Notes to Developmental Biology

1. Plant development is excluded here due to space constraints, but this also reflects a longstanding bias in how the phenomena of developmental biology are presented to students and novices.

2. Some multicellular animals do not have all three germ layers of tissue. For example, cnidarians, such as jellyfish and coral, lack mesoderm.

3. An empirical analysis of word usage for “theory” across scientific discourse shows tremendous heterogeneity. In a study of 781 articles published in Science over a year (Overton 2013), “theory” does not appear in the keywords of the 27 articles pertaining to developmental biology, whereas it appears in more than 40% of the 34 articles pertaining to evolution.

4. Minelli has argued that we need a “comprehensive theoretical account of development” with a principle of “developmental inertia,” analogous to the principle of inertia in Newtonian mechanics (Minelli 2011a, b). The motivation is to put developmental biology on the same theoretical footing as evolutionary biology.

5. “Regeneration necessarily involves regional specification of pattern and as the relevant interactions are local ones this means that cryptic information about pattern must be present throughout the mature structure. This is sometimes called positional information. The term was once widely used to indicate developmental pattern information but has fallen out of use as understanding of its molecular basis has increased” (Slack 2013: 385, emphasis added).

6. Some of these variables also help to structure problems in other sciences (e.g., abstraction and connectivity), but this specific combination of variables structures developmental biology, especially the juxtaposition of temporality and spatial composition.

7. It should be emphasized that the vast majority of researchers working in developmental biology prefer genetic explanations and their associated methodologies. This holds to such a degree that some developmental biologists are not aware of physical explanations or their associated methodologies.

8. Developmental Systems Theory (DST) is one place where efforts to deflate these claims is prominent (for a review of relevant considerations, see Griffiths and Stotz 2013). Importantly, genetic explanations, as discussed here, are compatible with the causal factors that are active during embryogenesis being diverse and exhibiting a distributed causal specificity. This entry does not attempt to adjudicate the debate between Waters (2007a) and DST proponents regarding whether or not DNA sequences are privileged as actual difference makers in biological processes.

9. “The molecular metamorphosis of our understanding of embryology has relied on the identification of genes that control development” (Fraser and Harland 2000: 47).

10. “The genome contains a program of instructions for making an organism—a generative program—that determines where and when different proteins are synthesized and thus controls how cell behave” (Wolpert et al. 2010: 29).

11. Importantly, qualifications are often found in the same context where the strong claims about differential genetic activity were advanced. For example:

As all the key steps in development reflect changes in gene activity, one might be tempted to think of development simply in terms of mechanisms for controlling gene expression. But this would be highly misleading. … To think only in terms of genes is to ignore crucial aspects of cell biology. (Wolpert et al. 1998: 15)

12. “It would … be an exaggeration to see in every bone nothing more than a resultant of immediate and direct physical or mechanical conditions; for to do so would be to deny the existence, in this connection, of a principle of heredity” (Thompson 1992 [1942]: 1022–3).

13. “Understanding morphogenesis, the origin of shape in anatomical structures, organs and organisms, has always been a central goal of developmental biology. … with the modern revolution in molecular biology, the field focused on a framework built around gene regulation, signalling molecules and transcription factors. …More recently, however, there has been a renewed appreciation of the fact that to understand morphogenesis in three dimensions, it is necessary to combine molecular insights (genes and morphogens) with knowledge of physical processes (transport, deformation and flow) generated by growing tissues” (Savin et al. 2011: 57).

14. Additionally, explanatory integration that combines genetic and physical difference makers is being actively explored for evolutionary phenomena, such as the origin of evolutionary novelties in the Cambrian Explosion (Love and Lugar 2013).

15. “The motivation for their study is not simply to understand how that particular animal develops, but to use it as an example of how all animals develop” (Slack 2006: 61).

16. A different reply to the representational criticism, whether it concerns the phenomena or the mechanisms of development, is in terms of pragmatic factors: availability and cost; ease of obtaining all stages of development and micromanipulation; and, genetics and genomic maps (Slack 2006: ch. 6) The manipulative techniques available for experimental analysis, most of which are molecular, mitigate—if not counterbalance—the concern of non-representativeness (Davis 2004; Rubin 1988). The experimental toolkit of molecular biology (e.g., gene cloning, in situ hybridization, RNA interference, and others) that focuses on molecular difference makers (Section 3.1) is most applicable in model organisms and the causal knowledge acquired through manipulation can in some sense compensate for non-representation (see supplement: “Model Organisms and Manipulation”).

17. “Model organisms serve as models for whole, intact organisms … for a range of systems and processes which occur in living organisms, including genetics, development, physiology, evolution, and ecology” (Ankeny and Leonelli 2011: 318).

18. Some further examples:

Structural and functional homology between duck and chicken interferon-gamma (Huang et al. 2001);

Phasic cholinergic signaling in the hippocampus: functional homology with the neocortex? (Gulledge and Kawaguchi 2007);

Functional homology between yeast piD261/Bud32 and human PRPK: both phosphorylate p53 and PRPK partially complements piD261/Bud32 deficiency (Facchin et al. 2003).

19. We can strengthen this adoption of activity-function by observing a neglected pre-Darwinian distinction about biological functions: use versus activity (Furley and Wilkie 1984: 58–69). The functional use of a physiological feature represents what it is for whereas the functional activity of a physiological feature picks out what it does. Multiple activities might underlie a particular use and one activity may be in the service of multiple uses; the terms do not have equivalent extensions. They also are not equivalent epistemologically because we may know what something does but not what it is for and, alternatively, what something is for but not how it accomplishes this. Causal role, viability, and selected effect are all use-functions.

20. “The biochemical function of these genes is highly conserved through evolutionary time, while their developmental function is relatively free to vary. This inherent property of developmental regulatory genes allows them to be independently co-opted to function in structures which clearly have independent evolutionary origins” (Abouheif 1997: 407).

21. For example, the standard periodization for post-embryonic ontogeny in arthropods is a barrier to evolutionary analyses of molt-timing evolution because the conventional periodization is in terms of molt-to-molt intervals subsequent to hatching, which are then grouped into stages (larva, pupa, and imago for insects), irrespective of differences in the timing of the molts (Minelli et al. 2006).

22. A good example is studies of dung beetle horn morphology, where some of the most persuasive evidence for the evolutionary significance of phenotypic plasticity has emerged (Emlen 2000; Moczek and Nagy 2005; Moczek 2008). A concentration on intra- and interspecific variation in specific morphological features (horns) of dung beetle congenerics means that normal stages for one particular species were not constructed using the eruption time or other characteristics of horn ontogeny. As a consequence, variability in these features was not minimized and remains salient in the context of experimental observations of development.

23. For example, in order to explore wing developmental evolution more precisely, Reed and colleagues (2007) constructed a staging for final-instar wing disk ontogeny in the common buckeye butterfly because the timing of larval events is relatively dissociated from wing disk development, and thus temporal measures of larval ontogeny do not correlate tightly with the developmental state of the wing disks. This directly facilitated studying the phenomenon of phenotypic plasticity:

Some cryptic variation, however, might manifest developmentally or physiologically, but simply not have an effect on phenotypes that is obvious or accessible to investigators. (Reed et al. 2007: 2)

Copyright © 2015 by
Alan Love <>

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