Critical Theory has a narrow and a broad meaning in philosophy and in the history of the social sciences. “Critical Theory” in the narrow sense designates several generations of German philosophers and social theorists in the Western European Marxist tradition known as the Frankfurt School. According to these theorists, a “critical” theory may be distinguished from a “traditional” theory according to a specific practical purpose: a theory is critical to the extent that it seeks human “emancipation from slavery”, acts as a “liberating … influence”, and works “to create a world which satisfies the needs and powers of” human beings (Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 246]). Because such theories aim to explain and transform all the circumstances that enslave human beings, many “critical theories” in the broader sense have been developed. They have emerged in connection with the many social movements that identify varied dimensions of the domination of human beings in modern societies. In both the broad and the narrow senses, however, a critical theory provides the descriptive and normative bases for social inquiry aimed at decreasing domination and increasing freedom in all their forms.
Critical Theory in the narrow sense has had many different aspects and quite distinct historical phases that cross several generations, from the effective start of the Institute for Social Research in the years 1929–1930, which saw the arrival of the Frankfurt School philosophers and an inaugural lecture by Horkheimer, to the present. Its distinctiveness as a philosophical approach that extends to ethics, political philosophy, and the philosophy of history is most apparent when considered in light of the history of the philosophy of the social sciences. Critical Theorists have long sought to distinguish their aims, methods, theories, and forms of explanation from standard understandings in both the natural and the social sciences. Instead, they have claimed that social inquiry ought to combine rather than separate the poles of philosophy and the social sciences: explanation and understanding, structure and agency, regularity and normativity. Such an approach, Critical Theorists argue, permits their enterprise to be practical in a distinctively moral (rather than instrumental) sense. They do not merely seek to provide the means to achieve some independent goal, but rather (as in Horkheimer’s famous definition mentioned above) seek “human emancipation” in circumstances of domination and oppression. This normative task cannot be accomplished apart from the interplay between philosophy and social science through interdisciplinary empirical social research (Horkheimer 1993). While Critical Theory is often thought of narrowly as referring to the Frankfurt School that begins with Horkheimer and Adorno and stretches to Marcuse and Habermas, any philosophical approach with similar practical aims could be called a “critical theory,” including feminism, critical race theory, and some forms of post-colonial criticism. In the following, Critical Theory when capitalized refers only to the Frankfurt School. All other uses of the term are meant in the broader sense and thus not capitalized. When used in the singular, “a critical theory” is not capitalized, even when the theory is developed by members of the Frankfurt School in the context of their overall project of Critical Theory.
It follows from Horkheimer’s definition that a critical theory is adequate only if it meets three criteria: it must be explanatory, practical, and normative, all at the same time. That is, it must explain what is wrong with current social reality, identify the actors to change it, and provide both clear norms for criticism and achievable practical goals for social transformation. Any truly critical theory of society, as Horkheimer further defined it in his writings as Director of the Frankfurt School’s Institute for Social Research, “has for its object [human beings] as producers of their own historical form of life” (Horkeimer 1972b [1992, 244]). In light of the practical goal of identifying and overcoming all the circumstances that limit human freedom, the explanatory goal could be furthered only through interdisciplinary research that includes psychological, cultural, and social dimensions, as well as institutional forms of domination. Given the emphasis among the first generation of Critical Theory on human beings as the self-creating producers of their own history, a unique practical aim of social inquiry suggests itself: to transform contemporary capitalism into a consensual form of social life. For Horkheimer a capitalist society could be transformed only by becoming more democratic, to make it such that all conditions of social life that are controllable by human beings depend on real consensus in a rational society (Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 250]). The normative orientation of Critical Theory, at least in its form of critical social inquiry, is therefore towards the transformation of capitalism into a “real democracy” in which such control could be exercised (Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 250]). In such formulations, there are striking similarities between Critical Theory and American pragmatism.
The focus on democracy as the location for cooperative, practical and transformative activity continues today in the work of Jürgen Habermas, as does the attempt to determine the nature and limits of “real democracy” in complex, pluralistic, and globalizing societies.
As might be expected from such an ambitious philosophical project and form of inquiry, Critical Theory is rife with tensions. In what follows I will develop the arguments within Critical Theory that surround its overall philosophical project. First, I explore its basic philosophical orientation or metaphilosophy. In its efforts to combine empirical social inquiry and normative philosophical argumentation, Critical Theory presents a viable alternative for social and political philosophy today. Second, I will consider its core normative theory—its relation to its transformation of a Kantian ethics of autonomy into a conception of freedom and justice in which democracy and democratic ideals play a central role (Horkheimer 1993, 22; Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 203]). As a member of the second generation of Critical Theory, Habermas in particular has developed this dimension of normative political theory into a competitor to Rawlsian constructivism, which attempts to bring our pretheoretical intuitions into reflective equilibrium. In the third section, I will consider its empirical orientation in practical social theory and practical social inquiry that aims at promoting democratic norms. A fundamental tension emerges between a comprehensive social theory that provides a theoretical basis for social criticism and a more pluralist and practical orientation that does not see any particular theory or methodology as distinctive of Critical Theory as such. In this way, the unresolved tension between the empirical and normative aspects of the project of a critical theory oriented to the realization of human freedom is manifest in each of its main contributions to philosophy informed by social science. Finally, I examine the contribution of Critical Theory to debates about globalization, in which the potential transformation of both democratic ideals and institutions is at stake.
- 1. Critical Theory as Metaphilosophy: Philosophy, Ideology and Truth
- 2. Democracy as a Practical Goal of Critique: From Ideology to Social Facts
- 3. Critical Theory, Pragmatic Epistemology and the Social Sciences
- 4. A Critical Theory of Globalization: Democratic Inquiry, Transnational Critical Theory
- 5. The Emerging Ideal of a Multiperspectival Democracy: The European Union
- 6. Conclusion: Critical Theory and Normative Inquiry
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The best way to show how Critical Theory offers a distinctive philosophical approach is to locate it historically in German Idealism and its aftermath. For Marx and his generation, Hegel was the last in the grand tradition of philosophical thought able to give us secure knowledge of humanity and history on its own. The issue for Left Hegelians and Marx was then somehow to overcome Hegelian “theoretical” philosophy, and Marx argues that it can do so only by making philosophy “practical,” in the sense of changing practices by which societies realize their ideals. Once reason was thoroughly socialized and made historical, historicist skepticism emerged at the same time, attempting to relativize philosophical claims about norms and reason to historically and culturally variable forms of life. Critical Theory developed a nonskeptical version of this conception, linking philosophy closely to the human and social sciences. In so doing, it can link empirical and interpretive social science to normative claims of truth, morality and justice, traditionally the purview of philosophy. While it defends the emphasis on normativity and universalist ambitions found in the philosophical tradition, it does so within the context of particular sorts of empirical social research, with which it has to cooperate if it is to understand such normative claims within the current historical context. After presenting the two main versions of this conception of philosophy, I turn to an illuminating example of how this cooperative relation between philosophy and the social sciences works from the point of view of the main figures in Critical Theory who sought to develop it: the critique of ideology, a form of criticism which if generalized threatens to undermine the critical stance itself as one more ideology. Even if Critical Theorists are united in a common philosophical project, this example shows the large differences between the first and second generation concerning the normative justification of social criticism.
In the modern era, philosophy defines its distinctive role in relation to the sciences. While for Locke philosophy was a mere “underlaborer,” for Kant it had a loftier status. As Rorty and others have put it, transcendental philosophy has two distinct roles: first, as the tribunal of Reason, the ultimate court of appeal before which disciplines stand and must justify themselves and secondly, as the domain for normative questions left out of naturalistic inquiry. In light of this ability to judge the results of the sciences, philosophy can also organize knowledge, assigning to each of them their proper sphere and scope. The Kantian solution denies the need for direct cooperation with the sciences on issues related to normativity, since these were determined independently through transcendental analysis of the universal and necessary conditions for reason in its theoretical and practical employment. Echoes of the subsequent post-Hegelian criticisms of Kantian transcendental philosophy are found in the early work of Horkheimer and Marcuse. Indeed, Horkheimer criticizes “traditional theory” in light of the rejection of its representational view of knowledge and its nonhistorical subject. Echoing Marx in The German Ideology, Horkheimer insists that for a critical theory the world and subjectivity in all its forms have developed with the life processes of society (Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 245]). Much like certain naturalists today, he argued that “materialism requires the unification of philosophy and science,” thus denying any substantive distinction between science and philosophy (Horkheimer 1993, 34). As Horkheimer understood the task of Critical Theory, philosophical problems are preserved by taking a role in defining problems for research, and philosophical reflection retains a privileged role in organizing the results of empirical research into a unified whole.
This understanding of the relation of philosophy and the sciences remains broadly Kantian. Even while rejecting the role of philosophy as transcendental judge, he still endorses its normative role, to the extent that it still has the capacity to organize the claims of empirical forms of knowledge and to assign each a role in the normative enterprise of reflection on historically and socially contextualized reason. This unstable mixture of naturalism with a normative philosophical orientation informed much of the critical social science of the Frankfurt School in the 1930s.
According to this conception of materialism, Critical Theory could operate with a theoretical division of labor in which philosophy’s normative stance could criticize the embodiments of reason and morality according to their internal criteria. At least for modern societies, such an enterprise of “immanent critique” was possible (see, for example, Horkheimer 1993, 39). However, Horkheimer and Marcuse saw the skeptical and relativist stance of the emerging sociology of knowledge, particularly that of Karl Mannheim, as precisely opposed to that of Critical Theory. As Marcuse puts it, “sociology that is only interested in the dependent and limited nature of consciousness has nothing to do with truth. While useful in many ways it has falsified the interest and goal of any critical theory” (Marcuse 1969 152). As opposed to merely debunking criticism, “a critical theory is concerned with preventing the loss of truth that past knowledge has labored to attain.” Given Critical Theory’s orientation to human emancipation, it seeks to contextualize philosophical claims to truth and moral universality without reducing them to social and historical conditions. Horkheimer formulates this skeptical fallacy that informed much of the sociologically informed relativism of his time in this way: “That all our thoughts, true or false, depend on conditions that can change in no way affects the validity of science. It is not clear why the conditioned character of thought should affect the truth of a judgment—why shouldn’t insight be just as conditioned as error?” (Horkheimer 1993, 141). The core claim here is that fallibilism is different from relativism, suggesting that it is possible to distinguish between truth and the context of justification of claims to truth.
Faced with a sociological naturalism that relativized claims to truth and justice are necessary for social criticism, the challenge could be answered by detranscendentalizing truth without losing its normativity (Horkheimer 1993, 6; McCarthy, in McCarthy and Hoy 1994, 10). Indeed it is relativism that depends on an implausible and ahistorical form of detachment and impartiality, especially expressed in its methodological commitments to “reverential empathy and description.” The skepticism offered by historicism and the sociology of knowledge is ultimately merely theoretical, the skepticism of an observer who takes the disengaged view from nowhere. Once the skeptic has to take up the practical stance, alternatives to such paper doubt become inevitable. Indeed, the critic must identify just whose practical stance best reveals these possibilities as agents for social transformation of current circumstances. As I point out in the next section, the Frankfurt School most often applied ideology critique to liberal individualism, pointing out its contextual limitations that lead to reductionist and pernicious interpretations of democratic ideals.
Despite the force of these antirelativist and antiskeptical arguments, two problems emerge in claims made by Horkheimer and Marcuse to underwrite some “emphatic” conception of truth or justice. First, philosophy is given the task of organizing social research and providing its practical aims even in the absence of the justification of its superior capacities. A more modest and thoroughly empirical approach would be more appropriate and defensible. Second, the source of this confidence seems to be practical, that critics must immanently discover those transformative agents whose struggles take up these normative contents of philosophy and attempt to realize them. But once this practical possibility no longer seems feasible, then this approach would either be purely philosophical or it would turn against the potentialities of the present. Indeed, during the rise of fascism in the Second World War and the commodified culture afterwards, the Frankfurt School became skeptical of the possibility of agency, as the subjective conditions for social transformation were on their view undermined.
