the ways that the world of goods was assuming new and more value through the agency of sign value and the code — which were part of the world of things, the system of objects. His polemics against Marxism were fuelled by the belief that sign value and the code were more fundamental than such traditional elements of political economy as exchange value, use value, production and so on in constituting contemporary society. Then, reflections on the media entered the forefront of his thought: the TV object was at the center of the home in Baudrillard’s earlier thinking and the media, simulations, hyperreality, and implosion eventually came to obliterate distinctions between private and public, inside and outside, media and reality. Henceforth, everything was public, transparent, and hyperreal in the object world that was gaining in fascination and seductiveness as the years went by.
In Fatal Strategies and succeeding writings, the object dominates or “defeats” the subject. The “fatal strategies” suggest that individuals should simply submit to the strategies and ruses of objects. In “banal strategies,” “the subject believes itself to always be more clever than the object, whereas in the other [fatal strategies] the object is always supposed to be more shrewd, more cynical, more brilliant than the subject” (1983: 259–260). Previously, in banal strategies, the subject believed itself to be more masterful and sovereign than the object. A fatal strategy, by contrast, recognizes the supremacy of the object and therefore takes the side of the object and surrenders to its strategies, ruses and rules.
In these works, Baudrillard seems to be taking his theory into the realm of metaphysics, but it is a specific type of metaphysics deeply inspired by the pataphysics developed by Alfred Jarry. For Jarry:
pataphysics is the science of the realm beyond metaphysics… It will study the laws which govern exceptions and will explain the universe supplementary to this one; or, less ambitiously, it will describe a universe which one can see — must see perhaps — instead of the traditional one…
Definition: pataphysics is the science of imaginary solutions, which symbolically attributes the properties of objects, described by their virtuality, to their lineaments (Jarry 1963: 131).
Like the universe in Jarry’s Ubu Roi, The Gestures and Opinions of Doctor Faustroll (1969), and other literary texts — as well as in Jarry’s more theoretical explications of pataphysics — Baudrillard’s is a totally absurd universe where objects rule in mysterious ways, and people and events are governed by absurd and ultimately unknowable interconnections and predestination (The French playwright Eugene Ionesco is another good source of entry to this universe). Like Jarry’s pataphysics, Baudrillard’s universe is ruled by surprise, reversal, hallucination, blasphemy, obscenity, and a desire to shock and outrage.
Thus, in view of the growing supremacy of the object, Baudrillard wants us to abandon the subject and to side with the object. Pataphysics aside, it seems that Baudrillard is trying to end the philosophy of subjectivity that has controlled French thought since Descartes by going over completely to the other side. Descartes’ malin genie, his evil genius, was a ruse of the subject that tried to seduce him into accepting what was not clear and distinct, but over which he was ultimately able to prevail. Baudrillard’s “evil genius” is the object itself which is much worse than the merely epistemological deceptions of the subject faced by Descartes and which constitutes a fatal destiny that demands the end of the philosophy of subjectivity. Henceforth, for Baudrillard, people live in the era of the reign of the object.
4. Into the 1990s: From Immanent Reversal to Impossible Exchange
In the 1980s, Baudrillard posited an “immanent reversal,” a flip-flop or reversed direction of meaning and effects, in which things turn into their opposite. Thus, according to Baudrillard, the society of production was passing over to simulation and seduction; the panoptic and repressive power theorized by Foucault was turning into a cynical and seductive power of the media and information society; the liberation championed in the 1960s had become a form of voluntary servitude; sovereignty had passed from the side of the subject to the object; and revolution and emancipation had turned into their opposites, trapping individuals in an order of simulation and virtuality. Baudrillard’s concept of “immanent reversal” thus provides a perverse form of Horkheimer and Adorno’s “dialectic of Enlightenment” (1972 ), where everything becomes its opposite. For Adorno and Horkheimer, within the transformations of organized and hi-tech capitalism, modes of Enlightenment become domination, culture becomes culture industry, democracy becomes a form of mass manipulation, and science and technology form a crucial part of an apparatus of social domination.
Baudrillard follows this concept of reversal and his paradoxical and nihilistic metaphysical vision into the 1990s and 2000s where his thought becomes ever more hermetic, fragmentary, and difficult. During the decade, Baudrillard continued playing the role of academic and media superstar, traveling around the world lecturing and performing in intellectual events.
Retiring from the University of Nanterre in 1987, Baudrillard subsequently functioned as an independent intellectual, dedicating himself to caustic reflections on our contemporary moment and philosophical ruminations that cultivate his distinct and always evolving theory. From June 1987 through May 1997, he published reflections on events and phenomena of the day in the Paris newspaper Liberation, a series of writings collected in Screened Out (2002 ) and providing access to a laboratory for ideas later elaborated in his books.
