Black Reparations

First published Tue Dec 14, 2010; substantive revision Thu Jan 13, 2022

States have long demanded reparations from other states at the end of wars. More recently non-state actors such as the Aborigines of Australia, the Maori of New Zealand, and many American Indian nations of North America are demanding the return of their tribal lands from Europeans as reparations; Eastern Europeans dispossessed by socialist governments are demanding the return of their property as reparations; and U.S. blacks (black people whose genealogy traces back to slavery within the U.S.[1]) are demanding reparations from the United States of America for the harmful wrongdoings to them caused by U.S. slavery and its aftermath. The last of these demands is our subject.

1. History of U.S. Reparations to Blacks

Oddly, Thomas Jefferson was probably the first to imply that the U.S. ought to make reparation to its slaves. He did not explicitly say that it did or ought to, and his proposal to send them off to “such place as circumstances of the time should render most proper” and to “declare them a free and independent people” was mainly motivated by a desire to rid the U.S. of them, but it also suggests that they were a people and that the U.S. was under some obligation to set them up as a people (Jefferson 1785a [1954: 138]). Some years after Jefferson’s proposal, American slaveholders founded (1816) the American Colonization Society whose ostensible object, made plausible by the presence of some white Quakers among its founders, was to help African Americans to go to Liberia and get a fresh start in a country free of racial discrimination. But the real object of the Society, or at least that of the white slaveholders who founded it, was to rid the country of free blacks who they feared endangered their peculiar institution. Their stratagem was therefore dealt a deadly blow when Martin Delany, who agreed with Jefferson that U.S. blacks were a people and needed a territory on which to become a state, declared that Liberia was “not an independent nation at all; but a poor miserable mockery—a burlesque on a government—a pitiful dependency on the American Colonizationists” and its “principal man, called President, in Liberia” was a “mere parrot” of these individuals (Delany 1852 [2004]: 185, emphasis in original).

Demands for compensation related to slavery frequently arose during the U.S. Civil War, but not do so in the way present day U.S. citizens would expect. The demands were not to compensate the black slaves for the injuries of slavery, but to compensate the white slaveholders for the anticipated loss of their slaves. These demands were voiced in the South when they faced the prospect of having to free their slaves, but they were also voiced in the North, and from the highest sources. President Abraham Lincoln, for example, repeatedly urged compensated emancipation, which meant paying the slaveholders for the loss of their slaves who would then be deported from the U.S.. Indeed, at one time he appeared to be ready to propose paying the South $400,000,000, for the loss of their slaves. As W.E.B. Du Bois observed dryly: “Lincoln was impressed by the loss of capital invested in slaves, but curiously never seemed seriously to consider the correlative loss of wage and opportunity of slave workers, the tangible results of whose exploitation had gone into the planters’ pockets for two centuries.” (Du Bois 1992 [1935]: 150). And Lincoln did not even sugar coat his deportation proposal with the suggestion that the freedmen were a nation and therefore needed a separate territory on which to govern themselves.

Thaddeus Stevens, congressman from Pennsylvania, argued that it was not enough to free the slaves and give them the right of suffrage; but that in addition they should be given land confiscated from the rebels. Charles Summer, senator from Massachusetts eventually came to agree with him, but surprisingly the radical ex-slave Frederick Douglass did not. Peter C. Myers (2008) speculated that Douglass’s “moderation” at this point was a reflection of “what was politically possible,” and of his concern that benevolent missions organized by whites might encourage dependence in the freedmen and prevent them from developing and exercising the virtues of a free people. Douglass’ proposed instead a federal corporation that would purchase tracts of land and then resell or lease them on favorable terms to the freedmen, urging that this arrangement was “more fully consistent with the principle of self-reliance” and give “greater societal recognition of the freed people’s virtue in providing for themselves.” Myers suggested that Douglass was following Jefferson in emphasizing the corrupting effects of dependence. But while Jefferson had indeed identified dependence as a crucial corrupter, it “begets subservience and venality, suffocates virtue, and prepares fit tools for the designs of ambition” (Jefferson 1785a [1954: 165]) he declared, he was equally clear that legislators must protect the independence of the small yeoman farmer “the most precious part of the state” from the usurpation of the powerful (Jefferson 1785b [2006: 154]). In other words, Stevens had proposed his scheme for the freed people for exactly the reasons Jefferson proposed legislation for protecting the white yeomen. Years later Douglass evidently saw the error of his moderation. Myers cites his comment in 1882 that had the counsels of Thaddeus Stevens, Charles Sumner, and ‘leading stalwart Republicans’ prevailed, “the terrible evils from which we now suffer would have been averted”, and “the Negro to-day”, would be “tilling his soil in comparative independence” (Myers 2008: 239, quoting Douglass 1882, Appendix A, 440–441). The theme continues to the present day.

Perhaps the most noteworthy demand for U.S. black reparations after the Civil War occurred in 1969 when James Foreman, a member of the Student Nonviolent Coordinating Committee (SNCC), read his “Black Manifesto” at the National Black Economic Development Conference, in Detroit, and later on in Riverside Church in New York City. The “Manifesto” demanded $500,000,000, in reparations from Christian white churches and Jewish synagogues, or as the “Manifesto” put it, “15 dollars per nigger.” This demand for reparations, the Manifesto argued, was justified because for over three and a half centuries, whites with the assistance and collaboration of their churches and synagogues had unjustly, through slavery and discrimination, wrested enormous economic advantages from blacks. Although this argument relied on widely accepted moral intuitions, the Manifesto received little popular support. It did, however, provoke discussion in newspapers and news magazines, as well as some scholarly discussion. Boris Bittker included it as an appendix in his book The Case for Black Reparations (1973); Hugo Bedau provided and extended analysis in his “Compensatory Justice and the Black Manifesto” (1972); Michael Harrington and Arnold Kaufman debated its merits in “Black Reparations—Two Views” (1969); and a number of philosophers wrote essays inspired by its argument, most notably, Bernard R. Boxill (1972).

Although interest in the topic remained high among U.S. black philosophers, the wider community of political philosophers preoccupied with Rawlsian ideal theory generally ignored it. But broad and vigorous interest has been rekindled. Perhaps the causes lie outside of academia; in 1988, the U.S. Congress passed the Civil Liberties Act which authorized payment of reparations to Japanese American citizens who had been imprisoned during World War II; U.S. Congressman John Conyers had in each session of Congress since 1989 introduced a bill to create a commission to study reparations for slavery and segregation; in 2000 Randall Robinson published his book The Debt: What America Owes to Blacks; in 2003 David Horowitz published his Uncivil Wars; and in 2014 Ta-Nehisi Coates’s widely discussed essay “The Case for Reparations”, appeared in The Atlantic. In September 2020, California Assembly Bill 3121 established the Task Force to Study and Develop Reparation Proposals for African-Americans, in connection with the enslavement of blacks in the U.S.