It is clear that in Dialectic of Enlightenment Horkheimer and Adorno abandoned this interdisciplinary materialist approach with its emphasis on cooperation with the social sciences (1982, xi). Adorno and Horkheimer did not to deny the achievements of the Enlightenment, but rather wanted to show that it had “self-destructive tendencies,” that its specific social, cultural and conceptual forms realized in modern Europe “contained its own possibility of a reversal that is universally apparent today” (Adorno and Horkheimer 1982, xiii). Since Adorno and Horkheimer planned to offer a positive way out of the dialectic of Enlightenment at the time they wrote these words, this reversal is by no means inevitable. Even if their specific historical story of the emergence of Enlightenment reason out of myth is no longer so convincing, it is not enough to say with Habermas that The Dialectic of Enlightenment did not “do justice to the rational content of cultural modernity” (Habermas 1987, 103). For the positive task of avoiding the reversal of Enlightenment, reconstructing the rational content of modernity is not enough, since the issue is not to affirm its universalism, but its self-critical and emancipatory capacity. If the issue is the self-correcting capacity of the Enlightenment, two questions emerge: how is it undermined? Where do we locate the exercise of this capacity? This is the “Enlightenment problem,” the solution to which is twofold: to reconstruct those human capacities that have such reflexivity built into them and to tie the operation of Enlightenment institutions to the conditions of their successful exercise.
Against this skeptical predicament of the first generation of Critical Theory, it could be said without exaggeration that Habermas’s basic philosophical endeavor from Knowledge and Human Interests to The Theory of Communicative Action has been to develop a more modest, fallibilist, empirical account of the philosophical claim to universality and rationality. This more modest approach rids Critical Theory of its vestiges of transcendental philosophy, pushing it in a naturalistic direction. Such naturalism identifies more specific forms of social scientific knowledge that help in developing an analysis of the general conditions of rationality manifested in various human capacities and powers. Thus, Habermas’s alternative sees practical knowledge, or reason in the robust sense, as it is “embodied in cognition, speech and action” (Habermas 1984, 10). Habermas’s calls for particular “reconstructive sciences,” whose aim it is to render theoretically explicit the intuitive, pretheoretical know-how underlying such basic human competences as speaking and understanding, judging, and acting. Unlike Kant’s transcendental analysis of the conditions of rationality, such sciences yield knowledge that is not necessary but hypothetical, not a priori but empirical, not certain but fallible. They are nevertheless directed to universal structures and conditions and raise universal, but defeasible claims to an account of practical reason. In this way, Habermas undermines both of the traditional Kantian roles for philosophy and brings them into a fully cooperative relation to the social sciences. This can be seen in the clear differences between his account of the critique of ideology, which is at once contextualist and antirelativist but also underwrites its own normativity in ways that Horkheimer and Marcuse’s more nearly transcendental account could not, given the inevitable tension between philosophical ideals and the historical conditions of current societies and their practices.
Like many other such theories, the theory of communicative action offers its own distinctive definition of rationality. In good pragmatist fashion, Habermas’s definition is epistemic, practical, and intersubjective. For Habermas, rationality consists not so much in the possession of knowledge and thus primarily concerned with the consistency and content of one’s beliefs, but rather in “how speaking and acting subjects acquire and use knowledge” (Habermas, 1984, 11). Such a broad definition suggests that the theory could be developed through explicating the general and formal conditions of validity in knowing and reaching understanding through language, and this task falls primarily on “formal pragmatics.” As one among many different “reconstructive sciences,” such a reconstruction of speech is inherently normative, in the sense that it is one of the disciplines that reconstructs a common domain: “the know-how of subjects who are capable of speech and action, who are attributed the capacity to produce valid utterances, and who consider themselves capable of distinguishing (at least intuitively) between valid and invalid expressions” (Habermas 1990, 31). The positive goal of such a theory is not only to provide an account of rationality based on this know-how that is rich enough to grasp uses of reason in all their variety, yet also normative enough to be able to clarify the necessary conditions for its practical employment as well as a critical analysis of the “pathologies” that occur when these conditions fail to obtain.
More than just reconstructing an implicitly normative know-how, Habermas is clear that such reconstructive sciences have a “quasi-transcendental” status by specifying very general and formal conditions of successful communication. In this way, their concern with normativity and with the abilities needed for rationality in Habermas’s practical and social sense permits them to acquire a critical role. Certainly, the goal of the reconstructive sciences is theoretical knowledge: they make such practical know-how explicit. But insofar as they are capable of explicating the conditions for valid or correct utterances, they also explain why some utterances are invalid, some speech acts unsuccessful, and some argumentation inadequate. Thus, such sciences “also explain deviant cases and through this indirect authority acquire a critical function as well” (Habermas, 1990, 32). This authority then permits the theory of rationality to underwrite critical claims about social and political practices, to show how their functioning violates not only the espoused rules but also the conditions of rationality.
Such an approach can be applied to normative features of democratic practices. Rather than only providing a set of explicit principles of justification and institutional decision rules, democracy is also a particular structure of free and open communication. Ideology restricts or limits such processes of communication and undermines the conditions of success within them. Ideology as distorted communication affects both the social conditions in which democratic discussion takes place and the processes of communication that go on within them. The theory of ideology, therefore, analyzes the ways in which linguistic-symbolic meanings are used to encode, produce, and reproduce relations of power and domination, even within institutional spheres of communication and interaction governed by norms that make democratic ideals explicit in normative procedures and constraints. As a reconstruction of the potentially correct insights behind Marx’s exaggerated rejection of liberalism, the theory of distorted communication is therefore especially suited to the ways in which meanings are used to reproduce power even under explicit rules of equality and freedom. This is not to say that explicit rules are unimportant: they make it possible for overt forms of coercion and power to be constrained, the illegitimacy of which requires no appeal to norms implicit in practices.
Democratic norms of freedom can be made explicit in various rights, including civil rights of participation and free expression. Such norms are often violated explicitly in exercises of power for various ends, such as wealth, security, or cultural survival. Besides these explicit rights, such coercion also violates the communicative freedom expressed in ignoring the need to pass decisions through the taking of yes/no attitudes by participants in communication. Habermas calls such speech that is not dependent on these conditions of communicative rationality “distorted communication.” For example, powerful economic groups have historically been able to attain their agency goals without explicitly excluding topics from democratic discussion but by implied threats and other nondeliberative means (Przworski and Wallerstein 1988, 12–29; Bohman 1997, 338–339). Threats of declining investments block redistributive schemes, so that credible threats circumvent the need to convince others of the reasons for such policies or to put some issue under democratic control. Similarly, biases in agenda setting within organizations and institutions limit scope of deliberation and restrict political communication by defining those topics that can be successfully become the subject of public agreement (Bohman 1990). In this way, it is easy to see how such a reconstructive approach connects directly to social scientific analyses of the consistency of democratic norms with actual political behavior.
This theory of ideology as distorted communication opens up the possibility of a different relation of theoretical and practical knowledge than Habermas has suggested so far. His approach uses formal pragmatics philosophically to reflect upon norms and practices that are already explicit in justifications in various sorts of argumentation or second-order communication. Such reflection has genuine practical significance in yielding explicit rules governing discursive communication (such as rules of argumentation), which in turn can be used for the purpose of designing and reforming deliberative and discursive institutions (Habermas 1996, 230). It is easily overlooked that such rules are only part of the story; they make explicit and institutionalize norms that are already operative in correct language use. Such implicit norms of well-formed and communicatively successful utterances are not identical with the explicit rules of argumentation.
These claims about norms raise two difficulties. First, there is a potential regress of rules, that is, that explicit rules requires further rules to apply them, and so on. Second, this approach cannot capture how norms are often only implicit in practices rather than explicitly expressed (Brandom 1994, 18–30). Here Habermas sides with Pettit in seeing the central function of explicit norms as creating a commons that can serve as the basis for institutionalizing norms, a space in which the content of norms and concepts can be put up for rational reflection and revision (Pettit 1992, Habermas 1990). Making such implicit norms explicit is thus also the main task of the interpretive social scientist and is a potential source of social criticism; it is then the task of the participant-critic in the democratic public sphere to change them. There is one more possible role for the philosophically informed social critic. As we have seen in the case of ideological speech, the reconstructive sciences “also explain deviant cases and through this indirect authority acquire a critical function as well” (Habermas, 1990, 32).
In this section, I have discussed claims that are distinctive of the metaphilosophy of Critical Theorists of both generations of the Frankfurt School and illustrated the ways in which critical normativity can be exercised in their differing models of the critique of ideology. Critical Theorists attempt to fulfill potentially two desiderata at the same time: first, they want to maintain the normativity of philosophical conceptions such as truth or justice, while at the same time they want to examine the contexts in which they have developed and may best be promoted practically. I argued that the first generation theorists avoided the relativism of sociologies of knowledge such as Mannheim’s only to fall into a practical skepticism about the feasibility of agents acting upon such norms in current contexts. Habermas’s conception of the cooperation between philosophy and the social sciences in rational reconstruction of practical knowledge allows him to articulate a normative conception of “real democracy” more fully and to develop a social scientifically informed conception of democracy that is an alternative to current liberal practices. This project shifts the goal of critical social inquiry from human emancipation as such, to the primary concern with democratic institutions as the location for the realization of ideals of freedom and equality. The limits on any such realization may prove to be not merely ideological: Critical Theory is also interested in those social facts and circumstances that constrain the realization of the ideal democracy and force us to reconsider its normative content. While such an account of the relation between facts and norms answers the sociological skepticism of Weber and others about the future of democracy, it may be based on an overly limited account of social facts.
In its initial phases Critical Theory attempted to develop a normative notion of “real democracy” that was contrasted with actual political forms in liberal societies. A democratic society would be rational, because in it individuals could gain “conscious control” over social processes that affect them and their life chances. To the extent that such an aim is possible at all, it required that human beings become “producers of their [social life] in its totality” (Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 244]). Such a society then becomes a “true” or expressive totality, overcoming the current “false totality,” an antagonistic whole in which the genuine social needs and interests cannot be expressed or developed (Jay 1984). Such a positive, expressivist ideal of a social whole is not, however, antiliberal, since it shares with liberalism the commitment to rationalism and universalism. The next phase in the development of Critical Theory took up the question of antidemocratic trends. This development of the Frankfurt School interpretation of the limits on democracy as an ideal of human freedom was greatly influenced by the emergence of fascism in the 1930s, one of the primary objects of their social research. Much of this research was concerned with antidemocratic trends, including increasingly tighter connections between states and the market in advanced capitalist societies, the emergence of the fascist state and the authoritarian personality. Horkheimer came to see that these antidemocratic trends gradually undermined the realization of an expressive whole, with the consequence that “the situation of the individual is hopeless,” that the subjective conditions for exercising freedom and achieving solidarity were being eroded by an increasingly totalizing social reification.
As first generation Critical Theorists saw it in the 1940s, this process of reification occurs at two different levels. First, it concerned a sophisticated analysis of the contrary psychological conditions underlying democracy and authoritarianism; second, this analysis was linked to a social theory that produced an account of objective, large-scale, and long-term historical processes of reification. If these facts and trends are true, then the idea of a “true totality” is a plausible critical category. However, this concept is ill suited for democratic theory due to a lack of clarity with regard to the underlying positive political ideal of Critical Theory. Finally, in reaction to these normative failures, Habermas seeks to develop an intermediate level of analysis and a new normative conception in the historical analysis of the emergence of the “public sphere” (Öffentlichkeit). As his later and more fully developed normative theory of democracy based on macrosociological social facts about modern societies shows, Habermas offers a modest and liberal democratic ideal based on the public use of reason within the empirical constraints of modern complexity and differentiation. This social theory may make it difficult for him to maintain some aspects of radical democracy as an expressive and rational ideal that first generation critical theorists saw as a genuine alternative to liberalism.