During the 1990s and until his death, Baudrillard continued to write short journal entries and by 2007 had published five volumes of his Cool Memories. These texts combine reflections on his travels and experiences with development of his (often recycled) ideas and perceptions. Baudrillard’s fragmentary diaries often provide revealing insights into his personal life and psychology, as well as capturing experiences and scenes that generate or embody some of his ideas. While often repetitive, his “cool memory” booklets provide direct access to the man and his ideas, as well as validating him as a global intellectual superstar who travels around the earth and whose every diary notation is worthy of publication and attention.
Baudrillard also produced reflections on contemporary issues like the Gulf War, the September 11 terror attacks, that he saw as the only real “event” of the past decades, globalization, the US invasion of Iraq, and other occurrences of the day. Baudrillard also continued his metaphysical speculations in works such as The Transparency of Evil (1993 ), The Illusion of the End (1994b ), The Perfect Crime (1996b ), Impossible Exchange (2001 ), The Intelligence of Evil or the Lucicity Pact (2005), and The Conspiracy of Art (2005). These texts continue his excursions into the metaphysics of the object and defeat of the subject and ironical engagement with contemporary history and politics. Bringing together reflections that develop his ideas and/or comment on contemporary events, these texts continue to postulate a break within history in the space of a postmodern coupure, though Baudrillard himself usually distances himself from other versions of postmodern theory.
Baudrillard’s retirement from a sociology faculty seemed to have liberated his philosophical impulses and in addition to his diary collections and occasional forays into engagement of issues of the day, Baudrillard turned out a series of increasingly philosophical and densely theoretical texts. The post-1990 texts continue the fragmentary style and use of short essays, aphorisms, stories, and aperçus that Baudrillard began deploying in the 1980s and often repeat some of the same ideas and stories. While the books develop the quasi-metaphysical perspectives of the 1980s, they also generate some new ideas and positions. They are often entertaining, although they can also be outrageous and scandalous. These writings can be read as a combination of cultivation of original theoretical perspectives along with continual commentary on current social conditions, accompanied by a running dialogue with Marxism, poststructuralist theory, and other forms of contemporary thought. Yet after his fierce and focused polemics of the 1970s against competing models of thought, Baudrillard’s later dialogues with theory consist mostly of occasional asides and recycling of previous ideas, a retro-theory that perhaps ironically illustrates his theses about the decline of theory and politics in the contemporary moment.
In The Transparency of Evil (1993), Baudrillard described a situation in which previously separate domains of the economy, art, politics, and sexuality, collapsed into each other. He claims that art, for instance, has penetrated all spheres of existence, whereby the dreams of the artistic avant-garde for art to inform life has been realized. Yet, in Baudrillard’s vision, with the realization of art in everyday life, art itself as a separate and transcendent phenomenon has disappeared.
Baudrillard calls this situation “transaesthetics” which he relates to similar phenomena of “transpolitics,” “transsexuality,” and “transeconomics,” in which everything becomes political, sexual, and economic, so that these domains, like art, lose their specificity, their boundaries, and their distinctness. The result is a confused condition where there are no more criteria of value, of judgement, or of taste, and the function of the normative thus collapses in a morass of indifference and inertia. And so, although Baudrillard sees art proliferating everywhere, and writes in The Transparency of Evil that “talk about Art is increasing even more rapidly” (p. 14), the power of art — of art as adventure, art as negation of reality, art as redeeming illusion, art as another dimension and so on — has disappeared. Art is everywhere but there “are no more fundamental rules” to differentiate art from other objects and “no more criteria of judgement or of pleasure” (p. 14). For Baudrillard, contemporary individuals are indifferent toward taste and manifest only distaste: “tastes are determinate no longer” (p. 72).
And yet as a proliferation of images, of form, of line, of color, of design, art is more fundamental then ever to the contemporary social order: “our society has given rise to a general aestheticization: all forms of culture — not excluding anti-cultural ones — are promoted and all models of representation and anti-representation are taken on board” (p. 16). Thus Baudrillard concludes that: “It is often said that the West’s great undertaking is the commercialization of the whole world, the hitching of the fate of everything to the fate of the commodity. That great undertaking will turn out rather to have been the aestheticization of the whole world — its cosmopolitan spectacularization, its transformation into images, its semiological organization” (p. 16).