2. John Locke on Reparations

John Locke provided an early and very clear argument for the reparations owed a lawful conqueror, and many arguments for black reparations follow the outlines of his argument.[2] For Locke people have natural rights they get directly from Natural Law and rights they have acquired in accordance with Natural law. To restrain violations of rights, he proposed punishment; punishment must be administered “with so much Severity as will suffice to make it an ill bargain to the Offender, give him cause to repent, and terrifie others from doing the like.” (Locke 1689: sec 8) And to repair the damage that crime “commonly” causes “some person or other,” Locke proposed reparations. As he put it, reparation must give the “satisfaction due to any private Man, for the damage he has received” (Locke 1689: sec 11). According to Locke, reparations were rights stemming from the right of self-preservation. But he insisted that the rights can be pressed only against the “goods or service of the Offender” (Locke 1689: sec 11). More precisely, while the person damaged can seek help from anyone, she, the victim, has a right to reparations only against the one who wrongly caused her damage. But Locke does not say that she must be the immediate victim of the “Offender”. His claim that crime commonly damages “some person or other” suggests that she may be anyone damaged as a result of the offender’s violation of right. For example, she may be damaged because someone murdered her father and thus caused her to live in straitened conditions. On Locke’s account, she may be entitled to press her right to reparations against the murderer for the damage he caused her to suffer. On the other hand, Locke’s claim that crime “commonly” damages someone suggests that crime or violations of rights do not always cause damage and consequently do not always generate rights to reparations, though it does not suggest that such violations of right do not deserve to be punished. But even when the violation of right does not cause material losses, it may cause damages to its victim’s self-respect and moral standing, and in such cases the satisfaction due to her may include an admission of wrong doing from the wrongdoer, a plea for her forgiveness, and an apology. If such admission, plea, and apology require that the wrongdoer repent, reparations may seem to require that the wrongdoer be punished, given Locke’s view that repentance is among the objects of punishment (Locke 1689: sec 8). But Locke seems clear that the rights to reparations and the right to punish are different rights. On his view, we give up the right to punish to the state, but retain the rights to reparations. He writes that the “Magistrate, … can often, where the publick good demands not the execution of the Law, remit the punishment of Criminal Offences …, but cannot yet remit the satisfaction due to any private Man, for the damage he has received” (Locke 1689: sec 11). Arguably, then, the apology the wrongdoer must give to his victim in order to give her the satisfaction she has a right to does not require that he repent and perhaps therefore does not require that his apology be sincere. It is also worth noting that although unjust enrichment from crime should not be tolerated, it has little if anything to do with reparations. Reparations focus on getting satisfaction for the injured victim of crime and the criminal need not unjustly enrich himself as a result of the crime to have wrongfully injured her. He owes her reparations even if he impoverished himself in the process of injuring her. Finally given Locke’s separation of the right to punish from the rights of reparations, and his claim that the rights to reparations is about making satisfaction to the victim of wrongdoing, Locke would seem committed to holding that when an act of wrong doing is excused though it causes harm that the victim has a right to reparations although the magistrate may well decide that the public good does not require that the state exercise its right to punish the wrongdoer.

3. Reparations, Restitution, and Compensation

In its primary sense, restitution is “restoration of something lost or stolen to its proper owner” (The New Oxford American Dictionary 2001). Clearly, then, reparations and restitution both presuppose the separation of something from its proper owner. But, equally clearly, reparations do not constitute restitution. Reparations can only occur after some losses or damage due to a prior wrongdoing. But though restitution can only occur after some loss or damage, that loss or damage need not be due to a prior wrongdoing. If A loses his wallet and B finds it and returns it to A, restitution has been made although no wrongdoing was committed. Further, while reparations is a right (or a cluster of rights), restitution is not always a right. If B finds but leaves A’s wallet where it is, restitution has not been made, but it is not clear that a right was violated. It is doubtful that a person who loses things has a right that others find it for him. If B finds but keeps A’s wallet, then again restitution has not been made, and A has a right that B return it. But in that case A has a right that B return it because A has a right to reparations and restitution can sometimes be part of reparations. Some authors seem to think that B ought to return the wallet because otherwise B will have unjustly enriched himself at A’s expense. But it is not clear why B’s unjust enrichment is a necessary condition for B’s obligation to return the wallet to A. Even if the wallet is worthless and B is not unjustly enriched by keeping it, B has no business holding on to it since it is not his property.

Restitution is neither necessary nor sufficient for reparations even when the thing to be restored to its proper owner was stolen. If A steals a bicycle from B, B has a right to reparations and consequently to restitution if A has the bicycle; reparations must give satisfaction, and A’s satisfaction may depend on her getting back the very thing that was stolen from her. But she may have lost more than the bicycle as a direct result of its theft and her right to reparations requires satisfaction for that further loss. Consequently, restitution is not always sufficient for reparations. On the other hand, the bicycle may have been destroyed or loss after its theft, making restitution but not reparations impossible. Consequently, restitution is not necessary for reparations.

Compensation is related to reparations and restitution but is not the same thing as either. It is not reparation because it simply makes up for damage, harm or loss or lack whether or not it was caused by wrongdoing. Robert Nozick’s famous definition of compensation makes this sufficiently clear: “Something fully compensates a person for a loss if and only if it makes him no worse off than he would otherwise have been; it compensates person X for person’s Y’s action A if X is no worse off receiving it, if Y had not done A.” (Nozick 1974: 57)

Note that Nozick (correctly) does not say that the loss or the action A must be wrongful. Thus a person may be compensated for a loss though he does not have a right to reparations. If a person deserves a loss he has no right to reparations for it, but he may be compensated for it, probably unjustifiably. Even if he has a right to compensation, he may still have no right to reparations. For example, he may have a right to be compensated for a loss if he is insured against it, but his right is a right to compensation not a right to reparations if no wrongdoing caused his loss.

But if a person has a right to reparations, he will also often have a right to compensation. This is because his right to reparations is a right to satisfaction for the damages he suffered and such satisfaction often requires that he be made no worse off than he would have been had he not suffered the loss. This does not make a right to compensation the same thing as a right to reparations since a right to reparations can only be generated by damages caused by wrongdoing.

Since a right to reparations is always generated by a wrongful harm, such rights are part of corrective justice or to use Rawls’s term, “partial compliance theory” (Rawls 1971: 8, 9). But Rawls must allow that there can be rights to compensation in full compliance theory. This follows since people can suffer damages that result from no one’s wrongdoing, and may have insured themselves against such damages. Consider too Rawls’s “principle of redress”. This is a principle of compensation for full compliance theory. It may be objected that it cannot be such a principle, but must be instead a principle of non-ideal justice, since according to Rawls himself it requires that “undeserved inequalities”, such as the “inequalities of birth and natural endowment” be “somehow compensated for” (Rawls 1999: 100). But Rawls’s use of “undeserved” at this point is not meant to imply that he is referring to inequalities that are the result of injustice. It only means that those with the inequalities in question did nothing to deserve them.

4. Kinds of Reparations

Kinds of reparations are at least two in number: compensatory, as discussed above, and non-compensatory. In either case, reparations are to be understood as matters of rights to those wrongfully harmed by a group or a state. However, while compensatory reparations amount to rights to monetary compensation paid by a responsible party to those they have harmed, as discussed in section 4 above, non-compensatory reparations constitute rights to enactments of social justice in non-monetary forms such as the removal of symbols of injustice from official governmental spaces, the accurate teaching of history of a society in non-exclusionary terms, etc. (Corlett 2010: 1-17). In either case, reparations can serve as a condition of an apology with an eye toward social forgiveness and reconciliation (Corlett 2010: 187–212).

5. Ethical Approaches to Reparations

Generally, there are two ethical approaches that might be used to ground or justify reparations: utilitarian versus rights-based. Utilitarian approaches to reparations seek to justify and articulate reparations in terms of equity for oppressed citizens relative to other citizens of a society, no matter to which, say, “racial” or ethnic groups they belong. Further, their commitment to a suitably described principle of utility will attempt to promote rights to reparations up to a point wherein social utility maximization and equality amongst the citizenry are threatened based on the perceived consequences of the application of a particular reparative policy. But this level of commitment to the rights to reparations is criticized for its inadequate commitment to honoring said rights qua rights, thereby subsuming the rights to reparations under the utilitarian commitments to social utility considerations and equality (Corlett 2010: 33–79), something the rights-based approach would reject concerning rights in general (Feinberg 1980; Rawls 1999). For the rights-based approach to reparative justice, a right to reparations fashioned by social utility maximal considerations is no right at all. The rights to reparations, like other rights, must be honored, not merely promoted in accordance with the ethics of a utilitarian calculation. For if X is a right at all, X as a right trumps social utility considerations.