Except for passages on “real democracy” as the achievement of a rational society, many of the Frankfurt School’s writings on democracy are concerned with developing a critique of liberal ideology reminiscent of “The Jewish Question.” Horkheimer puts his criticism of bourgeois negative liberty in these terms: “The limited freedom of the bourgeois individual puts on the illusory form of perfect freedom and autonomy” (Horkheimer 1972b [1992, 211]). Horkheimer criticizes the modern philosophical and legal subject as abstract, detached, and ahistorical; whatever freedom and autonomy actors have, they are best understood as “definite individuals” whose freedom is exercised in relation others and in historically specific societies. The freedom of real individuals can only be thought of in a holistic way, “in the resultant web of relationships with the social totality and with nature.” Like all good ideology critiques, then, this criticism of liberalism is immanent, using the liberal norms and values against their historical realization in specific institutions. Nonetheless, this ideology critique recognized that liberalism was still, as Marcuse put it, a “rationalist theory of society.” Whatever its successor, the new form would have to pass the normative tests that fascism and other emerging forms of antiliberalism do not: this new unity “would have to prove itself before the tribunal of individuals, to show that their needs and potentialities are realized within it” (Marcuse 1968, 7). Using Hegelian terminology, Critical Theorists came to regard advanced capitalist societies as a “totality,” in which the tight integration of states and markets threatened to eliminate the space for freedom. While the emergence of fascism is possible evidence for this fact, it is also an obvious instance in which reliance on the internal criticism of liberalism is no longer adequate.
The shift in the Frankfurt School to such external forms of criticism from 1940 onwards is not confined to the fascist state. With the development of capitalism in its monopoly form, the liberal heritage loses its rational potential as the political sphere increasingly functionalized to the market and its reified social relationships. In this way the critique of liberalism shifts away from the normative underpinnings of current democratic practices to the ways in which the objective conditions of reification undermine the psychological and cultural presuppositions of democratic change and opposition. Such a society is now a “wholly false totality.” The work of Adorno and Horkheimer in this period shows the philosophical consequences of this shift, especially in Dialectic of Enlightenment (1944) and The Eclipse of Reason (1947).
One of the central claims of Dialectic of Enlightenment concerns the “entwinement of myth and Enlightenment,” as providing a deep historical treatment of the genesis of modern reason and freedom and how they turn into their opposites. Rather than being liberating and progressive, reason has become dominating and controlling with the spread of instrumental reason. Liberal institutions do not escape this process and are indeed part of it with their institutionalization of self-interest and self-preservation, tending toward a “totally administered society.” In Eclipse of Reason Horkheimer turns this critique of instrumental reason against liberal democracy. He argues that the liberal tradition that Marcuse argued needed to be preserved only retained its normative force on the metaphysical foundation of “objective reason.” However grounded, liberalism depended on subjectivizing reason and objective moral principles; subjects are proclaimed “autonomous” all the while they sink into the heteronomy of market relations. The “inevitable” tendency of liberalism to collapse into fascism “can be derived, apart from any economic causes, from the inner contradiction between the subjectivist principle of self-interest and the idea of reason that it is supposed to express” (Horkheimer 1987, 21). Shorn of its objective content, democracy is reduced to mere majority rule and public opinion to some measurable quantity. The argument here is primarily genealogical (thus based on a story of historical origin and development) and not grounded in social science; it is a reconstruction of the history of Western reason or of liberalism in which calculative, instrumental reason drives out the utopian content of universal solidarity. Some nondominating, alternative conception is exhibited in Horkheimer’s religiously influenced ideal of identification with all suffering creatures or Adorno’s idea of mimetic reconciliation with the other found primarily in art (Horkheimer 1972a; Adorno 1973). These analyses were also complemented by an analysis of the emergence of state capitalism and of the culture industry that replaces the need for consent and even the pseudo-consent of ideology.
Some of the more interesting social scientific analyses of fascism that the Frankfurt School produced in this period were relatively independent of such a genealogy of reason. The first is the analysis of political economy of advanced, administered capitalist societies, with Franz Neumann providing a dissenting view that no state can completely control social and economic processes in the ways that might be more consistent with Horkheimer and Adorno’s critique of instrumental reason. Especially interesting were empirical investigations into the “authoritarian” and “democratic” personalities, which provided a microsociology of democratic and antidemocratic character traits (Adorno et al. 1953). Perhaps one of more striking results of this study is that the core of the democratic personality is a particular emotional or affective organization: “if fear and destructiveness are the major emotional sources of fascism, eros belongs mainly to democracy” (Adorno et al 1953, 480). Thus, long-term historical cultural development and macro- and micro-sociological trends work against the democratic ideal. The sources of resistance to these trends are increasingly found at the level of what Foucault would call “micropolitics.”
Whatever the merits of such general historical frameworks for critical interpretations of the present, the internal difficulty for a critical theory is that “real democracy,” the goal of emancipatory criticism, demands a richer set of practical and theoretical resources, including institutional possibilities. What was needed was an alternative conception of rationality that is not exhausted by the decline of objective reason into subjective self-interest. This basic problem of first generation Critical Theory has been the life-long theme of the work of Jürgen Habermas, for whom the publicity and more generally the public sphere (Öffentlichkeit), occupies precisely the right conceptual space. Habermas also replaces the expressive totality of a fully democratic society with the ideal of “undamaged intersubjectivity” and of universal solidarity established through “communication free from domination.” On the social theoretical side, totality is replaced by a conception of social complexity, which is not necessarily false or reifying. These shifts permit a more positive reassessment of the liberal tradition and its existing political institutions and open up the possibility of a critical sociology of the legitimation problems of the modern state. On the whole, Habermas marked the return to normative theory united with a broader use of empirical, reconstructive and interpretive social science. Above all, this version of Critical Theory required fully developing the alternative to instrumental reason, only sketched by Adorno or Horkheimer in religious and aesthetic form; for Habermas criticism is instead grounded in everyday communicative action. Indeed, he cam to argue that the social theory of the first generation, with its commitments to holism, could no long be reconciled with the historical story at the core of Critical Theory: the possible emergence of a more robust and genuine form of democracy
Habermas’s rejection of the explanatory holism of the first generation of the Frankfurt School has both explanatory and normative implications. First, he brings categories of meaning and agency back into critical social theory, both of which were absent in the macro-sociological and depth psychological approaches that were favored in the post war period. This brings democratic potentials back into view, since democracy makes sense only within specific forms of interaction and association, from the public forum to various political institutions. Indeed, Habermas’s first and perhaps most enduring work, The Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere (Habermas 1989/1961), traced the historical emergence of new forms of public interaction from the intimate sphere of the family, to coffee houses, salons, and finally to parliamentary debates. While linked ultimately to a narrative of its decline through the market and the administrative state, the core of such interaction and the critical and egalitarian potential of being part of a public whose members address one another as equals had for Habermas a nonideological, even “utopian” core (Habermas 1989, 88). Second, Habermas also developed an alternative sociology of modernity, in which social differentiation and pluralization are not pathological but positive features of modern societies (Habermas 1982, 1986). Indeed, the positive conception of complexity permits an analysis of the ways in which modern societies and their functional differentiation opens up democratic forms of self-organization independently of some possible expressively integrated totality. Such an ideal of an expressive totality and conscious self control over the production of the conditions of social life is replaced with publicity and mutual recognition within feasible discursive institutions.
This emphasis on the normative potential of modernity does not mean that modern political forms such as the state are not to be criticized. In Legitimation Crisis (1969), for example, Habermas argues not only that the demands of advanced capitalism restrict the scope and significance of democracy, but also that the state is “crisis ridden” and unable to solve structural problems of unemployment, economic growth, and environmental destruction. These crisis tendencies open up a space for contestation and deliberation by citizens and their involvement in new social movements. This criticism of the contemporary state is put in the context of a larger account of the relation between democracy and rationality. Contrary to “formal” democracy understood as majority rule, Habermas opposes “substantive democracy,” which emphasizes the “genuine participation of citizens in political will formation” (Habermas 1975, 32). The relevant notion of rationality that can be applied to such a process is procedural and discursive; it is developed in terms of the procedural properties of communication necessary to make public will formation rational and thus for it to issue in a genuine rather than merely de facto consensus.
With such an expansion of Kantian practical reason, democracy is now grounded in the intersubjective structure of communication exhibited in the special form of reflective and reciprocal communication and public testing of claims to validity that Habermas calls “discourse.” As communication about communication, discourse emerges in problematic situations in which new solutions must be sought in order to continue social cooperation. Democratic institutions have the proper reflexive structure and are thus discursive in this sense. In them, citizens deliberate as free and equal persons, for whom the legitimacy of the decision is related to the achievement of a “rational consensus.” That is, a consensus is rational to the extent that it is based on a norm that could under ideal conditions be justified to all those who are affected by a decision. Early on Habermas called the full list of these counterfactual conditions “the ideal speech situation,” although later it is clear that it is meant to provide a principled basis by which to assess the quality of agreements reached discursively.
One philosophical purpose of such a procedural conception of rationality is to refute value skeptics, who reduce politics to what Weber called the struggle between “gods and demons” (Weber 1949). Its purpose in social theory is to provide the basis for an account of cultural rationalization and learning in modernity. In normative theory proper, Habermas has from the start been suspicious of attempts to apply this fundamentally epistemological criterion of rationality directly to the structure of political institutions. As early as Theory and Practice (1966), Habermas distanced himself from Rousseau’s claim that the general will can only be achieved in a direct, republican form of democracy. By failing to see that the ideal agreement of the social contract specifies only a certain procedural and reflexive level of justification, Rousseau confused “the introduction of a new principle of legitimacy with proposals for institutionalizing just rule” (Habermas 1979, 186). Indeed democratic principles need not be applied everywhere in the same way (Habermas 1973, 32–40). Instead, the realization of such norms has to take into account various social facts, including facts of pluralism and complexity (Habermas 1996, 474). For Habermas, no normative conception of democracy or law could be developed independently of a descriptively adequate model of contemporary society, lest it become a mere ought. Without this empirical and descriptive component, democratic norms become merely empty ideals and not the reconstruction of the rationality inherent in actual practices. I shall return to the problematic relation of social facts to democratic ideals in the next section in discussing Habermas’s account of the philosophy of critical social science.
Another way in which this point about democratic legitimacy can be made is to distinguish the various uses to which practical reason may be put in various forms of discourse. Contrary to the account of legitimacy offered in Legitimation Crisis, Habermas later explicitly abandons the analogy between the justification of moral norms and democratic decision-making. Moral discourses are clearly restricted to questions of justice that can be settled impartially through a procedure of universalization (Habermas 1990, 43ff). The moral point of view abstracts from the particular identities of persons, including their political identities, and encompasses an ideally universal audience of all humanity. Although politics and law include moral concerns within their scope, such as issues of basic human rights, the scope of justification in such practices can be restricted to the specific community of associated citizens and thus may appeal to culturally specific values shared by the participants.
There are at least three aspects of practical reason relevant to democratic deliberation: pragmatic, ethical, and moral uses of reason are employed with different objects (pragmatic ends, the interpretation of common values, and the just resolution of conflicts) and thus also different forms of validity (Habermas 1993, 1–18). Because of this variety, democratic discourses are often mixed and complex, often including various asymmetries of knowledge and information. Democratic deliberation is thus not a special case of moral judgment with all of its idealizing assumptions, but a complex discursive network with various sorts of argumentation, bargaining, and compromise (Habermas 1996, 286). What regulates their use is a principle at a different level: the public use of practical reason is self-referential and recursive in examining the conditions of its own employment. Given the social circumstances of large-scale and pluralistic modern societies, distinctively democratic deliberation requires the “medium of law,” so that the results of deliberation must be expressed through law.
Habermas expresses the relevant differences among the uses of practical reason in morality and politics as sub-principles of the same principle of discursive justification, which he calls “D.” D simply names a discursive procedure: “just those norms of action are valid if all persons affected could agree as participants in rational discourse” (Habermas 1996, 107). The moral principle “U” specifies that the rule of argumentation for moral discourse is univeralizability (Habermas 1990, 65–66). The more specific principle of democracy states that “only those laws may claim legitimacy that can meet with the agreement of all citizens in a discursive lawmaking procedure that is itself legally constituted” (Habermas 1996, 110). He argues that such a principle is at a different level than the moral principle, to the extent that its aim is primarily to establish a discursive procedure of legitimate law making and is a much weaker standard of agreement.