In the postmodern media and consumer society, everything becomes an image, a sign, a spectacle, a transaesthetic object — just as everything also becomes trans-economic, trans-political, and trans-sexual. This “materialization of aesthetics” is accompanied by a desperate attempt to simulate art, to replicate and mix previous artistic forms and styles, and to produce ever more images and artistic objects. But this “dizzying eclecticism” of forms and pleasures produces a situation in which art is no longer art in classical or modernist senses but is merely image, artifact, object, simulation, or commodity (Baudrillard is aware of increasingly exorbitant prices for art works, but takes this as evidence that art has become something else in the orbital hyperspace of value, an ecstasy of skyrocketing values in “a kind of space opera” [p. 19]).
Examples of the paradoxical and ironic style of Baudrillard’s philosophical musings abound in The Perfect Crime (1996b). Baudrillard claims that the negation of a transcendent reality in the current media and technological society is a “perfect crime” that involves the “destruction of the real.” In a world of appearance, image, and illusion, Baudrillard suggests, reality disappears although its traces continue to nourish an illusion of the real. Driven toward virtualization in a high-tech society, all the imperfections of human life and the world are eliminated in virtual reality, but this is the elimination of reality itself, the Perfect Crime. This “post-critical” and “catastrophic” state of affairs render our previous conceptual world irrelevant, Baudrillard suggests, urging criticism to turn ironic and transform the demise of the real into an art form.
Baudrillard has entered a world of thought far from academic philosophy, one that puts in question traditional modes of thought and discourse. His search for new philosophical perspectives has won him a loyal global audience, but also criticism for his excessive irony, word play, and intellectual games. Yet his work stands as a provocation to traditional and contemporary philosophy that challenges thinkers to address old philosophical problems such as truth and reality in new ways in the contemporary world.
Baudrillard continues this line of thought in his 1999 text Impossible Exchange (2001). In three parts containing a series of short essays, he first develops his concept of an “impossible exchange” between concepts and the world, theory and reality, and subject and object. He attacks philosophical attempts to capture reality, arguing for an incommensurability between concepts and their objects, systems of thought and the world. For Baudrillard, the latter always elude capture by the former, thus philosophy is an “impossible exchange” in which it is impossible to grasp the truth of the world, to attain certainty, to establish a foundation for philosophy, and/or produce a defensible philosophical system.
In retrospect, Baudrillard’s philosophical play with the subject/object distinction, his abandonment of the subject, and going over to the side of the object is a key aspect of his thought. He identifies this dichotomy with the duality of good and evil in which the cultivation of the subject and its domination of the object is taken as the good within Western thought, while the sovereignty and side of the object is interwoven with the principle of evil. Baudrillard’s thought is radically dualistic and he takes the side of the pole within a series of dichotomies of Western thought that has generally been derided as inferior, such as siding with appearance against reality, illusion over truth, evil over good, and woman over man. In The Perfect Crime (1996b), Baudrillard has declared that reality has been destroyed and henceforth that people live in a world of mere appearance. In this universe, certainty and truth are impossible and Baudrillard takes the side of illusion, arguing in Impossible Exchange (2001) that: “Illusion is the fundamental rule” (p. 6).
Baudrillard also argues that the world is without meaning and that affirming meaninglessness is liberating: “If we could accept this meaninglessness of the world, then we could play with forms, appearances and our impulses, without worrying about their ultimate destination… As Cioran says, we are not failures until we believe life has a meaning – and from that point on we are failures, because it hasn’t” (2001: 128). Most controversially, Baudrillard also identifies with the principle of evil defined as that which is opposed to and against the good. There is an admittedly Manichean and Gnostic dimension to his thought, mixed with skepticism, cynicism and nihilism. Deconstruction, however, takes apart the subject/object dichotomy indicating the impossibly of taking the side of subject or object, or of good and evil as both are interconnected with each other and there can be no pure object without subject and vice versa, an argument Adorno has made. Baudrillard’s thought is intrinsically dualistic and not dialectical. His thought is self-avowedly agonistic with the duel presented in tandem with his dualism, taking on and attacking rival theories and positions. Contradictions do not bother Baudrillard, for indeed he affirms them. It is thus tricky to argue with Baudrillard on strictly philosophical grounds and one needs to grasp his mode of writing, his notion of theory fictions (see Section 5), and to engage their saliency and effects.
5. Theory Fictions: Baudrillard in the Contemporary Moment
Baudrillard develops what he terms “theory fiction,” or what he also calls “simulation theory” and “anticipatory theory.” Such “theory” intends to simulate, grasp, and anticipate historical events, that he believes are continually outstripping all contemporary theory. The current situation, he claims, is more fantastic than the most fanciful science fiction, or theoretical projections of a futurist society. Thus, theory can only attempt to grasp the present on the run and try to anticipate the future. However, he has had a mixed record as a social and political analyst and forecaster. As a political analyst, he has often been superficial and off the mark. In an essay “Anorexic Ruins” published in 1989, he read the Berlin wall as a sign of a frozen history, of an anorexic history, in which nothing more can happen, marked by a “lack of events” and the end of history, taking the Berlin wall as a sign of a stasis between communism and capitalism. Shortly thereafter, rather significant events destroyed the wall that Baudrillard took as permanent and opened up a new historical era.