For the rights-based approach to reparations, such rights include at least the following rights-cluster: The set of rights to corrective justice honored in proportion to the wrongful harm experienced by either the proximate cause of the harm caused to the group or to the group responsible for honoring the reparations in question. It is important to note that a group can be responsible for compensating a harm without that group being guilty of causing the harm (Feinberg 1970). Hence in the case under consideration, the U.S. government is said to owe reparations to U.S. blacks for the enslavement of said blacks on what is currently considered to be U.S. soil.

6. Reparations for Slavery

This entry focuses on making a case for reparations for contemporary U.S. blacks for the enslavement of their U.S.-enslaved ancestors, partly because slavery was one of the most horrific experiences that said blacks have endured in the U.S., and the one for which the immediate victims of the experience most clearly deserve reparations; and partly because making the case in question nevertheless presents peculiar, difficult, and particularly interesting philosophical problems. As we will see, much of that case will depend on the argument that the injustices U.S. blacks endured after emancipation have caused some of the injuries of the slaves to persist into the present. But there is no reason to suppose that these injustices did not themselves cause damages to their victims, quite apart from causing the damages of slavery to persist, and that these damages may also deserve reparations. In fact, there is good reason to suppose that arguments to that effect may be more important politically than slave-based arguments for black reparations.

Stevens’s argument for slave reparations was simply that the slave holders had committed serious harmful transgressions against the slaves, who consequently had rights for reparation against their masters that could plausibly be satisfied by some of their masters’ land. Today, few would challenge that argument, at least publicly. The argument that many challenge today is that present day U.S. blacks have rights to reparations from contemporary U.S. citizens or the U.S. government because generations ago the U.S. government permitted many U.S. citizens to enslave several blacks. That argument seems to get no support from the undeniable fact that enslaved black ancestors had rights to reparations from their respective masters. People do not have rights to reparations for the wrongful harms others suffer. Two arguments, the harm argument and the inheritance argument, each attempt to circumvent this difficulty.

The harm argument relies on the idea that the transgressions of slavery initiated an unbroken chain of harms linked as cause and effect that began with the slaves and continues among U.S. blacks to the present day. Therefore, since the transgressions of slavery harm present day U.S. blacks they have rights to reparations against those who committed those transgressions. It differs crucially from the inheritance argument because it assumes that slavery’s transgressions against the slaves have harmed present day U.S. blacks but the inheritance argument does not. The inheritance argument relies on the idea that present-day U.S. blacks have inherited the rights to reparation that was owed their enslaved ancestors and was never paid.

7. The Harm Argument

Three main objections have been urged against the harm argument against U.S. reparations to blacks. First, that although the transgressions of slavery harmed the slaves, and present-day U.S. blacks do suffer from many disadvantages, these disadvantages may not be the result of the transgressions of slavery; they could easily be the result of vast economic and political changes that have occurred since slavery ended. The present harms may not be the “automatic effects of slavery” (Sher 1981: 7). Second, that even if present day U.S. blacks have been harmed by the slaveholders’ transgressions against their ancestors, and have rights to reparations against these slaveholders, such rights can only be pressed against the slaveholders who are now all dead. Third that if present-day U.S. blacks demand reparations for the harms that the transgressions of slavery caused them, then since reparation implies compensation, they demand to be made no worse off than they would have been had the transgressions of slavery never occurred. But if these transgressions had never occurred present-day U.S. blacks would not exist. Consequently, the harm argument is incoherent (Morris 1984, Levin 1980).

Fullinwider reformulated the harm argument so that it avoids the first two objections. The reformulated argument goes as follows: the U.S. government after 1865 failed “to vindicate the rights to full and equal citizenship the Civil War Amendments extended to U.S. blacks;” but, had that government “vigorously” protected those rights, “the legacy of slavery would have faded considerably if not wholly by now through the industry of blacks themselves”. Consequently if present day blacks do suffer from various aspects of the legacy of slavery, the real cause of those harms is not slavery, but the U.S. governments after 1865, for if those governments had vigorously protected the rights of the freed people and their descendants, the legacy of slavery would have faded and present day U.S. blacks would not be disadvantaged by it (Fullinwider 2004).

Boris Bittker made a similar suggestion. His main argument is that had the goals of Reconstruction not been foiled by the “political settlement of 1877” and the network of Jim Crow laws not been introduced and finally fully authorized by Plessy v. Ferguson in 1896 the “only identifiable residue of slavery today would have been cultural”, and the descendants of U.S. slaves and the descendants of U.S. slaveholders would lead the same lives (Bittker 2003: 12, 13). In other words, Bittker seems to go a little further than the first one, suggesting that the legacy of U.S. slavery would have disappeared completely if the U.S. government had protected the rights of the freed people and their descendants, the second line of reasoning too concludes that any responsibility for the legacy of slavery that persists today must be attributed to post Civil War governments.

These arguments of Fullinwider and Bittker are clear improvements on the original harm argument. But they seem to assume that post-Civil War governments committed only one transgression against their black populations, namely those governments failed to protect the civil rights of the members of those populations. In fact, however, these governments committed another and quite distinct transgression against their black populations; they failed to make reparations to those populations. These two transgressions are not the same thing. The duty of government to protect its citizens’ civil and political rights is one thing; its duty to pay and/or make reparations to them if it has wrongly injured them is quite another.

Fullinwider seems aware that protecting civil and political rights is not the same as making reparations, that the U.S. government did not fulfill all of its obligations to the Japanese it interred during World War II just because it released them after the war and protected their civil and political rights after that. But some write as if they believe that the post-Civil War governments would have fulfilled all of their obligations to their black citizens if only they had protected those citizens’ civil and political rights (Fullinwider 2004: 148). Others write that compensation in 1865 to the slaves for their forced or unpaid might have been “strong” (Bittker 2003: 12), and that “compensation in 1865 for blacks’ forced labor would certainly have been appropriate” (Bittker 2003: 28). But having conceded that monetary compensation would have been in order in 1865, Bittker then drops the point without comment. Interestingly, too, he seems to think that unpaid labor is the only harm the transgressions of slavery caused the slaves or that merits any mention. This is a strange position to hold for a book titled The Case for Black Reparations, for of course unpaid labor was perhaps the least of the harms that the transgressions of slavery visited on the slaves. What about reparation for the theft of their liberty?

But the claim that “Had the federal government done nothing after 1865 except vigorously protect the civil and voting rights of blacks, the legacy of slavery would have faded considerably if not wholly by now through the industry of blacks themselves” (Fullinwider 2004: 148) suggests that only the governments’ failure to protect the civil and political rights of the freed people and their descendants caused any problem. An obvious difficulty with this view is that large economic inequalities make it difficult for the government to protect the rights of the poor. That problem aside, these authors give no argument to support their view that the freed peoples’ descendants would have recovered from the wrongful harms of slavery without the help of reparations if only government had protected their civil and political rights. Fullinwider’s confidence seems to rest on the “immigrant model”, by which is meant the path to success taken by the European immigrants who came to America after the Civil War, and with “little to offer but their physical labor”, and “by dint of hard work” eventually “blended into the larger American fabric”. The implication is that the freed people were sufficiently like these immigrants to justify the inference that had government vigorously protected their civil and voting rights then they too by would have blended into the larger American fabric (Fullinwider 2004: 148).