Nonetheless, even this democratic principle may still be too demanding, to the extent that it requires the agreement of all citizens (counterfactually) as a criterion of legitimacy. Habermas admits that in the case of cultural values we need not expect such agreement, and he even introduces compromise as a possible discursive outcome of democratic procedures. One way to genuinely weaken the principle would be to substitute cooperation for consensus and the outcome of the procedure: “a law then would be legitimate only if it could be agreed to in a fair and open deliberative process in which all citizens may freely continue to participate whatever the outcome” (Bohman 1996, 89). In this way, what is crucial is not the agreement as such, but how citizens reason together within a common public sphere. The democratic principle in this form expresses an ideal of citizenship rather than a standard of liberal legitimacy .
The internal complexity of democratic discourse does not overcome the problem of the application of the democratic principle to contemporary social circumstances. As Habermas puts it, “unavoidable social complexity makes it necessary to apply the criteria of democracy in a differentiated way” (Habermas 1996, 486). Such complexity restricts the application of fully democratic justification for a number of reasons: first, it is not possible for the sovereign will of the people by their democratic decision-making powers to constitute the whole of society; and, second, a society formed by merely associative and communicative means of coordination and cooperation is no longer possible. This objection to radical democracy is thus directed to those theories that do not figure out how such principles can be institutionally mediated given current social facts. Indeed, institutional mediation can overcome deficits in communicative self-organization, in so far as they compensate for “the cognitive indeterminacy, motivational insecurity, and the limiting coordinating power of moral norms and informal norms of action in general” (Habermas 1996, 323).
This approach to law has important consequences for a critical theory, since it changes how we appeal to democratic norms in criticizing current institutions: it is not clear exactly what the difference is between a radical and a liberal democracy, since some of the limitations on participation are due to the constraints of social facts and not to power asymmetries. By insisting upon popular sovereignty as the outcome of the generation of “communicative power” in the public sphere, Habermas tries to save the substance of radical democracy. The unresolved difficulty is that in a complex society, as Habermas asserts, “public opinion does not rule” but rather points administrative power in particular directions; or, as he puts it, it does not “steer” but “countersteers” institutional complexity (Habermas 1996, chapter 8). That is, members of the public do not control social processes; qua members of a public, they may exercise influence through particular institutionalized mechanisms and channels of communication.
The open question for current Critical Theory (although not all critical theories) is then whether or not “real democracy” is still the goal of social criticism given these putatively “unavoidable” facts about the structure of modern society. Even given the limits of social complexity, there is still room for judgments of greater or lesser democracy, particularly with regard to the democratic value of freedom from domination. For example, a critical theory of globalization could show that the democratic potential of modern societies is being undermined by neoliberal globalization and denationalization of economic policy. Such a theory sees the solution here to be the achievement of more democracy at the international level. It is also possible that the critical use of democratic concepts may require reconceptualizing the democratic theory that has informed much of Enlightenment criticism in European societies. Here critical theorists are then simply one sort of participant in the ongoing internal work of redefining the democratic ideal, not simply in showing the lack of its full realization.
Either way, radical democracy may no longer be the only means to social transformation, and indeed we may, with Marcuse, think that preserving the truths of the past, such as democratic constitutional achievements, to be as important as imagining a new future. Given the new situation, Critical Theory could now return to empirical social inquiry to discover new potentials for improving democracy, especially in understanding how it may increase the scope and effectiveness of public deliberation. In these various roles, critical theorists are participants in the democratic public sphere. One of the main continuing legacies of Critical Theory has been to see that democracy is “the unfinished project of modernity” (Habermas 1986, xi) and its further realization and transformation a genuine goal even in complex and globalizing societies. To do so would entail a different, perhaps more reflexive notion of critical social inquiry, in which democracy is not only the object of study but is itself understood as a form of social inquiry. Critical Theory would then have to change its conception of what makes it practical and democratic.
In the next two sections, I will discuss two aspects of this transformed conception of Critical Theory. First, I turn to the role of social theory in this more pragmatic account of critical social inquiry. Contrary to its origins in Marxian theoretical realism, I argue for methodological and theoretical pluralism as the best form of practical social science aimed at human emancipation. Second, I illustrate this conception in developing the outlines of a critical theory of globalization, in which greater democracy and nondomination are its goals. This theory also has a normative side, which is inquiry into democracy itself outside of its familiar social container of the nation state. In this sense, it attempts not just to show constraints but also open possibilities. Critical Theorists have failed not only to take up the challenge of such new social circumstances but also thereby to reformulate democratic ideals in novel ways. I shift first to the understanding of the philosophy of social science that would help in this rearticulation of Critical Theory as critical social inquiry as a practical and normative enterprise.
Such a practical account of social inquiry has much in common with pragmatism, old and new (Bohman 1999a, 1999b). As with pragmatism, Critical Theory came gradually to reject the demand for a scientific or objective basis of criticism grounded in a grand theory. This demand proved hard to square with the demands of social criticism directed to particular audiences at particular times with their own distinct demands and needs for liberation or emancipation. The first step was to move the critical social scientist away from seeking a single unifying theory to employing many theories in diverse historical situations. Rather, it is better to start with agents’ own pretheoretical knowledge and self-understandings. The issue for critical social inquiry is not only how to relate pretheoretical and theoretical knowledge of the social world, but also how to move among different irreducible perspectives. The second step is to show that such a practical alternative not only provides the basis for robust social criticism, but also that it better accounts for and makes use of the pluralism inherent in various methods and theories of social inquiry. While it is far from clear that all critical theorists understand themselves in this way, most agree that only a practical form of critical inquiry can meet the epistemic and normative challenges of social criticism and thus provide an adequate philosophical basis fulfilling the goals of a critical theory.
The philosophical problem that emerges in critical social inquiry is to identify precisely those features of its theories, methods, and norms that are sufficient to underwrite social criticism. A closer examination of paradigmatic works across the whole tradition from Marx’s Capital (1871) to the Frankfurt School’s Studies in Authority and the Family (1939) and Habermas’s Theory of Communicative Action (1982) reveals neither some distinctive form of explanation nor a special methodology that provides the necessary and sufficient conditions for such inquiry. Rather, the best such works employ a variety of methods and styles of explanation and are often interdisciplinary in their mode of research. What then gives them their common orientation and makes them all works of critical social science?
There are two common, general answers to the question of what defines these distinctive features of critical social inquiry: one practical and the other theoretical. The latter claims that critical social inquiry ought to employ a distinctive theory that unifies such diverse approaches and explanations. On this view, Critical Theory constitutes a comprehensive social theory that will unify the social sciences and underwrite the superiority of the critic. The first generation of Frankfurt School Critical Theory sought such a theory in vain before dropping claims to social science as central to their program in the late 1940s (Wiggershaus 1994). By contrast, according to the practical approach, theories are distinguished by the form of politics in which they can be embedded and the method of verification that this politics entails. But to claim that critical social science is best unified practically and politically rather than theoretically or epistemically is not to reduce it simply to democratic politics. It becomes rather the mode of inquiry that participants may adopt in their social relations to others. The latter approach has been developed by Habermas and is now favored by Critical Theorists.
Before turning to such a practical interpretation of critical social inquiry, it is first necessary to consider why the theoretical approach was favored for so long and by so many Critical Theorists. First, it has been long held that only a comprehensive social theory could unify critical social science and thus underwrite a “scientific” basis for criticism that goes beyond the limits of lay knowledge. Second, not only must the epistemic basis of criticism be independent of agents’ practical knowledge, but it might also be claimed that the correctness of any explanation is independent of its desirable or undesirable political effects on a specific audience. So conceived, social criticism is then a two-stage affair: first, inquirers independently discover the best explanation using the available comprehensive theory; then, second, they persuasively communicate its critical consequences to participants who may have false beliefs about their practices.
Starting with Marx’s historical materialism, large-scale macrosociological and historical theories have long been held to be the most appropriate explanatory basis for critical social science. However, one problem is that comprehensiveness does not ensure explanatory power. Indeed, there are many such large-scale theories, each with its own distinctive and exemplary social phenomena that guide an attempt at unification. A second problem is that a close examination of standard critical explanations, such as the theory of ideology, shows that they typically appeal to a variety of different social theories (Bohman 1999b). Habermas’s actual employment of critical explanations bears this out. His criticism of modern societies turns on the explanation of the relationship between two very different theoretical terms: a micro-theory of rationality based on communicative coordination and a macro-theory of the systemic integration of modern societies in such mechanisms as the market (Habermas 1987).
Not only does the idea of a comprehensive theory presuppose that there is one preferred mode of critical explanation, it also presupposes that there is one preferred goal of social criticism, a socialist society that fulfills the norm of human emancipation. Only with such a goal in the background does the two-step process of employing historical materialism to establish an epistemically and normatively independent stance make sense. The validity of social criticism does not merely depend on its being accepted or rejected by those to whom it is addressed. Pluralistic inquiry suggests a different norm of correctness: that criticism must be verified by those participating in the practice and that this demand for practical verification is part of the process of inquiry itself.
Despite his ambivalence between theoretical and practical pluralism, Habermas has given good reasons to accept the practical and pluralist approach. Just as in the analysis of modes of inquiry tied to distinct knowledge-constitutive interests, Habermas accepts that various theories and methods each have “a relative legitimacy.” Indeed, like Dewey he goes so far as to argue that the logic of social explanation is pluralistic and elides the “apparatus of general theories.” In the absence of any such general theories, the most fruitful approach to social scientific knowledge is to bring all the various methods and theories into relation to each other: “Whereas the natural and the cultural or hermeneutic sciences are capable of living in mutually indifferent, albeit more hostile than peaceful coexistence, the social sciences must bear the tension of divergent approaches under one roof …” (Habermas 1988, 3). In The Theory of Communicative Action, Habermas casts critical social theory in a similar pluralistic, yet unifying way. In discussing various accounts of societal modernization, for example, Habermas argues that the main existing theories have their own “particular legitimacy” as developed lines of empirical research, and that Critical Theory takes on the task of critically unifying the various theories and their heterogeneous methods and presuppositions. “Critical Theory does not relate to established lines of research as a competitor; rather, starting from its concept of the rise of modern societies, it attempts to explain the specific limitations and relative rights of those approaches” (Habermas 1987, 375).
This tension between unity and plurality leads in two different directions, one practical and the other theoretical. What might be called the “Kantian” approach proceeds case by case, seeing the way in which these theories run up against their limits in trying to extend beyond the core phenomena of their domain of validity (Bohman 1991, chapter 2). This approach is not theoretical in orientation, but more akin to “social science with a practical intent” to use Habermas’s older vocabulary (Habermas 1971). The “Kantian” answer is given sharpest formulation by Weber in his philosophy of social science. While recognizing the hybrid nature of social science as causal and interpretive, he sought explanations of particular phenomena that united both dimensions. For example, in his Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism he brought the macroanalysis of institutional structures together with the micro-analysis of economic rationality and religious belief (Weber 1958). According to this contrasting approach, “the relative rights and specific limitations” of each theory and method are recognized by assigning them to their own particular (and hence limited) empirical domain rather than establishing these judgments of scope and domain through a more comprehensive theory that encompasses all others.
The second approach may be termed “Hegelian.” Here theorists seek to unify social scientific knowledge in broad comprehensive theories that produce a general history of modern societies. But general theories provide “general interpretive frameworks” on which it is possible to construct “critical histories of the present” (McCarthy in Hoy and McCarthy 1994, 229–230). Even this account of a comprehensive theory hardly eliminates competing histories that bring together different theories and methods. Rather than aiming at a single best history, “Hegelian” theories of this sort are seen as practical proposals whose critical purchase is seen in offering a comprehensive interpretation of the present situation. They do not rely on the criteria of a theory of rationality often appealed to in the Kantian approach, but still seem to justify particular moral claims, such as claims concerning justice and injustice.