The Cold War stalemate was long taken by Baudrillard as establishing a frozen history in which no significant change could take place. Already in his mid-1970s reflections, he presented the Vietnam war as an “alibi” to incorporate China, Russia, and eventually Vietnam into a more rationalized and modernized world economic and political order (Baudrillard 1983a: 66f), and in his book on the Gulf war he repeats this claim (1995: 85), thus failing to see the actual political stakes and reasons for the Vietnam war, as well as the significance of the struggles between capitalist and communist blocs.
For Baudrillard, the twin towers of the World Trade Center in New York also symbolized the frozen history and stasis between the two systems of capitalism and communism. On the whole, he sees history as the unfolding of expanding technological rationality turning into its opposite, as the system incorporates ever more elements, producing an improved technological order, which then becomes irrational through its excesses, its illusions, and its generating unforeseen consequences. This mode of highly abstract analysis, however, occludes more specific historical determinants that would analyze how technological rationality is constructed and functioned and how and why it misfires. It also covers over the disorder and turmoil created by such things as the crises and restructuring of global capitalism, the rise of fundamentalism, ethnic conflict, and global terrorism which were unleashed in part as a response to a globalized rationalization of the market system and to the breakup of the bipolar world order.
Baudrillard’s reflections on the Gulf war take a similar position, seeing it as an attempt of the New World Order to further rationalize the world, arguing that the Gulf war really served to bring Islam into the New World Order (1995: 19). The first study titled “The Gulf war will not take place” was initially published a few days before the actual outbreak of military hostilities and repeats his earlier concept of “weak events” and frozen history. Baudrillard to the contrary, the Gulf war took place, but this did not deter him from publishing studies claiming during the episode that it was not “really taking place” and after the war asserting that it “did not take place” — arguing that it was a media spectacle and not a genuine war. Baudrillard does not help us to understand much about the event and does not even help us to grasp the role of the media in contemporary political spectacles. Reducing complex events like wars to categories like simulation or hyperreality illuminates the virtual and high-tech dimension to media events, but erases all their concrete determinants. And yet Baudrillardian postmodern categories help grasp some of the dynamics of the culture of living in media and computer worlds where people seem to enjoy immersing themselves in simulated events (witness the fascination of the Gulf war in 1991, the O.J. Simpson trials during 1994–6, the Clinton sex scandals, and various other media spectacles throughout the 1990s, and the September 11 terror attacks in the early days of the third millennium).
In The End of the Illusion (1994b), Baudrillard attacks head-on what he sees as current illusions of history, politics, and metaphysics, and gamely tries to explain away his own political misprognoses that contemporary history appeared in a frozen, glacial state, stalemated between East and West, that the system of deterrence had congealed, making sure that nothing dramatic could henceforth happen, that the Gulf war couldn’t take place, and that the end of history had occurred. Baudrillard unleashes his full bag of rhetorical tricks and philosophical analysis to attempt to maintain these hypotheses in the face of the dramatic events of 1989–1991, which he claims are in fact “weak events,” that events are still on strike, that history has indeed disappeared. He continues to argue that modernity as a historical epoch is over, with its political conflicts and upheavals, its innovations and revolutions, its autonomous and creative subject, and its myths of progress, democracy, Enlightenment, and the like. These myths, these strong ideas, are exhausted, he claims, and henceforth a postmodern era of banal eclecticism, inertial implosion, and eternal recycling of the same become defining features.
For Baudrillard by the end of the 1990s with the collapse of communism, the era of the strong ideas, of a conflicted world of revolution and universal emancipation, is over. Communism, on his reading, collapsed of its own inertia, it self-destructed from within, it imploded, rather than perishing in ideological battle or military warfare. With the absorption of its dissidents into power, there is no longer a clash of strong ideas, of opposition and resistance, of critical transcendence. With the embedding of the former communist regimes into the system of the capitalist world market and liberal democracy, the West no longer has an Other to battle against, there is no longer any creative or ideological tension, no longer any global alternative to the Western world.
Baudrillard celebrated the coming of the new millennium with a recycling of some his old ideas on cloning, the end of history, and the disappearance of the real in a series of lectures collected as The Vital Illusion (2000). For Baudrillard (2000), cloning is connected to the fantasy of immortality, to defeating the life-cycle. Thus, it is no surprise that cryogenics — the freezing of dead human beings in the hope they might be regenerated in the future through medical advances — is a booming global industry. Likewise, in a digital era, he claims that history has come to an end and reality has been killed by virtualization, as the human species prepares itself for a virtual existence. Baudrillard complained that the contemporary era was one of weak events, that no major historical occurrences had happened, and that therefore life and thought were becoming increasingly boring.