But the freed people and their descendants were not very much like the white immigrants arriving from Europe. To say the obvious, slavery is very bad for people. It prevents them from developing the useful dispositions and skills that people tend to develop in freedom. Although the immigrants had had a rough time in Europe—that is why they flocked to America—they were better prepared to take advantage of the opportunities available than the slaves. Consequently, they would likely have kept well ahead of the freed people and their descendants even if the civil and political rights of each group were equally protected. The issue is debatable of course. Some black writers, Douglass, for example, seem to think that human beings are resilient, equipped as they are with an almost ineradicable love of liberty, and consequently the slaves would recover readily from the rigors of slavery if only they were given justice. He liked to say that all he asked for the Negro was “simply justice”, though the contexts always left it unclear how much he included in justice, whether it would involve reparation, and whether he was simply denying that he was not asking for “benevolence” or “pity” for the Negro (Douglass 1865: 283). Alexander Crummell, on the other hand, seemed to worry about the enduring effects of slavery especially because of the tendency of its victims to remember its horrors, though interestingly Douglass thought that these memories could be bracing (Crummell 1891: 18, 19). The issue of the effects of the memory of enslavement and domination on recovery from the effects of these evils deserves further study. Whatever the results of that study, however, it does not follow straightaway that the wrongly injured are not owed reparations just because they are resilient enough to recover from the effects of their injuries without it.

Even if socio-economic advancement depends on informal contacts that involve the sharing and transfer of genuinely useful information and skills among people who enjoy what used to be called “social equality”. But social equality cannot be secured by even the most rigorous protection of the civil and political rights of the freed people; on the contrary such protection can help social inequality to persist since it entitles individuals to choose their friends and associates even if their choice is determined by color prejudice. Since color prejudice remained strong after the Civil War the white immigrants would more readily associate with well-placed and well-educated locals and learn useful information and skills from them. Finally, since social equals tend to marry each other rather than their inferiors, and since immigrant whites were more likely than the freed people and their descendants to become the social equals of prosperous native whites, they were also more likely to marry such individuals and thus to gain access to their wealth, much of it incidentally inherited from the spoils of slavery.

Bittker seems aware that the official enforcement of civil and political rights might not nullify the effects of personal prejudice and asks whether “personal” prejudice without official segregation would have produced segregation, “first in the home, then in Mrs Murphy’s boardinghouse, and then in business and politics”. This issue is of decisive importance for the implied contention that even without reparations blacks would have made themselves equal to whites if there had been no Jim Crow legislation. He rejects William Graham Sumner’s maxim “law-ways cannot alter folkways” which implies that segregation and prejudice could have persisted without the help of Jim Crow laws. However, there seems to be no argument to show that Sumner’s maxim is mistaken. Bittker takes it as a “working hypothesis” that “statutes, ordinances, and other official actions have been the predominant source of the racial discrimination that has blighted our public and private life,” given that we have no science “capable of producing a model of the United States as it would have been if blacks had come here as voluntary immigrants rather than as slaves, or if emancipation had been followed by an integrated society” (Bittker 2003: 26).

The many and various considerations just canvassed conclude that it is too optimistic to suppose that the descendants of the freed people, without reparations, would have achieved parity with the descendants of the white immigrants if only their civil and political rights had been protected. In any case, the issue they raise is a distraction from the central question whether U.S. blacks are owed reparations. Achieving parity with the descendants of immigrants is not the same thing as receiving the reparations one is owed. The point of reparations is not to make people equal to others; reparations is not defined as making the wrongly harmed equal to others. In fact, equality has little to do with reparations. People deserve reparations as a matter of right when they have been wrongfully harmed by transgression but a person may be harmed as a result of transgression and may therefore have a right to reparations and yet be better off than others. Similarly, a person may be worse off than others without having suffered from any harm or disadvantage for which he deserves reparations. If reparations necessarily requires compensation it requires that people be put as far as possible in the condition they would have been in had they not been wrongly injured. This may make them equal to others, but it may not. It can leave them worse off than others and it can also make them better off than others. Some philosophers may protest that we should not allow claims for reparations to get in the way of an ideal egalitarian society, but of course their position is as bad as the utilitarian arguments they disparage that rights may and should be violated in order to maximize utility (Corlett 2010).

But it is now time to consider the third main objection to the harm argument. This objection, let us recall, is that making reparations to the present U.S. black population for the harms that slavery caused it is impossible because if slavery had never occurred the present U.S. black population would not exist. This problem is now known as the non-identity problem. This difficulty might seem to reappear in the revised harm argument just described. For although this argument does not call for compensating the present U.S. black population for the harms that slavery caused it, it may seem to call for compensating the present U.S. black population for the harms it suffers because of policies enacted and enforced before it was conceived. Given that these policies would have affected who was conceived in succeeding U.S. black populations, had they not occurred the present U.S. black population would not exist.

The following discussion shows how this difficulty can be avoided. Imagine two slaves, Tom and Beulah released from slavery. They were released from slavery but the government continued to wrong them in at least two ways: first, by preventing them from exercising rights guaranteed to every citizen; second, by violating their rights to be compensated for the harms that it had caused them by supporting their enslavement. And both these wrongs probably harmed them. Obviously preventing them from voting or going to school probably harmed them; and the harm that often results when one’s right to be compensated is violated is an additional harm, on top of the harm caused by the first violation of right. If you owe me a hundred dollars to compensate me for wrongly breaking my arm, you wrong me again by refusing to give me what you owe me, and you might owe me another thousand dollars for the harms that second wrong might cause me, for example going around for a month with the pain and inconvenience of an unfixed broken arm. Now the government wronged Tom and Beulah in the two ways mentioned as soon as it caused them to be released from slavery and before Beulah conceived any child; but it also continued to wrong them in these ways after the conception of their daughter, Eulah. These wrongs to Tom and Beulah almost certainly harmed them by forcing them to remain longer in the poverty and ignorance that slavery had put them in. But it is more germane to the present argument that the wrongs also almost certainly harmed their daughter Eulah. They harmed her by keeping her parents in poverty and ignorance and by, therefore, also keeping her in ignorance and poverty. They also harmed her by causing her to be raised by parents with the various disabilities that the experience of slavery normally causes its victims. And if she acquired these disabilities from her parents by imitation and necessity, and if these disabilities harmed her, the government’s wrongs caused those harms too. If wrongdoers must make reparations for the damages their wrongdoing causes other people, then the government must make reparations to Eulah.

The argument is not that Eulah has a claim to the compensation her parents Tom and Beulah’s were owed and never paid. If that were the argument, we would have an inheritance argument, not a counterfactual argument. Eulah’s claim for compensation is for harms she herself suffered. And she can rightly press that claim against the government. It is not as though her parents could have done better by her but chose not to. The government’s wrongs prevented them from doing better by her. They had no choice but to raise her in poverty and ignorance. The government could have given them a choice if it had compensated for their wrongfully caused harms, or allowed to recover from them. But it did not. Second, the amount of the compensation she is owed does not depend on the amount of compensation they were owed. It depends on the harms she suffered. Though she suffered those harms because they were harmed and not compensated, compensating her for her harms may be much more, (or much less), than compensating them.

Third, she may have an inheritance-based claim to their compensation. The fact that she was harmed because they were not compensated and can claim compensation for that harm does not mean that they lose their claim to be compensated for their harms. If they were never compensated she may therefore inherit a right to their compensation. The counterfactual argument is compatible with the inheritance-based argument.

Fourth, her claim for compensation is not confounded by the argument that she would not exist had the wrongs that caused her harms not occurred. Those wrongs are not the wrongs of slavery, which occurred before she was conceived, and indeed were among the causes of her being conceived. And they are not the wrongs that government committed against her parents after it released them from slavery and before she was conceived. They are the wrongs that were all committed after her conception. They are the wrongs of not protecting her parents’ rights and failing to compensate them for the wrongs already committed against them. Had those wrongs not been committed, she would have lived in less straitened conditions, and would have been less constrained to imitate and duplicate her parents’ slavery induced qualities and habits.