Habermas wants to straddle the divide between the Kantian and the Hegelian approaches in his social theory of modernity. Why not see Habermas’s theory of rationality as providing both a theoretical and practical basis for Critical Theory? Certainly, this is how Habermas sees the purpose of such a theory (Habermas 1984, chapter 1). Yet even if this theory of rationality has to be understood in this way, it would still have to avoid what Rorty calls “the ambiguity of rationality,” between its statuses as “a cognitive faculty and a moral virtue.” For this reason, Rorty keeps them distinct. “The epistemological notion of rationality concerns our relation to something nonhuman, whereas the moral notion concerns our relations to our fellow human beings” (Rorty 1996, 74). In a way similar to recent arguments in Putnam, Habermas now more strongly distinguishes between claims to truth and the context of justification in which they are made, even as he also wants to reject moral realism.
The problem for the practical conception of critical social inquiry is then to escape the horns of a dilemma: it should be neither purely epistemic and thus overly cognitivist, nor purely moralistic. Neither provides sufficient critical purchase. In the case of the observer, there is too much distance, so much so that it is hard to see how the theory can motivate criticism; in the case of the pure participant perspective, there is too little distance to motivate or justify any criticism at all. It is also the same general theoretical and methodological dilemma that characterizes the debates between naturalist and anti-naturalist approaches. While the former sees terms such as rationality as explanans to explain away such phenomena as norms, the latter argues that normative terms are not so reducible and thus figure in both explanans and explanandum. The best practical account here reconciles Rorty’s ambiguity by putting the epistemological component in the social world, in our various cognitive perspectives towards it that include the normative perspectives of others. The ambiguity is then the practical problem of adopting different points of view, something that reflective participants in self-critical practices must already be able to do by virtue of their competence.
This shift to “perspective taking” is already implicit in the reflexivity of practical forms of Critical Theory. Rather than look for the universal and necessary features of social scientific knowledge, Critical Theory has instead focused on the social relationships between inquirers and other actors in the social sciences. Such relationships can be specified epistemically in terms of the perspective taken by the inquirer on the actors who figure in their explanations or interpretations. Seen in this way, the two dominant and opposed approaches to social science adopt quite different perspectives. On the one hand, naturalism gives priority to the third-person or explanatory perspective; on the other hand, the anti-reductionism of interpretive social science argues for the priority of first- and second-person understanding and so for an essential methodological dualism. Critical Theory since Horkheimer has long attempted to offer an alternative to both views.
Habermas and other Critical Theorists rightly call “technocratic” any social inquiry that only develops optimal problem-solving strategies in light of purely third-person knowledge of the impersonal consequences of all available courses of action. Pragmatists from Mead to Dewey offer similar criticisms (Habermas 1971, 1973; Dewey 1927b). This conception of practical knowledge would model the role of the social scientist in politics on the engineer, who masterfully chooses the optimal solution to a problem of design. For the social scientist qua an ideally rational and informed actor, “the range of permissible solutions is clearly delimited, the relevant probabilities and utilities precisely specified, and even the criteria of rationality to be employed (e.g., maximization of expected utilities) is clearly stated” (Hempel 1965, 481). This technocratic model of the social scientist as detached observer (rather than reflective participant) always needs to be contextualized in the social relationships it constitutes as a form of socially distributed practical knowledge.
By contrast with the engineering model, interpretive social science takes up the first-person perspective in making explicit the meaningfulness of an action or expression. Interpretations as practical knowledge are not based on some general theory (no matter how helpful or explanatory these may be when interpretation is difficult), but reconstruct agent’s own reasons, or at least how these reasons might seem to be good ones from a first-person perspective. This leaves an interpreter in a peculiar epistemic predicament: what started as the enterprise of seeing things from others’ points of view can at best provide the best interpretation for us of how things are for them. As a matter of interpretive responsibility, there is no getting around the fact that ethnography or history is our attempt “to see another form of life in the categories of our own” (Geertz 1971, 16–17; Bohman 1991, 132). The only way out of this problem is to see that there is more than one form of practical knowledge.
Naturalistic and hermeneutic approaches see the relationship of the subject and object of inquiry as forcing the social scientist to take either the third-person or first-person perspective. However, critical social science necessarily requires complex perspective taking and the coordination of various points of view, minimally that of social scientists with the subjects under study. The “second-person perspective” differs from both third-person observer and the first-person participant perspectives in its specific form of practical knowledge. It employs the know-how of a participant in dialogue or communication (Bohman 2000). This perspective provides the alternative to opposing perspectives especially when our first-person knowledge or third-person theories get it wrong. When faced with interpreting others’ behavior we quickly run into the limits of first-person knowledge simpliciter. Third-person accounts face the same “gerrymandering problem” as made clear in the private language argument (Brandom 1994, 28ff). Neither the interpreter’s nor the observer’s perspectives are sufficient to specify these opaque intentional contexts for others. For social scientists as well as participants in practices more generally, the adjudication of such conflicts requires mutual perspective taking, which is its own mode of practical reasoning.
Theories of many different sorts locate interpretation as a practice, that is, in acts and processes of ongoing communication. Communication is seen from this perspective as the exercise of a distinctive form of practical rationality. A critical theory of communicative action offers its own distinctive definition of rationality, one that is epistemic, practical, and intersubjective. For Habermas, for example, rationality consists not so much in the possession of particular knowledge, but rather in “how speaking and acting subjects acquire and use knowledge” (Habermas 1984, 11). Any such account is “pragmatic” because it shares a number of distinctive features with other views that see interpreters as competent and knowledgeable agents. Most importantly, a pragmatic approach develops an account of practical knowledge in the “performative attitude,” that is, from the point of view of a competent speaker. A theory of rationality can be a reconstruction of the practical knowledge necessary for establishing social relationships. This reconstruction is essential to understanding the commitments of the reflective participant, including the critic.
There are two general arguments for a theory that assumes the irreducibility of such a perspective. The first is that interpreting is not merely describing something. Rather, it establishes commitments and entitlements between the interpreter and the one interpreted. Second, in doing so the interpreter takes up particular normative attitudes. These “normative attitudes” must be those of the interpreted. In interpreting one is not just reporting, but rather expressing and establishing one’s attitude toward a claim, such as when the interpreter takes the interpreted to say something to be true, or to perform an act that is appropriate according to social norms. Some such attitudes are essentially two-person attitudes: the interpreter does not just express an attitude in the first-person perspective alone, but rather incurs a commitment or obligation to others by interpreting what others are doing (Brandom 1994, 79). To offer an interpretation that is accepted is to make explicit the operative social norms and thus to establish the normative terms of a social relationship.
The critical attitude shares with the interpretive stance a structure derived from the second-person perspective. Here an agent’s beliefs, attitudes, and practices cannot only be interpreted as meaningful or not, but must also be assessed as correct, incorrect, or inconclusive. Nonetheless, the second-person perspective is not yet sufficient for criticism. In order for an act of criticism itself to be assessed as correct or incorrect, it must often resort to tests from the first- and third-person perspectives as well. The reflective participant must take up all stances; she assumes no single normative attitude as proper for all critical inquiry. Only such an “interperspectival” stance is fully dialogical, giving the inquirer and agent equal standing. If indeed all cooperative social activities “involve a moment of inquiry” (Putnam 1994, 174), then they also need a moment of self-reflection on the assumptions of such inquiry itself. It is this type of reflection that calls for a distinctively practical form of critical perspective taking. If critical social inquiry is inquiry into the basis of cooperative practices as such, it takes practical inquiry one reflective step further. The inquirer does not carry out this step alone, but rather with the public whom the inquirer addresses. As in Kuhn’s distinction between normal and revolutionary science, second-order critical reflection considers whether or not the framework for cooperation itself needs to be changed, thus whether new terms of cooperation are necessary to solve problems.
Various perspectives for inquiry are appropriate in different critical situations. If it is to identify all the problems with cooperative practices of inquiry, it must be able to occupy and account for a variety of perspectives. Only then will it enable public reflection among free and equal participants. Such problems have emerged for example in the practices of inquiry surrounding the treatment of AIDS. The continued spread of the epidemic and lack of effective treatments brought about a crisis in expert authority, an “existential problematic situation” in Dewey’s sense (Dewey 1938, 492). By defining expert activity through its social consequences and by making explicit the terms of social cooperation between researchers and patients, lay participants reshape the practices of gaining medical knowledge and authority (Epstein 1996, Part II). The affected public changed the normative terms of cooperation and inquiry in this area in order that institutions could engage in acceptable first-order problem solving. If expertise is to be brought under democratic control, reflective inquiry into scientific practices and their operative norms is necessary (Bohman 1999a). This public challenge to the norms on which expert authority is based may be generalized to all forms of research in cooperative activity. It suggests the transformation of some of the epistemological problems of the social sciences into the practical question of how to make their forms of inquiry and research open to public testing and public accountability. This demand also means that some sort of “practical verification” of critical social inquiry is necessary.
A practical approach to Critical Theory responds to pluralism in the social sciences in two ways, once again embracing and reconciling both sides of the traditional opposition between epistemic (explanatory) and non-epistemic (interpretive) approaches to normative claims. On the one hand, it affirms the need for general theories, while weakening the strong epistemic claims made for them in underwriting criticism. On the other hand, it situates the critical inquirer in the pragmatic situation of communication, seeing the critic as making a strong claim for the truth or rightness of his critical analysis. This is a presupposition of the critic’s discourse, without which it would make no sense to engage in criticism of others.
A good test case for the practical and pluralist conception of Critical Theory based on perspective taking would be to give a more precise account of the role of general theories and social scientific methods in social criticism, including moral theories or theories of norms. Rather than serving a justifying role in criticisms for their transperspectival comprehensiveness, theories are better seen as interpretations that are validated by the extent to which they open up new possibilities of action that are themselves to be verified in democratic inquiry. Not only that, but every such theory is itself formulated from within a particular perspective. General theories are then best seen as practical proposals whose critical purchase is not moral and epistemic independence but practical and public testing according to criteria of interpretive adequacy. This means that it is not the theoretical or interpretive framework that is decisive, but the practical ability in employing such frameworks to cross various perspectives in acts of social criticism. In the above example, it is accomplished in taking the patients’ perspectives seriously in altering practices of medical inquiry into AIDS.
Why is this practical dimension decisive for democratizing scientific authority? There seems to be an indefinite number of perspectives from which to formulate possible general histories of the present. Merely to identify a number of different methods and a number of different theories connected with a variety of different purposes and interests leaves the social scientist in a rather hopeless epistemological dilemma. Either the choice among theories, methods, and interests seems utterly arbitrary, or the Critical Theorist has some special epistemic claim to survey the domain and make the proper choice for the right reason. The skeptical horn of the dilemma is embraced by “new pragmatists” like Richard Rorty (Rorty 1991) and Max Weber (1949) alike, who see all such knowledge as purpose-relative. The latter, perhaps Hegelian horn demands objectivist claims for social science generally and for the epistemic superiority of the Critical Theorist in particular--claims that Habermas and other Critical Theorists have been at pains to reject (Weber 1949; Habermas 1973, 38). Is there any way out of the epistemic dilemma of pluralism that would preserve the possibility of criticism without endorsing epistemic superiority?
The way out of this dilemma has already been indicated by a reflexive emphasis on the social context of critical inquiry and the practical character of social knowledge it employs. It addresses the subjects of inquiry as equal reflective participants, as knowledgeable social agents. In this way, the asymmetries of the context of technical control are suspended; this means that critical social inquiry must be judged by a different set of practical consequences, appealing to an increase in the “reflective knowledge” that agents already possess to a greater or lesser degree. As agents in the social world themselves, social scientists participate in the creation of the contexts in which their theories are publicly verified. The goal of critical inquiry is then not to control social processes or even to influence the decisions that agents might make in any determinate sort of way. Instead, its goal is to initiate public processes of self-reflection (Habermas, 1971, 40–41). Such a process of deliberation is not guaranteed success in virtue of some comprehensive theory. Rather, the critic seeks to promote just those conditions of democracy that make it the best available process upon the adequate reflection of all those affected. This would include reflection of the democratic process itself. When understood as solely dependent upon the superiority of theoretical knowledge, the critic has no foothold in the social world and no way to choose among the many competing approaches and methods. The publicity of a process of practical verification entails its own particular standards of critical success or failure that are related to social criticism as an act of interpretation addressed to those who are being criticized. An account of such standards then has to be developed in terms of the sort of abilities and competences that successful critics exhibit in their criticism. Once more this reveals a dimension of pluralism in the social sciences: the pluralism of social perspectives. As addressed to others in a public by a speaker as a reflective participant in a practice, criticism certainly entails the ability to take up the normative attitudes of multiple pragmatic perspectives in the communication in which acts of criticism are embedded.