Shortly after the September 11 terrorist attacks, Baudrillard wrote a paper “L’esprit du terrorisme” published November 2, 2001, in Le Monde. He argued that the assaults on the World Trade Center and Pentagon constituted a “strong event,” that the attacks were “the ultimate event, the mother of all events, the pure event uniting within itself all the events that have never taken place.” The “event strike,” Baudrillard declared, was over and since this time he has continued to focus intensely on the dynamics and happenings of contemporary history.
Hence, Baudrillard’s thought was reignited by 9/11 and the subsequent Terror War which demonstrate the continuing relevance of some of his key categories and that produced some of his most provocative later work. He had long written on terrorism and was focusing reflection on globalization when the 9/11 attacks occurred. He quickly responded with the Le Monde article, soon after translated and expanded into one of the more challenging and controversial books on the terror spectacle, The Spirit of Terrorism: And Requiem for the Twin Towers (2002a). For Baudrillard, the 9/11 attacks represent a new kind of terrorism, exhibiting a “form of action which plays the game, and lays hold of the rules of the game, solely with the aim of disrupting it… they have taken over all the weapons of the dominant power”. That is, the terrorists in Baudrillard’s reading used airplanes, computer networks, and the media associated with Western societies to produce a spectacle of terror. The attacks evoked a global specter of terror that the very system of globalization and Western capitalism and culture were under assault by “the spirit of terrorism” and potential terrorist attacks anytime and anywhere.
For Baudrillard, “the speeches and commentaries made since September 11 betray a gigantic post-traumatic abreaction both to the event itself and to the fascination that it exerts. The moral condemnation and the sacred union against terrorism are directly proportional to the prodigious jubilation felt at having seen this global superpower destroyed.” Baudrillard perceived that the terrorists hope that the system will overreact in response to the multiple challenges of terrorism: “It is the terrorist model to bring about an excess of reality, and have the system collapse beneath that excess”.
In Baudrillard’s view, the 9/11 attacks represented “the clash of triumphant globalization at war with itself” and unfolded a “fourth world war”: “The first put an end to European supremacy and to the era of colonialism; the second put an end to Nazism; and the third to Communism. Each one brought us progressively closer to the single world order of today, which is now nearing its end, everywhere opposed, everywhere grappling with hostile forces. This is a war of fractal complexity, waged worldwide against rebellious singularities that, in the manner of antibodies, mount a resistance in every cell.” (Sokal and Bricmont (1998) have criticized Baudrillard for such metaphoric use of scientific terminology.)
Upon the initial publication of his response in French newspapers and its immediate translation into English and other languages, Baudrillard himself was accused of justifying terrorism when he stated in the article in Le Monde: “Because it was this insufferable superpower [i.e., the US] that gave rise both to the violence now spreading throughout the world and to the terrorist imagination that (without our knowing it) dwells within us all. That the entire world without exception had dreamed of this event, that nobody could help but dream of the destruction of so powerful a Hegemon — this fact is unacceptable to the moral conscience of the West. And yet it’s a fact nevertheless, a fact that resists the emotional violence of all the rhetoric conspiring to cover it up. In the end, it was they who did it, but we who wished it.”
Baudrillard defended himself from accusations that such reflections constituted a virulent anti-Americanism or legitimation of terrorism, claiming: “I do not praise murderous attacks — that would be idiotic. Terrorism is not a contemporary form of revolution against oppression and capitalism. No ideology, no struggle for an objective, not even Islamic fundamentalism, can explain it. …I have glorified nothing, accused nobody, justified nothing. One should not confuse the messenger with his message. I have endeavored to analyze the process through which the unbounded expansion of globalization creates the conditions for its own destruction”.
Indeed, Baudrillard has also produced some provocative reflections on globalization. In “The Violence of the Global,” he distinguishes between the global and the universal, linking globalization with technology, the market, tourism, and information contrasted to identification of the universal with “human rights, liberty, culture, and democracy.” While “globalization appears to be irreversible, … universalization is likely to be on its way out.” Elsewhere, Baudrillard writes: “…the idea of freedom, a new and recent idea, is already fading from the minds and mores, and liberal globalization is coming about in precisely the opposite form — a police-state globalization, a total control, a terror based on ‘law-and-order’ measures. Deregulation ends up in a maximum of constraints and restrictions, akin to those of a fundamentalist society.”