8. The Inheritance Argument

The inheritance argument for black reparations states that the freed people had rights to reparations for their injuries; that they held these rights against the slave holders and also against the state and federal governments for failing in their duties to protect them from the slave holders; that these rights were never honored; and finally, that they passed on the right of inheritance to present day U.S. blacks who are their descendants and heirs. (Corlett 2010)

This argument avoids the objection that the present black population would not exist if their ancestors had never been enslaved. And each premise seems plausible. When people die their rights to their property are normally passed on to their heirs (Boxill 1972: 113–122; Kershnar 1999: 95–101). The reparations owed to the freed people was their property; it was never in their physical possession of course, but obviously something need not be in your possession to be your property. Neither did the freed people abandon their inheritance. Laws and guns very forcefully kept it from them. Consequently, it should pass, by right of inheritance, to their descendants, the present black population.[3]

Two important objections against the inheritance argument are: first that it relies on the counterfactual claim that the freed people and their descendants would have held on to their reparations had they received it; and second that it demands that people make reparations for the injuries of a crime that they could not have committed. Let us begin with the second.

Locke’s discussion of a lawful conqueror’s rights to reparations suggests how to solve it. “The right of Conquest”, Locke claims, “extends only to the Lives of those who joyn’d in the War, not to their Estates, but only in order to make reparation for the damages received, and the Charges of the War, and that too with reservation of the right of the innocent Wife and Children” (Locke 1689: sec. 180). Locke’s claim is that the lawful conqueror has rights to reparations from the estates of those who unjustly waged war against him, though some part of these estates should be reserved for their wives and children. The clear implication is that the wives and children would have gotten a larger part of the estates in question had their husbands and fathers not harmfully transgressed against the lawful conqueror; but Locke would be guilty of self-contradiction if he had meant that the wives and children were being forced to pay or make reparations for the harms their fathers’ and husbands’ the crimes caused. His view was that when people unjustly harm others, a portion of their estates may be used to make reparations to the people they harmed, and as a necessary result their children cannot inherit that portion of their estates.

The following argument parallels Locke’s argument: the slave holders harmed the slaves. Consequently the slaves had rights to reparations against the estates of the slave holders; these rights reduced the extent of the estates that the slave holders’ children would otherwise have inherited from them; the slaves were forcibly prevented from exercising those rights; but it is absurd to suppose that people lose rights just because they are forcibly prevented from exercising those rights; consequently the slaves retained their rights against the estates of the slave holders; present day U.S. blacks are their heirs; consequently present day U.S. blacks have rights against the estates of the slave holders. This argument does not prove much. Even if many descendants of the slave holders can be identified, proving that they inherited their property from their slave holding ancestors seems hopeless. But the argument can be improved. The first step is to see that the slaves did not have rights to reparations only against the slave holders. This step may seem to follow easily from Locke’s famous theory that residence in a state is tacit consent to it (Locke 1689: sec 119). This theory applied to the case of the lawful conqueror might seem to commit Locke to the view that the lawful conqueror had rights to reparations against all members of the state that waged the unjust war against him. But in fact Locke explicitly denied that it did. “The people” he said gave “to their governors no power to do an unjust thing, such as is to make an unjust War, (for they never had such power in themselves:) They ought not to be charged as guilty of the Violence and Injustice that is committed in an Unjust war, any further than they actually abet it” (Locke 1689: sec 179).

And he identified those who “actually abet” and unjust war as those who “assisted, concurred, or consented”, to that war (Locke 1689: sec 179). It may seem that Locke is guilty of self-contradiction here at least if we suppose that to consent to something, even tacitly, is to give the “power”, that is, the right to do it. But Locke evidently did not suppose that to consent to another’s action is to give the other the right to do it; and no one else supposes that it does, except perhaps confused philosophers. For such a supposition implies that one could not consent to another’s unjust action since of course one cannot give another a right to act unjustly, but of course people can and do often consent to another’s unjust action. To consent to another’s action is “to make oneself a partner in the other’s action and to accept a share in the responsibility for it” (Boxill 1993: 96–99). This suggestion may seem to leave us with the conclusion that if voluntary residence in a state is tacit consent to it, as Locke’s theory says, then all the residents of a state must have accepted responsibility for the state’s actions, including its unjust wars, and consequently that the just conqueror must have rights to reparations against all residents of the state. But, as we have seen, Locke denies that the lawful conqueror has such rights. The solution to this puzzle lies in a peculiarity of most signs of tacit consent. The peculiarity is that signs of tacit consent are normally conditions people have good reason to be in other than to give their consent. Thus voluntary residence in a state is a sign of tacit consent to it because most residents of a state have good reason to reside in the state other than to give consent to it. Since a sign of consent would be coerced, and consequently not a sign of consent if not making it is impossible or very costly, it follows that every sign of tacit consent, like residence in a state, must be such as to allow people to make the sign, while withdrawing their consent by making some cheap and easily performed sign of dissent. This reasoning suggests how Locke can say both that voluntary residence in a state is tacit consent to its actions and that the lawful conqueror has rights to reparations from only those who “assisted, concurred, or consented”, to their state’s unjust wars against him. All voluntary residents of a state have tacitly consented to its actions but only those who fail to make some sign of dissent to its unjust wars, have consented to its waging these wars, at least if there are signs of dissent that are relatively easy to make and are not too costly.

Returning to the question of reparations for slavery, U.S. citizens prior to the Civil War knew that their government permitted and supported slavery and also knew that slavery was a crime. The slave holding states certainly tried to conceal the full horrors of their “peculiar institution” but the evidence suggests that their efforts were not successful. Consequently, since few white U.S. citizens expressed dissent from their government’s complicity in the crime of slavery, although it did not punish such dissent, it seems fair to conclude that most white U.S. citizens voluntarily consented to their government’s complicity in the crime. In Locke’s language, they “assisted, concurred, or consented” to the government’s injustice against the slaves. Therefore, still following Locke, it follows that the slaves had rights to reparations against almost the entire white population of the United States for the damages that their enslavement caused them. This argument is perhaps open to the objection that there was in the period of slavery more than a little dissent to the government’s complicity in the crime of slavery; certainly the abolitionists strongly expressed their dissent. Or alternatively it could be objected that dissenting from the government’s complicity in slavery in the Deep South did carry considerable costs including costs not necessarily imposed by the government. Finally, the argument also requires a fuller account of what residents of a state must do in order to make appropriate signs of dissent from the injustice of their government, and consequently to avoid being rightly accused of consenting to that injustice. Presumably, confiding to a few friends that one was opposed to slavery would not be enough. But if these problems can be satisfactorily settled, then since the slaves had titles to reparations against the estates of those who assisted, concurred or consented to their enslavement, they would have titles to reparations against practically the entire white population, not just against the estates of the slave holders. These reparations were never paid. Instead each white generation specified that only whites of the succeeding generation were permitted to own, or compete for, or be educated by, the assets it was leaving behind. Since the slaves had titles to reparations against these assets, and the present generation of U.S. blacks is the slaves’ heir, the present generation of U.S. blacks has inherited titles to a portion of the assets held by the present white population. This includes the white immigrants who arrived in the U.S. after the abolition of slavery to take advantage of opportunities, funded by assets the slaves had titles to, or for the education the slaves and descendants were prevented from getting, or to take natural assets including land that the slaves also had titles to. The fact that they competed for these opportunities and worked hard misses the point since many of these “so called” opportunities had already been inherited by and were the property of, the slaves’ heirs (Corlett 2010: 161–186).