If the argument of the last section is correct, a pragmatic account is inevitably methodologically, theoretically, and perspectivally pluralistic. Any kind of social scientific method or explanation-producing theory can be potentially critical. There are no specific or definitive social scientific methods of criticism or theories that uniquely justify the critical perspective. One reason for this is that there is no unique critical perspective, nor should there be one for a reflexive theory that provides a social scientific account of acts of social criticism and their conditions of pragmatic success.
The standard ideas of ideology critique exhibit the problems with a solely third-person model of criticism dependent on some idea of the theorists being able to discern the “real interests” of participants (Geuss 1981). Rather than claiming objectivity in a transperspectival sense, most practically oriented Critical Theorists have always insisted that their form of social inquiry takes a “dual perspective” (Habermas 1996, chapter 1; Bohman 1991, chapter 4). This dual perspective has been expressed in many different ways. Critical Theorists have always insisted that critical approaches have dual methods and aims: they are both explanatory and normative at the same time, adequate both as empirical descriptions of the social context and as practical proposals for social change. This dual perspective has been consistently maintained by Critical Theorists in their debates about social scientific knowledge, whether it is with regard to the positivism dispute, universal hermeneutics, or micro- or macro-sociological explanations.
In the dispute about positivist social science, Critical Theorists rejected all forms of reductionism and insisted on the explanatory role of practical reason. In disputes about interpretation, Critical Theorists have insisted that social science not make a forced choice between explanation and understanding. Even if social scientists can only gain epistemic access to social reality through interpretation, they cannot merely repeat what agents know practically in their “explanatory understanding.” Here we might think of explanations that create micro- and macro linkages, as between intentional actions pursued by actors for their own purposes and their unintended effects due to interdependencies of various sorts. Such dual perspective explanations and criticism both allow the reflective distance of criticism and the possibility of mediating the epistemic gap between the participants’ more internal and the critics’ more external point of view. Given the rich diversity of possible explanations and stances, contemporary social science has developed a variety of possible ways to enhance critical perspective taking.
Such a dual perspective provides a more modest conception of objectivity: it is neither transperspectival objectivity nor a theoretical metaperspective, but always operates across the range of possible practical perspectives that knowledgeable and reflective social agents are capable of taking up and employing practically in their social activity. It is achieved in various combinations of available explanations and interpretive stances. With respect to diverse social phenomena at many different levels, critical social inquiry has employed various explanations and explanatory strategies. Marx’s historical social theory permitted him to relate functional explanations of the instability of profit-maximizing capitalism to the first-person experiences of workers. In detailed historical analyses, feminist and ethnomethodological studies of the history of science have been able to show the contingency of normative practices (Epstein 1996; Longino 1990). They have also adopted various interpretive stances. Feminists have shown how supposedly neutral or impartial norms have built-in biases that limit their putatively universal character with respect to race, gender, and disability (Mills 1997; Minnow 1990, Young 2002). In all these cases, claims to scientific objectivity or moral neutrality are exposed by showing how they fail to pass the test of public verification by showing how the contours of their experiences do not fit the self-understanding of institutional standards of justice (Mills 1997; Mansbridge 1991). Such criticism requires holding both one’s own experience and the normative self-understanding of the tradition or institution together at the same time, in order to expose bias or cognitive dissonance. It uses expressions of vivid first-person experiences to bring about cross-perspectival insights in actors who could not otherwise see the limits of their cognitive and communicative activities.
In these cases, why is it so important to cross perspectives? Here the second-person perspective has a special and self-reflexive status for criticism. Consider the act of crossing from the first-person plural or “we perspective” to the second-person perspective in two reflexive practices: science and democracy. In the case of science the community of experts operates according to the norm of objectivity, the purpose of which is to guide scientific inquiry and justify its claims to communal epistemic authority. The biases inherent in these operative norms have been unmasked in various critical science studies and by many social movements. For Longino, such criticism suggests the need for a better norm of objectivity, “measured against the cognitive needs of a genuinely democratic community” (Longino 1990, 236). This connection can be quite direct, as when empirical studies show that existing forms of participation are highly correlated with high status and income, that lower income and status citizens were often unwilling to participate in a public forum for fear of public humiliation (Verba, et al 1995, Mansbridge 1991, Kelly 2000). Adopting the second-person perspective of those who cannot effectively participate does not simply unmask egalitarian or meritocratic claims about political participation, but rather also suggests why critical inquiry ought to seek new forums and modes of public expression (Young 2002, Bohman 1996).
The practical alternative offers a solution to this problem by taking critical social theory in the direction of a pragmatic reinterpretation of the verification of critical inquiry that turns seemingly intractable epistemic problems into practical ones. The role of critical social science is to supply methods for making explicit just the sort of self-examination necessary for on-going normative regulation of social life. This practical regulation includes the governing norms of critical social science itself. Here the relation of theory to practice is a different one than among the original pragmatists: more than simply clarifying the relation of means and ends for decisions on particular issues, these social sciences demand reflection upon institutionalized practices and their norms of cooperation. Reflective practices cannot remain so without critical social inquiry, and critical social inquiry can only be tested in such practices. One possible epistemic improvement is the transformation of social relations of power and authority into contexts of democratic accountability among political equals (Bohman 1999a; Epstein 1996).
Properly reconstructed, critical social inquiry is the basis for a better understanding of the social sciences as the distinctive form of practical knowledge in modern societies. Their capacity to initiate criticism not only makes them the democratic moment in modern practices of inquiry; that is, the social are democratic to the extent that they are sufficiently reflexive and can initiate discussion of the social basis of inquiry within a variety of institutional contexts. Normative criticism is thus not only based on the moral and cognitive distance created by relating and crossing various perspectives; it also has a practical goal. It seeks to expand each normative perspective in dialogical reflection and in this way make human beings more aware of the circumstances that restrict their freedom and inhibit the full, public use of their practical knowledge. One such salient circumstance is the long-term historical process of globalization. What is a distinctively critical theory of globalization that aims at such a form of practical knowledge? How might such a theory contribute to wishes and struggles of the age, now that such problematic situations are transnational and even global? What normative standards can critics appeal to, if not those immanent in liberalism? While in the next section I will certainly talk about critical theorists, I will also attempt to do critical social inquiry that combines normative and empirical perspectives with the aim of realizing greater and perhaps novel forms of democracy where none presently exist.
While the standard theories of globalization deal with large scale and macrosociological processes, the social fact of globalization is not uniform; differently situated actors experience it differently. This makes it exemplary for pluralist and multiperspectival social inquiry. It is also exemplary in another sense. As a social fact that is not uniform in its consequences, globalization cannot be reconstructed from the internal perspective of any single democratic political community, it requires a certain kind of practically oriented knowledge about the possibilities of realising norms and ideals in praxis and is thus a theory of democratization, of creating a political space where none now exists. We may call this practical theory of praxis a “praxeology” (Linklater 2001, 38). Though the use of the term “praxeology” can be traced back to the work of Ludwig von Mises and even earlier to Alfred Espinas, Linklater’s use derives from the way the term is employed in Raymond Aron’s work (Aron 2003, 577). The purpose of praxeology, in this sense, is inquiry into the “knowing how” of practical normative knowledge, that is, how it is that norms are ongoingly interpreted, realized, and enacted under particular social and historical circumstances. A critical and praxeological theory of globalization must therefore solve two pressing internal problems: first, how to organize social inquiry within and among transnational institutions more democratically; and, second, it must show the salient differences between national and transnational institutions and public spheres so that the democratic influence over globalization becomes a more tractable problem with feasible solutions.
Current theories of globalization are primarily macro-sociological and focus primarily on globalization as imposing constraints on democratic institutions. While not denying that globalization is such a fact, its explanations can become more critical and practical by also showing how globalizing processes open up new institutional possibilities and new forms of publicity (Bohman 2003). In order to test these possibilities, this theory must make itself a more open and multiperspectival practice; it must become a global critical theory. It is in this context that we can press the questions of the normative adequacy of the democratic ideal that has been inherited from modern liberalism. Indeed, many critical theorists who defend a “cosmopolitan” conception of democracy have a surprisingly standard conception of how democracy is best organized discursively and deliberatively. For this reason, they have not asked the question whether such practices are able to sustain a sufficiently robust and cooperative form of inquiry under the new global circumstances of political interdependence.
In what respect can it be said that this novel sort of practical and critical social science should be concerned with social facts? A social scientific praxeology understands facts in relation to human agency rather than independent of it. Pragmatic social science is concerned not merely with elaborating an ideal in convincing normative arguments, but also with its realizability and its feasibility. In this regard, any political ideal must take into account general social facts if it is to be feasible; but it must also be able to respond to a series of social facts that ground skeptical challenges suggesting that circumstances make such an ideal impossible. With respect to democracy, these facts include, expertise and the division of labor, cultural pluralism and conflict, social complexity and differentiation, and globalization and increasing social interdependence, to name a few. In cases where “facts” challenge the very institutional basis of modern political integration, normative practical inquiry must seek to extend the scope of political possibilities rather than simply accept the facts as fixing the limits of political possibilities once and for all. For this reason, social science is practical to the extent that it is able to show how political ideals that have informed these institutions in question are not only still possible, but also feasible under current conditions or modification of those conditions. As I have been arguing, the ideal in question for pragmatism and recent critical social theory inspired by pragmatism is a robust and deliberative form of self-rule—also a key aspect of Critical Theory’s wider historical ideal of human emancipation and freedom from domination.
The issue of realizability has to do with a variety of constraints. On the one hand, democracy requires voluntary constraints on action, such as commitments to basic rights and to constitutional limits on political power. Social facts, on the other hand, are non-voluntary constraints, or within our problematic, constraints that condition the scope of the application of democratic principles. Taken up in a practical social theory oriented to suggesting actions that might realize the ideal of democracy in modern society, social facts no longer operate simply as constraints. For Rawls, “the fact of pluralism” (or the diversity of moral doctrines in modern societies) is just one such permanent feature of modern society that is directly relevant to political order, because its conditions “profoundly affect the requirements of a workable conception of justice” (Rawls 1999, 424).
This is not yet a complete story. Social facts such as pluralism have become “permanent” only to the extent that modern institutions and ideals developed after the Wars of Religion, including constitutional democracy and freedom of expression, promote rather than inhibit their development. This fact of pluralism thus alters how we are to think of the feasibility of a political ideal, but does not touch on its realizability or possibility. Similarly, the “fact of coercion,” understood as the fact that any political order created around a single doctrine would require oppressive use of state power, concerns not the realizability or possibility of a particular ideal, but its feasibility as “a stable and unified order,” under the conditions of pluralism (Rawls 1999, 225). Thus, for Rawls, regardless of whether they<unclear referent> are considered in terms of possibility or feasibility, they are only considered as constraints—as restricting what is politically possible or what can be brought about by political action and power. In keeping with the nature and scope of entrenched pluralism, not all actors and groups experience the constraints of pluralism in the same way: from the perspective of some groups, pluralism enables their flourishing; for others, it may be an obstacle.