Many see globalization as a matrix of market economy, democracy, technology, migration and tourism, and the worldwide circulation of ideas and culture. Baudrillard, curiously, takes the position of those in the anti-globalization movement who condemn globalization as the opposite of democracy and human rights. For him, globalization is fundamentally a process of homogenization and standardization that crushes “the singular” and heterogeneity. This position, however, fails to note the contradictions that globalization simultaneously produces homogenization and hybridization and difference, and that the anti-corporate globalization movement is fighting for social justice, democratization, and increased rights, factors that Baudrillard links with a dying universalization. In fact, the struggle for rights and justice is an important part of globalization and Baudrillard’s presenting of human rights, democratization, and justice as part of an obsolete universalization being erased by globalization is theoretically and politically problematical.
Before 9/11, Baudrillard saw globalization and technological development producing standardization and virtualization that was erasing individuality, social struggle, critique and reality itself as more and more people became absorbed in the hyper and virtual realities of media and cyberspace and virtual culture. This disappearance of reality constituted the “perfect crime” which is the subject of a book of that title (1996b) and elaborated in The Vital Illusion (2000). Baudrillard presents himself here as a detective searching for the perpetrator of the “perfect crime,” the murder of reality, “the most important event of modern history.” His recurrent theme is the destruction and disappearance of the real in the realm of information and simulacra, and the subsequent reign of illusion and appearance. In a Nietzschean mode, he suggests that henceforth truth and reality are illusions, that illusions reign, and that therefore people should respect illusion and appearance and give up the illusory quest for truth and reality.
Yet in the 9/11 attacks and subsequent Terror War, difference and conflict have erupted upon the global stage and heterogeneous forces that global capitalism appears unable to absorb and assimilate have emerged that have produced what appears to be an era of intense conflict. Ideological apologists of globalization such as Thomas Friedman have been forced to acknowledge that globalization has its dark sides and produces conflict as well as networking, interrelations, and progress. It remains to be seen, of course, how the current Terror War and intensified global conflicts will be resolved.
6. Concluding Assessment
Baudrillard has never been as influential in France as in the English-speaking world and elsewhere – a point made in many French obituaries upon his death. He is an example of the “global popular,” a thinker who has followers and readers throughout the world, though, so far, no Baudrillardian school has emerged. Baudrillard’s influence has been largely at the margins of a diverse number of disciplines ranging from social theory to philosophy to art history, thus it is difficult to gauge his impact on philosophy or the mainstream of any specific academic discipline.
Baudrillard is perhaps most important as part of the postmodern turn against modern society and its academic disciplines. His work cuts across the disciplines and promotes cross-disciplinary thought. He challenges standard wisdom and puts in question received dogma and methods. While his early work on the consumer society, the political economy of the sign, simulation and simulacra, and the implosion of phenomena previously separated can be deployed within critical philosophy and social theory, much of his post-1980s work quite self-consciously goes beyond the classical tradition and in most interviews of the past decade Baudrillard distances himself from critical philosophy and social theory, claiming that the energy of critique has dissipated.
Baudrillard thus emerges in retrospect as a transdisciplinary theorist of the end of modernity who produces sign-posts to the new era of postmodernity and is an important, albeit hardly trustworthy, guide to the new era. One can read Baudrillard’s post-1970s work as science fiction that anticipates the future by exaggerating present tendencies, and thus provides early warnings about what might happen if present trends continue (Kellner 1995). It is not an accident that Baudrillard is an aficionado of science fiction, who has himself influenced a large number of contemporary science fiction writers and filmmakers of the contemporary era, including The Matrix (1999) where his work is cited.
However, in view of his exaggeration of the alleged break with modernity, it is ambiguous whether Baudrillard’s last two decades of work is best read as science fiction or theory. He obviously wants to have it both ways with social theorists thinking that he provides salient perspectives on contemporary social realities, that Baudrillard reveals what is really happening, that he tells it like it is. And yet more cynical anti-sociologists are encouraged to enjoy Baudrillard’s fictions, his experimental discourse, his games, and play. Likewise, he sometimes encourages cultural metaphysicians to read his work as serious reflections on the realities of our time, while winking a pataphysical aside at those skeptical of such undertakings. And Baudrillard’s philosophical writings provoke philosophers to defend their positions against his and to rethink certain traditional questions in the light of contemporary realities.