Locke put a limit on the right to reparations. In the case he discussed, the lawful conqueror’s right to reparations was limited by reservations made for the rights of the wife and children of those engaged in or consented to the unjust war against him. As Locke put it:

The Conqueror has a Title to Reparations for Damages received, and the Children have a Title to their Father’s Estate for their Subsistence…What must be done in the case? I answer; The Fundamental Law of Nature being, that all, as much as may be, should be preserved, it follows, that if there be not enough fully to satisfy both, viz, for the Conqueror’s Losses, and the Children’s Maintenance, he that hath, and to spare, must remit something of his full Satisfaction, and give way to the pressing and preferable Title of those, who are in danger to perish without it. (Locke 1689: sec.183)

Thus Locke appeals to the Fundamental Law of Nature which requires that all or as much as may be should be preserved in order to argue that that the lawful conqueror’s right to reparations must give way if it comes into conflict with the rights to subsistence and maintenance of the children of those who owe him reparations. But Locke does not say that the lawful conqueror’s right to reparations is trumped by the children’s right to inheritance; on his account, it is the right to subsistence that trumps the right to reparations when the two rights conflict. When Locke limits the conqueror’s right to reparations, he does so in order to accommodate the rights to subsistence of innocent children. He is concerned that such children will die if he presses the right to reparations too hard, not that they will inherit very little.

Do these reasonable limitations on the right of inheritance have any relevance to whether U.S. blacks have a right to inherit the reparations owed their slave ancestors? Here it is important to note these limitations do not abolish or cancel the right to inheritance. They do not imply, that is, that there is no right to inherit at all. They allow that there is such a right, and that it holds in normal circumstances, but that it fails to hold or is outweighed when allowing it to hold would make innocent people destitute, or create large inequalities that are likely to lead to exploitation and domination. In other words, we cannot set aside the inheritance argument just because it depends on the right of inheritance. We can set aside the inheritance argument aside only if implementing it would make innocent people destitute or create large inequalities that are likely to lead to their exploitation and domination. But would implementing the inheritance argument have these results? It would not. The slaves were horribly harmed by slavery, but paying or making reparations to them would not have required turning over a continent to them. It would have called for no horrendous uprooting of populations, or driven anyone into poverty, or created morally outlandish inequalities. The slaves would not suddenly have become the masters and the whites their subordinates. The nation could have made reparations and suffered mild discomfort at worst. As for the right of inheritance of their heirs, we must remember that it is not limited by the mere length of time between benefactor and heir. The right of inheritance is limited by the dangerous and morally repugnant inequalities that would result from honoring it. These could appear after one generation, or fail to appear after ten generations. We are certainly not referring here to a statute of limitations. It would be wrong for someone’s immediate heir to insist on his right to inherit his father’s goods if this would cause undue hardship to others, or put him in a position to oppress them. But it would be right for someone’s distant heir to insist on her right to inherit his goods if this could save her from hardship or oppression at the hands of her debtors. But is not this latter case exactly similar to that of U.S. blacks? Would they not save themselves from hardship and oppression at the hands of their debtors if they insisted on their right to inherit the reparations that were owed their slave ancestors and never paid?

9. Supersession and Historic Injustices

Others have objected to arguments for reparations for “historic” injustices, specifically Europeans’ theft of Australia, New Zealand, Canada and the U.S. from their original occupiers the Aborigines, Maori, and American Indians (Waldron 1992: 4–28). The basic objection is that the historic wrongs of the ancestors of the Europeans now in the territories have been “superseded” (Waldron 1992: 24). Possibly the objection can be raised against the inheritance argument for reparations to U.S. blacks.

The following example has been used to illustrate what is meant by an historic wrong being superseded. Suppose that there are plenty of water holes on the savanna and two groups P and Q each have a waterhole, but

motivated purely by greed, members of group Q descend on the water hole possessed by group P and insist on sharing that with them. (What’s more they do not allow reciprocity; they do not allow members of P to share any water hole that was legitimately in the possession of Q.) That is an injustice. But then circumstances change, and all the water holes of the territory dry up except the one that originally belonged to P. The members of group Q are already sharing that water hole on the basis of their earlier incursion. But now that circumstances have changed, they are entitled to share the water hole; so that their doing so no longer counts as an injustice. It is in fact part of what justice requires. The initial injustice of Q against P has been superseded by circumstances. (Waldron 1992: 25)

What is meant by the circumstances having changed so that the initial injustice “has been superseded?” The meaning seems to be that, although the members of Q acted unjustly when they first shared P’s water hole, they do not act unjustly now when they share P’s water hole; and this is because circumstances have changed. In the changed circumstances the members of P and Q are now joint owners of the waterhole. It might be asserted that this follows from one of the conditions Locke laid down as necessary for taking something as property, the Lockean proviso, as Nozick famously put it (Nozick 1974: 175; Locke 1689: Book II, 5, sec 27). According to the proviso, the water hole used to be P’s waterhole when circumstances were such that it was permissible for P to make it his property. But circumstances have changed so that it is no longer permissible for P to make the waterhole his exclusive property. The present circumstances make the waterhole the joint property of P and Q.

This argument seems persuasive if we suppose that the only alternative to making the waterhole the joint property of P and Q is for P to prevent Q from using its water since in that case Q would die very painfully. But there are other alternatives. Members of P (Ps) can generously allow the members of Q (Qs) to use the water; or they can sell the water to the members of Q; or they can rent Q a piece of land next to the waterhole. These alternatives may be ruled out by Locke’s apparent opposition to arrangements that put some people in a position of extraordinary dependence on others. For example, he argued that a beggar has a “right” to a portion of a rich man’s surplus when she must have it in order to survive. If so the Qs must have rights to an adequate supply of the water in P’s waterhole. Otherwise if the Ps with ostensible generosity allowed Qs to drink they could also have demanded demeaning behavior from the Qs in exchange; or if they sold water to the Qs they could raise its price as much as they liked; and so on. But in any case, there are alternatives to the joint ownership of the waterhole by the Ps and Qs that do not turn the Qs into P’s dependents. We could, for example, divide the waterhole so that the Qs get an adequate supply of water and are not dependent on the Ps.

In this scenario, the entire case for supersession would seem to rest on the Lockean proviso and its alleged prohibition of claiming unowned stuff as property when there is not enough and as good left over for others. We say “alleged prohibition” for it is not at all clear that Locke’s words amount to such a prohibition. However, the supersession thesis fails even if we allow the prohibition. To see this, let us agree that the Ps and Qs are now joint owners of the waterhole and that the Ps cannot demand that the Qs depart leaving them the waterhole’s sole owners. Our agreement does not imply that we also agree that the Ps cannot demand reparations from the Qs for the damages that the Qs earlier wrongly caused them. That would be absurd because it implies that the Ps and the Qs had always been joint owners of the waterhole, but by assumption the Ps and Qs were not always joint owners of the waterhole. In particular, by assumption, the Ps were once the sole owners of the waterhole when the Qs attacked them and stole their water. This foregoing sketch is meant to parallel the case of the Europeans and indigenous peoples in New Zealand, Australia, and the Americas. For convenience, let us consider the Europeans and the Maoris in New Zealand. We concede that these two people are now the joint owners of the land mass of New Zealand. The Maoris cannot demand that land mass back as reparation because they are no longer its sole owners. They used to be its sole owners, but circumstances have changed and now they are only its joint owners. No one can demand that anyone leave. But that concession does not make the injustice of the European conquest two hundred years ago disappear into thin air. New Zealand may not now belong exclusively to the Maori, but it once did, and when it did, the Europeans did then injure them unjustly. If those injuries persist in the Maoris’ descendants because the European conquerors and their descendants did not pay or make reparations to the original Maoris, their descendants have rights to reparations against the Europeans’ descendants for their injuries, even if they do not have rights that the Europeans’ descendants leave New Zealand to them. To put the point in a different way, the fact that restitution is no longer possible and morally mandatory does not imply that reparations is not still possible and morally mandatory. Restitution, the return of a stolen item to its rightful owner, is often a part of making reparations to the victim of the theft, but as we stressed earlier it is neither necessary nor sufficient for such reparations. It is not sufficient because if I steal your bicycle and then return it to you, though I have made restitution I have not made reparations since the damages you suffer as a result of my theft may be more that the loss of the bicycle; and restitution the return of your bicycle may not cancel, undo or erase the damages you suffered as a result of my theft. And restitution is not necessary for reparations because while the loss or destruction of a stolen item may make its restitution impossible, it does not make reparation for the loss of the item impossible or obligatory. If the bicycle I stole from you is lost restitution is impossible. But it does not follow that reparations is impossible. I can still make reparations to you by providing you with the money to buy another one.[4]