If this were the only role of putative “facts” in Rawls’ political theory of modernity, then it would not be a full practical theory in the sense that I am using the term here. Rawls’ contribution is that social facts differ in kind, so that some, such as the fact of pluralism, are “permanent” and not merely to be considered in narrow terms of functional stability. Social facts related to stability may indeed constrain feasibility without being limits on the possibility or realizability of an ideal as such; in the case of pluralism, for example, democratic political ideals other than liberalism might be possible. Without locating a necessary connection between its relations to feasibility and possibility, describing a social fact as “permanent” is not entirely accurate. It is better instead to think of such facts as “institutional facts” that are deeply entrenched in some historically contingent, specific social order rather than as universal normative constraints on democratic institutions.
This approach allows us to see the “facts” of modern societies as practical: they are precisely those determinations that are embedded in relatively long-term social processes, whose consequences cannot be reversed in a short period of time—such as a generation— by political action. Practical theories thus have to consider the ways in which such facts become part of a constructive process that might be called “generative entrenchment” (Wimstatt 1974, 67–86). By “entrenchment of social facts,” I mean that the relevant democratic institutions promote the very conditions that make the institutional social fact possible in assuming those conditions for their own possibility. When the processes at work in the social fact then begin to outstrip particular institutional feedback mechanisms that maintain it within the institution, then the institution must be transformed if it is to stand in the appropriate relation to the facts that make it feasible and realizable. All institutions, including democratic ones, entrench some social facts in realizing their conditions of possibility.
Consider Habermas’ similar use of social facts with respect to institutions. As with Rawls, for Habermas pluralism and the need for coercive political power make the constitutional state necessary, so that the democratic process of law making is governed by a system of personal, social, and civil rights. However, Habermas introduces a more fundamental social fact for the possibility and feasibility of democracy: the structural fact of social complexity. Complex societies are “polycentric,” with a variety of forms of order, some of which, such as non-intentional market coordination, do not necessarily have to answer to the ideals of democracy. This fact of complexity limits political participation and changes the nature of our understanding of democratic institutions. Indeed, this fact makes it such that the principles of democratic self-rule and the criteria of public agreement cannot be asserted simply as the proper norms for all social and political institutions, and this seems ideally suited to understanding how globalization limits the capacity of democracy to entrench itself. As Habermas puts it, “unavoidable social complexity makes it impossible to apply the criteria [of democratic legitimacy] in an undifferentiated way” (Habermas 1996, 305). This fact makes a certain kind of structure ineluctable; since complexity means that democracy can “no longer control the conditions under which it is realized.” In this case, the social fact has become “unavoidable,” and certain institutions are necessary for the social integration to which there is “no feasible alternative” (Habermas 2001 122).
While plausible, this claim lacks empirical evidence. Habermas here overestimates the constraining character of this “fact,” which does little to restrict a whole range of indirect, institutionally mediated institutional designs. These mediated forms of democracy would in turn affect the conditions that produce social complexity itself and thus stand in a feedback relation to them. The consequences of the “fact” of social complexity is thus not the same across all feasible, self-entrenching institutional realizations of democracy, and some ideals of democracy may rightly encourage the preservation of aspects of complexity, such as the ways in which the epistemic division of labour may promote wider and more collaborative problem solving and deliberation on ends. How might this alternative conception of social facts guide a critical and praxeological theory of globalization?
When seen in light of the requirements of practical social science and the entrenchment of facts and conditions by institutions, constructivists are right to emphasise how agents produce and maintain social realities, even if not under conditions of their own making. In this context an important contribution of pragmatism is precisely its interpretation of the practical status of social facts. Thus, Dewey sees social facts as always related to “problematic situations,” even if these are more felt or suffered than fully recognised as such. The way to avoid turning problematic situations into empirical-normative dilemmas is, as Dewey suggests, to see even facts practically: “facts are such in a logical sense only as they serve to delimit a problem in a way that affords indication and test of proposed solutions” (Dewey 1938, 499). They may serve this practical role only if they are seen in interaction with our understanding of the ideals that guide the practices in which such problems emerge, thus where neither fact nor ideal is fixed and neither is given justificatory or theoretical priority.
The debate between Dewey and Lippmann about the public sphere and its role in democracy is precisely praxeological in the sense that I defined the term earlier. In response to Lippmann’s insistence on the preeminence of expertise, Dewey criticised “existing political practice” for the reason that it largely ignored “occupational groups and the organized knowledge and purposes that are involved in the existence of such groups, manifests a dependence upon a summation of individuals quantitatively” (Dewey 1927a, 50–51). At the same time, he recognised that existing institutions were obstacles to the emergence of such a form of participatory democracy in an era when “the machine age has enormously expanded, multiplied, intensified, and complicated the scope of indirect consequences” of collective action and where the collectives—affected by actions of such a scope—are so large and diverse “that the resultant public cannot identify and distinguish itself” (Dewey 1927b, 314). Dewey saw the solution in a transformation both of what it is to be a public and of the institutions with which the public interacts. Such interaction will provide the basis for determining how the functions of the new form of political organization will be limited and expanded, the scope of which is “something to be critically and experimentally determined” in democracy as a mode of practical inquiry (Dewey 1927b, 281). The question is not just one of current political feasibility, but also of possibility, given that we want to remain committed in some broad sense to democratic principles of self-rule even if not to the set of possibilities provided by current institutions. How do we identify such fundamentally unsettling facts? I turn next to the discussion of a specific social fact, the “fact of globalization” and interpret it not as a uniform and aggregative process but as a problematic situation that is experienced in different and even contradictory ways at different locations and from a variety of perspectives, and is differently assessed with respect to different normative ideals of democracy. Since this is a relatively recent and unsettled debate, through this example we can see Critical Theory in the making.
For some critical theorists, the relatively “new” fact of globalization permits a direct inference to the need for new and more cosmopolitan forms of democracy and citizenship. Whatever the specific form these assume in future institutions, the usual arguments for political cosmopolitanism are relatively simple despite the fact that the social scientific analyses employed in them are highly complex and empirically differentiated in their factual claims. In discussions of theories of globalization, the fact of global interdependence refers to the unprecedented extent, intensity, and speed of social interactions across borders, encompassing diverse dimensions of human conduct from trade and cultural exchange to migration (Held, et al 1999). The inference from these facts of interdependence is that existing forms of democracy within the nation-state must be transformed and that institutions ought to be established that solve problems that transcend national boundaries (Held 1995, 98–101). Thus, globalization is taken to be a macro-sociological, aggregative fact that constrains the realization of democracy so long as the proper congruence between decision makers and decision takers is lacking. Globalization is thus taken as a constraint on democracy as it is realized in existing liberal representative systems. The Deweyan alternative is to see that facts “have to be determined in their dual function as obstacles and as resources,” as problems that also hold out the conditions that make the transformation of the situation possible (Dewey 1938, 399–400). The “mere” fact of the wider scale of interaction is thus inadequate on its own and does not capture what role globalization may play as a problematic situation for the emergence of new democratic possibilities.
A pragmatic interpretation of social facts in this way encourages us to see globalization as Janus-faced, as an obstacle and as a resource for the realization of democratic ideals. This sort of theory sees globalization not as a unitary but rather as a multidimensional process. Even the notion of “complex interdependence” can be misleading insofar as it falsely suggests the telos of an increasingly integrated world or an increasingly homogeneous culture or political community (Keohane 2000, 117). A pragmatic analysis is better served by a concept such as “interconnectedness” as opposed to interdependence to the extent that interdependence suggests convergence and levels the differences in the ways in which globalization is experienced. Rather, it is important here, as in the case of the fact of pluralism, to see that this process can be experienced in different ways by different peoples or political communities, given that it is a multifaceted and multidimensional process producing “differential interconnectedness in different domains” (Held et al 1999, 27). In some domains such as global financial markets, globalization is profoundly uneven and deeply stratified reinforcing hierarchies and distributive inequalities. Inequalities of access to and control over aspects of globalizing processes may reflect older patterns of subordination and order, even while the process produces new ones by excluding some communities from financial markets and by making others more vulnerable to its increased volatility (Hurrell and Woods 1999).
If these descriptions are correct, the fact of globalization is a new sort of social fact whose structure of enablement and constraint is not easily captured at the aggregative level. It is even experienced in contradictory ways looking at its consequences and impacts that differ across various domains and at various locations. Institutions can only manage the problems of globalization in ways that consider the interests of everyone by having mechanisms that ensure that the full range of perspectives is available for inquiry. This requires that international financial institutions extent their forms of inquiry to include issues such as the social disintegration and domination produced by their policies (Rodrik 1994, Woods 2001).
One further question about the fact of globalization must be raised in order to understand the inherent possibilities for democracy in it. Is globalization a “permanent” fact for democracy as Rawls described the fact of pluralism for liberalism in that it is deeply embedded in its possible realizations? As many social theorists have argued, globalization is part of interlocking and long-term social processes beginning in early modernity; as Anthony Giddens put it, “modernity is inherently globalizing” (Giddens 1990, 63). Even if reversing such processes were possible, it is not feasible in any short time span and under the democratic constraints. As with Rawls’ fact of pluralism, so long as “globalizing” societies are democratic, we can expect such processes to continue. This is not to say that globalization in its current form is somehow permanent or unalterable if we want to realize democratic ideals. Indeed, just how globalization will continue, and under what legitimate normative constraints, become the proper questions for democratic politics, as citizens and public vigorously interact with those institutions that make globalization a deeply entrenched and temporally stable social fact. However entrenched, the social fact of globalization still remains open to democratic reconstruction, should creative reinterpretation of democracy come about. In the next section, I examine recent debates among Critical Theorists about the significance of the European Union as a model for a genuine transformation of democracy.
The analysis thus far has taken a robust ideal of democracy for granted consisting of self-rule by the public deliberation of free and equal citizens—the ideal of deliberative democracy that informs both pragmatism and Critical Theory (Bohman 2004). Given the uneven and potentially contradictory consequences of globalization, it seems clear that current democratic institutions themselves cannot be responsive to all the dimensions of domination and subordination that are possible considering the scale and intensity of interconnectedness. What are the alternatives? It is not just a matter of exercising an institutional imagination within broadly understood democratic norms and ideals. Informed by democratic ideals of non-domination, the practical knowledge needed to promote the democratising of uneven and hierarchical social relations requires an empirical analysis of current transformations and its embedded possibilities. The democratic ideal of autonomy leads David Held and others to emphasise the emerging structures of international law that produce a kind of binding power of collective decisions. Others look to ways of reforming the structures of representation of current international institutions (Pogge 1997, Habermas 2001). Still others look to the emergence of various institutions in the European Union (EU) to discuss the trend toward international constitutionalism or supranational deliberation.
According to the sort of plurality of perspectives endorsed by a pragmatist philosophy of social science, a historical account of the emergence of single and multiple institutions would be helpful. In Gerald Ruggie’s masterful analysis of the development of a global order beyond the nation-state, he shows that the modern sovereign state and the social empowerment of citizens emerged within the same epistemic era as the single point perspective in painting, cartography, or optics. “The concept of sovereignty then represented merely the doctrinal counterpart of the application of single point perspective to the organization of political space” (Ruggie, 2000, 186). Unbundling sovereignty would lead to new political possibilities, including the re-articulation of international political space in a new way that cannot be anticipated in dominant theories of international relations. Focusing on the shifts in the authority of states and the development of the European Union, Ruggie sees the “EU as the first multiperspectival polity to emerge in the modern era” and thus the emergence of a new political form. The concept of “the multiperspectival form” does seem to offer “a lens through which to view other possible instances of international transformation today” (Ruggie 2000, 196). Such an account also applies to the theory of practical knowledge that might inform reflection on the possibilities of democracy in an era of uneven globalization.
If the political authority that now promotes globalization is to answer to democratic will formation, the institutions in which such public deliberation takes place must seek to become explicitly multiperspectival in Ruggie’s sense. The positive conditions for such an extension of current political possibilities already exist in the fact of interdependence—the emergence of greater social interaction among citizens who participate in vibrant interaction across transnational civil society and within emerging global public spheres. In order to develop the framework for such a normative-practical praxeology for emerging multiperspectival institutions, pragmatism and Critical Theory once again suggest themselves: here Dewey’s testable claim that it is the interaction of public and institutions that promotes democracy and democratic inquiry. However important giving greater powers to the European Parliament may be, parliamentary politics at best serves a mediating role among transnational and national institutions and is not the sole means to democratisation (Habermas 2001). Given that such institutions cannot easily be scaled up and retain their full democratic character, it is necessary to look to a different institutional level: to the possibility of new forms of social inquiry that may be developing in the problem-solving mechanisms of the European Union.