Thus, it is difficult to decide whether Baudrillard is best read as science fiction and pataphysics, or as philosophy, social theory, and cultural metaphysics, and whether his post-1970s work should be read under the sign of truth or fiction. In retrospect, Baudrillard’s early critical explorations of the system of objects and consumer society contain some of his most important contributions to contemporary social theory. His mid-1970s analysis of a dramatic mutation occurring within contemporary societies and rise of a new mode of simulation, which sketched out the effects of media and information on society as a whole, is also original and important. But at this stage of his work, Baudrillard falls prey to a technological determinism and semiological idealism which posits an autonomous technology and play of signs generating a society of simulation which creates a postmodern break and the proliferation of signs, spectacles, and simulacra. Baudrillard erases autonomous and differentiated spheres of the economy, polity, society, and culture posited by classical social theory in favor of an implosive theory that also crosses disciplinary boundaries, thus mixing philosophy and social theory into a broader form of social diagnosis and philosophical play.
In the final analysis, Baudrillard is perhaps more useful as a provocateur who challenges and puts in question the tradition of classical philosophy and social theory than as someone who provides concepts and methods that can be applied in philosophical, social or cultural analysis. He claims that the object of classical social theory — modernity — has been surpassed by a new postmodernity and that therefore alternative theoretical strategies, modes of writing, and forms of theory are necessary. While his work on simulation and the postmodern break from the mid-1970s into the 1980s provides a paradigmatic postmodern theory and analysis of postmodernity that has been highly influential, and that despite its exaggerations continues to be of use in interpreting present social trends, his later work is arguably of more literary interest. Baudrillard thus ultimately goes beyond philosophy and classical social theory altogether into a new sphere and mode of writing that provides occasional biting critical insights into contemporary social phenomena and provocative critiques of contemporary and classical philosophy and social theory. He now appears, in retrospect, as a completely idiosyncratic thinker who went his own way and developed his own mode of writing and thought that will continue to provoke contemporary and future students of philosophy and critical theory.
Major Theoretical Works by Baudrillard:
- 1968 [1996c], The System of Objects, London: Verso.
- 1970 , The Consumer Society, Paris: Gallimard.
- 1973 , The Mirror of Production, St. Louis: Telos Press.
- 1973 , For a Critique of the Political Economy of the Sign, St. Louis: Telos Press.
- 1983a, Simulations, New York: Semiotext(e).
- 1983b, In the Shadow of the Silent Majorities, New York: Semiotext(e).
- 1983c, “The Ecstacy of Communication,” in The Anti-Aesthetic, Hal Foster (ed.), Washington: Bay Press.
- 1987, “When Bataille Attacked the Metaphysical Principle of Economy,” D.J. Miller (trans.), Canadian Journal of Political and Social Theory, 11: 57–62.
- 1988, America, London: Verso.
- 1990a, Cool Memories, London: Verso.
- 1990b, Fatal Strategies, New York: Semiotext(e).
- 1993a, Symbolic Exchange and Death, London: Sage.
- 1993b, The Transparency of Evil, London: Verso.
- 1994a, Simulacra and Simulation, Ann Arbor: The University of Michigan Press.
- 1994b, The Illusion of the End, Oxford: Polity Press.
- 1995, The Gulf War Did Not Take Place, P. Patton (trans.), Sydney: Power Publications, and Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- 1996a, Cool Memories II, Oxford: Polity Press.
- 1996b, The Perfect Crime, London and New York: Verso Books.
- 1997, Fragments: Cool Memories III, 1990–1995, London and New York: Verso Books.
- 2000, The Vital Illusion, New York: Columbia University Press.
- 2001, Impossible Exchange, London: Verso.
- 2002a, The Spirit of Terrorism: And Requiem for the Twin Towers, London: Verso.
- 2002b, Screened Out, London: Verso.
- 2005a, The Intelligence of Evil or the Lucicity Pact. London: Verson.
- 2005b, The Conspiracy of Art. New York: Semiotext(e).
- 2006a, Utopia Deferred. Writing from Utopie (1967–1978). New York: Semiotext(e).
- 2006b, “The Pyres of Autumn”, New Left Review II (37), Jan/Feb. [Baudrillard 2006b available online].
- 2010, The Agony of Power. Semiotext(e) Intervention Series. Vol. 6. Cambridge, MA: Semiotext(e).
- 2015, Jean Baudrillard: From Hyperreality to Disappearance: Uncollected Interviews, Richard G. Smith, and David B. Clarke, eds., Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press.
- 2017, Jean Baudrillard: The Disappearance of Culture: Uncollected Interviews, Richard G. Smith, and David B. Clarke, eds., Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press.
- Best, Steven, and Kellner, Douglas, 1991, Postmodern Theory: Critical Interrogations, London and New York: MacMillan and Guilford Press.
- –––, 1997, The Postmodern Turn, New York: Guilford Press.
- –––, 2001, The Postmodern Adventure, New York: Guilford Press.
- Bishop, Ryan (ed.), 2009, Baudrillard Now: Current Perspectives in Baudrillard Studies. Cambridge, UK: Polity Press.