The distinction between restitution and reparations resolves another case that may weaken sympathies for reparations for historic injustices. The case involves the theft of a car that ends up years later the treasured possession of the thief’s daughter who has no idea that it was stolen (Waldron 1992, 14–15). In the meantime, the car’s original owner has eventually outgrown his attachment to it and gotten many other cars. The inference that we are invited to draw is that it would be wrong for him to compel the thief’s daughter to return the car to him, given that she has invested so much of her life in it and he has lost interest in it. Perhaps; but just because it would be wrong of him to demand restitution, it does not follow that it would be wrong of him to demand reparations; that his rights to reparations are somehow “superseded”. This is an entirely different question. The owner may act wrongly in insisting on restitution; maybe he should allow the thief daughter to keep the car. But it does not follow that he cannot demand reparations from the thief for the losses he suffered as a result of the theft of his car.

These results should make it obvious that the supersession argument cannot nullify claims for reparations for historic injustices. To consider the example of New Zealand, perhaps restitution of the land mass of New Zealand to the Maori is out of the question. Perhaps justice cannot demand that Europeans leave New Zealand to the Maori. But it does not follow that justice does not demand that the Europeans make reparations to the Maori for violating their rights and injuring them when New Zealand belonged to them. Theft injures the victim by depriving him of the thing that was stolen from him; but it also injures him by depriving him of the benefits that he was going to earn and enjoy because of his possession of that thing. For the reasons we have surveyed, he may lose his rights to restitution; the thing for example may be lost or destroyed. But it does not follow that he therefore also loses his rights to reparations. Arguments for those rights have to deal with the various objections to historic reparations reviewed in this entry and elsewhere, but they are not undone by the supersession argument.

10. Reparations Policies

Not much has been published on possible policies of reparations to U.S. blacks. But at least a few words concerning such matters are in order in case said reparations are morally justified and required.[5] A rights-based approach to reparations to U.S. blacks by the U.S. government might most plausibly construe such reparations both compensatorily and non-compensatorily. In so doing, reparations are a cluster of rights to such means of corrective justice imposing duties on the U.S. government to provide said reparations to U.S. blacks. The provision of such rights is not to be diminished due to the amount of that which is owed, though it would be counter-productive to settle on an amount or demand so much that the U.S. could not possibly pay it. The main point is to estimate a combined figure that captures the fact that the peculiar institution was widely and deeply supported by several U.S. industries and workforces, from U.S. financial institutions to ship builders, from U.S. lawmakers and courts to slave owners, and well beyond (DeWolf 2008). Thus it is not unreasonable to argue that there was and remains a collective liability of the U.S. to provide such reparations (Corlett 2010: 161–186; McGary 1999).

Compensatory reparations can be calculated with approximation by figuring on a moderate number of sub-Saharan Africans who were brought against their wills to the territory of the U.S. to serve as slaves. Then a moderate estimation can be made of average life expectancy of said slaves, and how many hours a day and per week, etc. said slaves worked without monetary compensation. Perhaps even more important are the human rights abuses of slavery itself, an amount that might be estimated in terms of punitive damages. There are also social, political and psychological effects of slavery, among others, damages to some extent lingering amongst several U.S. black communities throughout the U.S..

However, in order to respect the sovereignty of U.S. blacks as a people and their autonomy as individuals, no presumption should be made that would make the provision of reparations to them dependent on the reconciliation between said blacks and the U.S.. In order to effect this, a Committee on Black Reparations might be established only by vote of U.S. blacks, having a 3–4 year service for each member. There would be no shortage of highly qualified U.S. blacks to serve excellently on said committee: from educators, business persons, attorneys, medical experts, etc.. Said committee would alone decide what to do with the monetary reparations paid by the U.S. Treasury. An annual audit of the transactions between the two parties could be conducted by a party of the committee’s choice.

Since the amount of compensatory reparations would likely reach into the trillions of dollars, the U.S. Congress would be asked to pass into law a U.S. Black Reparations Tax which might amount to a 3% tax on every income made in the U.S., in perpetuity (In perpetuity because of the relatively low percentage of the tax). The taxes received by the committee would presumably be used for the education of U.S. blacks, medical costs, job training, retirement benefits, cash disbursements for rent, mortgage payments, etc..

But also owed to U.S. blacks are non-compensatory reparations. Among other things, the names and images of the confederacy have no place in official public spaces as if they represented the U.S., state or local government. This is because, among other things, the U.S. Civil War was (at least in the minds of many) supposed to symbolize the bloody and painful sacrifice of many soldiers and families for the sake of instituting a slaveless society. Because of this, U.S. history books must continue to be revised in order to provide more balanced and accurate stories of the truth, inclusive of all peoples. This includes the revelation of the ugliest of truths often shrouded in myths in the name of U.S. patriotism. But genuine patriotism has nothing to do with misleading or false information dressed in the guise of history. It must often recount the evils of the 1921Tulsa, Oklahoma massacre of U.S. blacks by whites, the 1923 Rosewood, Florida massacre of many U.S. blacks by many U.S. whites, the murder of Emmet Till and the lynchings of thousands of other blacks, and the pervasive terrorism of U.S. blacks by the KKK. Continued recognition of such evils must replace self-serving glorified images and imaginings which persist to this very day in the minds of many U.S. whites that in one way or another promote white privilege. Such changes should be lawfully instituted, not because to fail to do so would stand as offensive (Corlett 2018), but rather because truth, justice and fairness demand it.