5.1 The Multiperspectival Public Sphere: The Critical and Innovative Potential of Transnational Interaction
How might new forms of inquiry emerge that are able to accommodate a greater number of perspectives and also remain democratic? Here we need again to distinguish between first- and second-order forms of deliberation, where the latter develops in order to accommodate an emergent public with new perspectives and interests. Dewey sees the normal, problem-solving functioning of democratic institutions as based on robust interaction between publics and institutions within a set of constrained alternatives. When the institutional alternatives implicitly address a different public than is currently constituted by evolving institutional practice and its consequences, the public may act indirectly and self-referentially by forming a new public with which the institutions must interact. This interaction initiates a process of democratic renewal in which publics organise and are organised by new emerging institutions with a different alternative set of political possibilities. Of course, this is a difficult process: “to form itself the public has to break existing political forms; this is hard to do because these forms are themselves the regular means for instituting political change” (Dewey 1927b, 255). This sort of innovative process describes the emergence of those transnational publics that are indirectly affected by the new sorts of authoritative institutions brought about by managing “deregulation” and globalization. This account of democratic learning and innovation seems not to be limited by the scope of the institutions, even as the potential for domination also increases under current arrangements.
What sort of public sphere could play such a normative role? In differentiated modern societies (that is, societies divided into multiple economic and social spheres such as markets, a state, civil society and so on), one role of the distinctive communication that goes on in the public sphere is to raise topics or express concerns that cut across social spheres: it not only circulates information about the state and the economy, but it also establishes a forum for criticism in which the boundaries of these spheres are crossed, primarily in citizen’s demands for mutual accountability. But the other side of this generalization is a requirement for communication that crosses social domains: such a generalization is necessary precisely because the public sphere has become less socially and culturally homogeneous and more internally differentiated than its early modern form (Habermas 1989). Instead of appealing to an assumed common norm of “publicity” or a set of culturally specific practices of communication, a cosmopolitan public sphere is created when at least two culturally rooted public spheres begin to overlap and intersect, as when translations and conferences create a cosmopolitan public sphere in various academic disciplines. Instead of relying on the intrinsic features of the medium to expand communicative interaction, networks that are global in scope become publics only with the development and expansion of transnational civil society. The creation of such a civil society is a slow and difficult process that requires the highly reflexive forms of communication and boundary crossing and accountability typical of developed public spheres. On the basis of their common knowledge of violations of publicity, their members will develop the capacities of public reason to cross and negotiate boundaries and differences between persons, groups, and cultures.
In such boundary-crossing publics, the speed, scale, and intensity of communicative interaction facilitated by networks such as the Internet provides a positive and enabling condition for democratic deliberation and thus creates a potential space for cosmopolitan democracy. Such a development hardly demands that the public sphere be “integrated with media systems of matching scale that occupy the same social space as that over which economic and political decision will have an impact” (Garnham 1995, 265). But if the way to do this is through disaggregated networks (such as the Internet) rather than mass media, then we cannot expect that the global public sphere will no longer exhibit features of the form of the national public sphere. Rather, it will be a public of publics, of disaggregated networks embedded in a variety of institutions rather than an assumed unified national public sphere.
The emergence of transnational public spheres is informative for the practical goals of a critical theory of globalization. Once we examine the potential ways in which the Internet can expand the features of communicative interaction, whether or not the Internet is a public sphere is a practical question of possibility rather than a theoretical question about the fact of the matter. It depends not only on which institutions shape its framework but also on how participants contest and change these institutions and on how they interpret the Internet as a public space. It depends on the mediation of agency, not on technology. With the proliferation of non-governmental organizations (NGOs) and other forms of transnational civil society organization, it is plausible to expect that two different and interacting levels of multiperspectival innovation may emerge: first, new institutions such as the European Union that are more adapted to multiple jurisdictions and levels of governance; and, second, a vibrant transnational civil society that produces public spheres around various institutions with the goal of making their forms of inquiry more transparent, accessible and open to a greater variety of actors and perspectives. This approach does not limit the sources of the democratic impulse to transnational civil society. Rather, the better alternative is to reject both bottom-up and top-down approaches in favour of vigorous interaction between publics and institutions as the ongoing source of democratization and institutional innovation.
According to a pragmatically inspired democratic experimentalism, attempts at democratisation and reform need not wait for publics to emerge; they can be constructed in various practices. Consultative NGOs may generally become too intertwined with institutions and thus do not generatively entrench their own conditions in this way. This practical difficulty is evident in the official civil society organizations of the European Union that fail to promote public deliberation. Without further conceptual and normative clarification, the appeal to various “bottom up” strategies of democratization remains normatively underdeveloped (Dryzek 1996, Jaggar, 2004). Even when informed by democratic aims, this form of politics cannot capture the complex interrelationships of civil society, the state and the market, especially given the background of inequalities and asymmetries that operate in processes of globalization. Apart from powerful corporate actors in civil society, NGOs from economically advantaged regions possess significant resources to influence and shape the formation of civil society in other contexts. A critical theory of such activity asks about the possibility of a strong connection between their powers in civil society with market forces (Silliman 1998).
Besides the spontaneous emergence of publics out of transnational associations, it is also possible to make use of self-consciously constructed publics of relevant stakeholders to act as “mini-publics” that are empowered to deliberate and make decisions (Fung 2003). Here we can include a variety of experiments, from participatory budgets to citizen boards and juries that have a variety of decision-making powers. Properly empowered and self-consciously constructed, mini-publics offer a strategy to get beyond the dilemma of insider consultation and outsider contestation that is a structural feature of civil society activity in currently existing international institutions. Since self-consciously created minipublics seek to include all relevant stakeholders, they do not rely on representation as the mode of communicating interests, or even the inclusion of well-organized actors as a way of achieving effective implementation. Instead they open up a directly deliberative process within the institution that includes as many perspectives as possible and can be repeated when necessary. The minipublic is then an institutionally constructed intermediary, although it could act in such a way as to become an agent for the creation of a larger public with normative powers. In this capacity, minipublics may become open and expandable spaces for democratic experimentation. While many are issue or domain specific, such experiments often become models for democratic governance in dispersed and diverse polities. As Cohen and Rogers put it, the more specific and episodic practices aim at mutual benefits through improved coordination, experimental deliberative practices tied to larger political projects may redistribute power and advantage and in this way secure the conditions of democracy more generally (Cohen and Rogers 2003, 251).
The same point could be made about taking existing democratic institutions as the proper model for democratization. To look only at the constraints of size in relation to a particular form of political community begs the question of whether or not there are alternative linkages between democracy and the public sphere that are not simply scaled up. Such linkages might be more decentralized and polycentric than the national community requires. The issue here is the standard of evaluation, not whether some other public sphere or form of community “is totally or completely democratic, but whether it is adequately democratic given the kind of entity we take it to be” (McCormick 1996, 345). For a nation state to be democratic it requires a certain sort of public sphere sufficient to create a strong public via its connections to parliamentary debate. A transnational and thus polycentric and pluralist community, such as the European Union, requires a different sort of public sphere in order to promote sufficient democratic deliberation. Once a transnational and post-territorial polity rejects the assumption that it must be what Rawls calls “a single cooperative scheme in perpetuity,” a more fluid and negotiable order might emerge with plural authority structures along a number of different dimensions rather than a single location for public authority and power. Without a single location of public power, a unified public sphere becomes an impediment to democracy rather than an enabling condition for mass participation in decisions at a single location of authority. The problem for an experimental institutional design of directly deliberative democracy is to create precisely the appropriate feedback relation between disaggregated publics and such a polycentric decision making process. The lesson for a critical theory of globalization is to see the extension of political space and the redistribution of political power not only as a constraint similar to complexity but also as an open field of opportunities for innovative, distributive, and multiperspectival forms of publicity and democracy.
A critical theory of globalization is a practical or praxeologically oriented theory that sees the “fact of globalization” in relation to the goal of realizing the norms of human emancipation and democracy. The central and still open questions for such a practically oriented social science are the following: what available forms of praxis are able to promote the transformations that could lead to new forms of democracy? What sort of practical knowledge is needed to make this possible and how might this knowledge be stabilised in institutionalised forms of democratic inquiry? What are the possibilities and opportunities for democracy at a higher level of aggregation that globalization makes possible? How might the public sphere be realized at the global level? The argument here suggests that such inquiry and institutions must go beyond single perspective understandings of democracy that dominate national political life as well as the various administrative techne that are common in the international sphere. A critical praxeology of realizing norms in multiperspectival institutions might add that it is also a reflexive question of putting such organization in the larger context of a project of human emancipation. Such an interactive account of publics and institutions gives a plausible practical meaning to the extending of the project of democracy to the global level. It also models in its own form of social science the mode of inquiry that this and other publics may employ in creating and assessing the possibilities for realizing democracy. A critical theory of globalization does not only point out the deficits of current practices, but shows the potential for properly organized publics to create new ones. Since the new practices need not be modeled on the old ones, it is not a theory of democracy as such, but of democratization.
In facing the challenges of new social facts, Critical Theory remains a vital philosophical tradition in normative disciplines of social and political philosophy. Furthermore, this vitality is enhanced when it considers a range of democratic claims not discussed here, all of which equally challenge the fundamental frameworks of conceptions of democracy, justice, and their interrelationship: these include the struggles of aboriginal peoples, the disabled, women, and more. One great advantage of the practical account is that it makes it easier to see why there are many different critical theories in different historical contexts, what Marx called the “wishes and struggles of the age.” On a practical account, critical inquiry aims at creating the reflective conditions necessary for the practical verification of its inquiry, and these conditions are not confined only to democratic institutions, but wherever publics employ critical social theories and methods as the moment of inquiry of their democratic politics. As new forms of critical theory emerge related to racism, sexism, and colonialism, reflective social agents have transformed these same democratic ideals and practices in the interest of emancipation. In entrenching new social facts, agents transform the ideals themselves as well as their institutional form.
This critical and practical orientation gives rise to three different questions about critical social inquiry. First, does Critical Theory suggest a distinctive form of social inquiry? Second, what sort of knowledge does such inquiry provide in order to provide insight into social circumstances and justify social criticism of current ideals and institutions? Finally, what sort of verification does critical inquiry require? In light of the answers to these questions on the practical, democratic, and multiperspectival interpretation defended here, it is likely that Critical Theory is no longer a unique approach. Methodologically, it becomes more thoroughly pluralistic. Politically, it loses its capital letters as the aims and struggles of the age of globalization become more diverse and not automatically connected by the commitment to any particular holistic social theory. Given its own democratic aims, it would be hard to justify any other interpretation. In a period in which philosophy cooperates with empirical sciences and disciplines, Critical Theory offers an approach to distinctly normative issues that cooperates with the social sciences in a nonreductive way. Its domain is inquiry into the normative dimension of social activity, in particular how actors employ their practical knowledge and normative attitudes from complex perspectives in various sorts of contexts. It also must consider social facts as problematic situations from the point of view of variously situated agents.
This kind of normative practical knowledge is thus reflexive and finds its foothold in those ongoing, self-transforming normative enterprises such as democracy that are similarly reflexive in practice. By discussing democracy in this way, I have also tried to show just how deep the connections are between it and critical social science: critical theories are not democratic theories, but their practical consequences are assessed and verified in democratic practice and solved by inquiry into better democratic practice. Perhaps one of the more pernicious forms of ideology now is embodied in the appeal of the claim that there are no alternatives to present institutions. In this age of diminishing expectations, one important role that remains for the social scientifically informed, and normatively oriented democratic critic is to offer novel alternatives and creative possibilities in place of the defeatist claim that we are at the end of history. That would not only mean the end of inquiry, but also the end of democracy.
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