- Butler, Rex, 1999, Jean Baudrillard: The Defense of the Real, London and Thousand Oaks: Sage.
- Clarke, D.B., Doel, M.A., Merrin, William, and Smith, R.G. (eds), 2009, Jean Baudrillard. Fatal Theories. London and New York: Routledge.
- Debord, Guy, 1970, The Society of the Spectacle, Detroit: Black and Red.
- Frankovits, Alan, 1984, editor Seduced and Abandoned: The Baudrillard Scene, Glebe, New South Wales: Stonemoss.
- Gane, Mike, 1991, Baudrillard. Critical and Fatal Theory, London: Routledge.
- –––, 2000, Jean Baudrillard: In Radical Uncertainty. London: Pluto Press.
- ––– (ed.), 1993, Baudrillard Live. Selected Interviews, London: Routledge.
- Genosko, Gary, 1994, Baudrillard and Signs, London: Routledge.
- Grace, V., 2000, Baudrillard’s Challenge: A Feminist Reading, London: Routledge.
- Jarry, Alfred, 1963, “What is Pataphysics?,” Evergreen Review, 13: 131–151.
- –––, 1969, The Ubu Plays, New York: Grove press.
- Kellner, Douglas, 1989a, Jean Baudrillard: From Marxism to Postmodernism and Beyond, Cambridge and Palo Alto: Polity Press and Stanford University Press.
- –––, 1989b, Critical Theory, Marxism, and Modernity, Cambridge, UK and Baltimore, MD: Polity Press and John Hopkins University Press, 1989.
- ––– (ed.), 1994, Jean Baudrillard. A Critical Reader, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- –––, 1995, Media Culture. Cultural Studies, Identity and Politics Between the Modern and the Postmodern, London and New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2003a, Media Spectacle, London and New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2003b, From September 11 to Terror War: The Dangers of the Bush Legacy, Lanham, Md.: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Lefebvre, Henri, 1971 , Everyday Life in the Modern World, New Brunswick: Transaction Books.
- –––, 1991 [1947; 1958], Critique of Everyday Life, London: Verso.
- Norris, Christopher, 1998 Uncritical Theory: Postmodernism, Intellectuals and the Gulf War. Amhearst: Univ of Massachusetts Press.
- Rokek, Chris and Bryan Turner, 1993, editors Forget Baudrillard, London: Routledge.
- Smith, Jonathan, 2004, “The Gnostic Baudrillard: A Philosophy of Terrorism Seeking Pure Appearance,” in International Journal of Baudrillard Studies, Volume 1/No. 1 (January).
- Sokal, A. and J. Bricmont, 1998, “Jean Baudrillard” in Fashionable Nonsense: Postmodern Intellectuals’ Abuse of Science, New York: Picador, pp. 147–153.
- Stearns, William and William Chaloupka (eds.), 1992, The Disappearence of Art and Politics, New York and London: Saint Martins and Macmillan Press.
- Woodward, Ashley, 2009, Nihilism in postmodernity: Lyotard, Baudrillard, Vattimo, Aurora, Colo,: Davies Group, Publishers.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- International Journal of Baudrillard Studies, hosted at Bishop’s University.
- Baudrillard, J., 2002, “The Violence of the Global,” translated by François Debrix, from ‘La Violence du Mondial,’, in Jean Baudrillard, Power Inferno, Paris: Galilée, 2002, pp. 63–83.
- Baudrillard, J., 2003, “The Matrix Decoded: Le Nouvel Observateur Interview with Jean Baudrillard,” translated by Gary Genosko.
- Baudrillard, J., 2004, “This is the Fourth World War: The Der Spiegel Interview with Jean Baudrillard,” translated by Samir Gandesha, in International Journal of Baudrillard Studies, Volume 1/No. 1 (January).
- Goldblatt, M., 2001, America wanted Sept. 11., French Toast column, National Review Online, (December 13, 2001).
- Kellner, Douglas, 2005, “Baudrillard, Globalization and Terrorism: Some Comments on Recent Adventures of the Image and Spectacle on the Occasion of Baudrillard’s 75th Birthday,” International Journal of Baudrillard Studies, Volume 2, Number 1.
- Kroker, Arthur, “The Spirit of Jean Baudrillard: In Memoriam: 1929–2007”, C-Theory (posted March 8, 2007)
- C-Theory, edited by Arthur and Marilouise Kroker (University of Victoria).
- Jean Baudrillard Bibliography, maintained at the European Graduate School.
- Postmodern Theory, maintained by Douglas Kellner (UCLA).
- Situationist International, maintained by A.H.S. Boy.
For critical commentary that helped with the revision of this entry, I am grateful to Edward N. Zalta and Uri Nodelman.