  • Bedau, Hugo Adam, 1972, “Compensatory Justice and the Black Manifesto”, Monist, 56(1): 20–42.
  • Bittker, Boris, 2003 [1973], The Case For Black Reparations, second edition, Boston: Beacon Press, page numbers from this edition.
  • Boxill, Bernard R., 1972, “The Morality of Reparation”, Social Theory and Practice, 2(1): 113–123.
  • –––, 1993, “On Some Criticisms of Consent Theory”, Journal of Social Philosophy, 24: 81–102.
  • –––, 2003a, “The Morality of Reparation II”, in A Companion to African American Philosophy, Tommy L. Lott and John P. Pittman (eds), Malden: Blackwell Publishing Company, 134–147.
  • –––, 2003b, “A Lockean Argument for Black Reparations”, The Journal of Ethics, 7(1): 63–91.
  • Brooks, Roy L., 1999: “The Age of Apology”, in Roy L. Brooks (ed.), When Sorry isn’t Enough: The Controversy over Apologies and Reparations for Human Injustice, New York: New York University Press, 3–11.
  • Browne, Robert S., 1993, “The Economic Basis for Reparations to Black America”, Review of Black Political Economy, 21(3): 99–110.
  • Coates, Ta-Nehisi, 2014, “The Case for Reparations”, The Atlantic, June, Coates 2014 available online.
  • Cohen, Andrew I., 2009, “Compensation for Historic Injustices: Completing the Boxill and Sher Argument”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 37: 81–102.
  • Corlett, J. Angelo, 2003, Race, Racism, and Reparations, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2010, Heirs of Oppression, Totowa: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers.
  • –––, 2018, “Offensiphobia,” The Journal of Ethics, 22: 113–146.
  • Crummell, Alexander, 1891, “The Need for New Ideas and New Aims,” in A. Crummell, Africa and America: Addresses and Discourses, Springfield, MA: Willey & Company, pp. 11, 36.
  • Davis, Adrienne D., 2000, “The Case for United States Reparations to African Americans”, Human Rights Brief, 7(3): 3–5, 11.
  • Darity, William A., Jr., 2001, “End of Race?” Transforming Anthropology, 10(1): 39–43.
  • Delany, Martin Robinson, 1852, The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States, New York: Humanity Books, 2004.
  • –––, 1861, Official Report of the Niger Valley Exploring Party, New York: Thomas Hamilton.
  • DeWolf, Thomas Norman, 2008, Inheriting the Trade, Boston: Beacon.
  • Douglass, Frederick, 1865, “What the Black Man Wants”, reprinted in Negro Social and Political Thought 1850–1920, Howard Brotz (ed.), New York: Basic Books, 1966.
  • –––, 1882, The Life and Times of Frederick Douglass: From 1817 to 1882, London: Christian Age Office.
  • Du Bois, W.E.B, 1992 [1935], Black Reconstruction, New York: Harcourt, Brace. Reprinted as, 1992, Black Reconstruction in America: 1860– 1880, New York: The Free Press edition, page numbers from the latter.
  • Feinberg, Joel, 1970, Doing and Deserving, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1980, Rights, Justice, and the Bounds of Liberty, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Freedom and Fulfillment, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Foreman, James, 1969, “Black Manifesto”, presented at the Black National Economic Conference, Detroit, Michigan, July 10, 1969. [Foreman 1969 available online]
  • Fullinwider, Robert K., 2004, “The Case for Reparations,” in Reparations for Slavery, Ronald P. Salzberger and Mary C. Tuck (eds.), Lanham, MD: Roman and Littllefield, pp. 141–161.
  • Goldberg, David Theo, 2006, “Deva-Stating Disasters: Race in the Shadow(s) of New Orleans”, Du Bois Review, 3(1): 83–95.
  • Harrington, Michael and Arnold S. Kaufman, 1969, “Black Reparations—Two Views”, Dissent, 16(July–August): 310–320.
  • Horowitz, David, 2003, Uncivil Wars: The Controversy over Reparations for Slavery, San Francisco: Encounter Books.
  • Jefferson, Thomas, 1785a [1954], Notes on the State of Virginia, Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press. [Jefferson 1785a also available online]
  • –––, 1785b [2006], “Letter to James Madison, October 28, 1785”, reprinted in Jefferson 2006: 154. [Also available at Jefferson 1785b available online]
  • –––, 2006, The Essential Jefferson, Jean M. Yarbrough (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Kershnar, Stephen, 1999, “Are the Descendants of Slaves Owed Compensation for Slavery?” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 16(1): 95–101.
  • –––, 2001, “The Case Against Reparations”, Philosophy in the Contemporary World, 8(1): 41–46.
  • –––, 2002, “The Inheritance-Based Claim to Reparations”, Legal Theory, 8(2): 243–267.
  • –––, 2004 Justice for the Past, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Levin, Michael, 1980, “Reverse Discrimination, Shackled Runners, and Personal Identity,” Philosophical Studies, 37: 137–149.
  • Locke, John, 1689, Two Treatises of Government, in Peter Laslett (ed.), Locke’s Two Treatises of Government, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1960.
  • Lyons, David, 1977, “The New Indian Land Claims and the Original Rights to Land”, Social Theory and Practice, 4(3): 249–272.
  • –––, 2004, “Corrective Justice, Equal Opportunity, and the Legacy of Slavery and Jim Crow”, Boston University Law Review, 84: 1374–1404.
  • –––, 2013, Confronting Injustice: Moral History and Political Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGary, Howard, 1977, “Justice and Reparations”, Philosophical Forum, 9(2): 256–263.
  • –––, 1999, Race and Social Justice, London: Blackwell.
  • McGary, Howard Jr. and Bill E. Lawson, 1992, Between Slavery and Freedom, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Morris, Christopher W., 1984, “Existential Limits to the Rectification of Past Wrongs”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 21(2): 175–182.
  • Myers, Peter C., 2008, Frederick Douglass: Race and the Rebirth of American Liberalism, Lawrence: University Press of Kansas.
  • Nozick, Robert, 1974, Anarchy State and Utopia, New York: Basic Books.
  • Perez, Nahshon, 2011, “On Compensation and Return: Can the ‘Continuing Injustice Argument’ for Compensating for Historical Injustices Justify Compensation for such Injustices, or the Return of Property?” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 28(2): 151–168.
  • –––, 2012, Freedom From Past Injustice: A Critical Evaluation of Claims for Inter-Generational Reparations, Edinburgh: University of Edinburgh Press.
  • –––, 2014, “Must We Provide Material Redress For Past Wrongs?” Contemporary Debates in Applied Ethics., Second Edition, Andrew I. Cohen and Christopher Heath Wellman (eds), Oxford: Wiley Blackwell, 203–216.
  • Rawls, John, 1999, A Theory of Justice, Revised Edition, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Roberts, Rodney C., 2001, “Why Have the Injustices Perpetrated Against Blacks in America not been Rectified”, Journal of Social Philosophy, 32(3): 357–373.
  • –––, 2003, “The Morality of a Moral Statute of Limitations on Injustice”, Journal of Ethics, 7: 115–138.
  • Robinson, Randall, 2000, The Debt: What America Owes to Blacks, New York: Penguin.
  • Schedler, George, 2002, “Principles for Measuring the Damages of American Slavery”, Public Affairs Quarterly, 16(4): 377–404.
  • Sher, George, 1981, “Ancient Wrongs and Modern Rights” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 10(1): 3–17.
  • –––, 1997, Approximate Justice: Studies in Non-Ideal Theory, Lantham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • –––, 2005, “Transgenerational Compensation”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 33(2): 181–200.
  • Simmons, A. John, 1995, “Historical Rights and Fair Shares”, Law and Philosophy, 14(2): 149–184.
  • Thompson, Janna, 2002, Taking Responsibility for the Past: Reparation and Historical Injustice, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • –––, 2009, Intergenerational Justice: Rights and Responsibilities in an Intergenerational Polity, New York: Routledge.
  • Valls, Andrew, 2007, “Reconsidering the Case for Black Reparations”, in Reparations: Interdisciplinary Inquiries, Jon Miller and Rahul Kumar (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 114–129.
  • Valls, Andrew and Jonathan Kaplan, 2007, “Housing Discrimination as a Basis for Black Reparations”, Public Affairs Quarterly, 21(3): 255–273.
  • Viren, Sarah, 2021, “The Genealogy of a Lie,” The New York Times Magazine, 26–33, 45–46, 49.
  • Waldron, Jeremy, 1992, “Superseding Historic Injustice”, Ethics, 103(1): 4–28.
  • –––, 2002, “Redressing Historic Injustice”, The University of Toronto Law Review, 52(1): 135–160.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


This entry was originally composed by Bernard R. Boxill, and substantially revised by J. Angelo Corlett. The second author would like to thank the editors of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for the invitation.

Copyright © 2022 by
Bernard Boxill
J. Angelo Corlett <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free